Do justice considerations apply to intergenerational relations, that is, to relations between non-contemporaries? If we follow a broad understanding of justice (see Mill 1863, ch. 5) this is the case if future or past generations can be viewed as holding legitimate claims or rights against present generations, who in turn stand under correlative duties to future or past generations. One of the legitimate claims of future generations vis-à-vis present generations appears to be a claim of distributive justice: Depending on the understanding of the relevant principles of distributive justice to be applied, if there is an intergenerational conflict of interests, present generations may be obligated by considerations of justice not to pursue policies that impose an unfair intergenerational distribution of costs and benefits.
This entry will focus primarily on two questions: first, whether present generations can be duty-bound because of considerations of justice to past and future people; and second, whether other moral considerations should guide those currently alive in relating to both past and future people. Concerning the first question, the entry will suggest that present generations have duties of justice to future people but not to past people. Concerning the second question, the entry will suggest that present generations also have additional moral duties (duties not grounded in correlative rights) to future people as well as moral duties to past people owing, in part, to the rights these people had while alive. The entry will also argue for the lasting significance of past injustices in terms of what is owed to the descendants of the direct victims of the injustices. These are contentious claims as the discussion will show.
Discussions of what we owe to future people go back to ancient times (Auerbach 1995, 27–35) and ancient philosophy provides resources and insights for intergenerational ethics (Lane 2012). Important contributions within the utilitarian tradition include the analysis of the moral status of future sentient beings (see, e.g., Sidgwick 1907, 414), of optimal savings (Ramsey 1928, see also the entry on Ramsey and Intergenerational Welfare Economics), and of obligations of reproduction (Narveson 1967, see sect. 2.2). Within a theory of justice we owe the first systematic account of obligations to future people to John Rawls (see Section 4.4). Derek Parfit’s work has defined the problems of how we can and should relate to future people (see esp. Section 3).
- 1. How Intergenerational Relations Differ from Relations Among Contemporaries
- 2. Rights of Future People vis-à-vis Presently Living People
- 3. No Rights Due to Contingency of Future People Upon Our Decisions?
- 4. How to Specify the Threshold
- 5. The Significance of Past Wrongdoing
- 6. Conclusion
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- Related Entries
It may seem that considerations of justice do not apply to intergenerational relations, because there is a lack of direct reciprocity between generations of people who are not contemporaries. Among non-contemporaries, there is no mutual cooperation and there are no exchanges in kind (see Barry 1989b, 189–203; Barry 1991, 231–234; Heyd 2009a, 167–176; but see Gosseries 2009, Mazor 2010, and Brandstedt 2015 for conceptions of indirect and transgenerational reciprocity that do not require that the initial contributor is among the final beneficiaries). This fact about the relations between present and remote past or future generations is closely related to a second feature of intergenerational relations: the permanent asymmetry in power-relations between living people and those who will live in the future.
First, present generations may be said to exercise power over (remote) future generations when, for example, they create conditions that make it costly for future generations to decide against continuing to pursue present generations’ projects. In this way, present generations effectively manipulate interests of future generations, and can successfully achieve the intended result of having their projects continued. Remote future generations cannot exercise such an influence on presently living people, and in this sense the power-relation between present generations and remote future generations is radically asymmetrical: remote future people do not even have the potential for exercising such power over presently living people. Analogously, presently living people cannot exercise influence over past people (Barry 1977, 243–44; Barry 1989b, 189).
Second, not only can the present generation influence the conduct of future people by affecting their desires and circumstances, it can also exercise power by setting back the interests of future generations. It can, for example, pursue a natural-resource policy with long-term negative consequences. In this case, the present generation imposes upon future generations the risk of having their options reduced to an inadequate range—unless, that is, future generations will have available to them and can afford to use technologies that allow them to adapt to the circumstances (Barry, 1999; Beckerman, 1999). By contrast, remote future people cannot at all affect the value of the lives of the presently living, at least while the latter are alive. Still, such future people might nevertheless be considered able to set back the interests of or even wrong present or past persons insofar as the latter have, or had, interests with respect to posthumous future states of affairs. In the same way, the presently living may be morally constrained in their actions that relate to people who lived in the remote past (see Section 5.3). These power relations are quite different from those among contemporaries, which are relatively fluid and subject to change.
Third, those presently alive can affect the very existence of future people (whether or not future people will exist), the number of future people (how many future people will exist), and the identity of future people (who will exist). In short: future people’s existence, number, and specific identity depend (are contingent) upon currently living people’s decisions and actions. A decision taken by present generations could conceivably result in the termination of human life; there is a long tradition of institutionalized population policy whose goal is to control the size of future generations; and, more prosaically, a couple can certainly decide whether or not to have children. Furthermore, many of our decisions have indirect effects on how many people will live and who they are, for many of our decisions affect who meets whom and who decides to have children with whom. To explain such “different people choices”, Parfit adopts the genetic identity view of personal identity: the identity of a person is at least in part constituted by the DNA the person has as a result of which ovum was fertilized by this or that spermatozoon in the creation of this person. Our actions thus have an effect on the genetic identity of future people in so far as they affect from which particular pairs of cells future people will grow—and any action that affects people’s reproductive choices, directly or indirectly, will do that. Many of our actions in fact have an indirect effect on when future people will be conceived. If we decide between two long-term policies regarding the use of natural resources, for example, we know that depending on which we choose, different (and most likely also a different number of) future people will come into existence. E.g., the finding of the European Commission that more than one million babies may have been produced as a result of the Erasmus Programme (the European Community Action Scheme for the Mobility of University Students, and with more than three million students participating since 1987), most of who would very likely not have come to existence without at least one of their parents participating in the Programme (European Commission 2014, 130–131).
By contrast, when we make decisions affecting our contemporaries, we do not face different people choices. Our decisions may affect their existence only with respect to their survival; their number only with respect to how many survive; their identity only in the sense that we might be in a position to change their conditions of life, character, and self-understanding. Of course, we can affect neither the number nor the identity of past generations.
Lastly, our knowledge of the future is limited. While we can know the particular identities of both previously and presently existing people, we are normally not in a position to refer to specifically identifiable future persons. It is not that all predictions about the future decrease in certainty at some constant rate (see Cowen and Parfit 1992, 148). Indeed, many predictions are more likely to be true concerning the further future than the more immediate future. For example, the prediction that some policy will have changed or that certain resources will have been exhausted is more likely to be true in the further future. Nonetheless, we cannot know the specific identities of persons in the further future. Our lack of certain knowledge of the future also means that we often will be in a position to know at best merely the likelihood of normatively relevant consequences of alternative long-term policies. The question then is how to assess the imposition of differing risks of rights violations (see, e.g., McCarthy 1997; Oberdiek 2012; Perry 2014).
These differences between our relations to one another and our relations to subsequent or antecedent generations give rise to a number of important normative problems. Among them are the following: The first concerns the normative significance of the non-changeable fact that remote future people as well as deceased people do not even have the potential for exercising power over presently living people. According to the Will Theory, for a person to have a right vis-à-vis another person requires the former to be able to exercise his or her rights with respect to the conduct of the latter (Hart 1955, 183–184; Hart 1982, 183; Wellman 1995, 91–92; Steiner 1994, 59–73). Thus, the unchangeable power-asymmetry among non-contemporaries will exclude the possibility of future non-contemporaries and deceased people being bearers of rights claims against presently living people (Steiner, 1983; Steiner 1994, 249–61; Fabre 2001; see also Ackerman 1980, 70–75). Consequently, for the proponents of the Will Theory considerations of justice (as understood in this entry) do not apply to intergenerational relations. In our following discussions we will assume with the proponents of the Interest Theory of Rights (Raz 1984; Raz 1986, 166–188; Raz 1994, 45–51; Kramer 1998, 60–101) that being able to exercise one’s rights—to demand or waive the enforcement of a right—is neither sufficient nor necessary for someone to be the bearer of the right. According to the Interest Theory for a person actually to hold a right, the right, when actual, necessarily preserves one or more of the persons’ interests (Kramer, 1998, 62). In terms of the understanding of justice that the entry presupposes, we will assume that for a person to have a valid justice claim vis-à-vis another person (who stands under the correlative duties) does not depend upon being able to harm or benefit the other person (Barry 1989b, chs. 4–6; Buchanan, 1990; but see Gauthier 1986; Heyd 2009a; Hiskes 2009, 9). The entry as a whole will explore the validity of justice considerations for the normative assessment of various aspects of intergenerational relations.
The second problem concerns the normative significance of the contingency of future people upon currently living people’s decisions and actions. If and insofar as the existence, identity, or number of future people depend upon present decisions and actions, to what extent can the former be said to be harmed by the latter? Furthermore, can presently existing persons, in making such decisions, be guided by the interests of future persons? These are the questions that underlie the so-called ‘Non-Identity-Problem’ (see Sections 3 and 4).
Third, our limited knowledge of the future also means that we often will be in a position to know at best merely the likelihood of normatively relevant consequences of alternative long-term policies. How should we relate to people who will live in the future under conditions of risk and uncertainty? As we know at best merely the likelihood of the differing consequences of alternative policies, how should we assess the imposition of differing risks on and the likely or uncertain provision of benefits for future people?. Fourth, is it possible for us to harm past people, and do we have duties toward them? (See Section 5). Fifth, what motivation could we have for fulfilling our duties to future people, given that we know neither their individual identities nor their particular preferences?
The entry will focus on the second and fourth problems as they are centrally important for understanding the very possibility of intergenerational justice. In discussing these questions we need to be clear who (or what) can count. According to the so-called person-affecting view, an act can be wrong only if that act harms, or will harm or can be expected to harm, a person who does or will exist (see especially Parfit 1984, 363, 295–396; Heyd 1992 and 2014, 2–3; Boonin 2008; Roberts 2013). In the context of intergenerational justice, we assess how a future person is affected by currently living people’s actions and in particular when these actions are among the necessary conditions for future people’s very existence, identity and number. The entry investigates whether duties of intergenerational justice can be understood on the basis of what might be called a weak person-affecting view: Answers to the questions of whether a future person will be harmed or wronged by having been brought into existence under certain conditions may rely neither on a comparison with the state the person would have been in had she not been brought into existence, that is with the person’s never-ever existing, nor on a comparison with how well off other people would have been had currently living people acted differently. Never-ever existing and potentially existing people do not count; only those people who actually exist at some time count.
This weak person-affecting view stands in contrast to a strong person-affecting view according to which an act or action harms a person only if the same person is worse off than she would otherwise at that time have been. Both the weak and the strong person-affecting views differ from impersonal views according to which the value of states of affairs is not reducible to their effect on the interests of actual people. Currently living people ought to choose to bring about the state of affairs in which more of the morally relevant values will be realized irrespective of who the people are who will live. Many theorists claim that a plausible understanding of intergenerational ethics must be impersonal or must combine person-affecting and impersonal considerations (see especially Harris 1992, 94–95; Singer 1998; Buchanan et al. 2000, 249; Harman 2004, 101–102; McBrayer 2008, 304; Holtug 2009, 71–92; McMahan 2009, 49–68; Temkin 2012, 313–362; Williams and Harris 2014, 347; Heyd’s interpretation of Parfit 2011 in Heyd 2014). The differences between the person-affecting and impersonal understandings will come to the fore in Sections 2.2 and 3 on intergenerational duties that reflect what is owed to future people as a matter of justice as well as in Section 4.5 on the limits of a rights-based account of intergenerational ethics.
This entry discusses and defends an interpretation of intergenerational justice that can be characterized by the following two sets of claims. First, with respect to the relation between currently living people and future people the following propositions are discussed (Sections 2–4): The dependency (or contingency) of the number and specific identity of future people upon our decisions does not matter where the question is our potentially harming future people’s interests and violating their rights; considerations of justice, namely the welfare rights claims of future people vis-à-vis currently living people can guide us in choosing among long-term policies; such considerations can also guide prospective parents in deciding whether they ought to revise their decision to conceive out of regard for the children they would thereby beget (Sections 2–3); intergenerational justice will reflect, at least in part, a sufficientarian conception of justice (Section 4); important concerns for future generations many people share cannot be understood as duties of justice vis-à-vis future people; rather they are based on an understanding of the ethical significance of seeing ourselves as members of a transgenerational polity and community (Section 4.5).
Second, with respect to the relations between currently living people and past people we will investigate the following claims (Section 5): Currently living people can be understood to be negatively affected by historical injustices even if these injustices are among the necessary conditions of their very existence and identity; assuming that the supersession of injustice is possible we will need to investigate whether and to what extent it has occurred in any given case; even if we held the view that the non-identity-problem excluded the possibility of currently living people being indirect victims of past injustice or that the historical injustice under consideration has been superseded, currently living people can stand under surviving duties to deceased victims owing to the wrongs committed against them (by others) in the past.
On a person-affecting view, future people count if, and insofar as, they have interests, just claims, or rights vis-à-vis currently living people. Some philosophers deny that this can ever be the case. In addition to an argument reflecting the ‘Non-Identity-Problem’ we can distinguish at least four further arguments in support of the denial of the possibility of future people having rights vis-à-vis us. The first argument is based on the fact that future people will live in the future. According to the second argument, for future people to have rights vis-à-vis us we would have to ascribe a right to existence to them. Third, our epistemic situation does not allow us to relate to future people as individuals. And in Section 1 we also investigate a fourth argument according to which future people cannot be said to have rights vis-à-vis currently living people since they cannot claim these rights against them and, a fortiori, cannot impose sanctions on currently living people for non-fulfillment of their corresponding duties. As will be shown, this argument presupposes what is a clearly contentious claim about the necessary conditions for being the bearer of a right.
We hope to remove these skeptical doubts before turning to a discussion of the relevance of the contingency of future people—the subject that, under the title of the ‘Non-Identity-Problem’ has been at the core of much of the philosophical inquiry into the foundations of intergenerational justice (Sections 3–4.3). We will introduce that core issue by addressing a specific criticism of the person-affecting view in the context of intergenerational justice (Section 2.2): Some have argued that a person-affecting view cannot account for the widely held belief that persons have the right not to be brought into existence if the person-to-be would not reach a sufficiently good (or decent) level of well-being.
First, some philosophers have denied that future people can have rights (or just claims), based simply on the fact that they will live in the future. Consider the following claim: “Future generations by definition do not exist now. They cannot now, therefore, be the present bearer or subject of anything, including rights” (De George 1981, 161; see also Macklin 1981, 151–52; Beckerman and Pasek 2001, 14–23; Herstein 2009, 1180–82). Claiming that we can violate the rights of future people now does not, however, imply that future people have rights now (though see Partridge 1990, 54–55, who suggests that future people have rights in the present). That implication would hold only if it were conceded that presently existing rights alone constrain present action. But we can safely assume, first, that future people will be bearers of rights in the future, second, that the rights they have will be determined by the interests they have then, and third, that our present actions and policies can affect their interests. If we can violate a person’s rights by frustrating her interests severely, and if we can so severely frustrate such interests of future people, we can violate their future rights (see Hoerster 1991, 98–102). Their future existence itself is thus insufficient to ground the claim that we cannot now violate the rights of future persons.
Second, we are not committed to the claim that if we are able now to violate the rights of future generations, it is their rights to existence that we violate. Since it is implausible that anyone has a right to existence as such, it is implausible that future persons have rights to existence. Furthermore, when we prevent someone’s existence, we do not thereby harm the hypothetical interests of this potential subject. Thus, claiming that actual future people have rights vis-à-vis currently living people now cannot commit us to claiming that possible future people have a right to existence.
Are our present actions nonetheless constrained by rights of future generations that are based on interests other than existence as such, interests such as subsistence, etc.? This is possible only if attributing rights to people does not require us to make reference to individual persons (Herstein 2009, 1180–82). However, third, lack of particular knowledge of future people as individuals does not stand in the way of attributing to them welfare rights, such as a right to subsistence.
When we consider which natural-resource policy presently living people ought to adopt, we cannot possibly be guided by obligations to concrete (genetically identifiable) people living in the (remote) future. From this fact, however, it does not follow that we have no obligations to future people. All that follows is that such obligations do not depend on the particular identity of future persons. Rather, such obligations would be grounded in the fact that future persons are human beings; that is, they share those properties of being human that permit and require us to relate morally to them as fellow humans. In evaluating a natural-resource policy, we can safely assume that future people will exist to whom we owe obligations as human beings—for example, the obligation to protect their interests in having the means of subsistence. We may also be able to predict with some accuracy the effects of our present actions on future generations’ means of subsistence. Thus, if we decide to deplete rather than conserve resources, this will in all likelihood have adverse impacts on future people’s rights to subsistence (to life, health, food, water and housing), to development and self-determination. In other words, the in principle avoidable consequences of a policy of depletion (IPCC 2014, 10–17) impose heavy risks on future people by significantly increasing the likelihood of very many future people’s basic human rights being violated (see, e.g., Caney, 2010). If there are rights to subsistence, development and self-determination based on humanity alone, then, those people who will exist under our policies of depletion are more likely than those who will exist under our policies of conservation to have such rights violated (assuming here the number of future people being constant). This would be a rights-based consideration for not choosing a policy of depletion. As will be shown in Section 3, the claim that rights considerations can guide us in choosing among policies or actions that have an impact on the composition of the future human population relies upon a notion of harm that does not depend upon a comparison of the state of the supposedly harmed person to a counterfactual state of this person had the harmful action not occurred.
Can prospective children be said to have an interest that their parents not act in a way likely to lead to their birth when the parents are in a position to know that the life of the child, should it be born, would fall below some relevant threshold of well-being? (On the significance of the notion of a threshold level of well-being, see below, Sections 3 and 4). John Stuart Mill endorses the idea of a procreational duty not to bring a person into existence unless the person will have “at least the ordinary chances of a desirable existence” (see Mill 1859, 301–304). It is a widely held belief that under certain circumstances prospective parents should refrain from procreating owing to the predicted plight of the would-be child. Antinatalists hold that these conditions hold generally (see, e.g., Schopenhauer, 1851, vol. 2, ch. xii, § 149; Cioran, 1978, 117; Horstmann, 1983, 99–101). More recently, e.g., David Benatar (2006, esp. ch. 2) has argued that the birth of a new person always entails nontrivial harm to that person, and therefore we ought to refrain from procreating.
Since the publication of Narveson’s seminal paper “Utilitarianism and New Generations” (Narveson 1967; see also Narveson 1973), many have contributed to the debate on whether a person-affecting approach can account for the asymmetry of our procreational duties (Parfit 1976; Feinberg 1984, 101, and 1986; Mulgan 2006, ch. 6; Rivera-López 2009). The claimed asymmetry is the following: while prospective parents have no obligation to procreate out of regard for the interests of possible future children, they have an obligation not to beget children who are going to be miserable.
Some have argued that belief in such an asymmetry is incompatible with a person-affecting view and, more particularly, with the claim that possible people cannot be said to have, against us, a right to existence. It is helpful at this point to make a distinction between the reasoning of potential parents that involves a possible future child and reasoning that involves their future child (see Govier 1979, 111). For instance, in deciding not to procreate at all people do not thereby harm the children they could have brought into existence (see Section 2.1) since these are merely possible individuals. Thus, much reasoning about whether or not to have a child should concern the interests of those already alive; it is actual people’s lives that would be affected by whether or not the child comes into existence (see Heyd 1992, 96–97; Roberts 2009, sec. 2). Nonetheless, people might make choices about procreation based on the welfare of their future child; that is, the welfare of that as yet non-existent individual would feature in their reasoning. When prospective parents decide in favor of having a child and now learn that this child, if born, would have a life that falls below a certain threshold of well-being they ought to consider the effects of their actions on their child and might well decide not to have a child after all.
Objections to the asymmetry view presented above concern, in particular, the claim that after having made a decision to have children, prospective parents should revise their decision out of regard for their would-be child(ren) when they learn that the prospective child(ren) would have a life that falls below the relevant threshold. Why, under these circumstances, should parents revise their decision to have children out of regard for the children? The reason is that they would harm the would-be child, and, thus, arguably, would act wrongly toward it. Here, harming their child-to-be would inflict a wrong on it. When prospective parents learn that their child would have a life that falls below the relevant threshold, they should refrain from having it, for by bringing the child into existence they would cause harm to it. In bringing about a child’s existence they can harm this child.
This claim has been said to be incompatible with a person-affecting view (see Heyd 1992, 102, 105–06, 241–42). In Section 3, two notions of harm will be distinguished. The first relies on comparing a person’s actual state to a counterfactual (or historical) state of the same person. The second relies on no such comparison. Both notions of harm require us to ask: for whom is the action worse? However, while both notions can be understood to reflect the person-affecting view as specified above (Section 1), only the first fulfills the stronger conditions of Parfit’s “two-state requirement” or “better-or-worse-for-the-same-person” requirement: “we benefit or harm someone only if we cause him to be better or worse off than he would otherwise at that time have been” (Parfit 1984, 487). The contingency of future people will often mean that the same person could not or is not likely to have come into existence as a result of two alternative acts or actions (see below Section 3.1). As will be shown in Section 3.2 below, in applying the second notion, we do not have to compare the value of life below some threshold with nonexistence (or with how well off another person or other people would have been) in order to be able to claim that we can cause harm to a person by bringing about that person’s existence.
Assuming that the person can be considered harmed, why was the person wronged by having been brought into existence if the person has a life worth living? If we specify the threshold in terms of rights we might think that the person would waive whatever right was violated by having been brought into existence as the person can be assumed to much prefer living to never-ever-coming into existence. Then we might believe that bringing into existence a person whose life is worth living, but below the threshold, is a case of wrongless harm-doing if we consider the issue in person-affecting terms (see Harris 1992, 94–96; Williams and Harris 2014, 347–348).
The assumed fact that the person would waive her right clearly does not settle the matter of whether she was wronged by having been brought into existence (Harman 2004, 89–101; Liberto 2014, 79–80). A person can have a legitimate complaint about having been brought into existence although she does not wish that the action had not occurred, although she (the same person) could not be in the state of not having been wronged (but see Heyd 2014, 4–5), and even though she enjoys a life worth living.
The claim that bringing into existence a person in a harmed state according to a certain threshold is wrongful implies that this person is worse off than she ought to be. That the person will have a life worth living is not a sufficient reason to render permissible bringing the person into existence and in a harmed sub-threshold state. The ground for this reason does not rely on a comparison with how well off the person or other people would be if we refrain from bringing the person into existence or acted differently (but see Harman 2004, 101–102; McBrayer 2008, 304; Woollard 2012). The reason understood in person-affecting terms does not reflect the view that the person would be better off if he or she would never ever come to existence or the view that we should bring into existence another person whose life is above the threshold or the view that we should maximize the number of people with lives above the threshold. Rather, if we have a choice between bringing into existence a person with a life worth living, but below the threshold, and bringing into existence a person with a life worth living at or above the threshold, the reason speaks against doing the former but not in favor of doing the latter.
Let us note that one can also defend the asymmetry of our procreational duties from an impersonal view, according to which the value of states of affairs is not reducible to how these states affect the interests of people. From an impersonal view one does not have to claim that prospective parents should refrain from procreation out of regard for the children they would have. Based on this view, two alternative interpretations of the asymmetry of our procreational duties have been discussed in the literature. One could adopt a version of negative consequentialism and argue that the universe would be better if present generations were guided by a criterion of right action that requires them to give priority to the prevention of suffering over the creation of good and happiness (see Heyd 1992, 59–60, for problems with this account). Alternatively, an impersonal approach could argue that we have a prima facie duty to promote over-all happiness by creating new well off people—which duty, however, may be more easily overridden than duties not to cause harm. The paradoxical implications of the latter view have been prominently explored by Derek Parfit.
The main source of skepticism concerning the very possibility of future people having welfare rights vis-à-vis those currently living rests upon the contingency of future people upon currently living people’s decisions and actions. We know, of course, that when we harm future people’s interests and violate their rights, specific persons are harmed. But the decision we take counts as a necessary condition of the very existence of this genetically and numerically specific set of people at some future point in time. The so-called ‘Non-Identity-Problem’ presupposes this fact and interprets it as a challenge to the very possibility of intergenerational justice.
Consider a policy of making intensive and extensive use of exhaustible resources for the aim of increasing the welfare of currently living people. If the policy is criticized for harming future people on the ground that this policy will predictably worsen their conditions of life and thus is likely to violate their welfare rights, a defender of the policy could reply by saying: many, if not all of our actions have (indirect) effects not only on the conditions of life, but also on the composition of future persons, that is, on the number, existence, and identity of future persons. This is also true for actions that allegedly harm future persons. If the non-performance of the allegedly harmful action would have resulted in the allegedly harmed person not coming into existence, then that person cannot be said to have been harmed by this action—or, at any rate, according to the common understanding of harm (see Meyer 2003, 147–49, 155–58, for a detailed discussion).
The common understanding is informed by a diachronic notion of harm and a notion that requires a subjunctive comparison with a historical baseline (hereinafter subjunctive-historical notion of harm). Both the diachronic and the subjunctive-historical notions of harm require that the existence of the harmed person or people qua individuals is independent of the harming act or policy. On the diachronic notion of harm the following formula holds:
(I) (diachronic) An action (or inaction) at time t1 harms someone only if the agent causes (allows) this person to be worse off at some later time t2 than the person was before t1.
On the subjunctive-historical notion of harm, the corresponding necessary condition for harming is:
(II) (subjunctive-historical) An action (or inaction) at time t1 harms someone only if the agent causes (or allows) this person to be worse off at some later time t2 than the person would have been at t2 had the agent not interacted with (or acted with respect to) this person at all.
When considering future individuals as possible individuals both the diachronic and the subjunctive-historical notions of harm will exclude the possibility of present people harming future people, for the (future) people whose interests and rights they are required to respect are not in a particular state of well-being at the time they take their decision—they do not, at that time, exist. But according to (I) unless we can claim that the person is in a particular state of well-being at the time of our decision, that is, at t1, we cannot say that the person is worse off at t2 owing to our decision at t1. And likewise with (II): unless we can claim that there is a specific person who would have been better off at t2 than this person actually is at t2 had we not acted with respect to this person at all, this notion of harm makes no sense.
Adopting either the diachronic or the subjunctive-historical notions of harm excludes the possibility of our harming future people when we choose among long-term policies with significantly differing consequences for the quality of life of future people. With respect to persons whose existence is dependent upon the allegedly harming action, they cannot be worse (or, indeed, better) off owing to this action than they would have been had this action not been carried out. For in that case, they would not have existed.
We can distinguish four main responses to the ‘Non-Identity-Problem’ so understood (compare Boonin 2008, 134 ff; Page 2008; Heyd 2009b; Roberts 2013; Wrigley 2012, 178): First, some philosophers hold the view that future people whose existence depends upon currently living people’s actions cannot have rights vis-à-vis the latter people’s actions (see Schwartz 1978; cf. Adams 1979; Kavka 1982; Parfit 1984, part iv; Boonin 2008; Roberts 2009). Second, others argue that currently living people can violate the rights of future people even if the former cannot harm the latter (see Kumar 2003). If so, future people cannot have welfare rights vis-à-vis currently living people insofar as violating welfare rights implies setting back or harming the interests of the right holders. Third, we can attempt to limit the practical significance of the non-identity-problem by limiting the relevant actions to those that are not only likely but indeed necessary conditions of the existence of the concerned person.
Finally, some have sought to circumvent the non-identity problem by suggesting an alternative notion of harm that is unaffected by the non-identity-problem, the so-called ‘Threshold Conception of Harm’ (Hanser 1990, 2009; McMahan 1998; Shiffrin 1999; Meyer 2003, 2009; Harman 2004, 2009; Rivera-López 2009). The response to the ‘Non-Identity-Problem’ based on the threshold conception is relevantly different from other responses (such as those criticized by Heyd in 2009b). The threshold response can be understood to be person-affecting in the weak sense (see Section 1 above): While the person being harmed according to the threshold notion does not imply that the same person is worse off than she would have otherwise been at that time, it does imply that this person is worse off than she ought to be. We owe it to the person when she will have come to existence that she is not in a harmed state (see Section 2.2 above). Such an understanding is relevantly different from an impersonal understanding according to which the universe is a better place when it does not include people in a harmed state as judged by the threshold Notion (but see Wrigley 2012, 178).
The threshold notion substitutes the necessary condition:
(III) (threshold) An action (or inaction) at time t1 harms a person only if the agent thereby causes (allows) either the coming into existence of this person in a sub-threshold state or the already existing person to be in a sub-threshold state; further, only if this person would not be in the harmed state had the agent not interacted with (or acted with respect to) this person at all; and furthermore, only if the agent, if he cannot avoid causing harm in this sense, does not minimize the harm.
According to such a threshold notion of harm an action harms a person only if, as a consequence of that action, the (then existing) person falls below a normatively defined threshold (see McMahan 1998, 223–29; Shiffrin 1999). This threshold notion is unaffected by the non-identity-problem, for here the finding of harm does not require that the person who is in the sub-threshold state would be in a better state in the situation that would have obtained in the absence of the harming action. Thus, future people can be said to be harmed by currently living people’s actions even if these actions are among the necessary conditions of the existence, identity or number of future people. Such a notion of harm limits the practical significance of the non-identity-problem to different degrees depending upon how the threshold is substantially defined (see Section 4 below).
Both of the claims discussed above (in Sections 1 and 2, passim), namely,
first, that considerations reflecting the welfare rights of future people vis-à-vis present people can guide the latter in choosing among long-term policies, and
second, that considerations of the rights of people not to be brought into existence if they are likely not to realise a certain level of well-being can guide prospective parents in deciding not to conceive out of regard for the children they would otherwise have,
can be read as relying upon a threshold notion of harm.
Adopting either the diachronic or the subjunctive-historical notions of harm or both excludes the possibility of our harming future people when we choose among long-term policies with significantly differing consequences for the quality of life of future people. But if we adopt the threshold notion of harm at (III), future people can be said to be wronged by our choice of a policy that harms them, notwithstanding the fact that the existence of the specific people who are said to be harmed is causally dependent on our decision to pursue this policy.
The threshold notion of harm is also crucial for understanding the second claim at issue. The three notions of harm as distinguished above (Section 3.1) can be shown to have differing presuppositions when they are used to explicate the claim that by bringing about the existence of a child we can cause harm to this child. Consider the following claims:
(a) A living person can be worse off than that person was before she was conceived.
(b) Any life lived by a human being is commensurable with non-existence.
(c) We can say of a person that she did not exist before her conception.
(d) We can lay out a general standard of well-being so that we violate a duty to a person when we cause this person to fall below the standard specified, or when we fail to cause this person to reach the standard.
In shorthand form, the situation is this: Depending on which notion of harm is used, the claim that parents have harmed their child by bringing it into existence presupposes a different set of assumptions ((a)-(d)): as explained below, notion (I) commits us to (a), (b), (c); notion (II) commits us to (b) and (c); and notion (III) commits us to (c) and (d). Propositions (a) and (b) will be shown to be, at very least, implausible. Given that it is only the third notion of harm that, when applied to procreative decisions, does not presuppose either (a) or (b), this notion seems more apt for explicating the claim that we can cause harm to a child by bringing about the existence of this child.
All three notions presuppose assumption (c). Claiming that a person harms another person by bringing about this person’s existence presupposes that bringing about someone’s existence is something that happens to this person at the time the person comes into existence.
When used to explicate the claim that we can cause harm to a person by bringing that person into existence, (I) presupposes assumption (a). But attributing a state of well-being to an egg cell before its fertilization by a sperm does not seem to make sense. In this case, however, (I) is inapplicable in the context in question.
(II) presupposes (b). In claiming that, by bringing about a person’s existence, we thereby cause that person to be worse off than he or she would otherwise have been at that time—if , that is, the person had never come into existence—we are relying on the possibility of making an intrapersonal comparison between the values of nonexistence (in the sense of “never existing”) and a person’s life. However, from a person-affecting view such a comparison is difficult if not impossible as David Heyd has pointed out: “the comparison between life and nonexistence is blocked by two considerations: the valuelessness of nonexistence as such and the unattributability of its alleged value to individual subjects. The two considerations are intimately connected: one of the reasons for denying value to nonexistence of people is the very fact that it cannot be attached to people.” (Heyd 1992, 37, 113). While a person can retrospectively prefer not to have been brought into existence, it does not follow that this person would have been better off had she never been brought into existence (but see Roberts 1998, 151, and Meacham 2012, 262, assigning zero-value to never having existed (for discussion see Broome 1999, Parsons 2002, Arrhenius 2003, and Holtug 2004). To be sure, as we noted above, we can attribute to an existing person the state “nonexistence before conception” just as we can attribute the state of “having ceased to exist” to this person. This does not mean, however, that never existing at all is of (dis)value for that person.
In this respect, death seems to be different from never existing at all. Life can be understood as an ongoing project that consists of more particular projects that are defined in part by goals and whose completion requires time (see Nagel 1979, 8–9; for discussion see Scheffler 2013, Lecture 3). If a person’s life is cut short, this can be contrary to this person’s interests. Through death, the person is hindered from bringing his or her projects to fruition. As far as carrying out these projects is concerned, there may not be anyone else in a position to take this person’s place. Saying this does not require us to compare the value of the state of being dead to the value of continuing to exist for the person. Rather the “question is whether had one not died, had one lived longer, one’s survival would have been good for one” (Raz 2001, 85; see McMahan 2002, part 2). On the other hand, the fact that my pursuing certain projects makes my life worth living for me does not mean that it would necessarily have been undesirable for me not to have ever been given the chance to form the idea of any meaningful projects, namely, by having never been brought into existence at all. “Never existing” is of (dis)value for no one.
Harm (III) relies on the idea that we have a general duty to people not to cause them to be worse off than they should be. We can cause—by our actions and omissions—a person to be worse off than that person is entitled to be. This notion of harm relies on, inter alia, our being able to specify a standard of what any person is entitled to (d). In claiming that people should refrain from having children out of regard for the children, when the children can be expected to have a life that falls below the relevant threshold, we rely on our being able to define what it means to be in a state below the relevant threshold and to judge when lives are in that state. If we make these assumptions, we can then use this notion of harm to explicate the claim “by bringing a person into existence we can cause harm to this person” without having to confront the peculiar ethical difficulties discussed in the previous paragraphs. In applying this notion of harm, we compare the values of “having a sufficiently good life” and “having a life that falls below the relevant threshold”. Comparing these values does not present special difficulties either intrapersonally or interpersonally.
Harming a person by bringing about his existence is clearly a special case. When applied to this case, same-person-comparative notions of harm (of which I and II are species) presuppose one or both of (a) and (b), which were found to be dubious, if not mistaken. Now, at the time prospective parents consider whether they should revise their decision to bring about the existence of a child, there is no right bearer of the right not to be brought into existence in a harmed sub-threshold state (or of the so-called right to non-existence). But according to (III) this does not mean that the parents could not act in light of an interest on the part of their would-be child in never existing at all: if the child were to be born, it would have a life below the relevant threshold. The subject of harm is the person when she is brought into existence in a harmed state. That she would not be worse or better off than she otherwise would have been is irrelevant for determining that she is or will be in a harmed sub-threshold state.
In the circumstances in which bringing about the existence of a person causes harm to this person in the sense specified, the right to non-existence is violated when, quite simply, the existence of the person is brought about. The only way, here, in which the prospective parents can avoid violation of the right is by ensuring that the person whose right it would be does not come into existence at all. Thus, the only way in which the prospective parents can respect the right is by excluding the possibility that the right ever becomes actual.
To be sure, the supposed right to non-existence is open to the objection that the person cannot be considered wronged by having been brought into existence when the person is in a harmed sub-threshold state and has a life worth living (for discussion of the objection see Section 2.2 above). Often the reasons reflecting the right to non-existence are not likely to be decisive for our procreational choices or choices between population policies. If we have a choice between bringing into existence a person with a life worth living, but below the threshold, and bringing into existence a person with a life worth living at or above the threshold, the reasons reflecting the right to non-existence speaks against doing the former but not in favor of doing the latter. If we have to choose between two policies, both of which will lead to future sub-threshold lives, there is a host of further questions such as whether the reasons can differ in strength depending on the particular state the person is in (assessed in terms of, e.g., how many of her basic rights she cannot or will not be able to realize) and depending on the number of persons whose rights to non-existence are violated (see Section 3.3 below).
We do not have to think of the right to non-existence as an absolute constraint on either people’s procreational choices or policy choices that affect the composition of a future population. Rather, the right to non-existence is to be taken into account in the comparative consequential evaluation of such options (cf. Sen 1982). The right to non-existence is not likely to be the only right to be taken into account when we choose between population policies. Thus, that a policy will lead to future sub-threshold lives is not by itself likely to make the policy morally prohibited.
Harm (III) does not support the claim that if a possible person were to have a sufficiently good life, but a different person could instead be brought into existence who would have an even better life, there is an obligation to bring into existence the second, rather than the first, child; nor does (III) support the analogous claim on the level of collective decision-making: present generations have no obligation to bring into existence only those whose lives, among possible future persons, would be optimal.
To illustrate this, consider the following example: A woman knows that if she conceives a baby now, because of a particular disease she has, the child will have a particular slight handicap, but will enjoy a life above the relevant threshold of well-being—assuming that any marginally disabling condition will not bring a life below the relevant threshold (but see Harris 1992, 88–89). Fortunately, there is a treatment against this disease that is such that, afterwards, the woman will be able to conceive a perfectly healthy child. The treatment takes three months. There is, thus, no way this particular child can be born without having this handicap. Can the woman be said to owe it to her child to postpone conceiving a child until after she has been treated for the disease? According to the view outlined here, she cannot be said to owe this to her child so that she will not harm the child (Woodward 1986, 815, fn. 12; Woodward 1987, 808–09). She might have good reasons to receive the medical treatment and conceive later, however. These reasons will reflect the interests of her and her partner, as well as the interests of other present and future people (cf. Section 2.2) Such interests could be important enough to give rise to an obligation on the part of the parents. Then we can have obligations not to bring into existence persons whose lives, although still above the decency threshold, are less worth living than the lives of others we could bring into existence in different circumstances, but these obligations are not grounded on considerations of harm to the future children in question—assuming here and in the following discussion that we can meaningfully carry out the relevant calculations and weighings.
To support the claim that parents do owe it to their prospective child to bring into existence the possible child who, among the options available to them, enjoys the highest level of well-being, we will have to rely on a different notion of harm—namely a notion of harm which is based upon the comparison of the state of a person to the counterfactual state of another person who could have been brought into existence instead of him:
(subjunctive-different-person) Having brought about a person’s existence at a time t1, the agent thereby harms someone only if the agent causes this person to be worse off at some later time t2 (see note 12) than another person—whose existence the agent could have brought about instead—would have been at t2 had the agent acted differently.
Prospective parents might bring about more or less people (one child, twins, triplets etc.) depending upon their decisions. Decisions concerning long-term policies are likely to have an impact on the size of the future population (see Section 2). Thus at least when we wish to support an analogous claim at the collective level, we will have to allow for different numbers also:
(subjunctive-different-persons) Having brought about a person’s existence at a time t1, the agent thereby harms someone only if the agent causes this person to be worse off at some later time t2 (see note 12) than other persons—whose existence the agent could have brought about instead—would have been at t2 (on average or individually in absolute terms) had the agent acted differently.
If we follow the subjunctive-different-person(s) notion of harm, a person whose quality of life is above the relevant threshold of well-being will be considered harmed if there is a possible state of affairs in which this person would not have existed but another person or other persons would have existed and the latter person or persons would have realized an even higher quality of life (on average or individually in absolute terms). But according to the person-affecting approach and from the perspective of the allegedly harmed person, the comparison of the life of this person and the counterfactual state of affairs in which this person could never have existed but another person or other persons would exist does not make sense. We cannot attribute the alleged value of non-existence to individual subjects.
In summary: It is at the very least difficult (if not impossible) to understand why a person should be considered harmed if the person can be considered harmed according to neither the subjunctive-historical (II) nor the diachronic (I) nor the threshold (III) notions of harm. This is not to say that we cannot have person-affecting reasons to prefer a future of people who have lives far above the relevant threshold of well-being to a future of people whose lives are less good but sufficiently good, points to which we shall return (see Section 4.5 below). We next turn to the question how we should understand the notions of harm (I-III) as distinguished in light of the so-called ‘No-Difference View’.
Derek Parfit has introduced the ‘No-Difference View’: It makes no (practical or theoretical) difference to how we should act, all things considered, whether the size and composition of future generations depend upon our present decision. To what extent we can defend that view will depend on how we understand the relation between the notions of harm as distinguished in Section 3.1: Here we will delineate two views of how to understand these notions of harm and investigate the question of the extent to which these two alternative views support Parfit’s ‘No-Difference View’. According to our first view, one must choose between the “single threshold” and the “single subjunctive-historical” notion of harm: to claim that rights-considerations can guide us in choosing among long-term policies we will have to adopt one of these notions of harm as specifying necessary conditions of harm; in doing so, we have to deny that the other notion specifies necessary (or sufficient) conditions of harm. According to the second view, the threshold notion of harm and the subjunctive-historical notion can be combined.
According to this “disjunctive notion” the necessary condition for harming is the disjunction of the conditions for harming as set out by the notions of harm at (II) and (III). The proposal is this: instead of interpreting accounts of harm at (II) and (III) as providing alternative necessary conditions for harming, we can take these two notions to provide the disjuncts for a necessary condition for harming. This disjunctive notion of harm substitutes yet a fourth necessary condition of what it means to harm someone:
(IV) (disjunctive) An action (or inaction) at time t1 harms someone only if either (as in III) the agent thereby causes (allows) this person to be in a sub-threshold state, and, if the agent cannot avoid causing harm in this sense, does not minimize the harm; or (as in II) the agent causes this person to be worse off at some later time t2 than the person would have been at t2 had the agent not interacted with this person at all.
We clearly ought to prefer the disjunctive notion to the single subjunctive-historical view according to which the subjunctive-historical notion of harm specifies necessary conditions of harm (and the threshold notion at (III) specifies neither necessary nor sufficient conditions). The disjunctive notion is compatible with the thesis of this entry that relies upon our employing a threshold notion of harm where the subjunctive-historical and the diachronic notions do not apply. Some authors also argue that being worse off than the same person was or would have been is not a necessary condition for harm where the identity of the person is independent of the harming action (Hanser 1990; Shiffrin 1999; Harman 2004, 98–101; Woollard 2012, 681–683; but see Roberts 2009, 19–20). Ought we to prefer the disjunctive notion to the single threshold notion according to which the threshold condition is a necessary condition of harm? The advantage of the disjunctive notion is that this view of harm allows us to rely on the subjunctive-historical notion of harm whenever it is applicable, that is, when we will harm an existing person. In these cases the notion of harm at (II) provides us with what most consider a straightforward account of the harm caused.
Consider the type of case where we can act in a way that diminishes the well-being of a person who lives above any plausibly construed threshold. However, we will diminish the person’s well-being to a level still clearly above the threshold. For example, someone breaks into the garage of a mansion and steals the new convertible while the wealthy owner is at his penthouse in the city. This theft is not likely to cause the wealthy person’s well-being to fall below any plausibly construed threshold of harm, and thus according to (III) does not harm him. This seems implausible. Such a case is normally understood as a case in which the affected person is clearly harmed. More generally, the objection is that the threshold conception is under-inclusive in interpreting which acts we consider harmful.
The single threshold view by itself does not provide us with a response to this objection. For a plausible substantive specification of a threshold notion (see Section 4.3 below) will not include a concern for the well-being of those above the threshold. Thus, in responding to the objection we would have to add an additional obligation. E.g., we could appeal to the additional obligation of minimizing harm to other persons: The obligation requires that we not cause another person to fall to a lower level of well-being quite independently of the level of well-being the person already realizes. What counts as a lower level of well-being can be measured by the specified threshold.
On the other hand, the disjunctive notion allows us to rely on the notion of harm at (II). This provides us with a straightforward account of the harm caused. Thus, the disjunctive notion is not open to the objection as stated. However, while the single threshold view can be shown to be fully compatible with Parfit’s No-Difference View, the disjunctive notion of harm raises difficult questions of interpretation of its own.
Parfit illustrates the No-Difference View by considering two medical programs (Parfit 1984, 367). In each case a certain rare condition can be passed from mother to child. One involves pregnancy testing. If the test comes out positive, fetuses are treated for the rare condition. The other involves preconception testing. The women who test positive as carriers of the rare condition are told to postpone conception for at least two months and to undergo (harmless) treatment after which the condition will have disappeared. Available funds can be spent on one or the other program, and the other must be cancelled. Assuming that both programs have equivalent effects on parents, that the conditions lead to the same particular handicap in children, and that the two programs will achieve a similar success rate, the programs differ only in affecting actual people (pregnancy testing) or possible people (preconception testing). The (practical) no-difference view says: our reason to prevent harm to possible future people (those who might be conceived) is as strong as our reason to prevent harm to actual people (those already conceived who will develop from the already existing fetuses in due course). The two medical programs in Parfit’s example are equally worthy and it makes no moral difference which is cancelled.
Is the disjunctive notion of harm compatible with the no-difference view, thus understood? Here we cannot discuss the implications of the disjunctive notion in any detail. We might first observe that both the subjunctive-historical and threshold notions of harm can be employed to interpret many core cases of harm. That is to say, both sets of conditions as specified by the two notions of harm will arguably be satisfied in many cases where most people agree that harm was caused—at least under plausible construals of both notions of harm. Second, in the cases in which not all sets of conditions obtain, we still find that harm was caused, namely, as long as at least one set of conditions obtains. If the threshold notion of harm applies, we find that harm was caused. The disjunctive notion entails that canceling either test causes harm.
However, the disjunctive notion does not entail that it makes no practical difference which test we cancel. A plausible interpretation of the disjunctive notion might be the following: satisfying either set of the conditions provides a reason for objecting to the proposed action; if both sets of conditions obtain, the objection is presumably stronger than when only one set of conditions obtains. According to this understanding of the disjunctive notion and assuming that in Parfit’s example of the two medical programs the children, if either they or their mothers are not treated, will suffer a severe handicap, the objection to canceling pregnancy testing is stronger than the objection to canceling the preconception testing program. Because the handicap is severe, the children will fall below the threshold and the threshold notion of harm provides the same reason for objecting to canceling either program. But if pregnancy testing is cancelled this will be worse for the children who are not treated—the subjunctive-historical notion of harm applies. The subjunctive-historical notion of harm does not, however, provide a reason for objecting to cancellation of preconception testing. The children who will be born handicapped would never have existed if there had been testing prior to conception. This understanding of the disjunctive notion may not, then, be compatible with the no-difference view. An alternative understanding would deny that where both notions of harm are applicable this strengthens the objection to the harmful act. Whether this strengthens the objection and, if so, how much more is a matter of future research(see Woollard 2012, 684–689).
The single threshold interpretation of harm is also compatible with a second and stronger understanding of the no-difference view: there is no theoretical difference in harming possible future people and harming actual people since the very same reasons hold against harming either group. The disjunctive notion is clearly incompatible with the theoretical understanding of the no-difference view. According to the disjunctive notion it would often not be true that the same reasons hold against harming either such group. When we object to the harming of actual people we will often have additional reasons that reflect the fact that the subjunctive-historical notion of harm applies.
The above mentioned considerations seem to suggest a specification of the relevant threshold as a sufficientarian standard defined in terms of absolute, noncomparative conditions (Shiffrin 1999, 123–24; McMahan 1998, 223–29; Page 2006, esp. 90–95, 170–173; Meyer and Roser 2009, 226–243; Huseby 2012). One could hold a unitary view of the threshold according to which one and the same threshold would be applicable to all decisions. Even if we held that the same list of rights were attributable to all people (wherever and whenever they live), for example, those which are meant to protect basic capabilities of human beings, what these rights amount to will reflect contemporary social, economic, and cultural conditions (see, e.g., Sen 1984; Nussbaum 2000, 132–33; Page 2006, 71–75).
Specifying the standard by attributing equal minimal rights to people is only one possible interpretation of the threshold. We might, instead, want to define the threshold on the basis of egalitarian reasons. On the basis of these reasons we will object to inequalities, for egalitarian reasons make it possible for us to understand relative differences between the states of persons as something “which is itself to be eliminated or reduced” (Scanlon 2005, 6). Egalitarian considerations that address relative differences between people can help specify the standard in at least two ways. We might hold that the standing of people relative to their contemporaries is (extrinsically or intrinsically) important and that the threshold notion of harm ought to reflect, say, the average level of well-being that people realize—or that future people will realize: the higher the average level of well-being, the higher the threshold level of harm should be set. According to one interpretation of such an egalitarian reading, presently existing people harm future people by causing them to realize a (much) lower level of well-being than their own contemporaries (Sher 1979, 389). In addition or alternatively, we might hold that the threshold level ought to reflect, say, the average level of well-being of the present generations upon whose decisions the existence, identity, and well-being of future people depend. According to such an interpretation presently existing people harm future people by causing them to realize a (much) lower level of well-being than they enjoy themselves (see, for example, Barry 1999). Still, even if egalitarian considerations that reflect a concern with the relative differences between people can contribute to the specification of the threshold, a plausible threshold is not going to be based on that concern, but will primarily reflect a concern with the absolute level of well-being of persons. Otherwise—this is an implication of the first interpretation—any level of well-being would be considered justified as long as all future people fare equally badly. This presupposes attributing intrinsic value exclusively to equality—an implausible view. Moreover, to define the threshold standard of well-being of future people as the level of well-being achieved by currently living people (whatever it may be) is less than plausible, unless we were to attribute intrinsic value exclusively to intergenerational equality, so understood (see Marmor 2003, Steiner 2003, Raz 2003, Gosepath 2004, 454–63; and Holtug and Lippert-Rasmussen 2007). This view would deny that currently living people may stand under a duty of justice positively to save for future people so that they will achieve a sufficientarian level of well-being.
According to the priority view (Parfit 1997, 213), equality as such does not matter. It is therefore not open to objections against holding equality to be of intrinsic value. A plausible version of the priority view reads as follows:
Priority view: Benefiting persons matters more the worse off the person is to whom the benefits accrue, the more people are being benefited and the greater the benefits in question.
The priority view has a built-in tendency towards equality, for the view accepts the following egalitarian condition: If X is worse off than Y, we have at least a prima facie reason for promoting the well-being of X rather than Y (unless conditions obtain under which the only or best way of raising the well-being of X is by raising the well-being of Y or conditions under which promoting the well-being of X brings about raising the well-being of Y as a side-effect). Even if prioritarians do not see anything intrinsically bad in social, economic or other differences, their priority view is a derivatively egalitarian view. To this extent it is correctly described as non-relational egalitarianism.
We might want to rely on, say, a prioritarian version of utilitarianism for specifying the threshold of harm. On this interpretation, future people are in a harmed state unless they are as well off as such a prioritarian view requires. However, such a prioritarian view for specifying the threshold of harm has most implausible implications even if it is coupled with the person-affecting approach. First, such a view is likely to define just one optimal outcome for people’s actions; people’s failing to bring about this outcome would then have to count as harming others. Thus most people’s actions will count as harming others. Second, it implies a version of Derek Parfit’s so-called ‘repugnant conclusion (see Parfit 1984, part iv, and ch. 17; see also Ryberg and Tännsjö 2004 and the entry on the repugnant conclusion). Given, first, the large number of future people whose level of well-being can be affected by the decisions and actions of currently living people, and second, that the number of future people depends in part upon currently living people’s decisions and actions, the priority view might make unreasonable demands on the currently living. How likely this is will also depend upon the strength we give to the priority of the worse off who are (very) badly off. According to such a prioritarian view, in assessing alternative options we will have to weigh the claims to improvements as well as take into account both the size of the benefit and the number of beneficiaries; if the number of future people is sufficiently large, we would then have to choose the option that improves their well-being even if both their claims to improvements in well-being are weak and the benefits they receive are small. If the number of future people is sufficiently large, currently living people could well stand under an obligation to improve their well-being even if in fulfilling this obligation they lose a great deal of their own well-being and the improvements in well-being of future people are small or even trivial (see Meyer and Roser 2009, 233–235). Of course, the priority view will not have this implication if all future people were to enjoy levels of well-being that are higher than those of all or most currently living people.
It thus seems plausible to reject the idea that the priority view as such specifies the relevant threshold of intergenerational harm. Instead, the priority view can rather be understood to specify what we optimally ought to do as a matter of morality. However, (future) people might be thought not to be harmed if currently living people do less than that. It might be permissible to bring about a less than optimal outcome. The less than optimal outcome could not be said to be harmful to future people. However, such a view depends upon our being able to specify the relevant threshold of intergenerational harm in a different way. For this purpose, we now turn to sufficientarian interpretations of the threshold.
A sufficientarian conception of justice also holds that equality as such does not matter (Frankfurt 1987). And sufficientarianism also has a built-in tendency to equality. However, the tendency is restricted in the following way: To benefit person X is more important than to benefit person Y, if X is below the threshold and if Y is better off than X. On a low level of well-being, equality is of derivative value. In other words, concerning the improvement of the position of the less well off, sufficientarianism holds both a negative and a positive thesis: Below the threshold the priority view is valid (this being the positive thesis), above the threshold the improvement of the position of the less well off is of no particular concern (this being the negative thesis) (see Benbaji 2005; Brown 2005; Casal 2007, 297–298; for critical discussion of this characterization see esp. Casal 2007 and Shields 2012).
We can distinguish between weak and strong interpretations of sufficientarianism (see Crisp 2003; Benbaji 2006). According to weak sufficientarianism the priority to be given to people below the threshold decreases to zero at the threshold. However, as the priority view, the position of weak sufficientarianism can also make unreasonable demands on the currently living (unless all future people were to enjoy levels of well-being that are higher than those of all or most currently living people). For, even if we attribute particular weight to improving the well-being of people below the threshold, we might be able to do more good (in total) by benefiting many more people who are well off already—that is, if, as seems plausible, we give some weight to the well-being of people above the threshold.
The position of strong sufficientarianism, however, differs from weak sufficientarianism in how it interprets the priority of persons below the threshold. Strong sufficientarianism attributes a significant priority to those whose well-being is just below the threshold (while according to weak sufficientarianism this priority decreases to zero at the threshold). Versions of sufficientarianism are stronger the greater the priority they attribute to those just below the threshold. With an absolute or lexical priority threshold strong sufficientarianism also rejects the view that it always matters more—either below or above the threshold—to benefit persons the more people are being benefited and the greater the benefits in question. This precludes the implication of unreasonable demands on currently living people as discussed (though the demands might be impossible to meet). Accordingly a plausible version of strong sufficientarianism can be characterized as follows:
Strong sufficientarianism: First, to the group of persons whose improvement in well-being has absolute or lexical priority belong those whose level of well-being is below the threshold; to benefit persons below the threshold matters more the worse off they are. Second, and in addition, while within the group of both those below and those above the threshold, it matters more to benefit persons the more people are being benefited and the greater the benefit in question, trade-offs between persons above and below the threshold are precluded.
Richard Arneson and others (Arneson 1999, 2000; Roemer 2004; and see Casal 2007, esp. 312–314, 315–318) have objected to thresholds, and especially those that designate an absolute priority—as is characteristic of the position of strong sufficientarianism—on the grounds that we cannot avoid an arbitrary specification of such priority thresholds (but see Crisp 2003, 757–758; Benbaji 2006, 324–326) and, further, that such thresholds are incompatible with our distributive convictions’ being continuous (that is, that they all can be accounted for by means of one principle of distribution) (but see Crisp 2003, 753–757; Benbaji 2006, 332–344; Page 2007, 16–18; Dorsey 2008; Huseby 2010, 180–182; Freiman 2012, 30–33; Shields 2012, 111–115; and on both objections see Sher 2014, chs. 8 and 9). For the purposes of the present discussion we will assume that one could justify a priority threshold as specified by strong sufficientarianism. If so, the objections to specifying the threshold in terms of the prioritarian conception and the conception relying on the notion that equality is of intrinsic value present a particular reason for holding that the specification of the threshold ought to be informed by a sufficientarian understanding of justice, at least for intergenerational relations.
In defining the relevant threshold of harm we may also rely on considerations that reflect the significance of relative differences among future people or people who belong to different generations including the currently living. Considerations characteristic of the priority view may also be considered relevant for the specification of the threshold of harm. It is implausible, however, to hold the view that we might define the relevant standard as reflecting reasons solely based on egalitarian or prioritarian weighting of claims to improvements of well-being. Defining a threshold of well-being according to which both currently and future living people are able to reach a sufficientarian threshold allows us to avoid the implausible implications of the egalitarian and prioritarian alternatives when we understand the latter to define thresholds of harm: First, avoiding or reducing differences must not lead to a state of affairs in which people are worse off than they ought to be. Secondly, claims against currently living people are unreasonable if in fulfilling them the currently living people will bring about minimal or even trivial improvements of the well-being of future people but suffer losses themselves, causing them to fall below a plausible threshold level of well-being.
This is not to say that it is impermissible for people to choose to procreate when securing a threshold level of well-being for their children-to-be will require them to sacrifice their own well-being to such a degree that they themselves will not enjoy a threshold level of well-being. Rather, in decision-making contexts where currently living people relate to future people who will exist (and in high numbers) whatever they will decide to do, currently living people do not harm future people when they secure a threshold level of well-being for them even if they could further improve the well-being of future people. And: in such decision-making contexts currently living people cannot be said to stand under an obligation to sacrifice their own well-being so that they will fall below the threshold standard of well-being for the sake of securing a well-being for future people over and above the standard.
If these objections against an egalitarian and prioritarian specification of the threshold of harm are valid, we have particular reasons for interpreting intergenerational justice according to a sufficientarian threshold. At the same time, the reasons for a sufficientarian understanding of intergenerational justice are not equally relevant for the relations among contemporaries—never mind whether we think of these contemporaries simply as people wherever they may live, or as members of a well-ordered liberal society, or as found in different basic political units. For the reasons reflect particular features of intergenerational relations: The non-identity-problem simply does not arise in relations among contemporaries. The problem does not arise among institutionalized transgenerational legal entities such as Rawls’s peoples or states understood as subjects of public international law, either. Also, the objections to both the prioritarian conception and the conception relying on the notion that equality is of intrinsic value reflect, in part, particular features of intergenerational relations: The repugnant conclusion as an implication of the priority view presupposes that both the number and the identity of future people are contingent upon the decisions of currently living people; a large number of future people leads to unreasonable demands on currently living people—this as an implication of the priority view, too. Moreover, we can demand of currently living people that they positively save for future people only in the context of intergenerational relations. Thus, the specific reasons for a sufficientarian understanding of intergenerational justice are at least in part specific reasons and are not relevant for understanding either global justice or the notion of justice that holds among contemporary members of well-ordered societies.
John Rawls was the first to develop a systematic account of obligations to future people as a central element of a theory of justice (Rawls 1971, 1999, especially section 44; Rawls 1993, 274; Rawls 2001, especially sections 49.2 and 3). Rawls proposes a principle of “just savings”. Long before Rawls, Frank Ramsey developed a model for determining the optimal savings within a utilitarian framework (Ramsey 1928; see also the entry on Ramsey and Intergenerational Welfare Economics) disregarding distributional considerations. Following Sidgwick (1907, 414), Ramsey (1928, 261) as well as Rawls (1971, 263) and Parfit (1984, appendix F) reject what is called “pure time discounting”, that is, giving less weight to the well-being or legitimate claims of future people just because they live in the future. A long-standing issue in economics is how loans and taxes for financing public policies compare in terms of the burdens imposed on future generations (see e.g., Pigou 1920, ch. ix, Viner 1920, Mishan 1963). Provisions to protect the welfare interests of future generations have been in place since ancient times (Auerbach 1995, 27–35; Wissowa 1937, vol. xi, 2011, 2014, 2021).
Rawls never discusses the non-identity-problem and for most of his discussions he assumes that the number of future people is constant. However, his principle of just savings can be understood to provide us with a particularly sensible (and, certainly, the most prominent) substantive understanding of intergenerational sufficientarianism. It can be understood as an interpretation of a threshold notion of harm in different number choices (see also Reiman 2007; Attas 2009).
Rawls specifies the sufficientarian threshold relevant for defining currently living people’s obligations of justice vis-à-vis future people: “the conditions needed to establish and to preserve a just basic structure over time” (Rawls 2001, 159; on the basic structure as the subject of the application of a sufficientarian principle see also Freiman 2012, 33–37). Rawls distinguishes two stages of societal development for the application of his principle of just savings. Currently living people have a justice-based reason to save for future people only if such saving is necessary for allowing future people to reach the sufficientarian threshold as specified. This is known as the accumulation stage. Once just institutions are securely established—this is known as the steady-state stage—justice does not require people to save for future people. Rather they should do what is necessary to allow future people to continue to live under just institutions. Rawls also holds that, in that second stage, people ought to leave their descendants at least the equivalent of what they received from the previous generation (see Gosseries 2001 for a comparative assessment of Rawls’s substantive principle). This additional claim can be supported by the idea of a presumption in favor of equality (see Sidgwick 1907, 379–80, and the entry on equality) and by the considerations delineated in the next section (Section 4.5).
As is characteristic of Rawls’s work, he presents the just savings principle as the outcome of a decision reached in the contractualist (hypothetical and non-historical) decision-situation of the original position. Who are the persons in the original position? Rawls considers an original position in which every generation is represented. However, as the relations between the contractors so conceived are not characterized by the “circumstances of justice” (Rawls 1971, paragraph 22), the question of justice as Rawls understands it does not arise: We cannot cooperate with previous generations and, while previous generations can benefit or harm us, we cannot benefit or harm them (see Section 1). Instead Rawls therefore adjusts the (present-time of entry) interpretation of the original position for the intergenerational context (Rawls 1993, 274; Rawls 2001, paragraph 25.2). The contractors know that they belong to one generation, but the veil of ignorance blinds them to which particular generation they belong (see Gardiner 2009, esp. 97–116, and Heyd 2009a, esp. 170–176, for a comparative analysis of contract theories can be extended to the subject matter of intergenerational relations). From the position of the original position the contractors determine a just savings rate.
While the circumstances of justice clearly hold among contemporaries, the contractors cannot know whether previous generations have saved for them. Why then should they agree to save for future generations? In A Theory of Justice, Rawls stipulates “a motivational assumption” according to which the contractors care for their descendants so that they will want to agree to save for their successors—irrespective of whether previous generations saved for them. In Political Liberalism, Rawls withdraws this motivational assumption. He now understands previous generations’ non-compliance with a just savings principle as a problem of non-ideal theory. The original position, however, belongs to ideal theory: strict compliance with whatever principles are agreed on is assumed (Rawls 1971, 144–45). Rawls introduces problems of partial and non-compliance only at the level of non-ideal theory (Rawls 1971, ch. iv). In accordance with this understanding of ideal theory, Rawls assumes that the generations are mutually disinterested. He takes the contractors to agree to a savings principle “subject to the further condition that they must want all previous generations to have followed it.” Rawls continues: “Thus the correct principle is that which the members of any generation (and so all generations) would adopt as the one their generation is to follow and as the principle they would want preceding generations to have followed (and later generations to follow), no matter how far back (or forward) in time” (Rawls 1993, 274; Rawls 2001, 160). The principle of just savings thus agreed on is thought to be binding for all previous and future generations.
So far this entry has argued for interpreting intergenerational justice in terms of a conception for which a sufficientarian threshold is of central significance. The argument is, in part, a response to the non-identity-problem. A sufficientarian interpretation of the threshold notion of harm (together with an appropriate conception of wrongdoing) provides us with a plausible understanding of what is owed to future people: the fact that future persons’ existence is contingent on our present decisions does not matter where what is in question is our ability to harm future people’s interests and to violate their rights. By employing a non-comparative notion of harm one can justify the present generation’s duties not to violate the rights of future generations against being harmed. Accordingly, rights-based considerations may not bear merely upon “same people choices”, but will bear also upon both types of “different people choices” that Parfit distinguishes, namely “same number choices” (in which the same number of future people live, irrespective of present choices) and “different number choices” (in which a different number of future people will live depending on which choices we now make) (Parfit 1984, 355–56). Thus, intergenerational sufficientarianism allows us to specify the considerations of justice relevant for decisions concerning population policies: Future people have rights vis-à-vis us that reflect considerations of justice as specified by intergenerational sufficientarianism. Our correlative duties set a normative framework for most of our decisions concerning future people, including those that have an impact on their number and identity.
However, such a framework does not provide a complete moral theory of intergenerational relations and especially not in the context of decisions on the existence, number, and identity of future people. There are concerns for future people shared by many of us that cannot be accounted for by rights-based considerations (Jonas 1979; Heyd 1994 and 2009a; De-Shalit 1995, ch. 1; Meyer 1997; Thompson 2009; Sanklecha 2013, parts 3 and 4; Scheffler 2013, 60–63, 72–73,80–81). First, many of us believe that that it is important that there be future people at all. However, a person-affecting intergenerational sufficientarianism will account for the asymmetry of our procreational duties (see Section 2.2): On the one hand, prospective parents should refrain from procreation out of regard for the child(ren) they would have if the life of their child(ren) would fall below the relevant sufficientarian threshold. On the other hand, people have no obligation to procreate out of regard for the interests of possible future children. Possible people have no right to be brought into existence (and we do not have the correlative obligation to procreate). Second, many of us believe that future people should have a life that is well above the level of well-being specified by a threshold notion of harm. This, in part, reflects a third concern many have: Future people should be able to share (at least certain aspects of) the particular way of life of currently living people. But, presumably, currently living people do not violate the rights of future people by failing to sustain their way of life for them. Thus, we cannot prefer a future with people all of whom have lives far above the level of a sufficiency threshold to a future with no people on the basis of considerations of rights of future people.
This insufficiency of rights considerations in guiding our choices concerning future people is not restricted to our choices of population policies. It will be apparent whenever we are choosing between securing sufficiently good conditions of life for actual future people and securing conditions under which actual future people will be able to live lives above the level of the sufficientarian threshold. For example, assuming that future people have certain welfare rights against us, there are considerations based on the rights of future people that prohibit us from choosing a policy of depletion. However, such considerations might well be insufficient in guiding us in choosing among alternative conservation policies that have different consequences with respect to the quality of life future people can be expected to enjoy.
Clearly, considerations based on the rights of future people cannot or cannot fully account for all the concerns we might have for future people. What considerations besides rights-based considerations can guide us in our relations to future people? It has been suggested that the widely shared concerns about the continuation of human life on earth at a high level of well-being can, at least in part, be accounted for by an obligation toward future people that have no correlatives in future people’s rights vis-à-vis current people. This obligation reflects those widely shared concerns about future people which cannot be accounted for by rights-based considerations. The obligation can be described along the following lines (Baier 1981; Meyer 2005, chs. 4 and 5; Thompson 2009): those currently alive owe respect to highly valuable goods that their predecessors bequeathed to them as well as to more remote future people, and they also owe respect to the highly valuable future-oriented projects of their contemporaries. Owing such respect gives rise to a general obligation, namely that current people should not willfully destroy the inherited goods and the conditions that are constitutive of persons’ pursuit of future-oriented projects. In other words, such respect gives rise to a general obligation that one not willfully destroy the social practices on which the possibility of people pursuing future-oriented projects depends. While future people belong to the beneficiaries, the obligation is owed to both present and past people (see also Section 5).
Intergenerational justice concerns the relations between generations. So far we have mainly addressed the relations between currently living and future people. This section discusses the three issues that have been central to the philosophical investigation of the relations between past people and currently living people and to understanding the significance of what happened in the past (and, in particular, of past wrongs) for currently living (and future) people’s justice claims: First, how can currently living people be understood to be negatively affected by historical injustices? Second, can the ongoing effect of past wrongs become legitimate when circumstances change? And, thirdly, we need to address the question of the moral status of deceased persons and dead victims of injustice in particular.
With respect to harm-doing suffered by victims in the past at the hands of perpetrators in the past the non-identity-problem gives rise to the following general question: how can individuals today have a just claim to compensation owing to what was done to others in the past when the (potential) claimants may not exist today had past people not suffered these harms (Morris 1984; Kumar and Silver 2004; Kershnar 2004, 70–75; Meyer 2004b and 2013)? The non-identity problem arises with respect to several specific understandings of how to justify claims to historic compensation. Here we discuss currently living people’s just claims to historic compensation based on a causal link between the past injustices and the harm suffered by them today. The causal link may be constituted in at least two ways: the harm suffered by victims in the past at the hands of perpetrators in the past causes additional harm for currently living people; or the harming activities of the past perpetrators harmed currently living people along with victims in the past. In Sections 5.3–4 we investigate the question whether compensation can be owed to past victims. Giving benefits to currently living descendants may be thought to be appropriate compensation for the harms victims in the past suffered at the hands of perpetrators in the past.
For example, do African Americans, whose ancestors were subjected to the terrible injustices of being kidnapped in Africa and subsequently enslaved, have a just claim to compensation? Let us set aside a host of specifically legal questions concerning, for example, the statute of limitations and liability. Let us also assume that it is sometimes possible to identify with certainty direct descendants of slaves. Consider the case of Robert, who has been identified as one such person (see Fishkin 1991, 91–93). People can claim compensation for harms they suffered. As a descendant of slaves, has Robert been harmed owing to the injustices suffered by his ancestors? First, consider briefly the subjunctive-historical notion of harm at (II) (see Section 3.1). According to this interpretation of harm, a person can be understood to be fully compensated for an act or policy (or event) when she is as well off as she would have been had the act not been carried out. According to this interpretation of harm, it is not the case that Robert has been harmed by his ancestors’ having been kidnapped and enslaved. If his ancestors had not been kidnapped and enslaved, Robert would not exist today. His existence depends on the fact that the genealogical chain was not broken at any point. Hence, the initial kidnapping in Africa, the transport to America, and the slavery of his ancestors are necessary conditions for Robert’s having come into existence at all. He would not have been better off had his ancestors not been badly wronged. Thus, we cannot rely upon this interpretation of harm and its accompanying interpretations of compensation in claiming that Robert has been harmed and should be compensated; the required state of affairs under this interpretation implies the nonexistence of the claimant to compensation.
To this claim we can respond in a number of ways. As suggested by our discussion in secs. 3 and 4 we can allow for an identity-independent notion of harm in addition to the common identity-dependent notion of harm. Consider the threshold notion of harm at (III). Under this interpretation of harm, a person can be understood to be fully compensated for an act or policy (or event) if that person does not fall below the specified standard. According to this interpretation, Robert can be harmed because his ancestors were kidnapped and enslaved. Whether Robert has been harmed due to the way his ancestors were treated depends upon whether the way they were treated has led to Robert’s falling below the specified standard of well-being. That this is true in the case of Robert, however, will turn on a causal link between the past injustices and his current state of well-being. Employing this interpretation of harm and its accompanying interpretation of compensation requires a forward-looking assessment of what others ought to do today in terms of providing compensation for past injustice. When we analyze historical claims on the basis of such a threshold notion of harm, the current normative relevance of past wrongs will depend upon their causal relevance for the well-being of currently living (and future) generations. Fulfilling our duties to both the latter might well require compensation for the consequences that stem from the fact that their predecessors have been badly wronged. That their predecessors were wronged, however, does not in itself give rise to just claims of compensation on the part of their descendants today. Thus in accordance with the disjunctive notion of harm (IV) as discussed above (Section 4), present generations can have obligations to compensate those who currently suffer harms resulting from the lasting impact of injustices experienced by their predecessors, even if the reasons for providing them with compensation are different from (and possibly less weighty than (see Section 4.2)) the reasons for compensating people whose identities are not dependent on (or changed by) the harmful acts.
However, the non-identity-problem is of little practical significance for assessing the validity of rights to compensation or restitution owing to more recent past injustices. First, the non-identity-problem does not arise with respect to surviving victims of wrongs. The harm done to surviving victims can be understood in accordance with the common understanding of harm: the past wrongdoing caused these people to be worse off than they would have been in the absence of that act or policy. These individuals would be fully compensated for the harm done to them where it the case that as a result of compensation undertaken they are as well off as they would be if the policy had not been carried out.
Second, consider the case of people having been wrongfully expelled from their homeland and not having received compensation for the wrongs inflicted upon them. For their descendants it might well be true that they would not exist had their parents and (great-) grandparents not been expelled. However, the descendants can be said to be victims of the additional wrong that their parents did not receive compensation for the wrongs inflicted upon them. The individual descendants can be said to have been harmed from conception or birth because of the lack of sufficient compensation to their parents (Sher 2005; and see Butt 2006, Cohen 2008, and Herstein 2008). Again, the harm done to them can be understood in accordance with the common understanding of harm: If those entities which stand under the obligation to provide compensation to the first generation of displaced persons do not (entirely) fulfill their obligations, they thereby harm the descendants of the first generation of displaced people by making those descendants worse off than they would otherwise be—i.e., if (sufficient) compensation had been provided by the first generation. This line of argument can be extended to the second, third, fourth etc. generation: generation X of displaced people would be fully compensated for the harm done to them were it the case that as a result of compensation undertaken the people of generation X are as well off as the people of this generation would be if the first generation of displaced people had received the compensation they were entitled to. While it is clear that thus understood the later generations’ claims to compensation do not have to contend with the non-identity problem (Sher 2005), what is owed to them will depend on how best to understand the counterfactual relevant to determine the amount of compensation owed. Here we do not discuss the intricate problem of how best to understand the relevant counterfactual (cf. Sher 1979, 1981).
However, most agree that the legitimacy of people’s claims to compensation can depend upon their actions (and inactions) and the impact these have on their well-being. For these actions (and inactions) can normatively be attributed to people only insofar as they make the decision to act (or not act). Then the strength of later generations’ claim to compensation—owing to the failure of providing sufficient compensation to the first generation that suffered the initial harm—may wane over time. The more the descendants’ well-being can be attributed to actions or inactions for which they themselves or members of the intermediate generations are responsible, the less the hypothetical state of affairs that would obtain had the direct victims received adequate compensation is relevant for the determination of the claims of the indirect victims (Sher 1981). However, historical injustices may well have resulted in ongoing systemically unequal distributions of life chances due to the inheritance of the benefits stemming from historical injustices on the side of the descendants of the perpetrators (see Butt 2013).
We will have to assess the practical significance of these claims for each case. For the claims to compensation of the first couple of generations of descendants for the direct victims the insight is likely to be of little practical significance. The harm done to their ancestors is not ancient. Thus, the descendants’ claim to compensation—based on the harm inflicted on them due to the failure of providing adequate compensation for the initial harm—is likely to be strong.
We now turn to a second source of doubts about the validity of historical claims to reparations. Injustices committed against people in the past may not give rise to claims to reparations today if such claims can be understood to presuppose an indefensible interpretation of property entitlements. Jeremy Waldron (Waldron, 1992a; Waldron 1992b, 27; Waldron 2002; Waldron 2003; Waldron 2004a; Waldron 2004b, 37; Waldron 2006a; Waldron 2006b; Waldron 2007; Quist and Veraart 2009; see also Lyons 1977) argues that the view that once we acquire entitlements they continue until we transfer or relinquish them is indefensible since there are reasons of principle for holding that entitlements and rights are sensitive to the passage of time and changes of circumstances. According to Waldron, entitlement to land is based upon the idea that such entitlement can be an integral part of people’s life plans and projects as individuals and as members of groups. Entitlements to land can be important for people being able to autonomously realize particular goods of their way of life. When circumstances change the entitlement might no longer be important in that sense or decrease in its normative significance. For example, the entitlement of original owners might weaken over time if they are separated from the land. Having been separated from the land, entitlement to the land might no longer be important for the original owners autonomously realizing their way of life. Thus, generally speaking, entitlements are sensitive to background circumstances and they are vulnerable to prescription. As Waldron argues, property entitlement is a set of claim rights, liberty rights and powers that are “circumstantially sensitive”.
Further, if legitimate entitlement is sensitive to background changes, it is possible that the ongoing effect of an illegitimate acquisition and, more generally, of unjust violations of rights of others can become legitimate when circumstances change. This is Waldron’s principal argument for the thesis that historical injustices may be superseded. He gives an example in which the violation by one group of the legitimate rights of another group to a given waterhole is superseded by ecological catastrophe such that the interlopers acquire a right to share what they had wrongly begun to use. In these circumstances, “they are entitled to share that water hole. Their use of [the waterhole] no longer counts as an injustice; it is now in fact part of what justice now requires. The initial injustice by [the first group] against [the second] has been superseded by circumstances” (Waldron 2004a, 67). Hence justice may require that original owners of land share their land with others and they may be required to share even with those who unjustly appropriated the land.
However, even if supersession of injustice is possible, the claim that it has occurred in any given situation “depends on which circumstances are taken to be morally significant and how as a matter of fact circumstances have changed” (Waldron 2004a, 67). The argument for the possibility of supersession rests on a hypothetical case of ecological disaster such that the need of others to make use of the resources was both extreme and brought about by circumstances beyond their control.
One might doubt that these conditions are fully met even in cases of so-called ancient historical injustice (Patton 2004, 167–71). With respect to more recent injustices the conditions for their supersession will often not be met (see Lyons 2004a, 296; Meyer 2007, 301–305).
Waldron put forward the supersession thesis with respect to indigenous peoples in the U.S., Canada, Australia, and New Zealand, and others have discussed the idea in this context (Patton, 2005; Sanderson, 2011; Spinner-Halev, 2012). The supersession thesis has also been discussed in the context of Israel/Palestine (Meisels, 2003, 2009, ch. 2; Meyer, 2004b; Gans, 2008, ch. 4), Fiji (Carens, 2000, ch. 9), and Pacific Island nations threatened by climate change (Nine, 2010). The supersession thesis has become influential among theorists both skeptical and supportive of reparations for past injustice (see, for example, Kymlicka, 1995, 220; Thompson, 2002; Hill, 2002; Wenar, 2006; Nine, 2008; Meyer, 2004a, 16–23; Waligore, 2009; Marmor, 2004; Hendrix, 2005; Kolers, 2009, ch. 3; Butt, 2009, 145–48).
So, we often should indeed attempt to counteract the negative impact of past wrongs for the well-being of current and future people. However, such an interpretation of the relevance of past injustices is incomplete when understood as a statement of how we ought to respond to the fact that past people were severely wronged. That is true quite independently of whether or not we find, in a particular case of historical injustice, that currently living people have valid claims to reparations for being indirect victims of historical injustice. Even if we held the view that the non-identity-problem excluded the possibility of currently living people being (indirect) victims of past injustice or that the historical injustice under consideration has been superseded, we will not wish to deny that past people were wronged. The moral significance of past wrongs does not exclusively lie in their impact on present and future people’s well-being; rather, the significance of past wrongs is also to be seen in the fact that past people were victims of these injustices. We need to enquire into the question of what we owe to the dead victims of past injustices. As sketched here, the interpretation is misleading in suggesting that we owe them nothing—that, in the words of Max Horkheimer, “[p]ast injuries took place in the past and the matter ended there. The slain are truly slain.”
To many it is intuitively plausible that present generations can have duties to dead victims owing to the wrongs committed against them (by others) in the past. If this intuition can be defended, we have duties to past generations that are grounded in past deeds. This would imply that at least some aspects of historical injustice cannot be accounted for by an historically informed theory of justice between contemporaries (or between contemporaries and future people).
To attribute rights to dead people may seem unproblematic if we assume that people continue to exist after their physical death and that they may be affected by (and affect) events of this world. These assumptions about the ontological status of previously living people are, however, at least as controversial as their converse (see Mulgan 1999, 54–55). In the following discussion we will proceed on the following assumption that might be said to occupy a sensible middle ground between the competing views:
(A) either the deceased do not exist (a1) or, if they do exist, there is no connection between them and those currently alive (a2).
In other words, we assume that, upon a person’s death, any causal interaction between her and the physical world as we know it ceases.
Assuming that dead people cannot be bearers of interests or rights and thus that those presently alive can neither harm nor wrong dead people, Joel Feinberg and others have discussed two alternative interpretations of posthumous harm. While both are compatible with presupposition (A), neither of these positions provides a satisfactory understanding of posthumous harm or wrong. According to the first interpretation, present generations can be said to owe something to surviving interests as such—that is, to interests that the deceased had, while alive, with respect to future posthumous states of affairs. However, while we have reasons to care about individual people, it is not clear that we have reasons to care about interests as such. According to the second (re-)interpretation (see Feinberg 1980; Feinberg 1977, 301–02), the significance of posthumous events is fully accounted for by the harm that these events cause a person during her life. However, this interpretation is not an interpretation of posthumous harm as such but of harm to living people that is caused by posthumous events. This position has been shown to be incompatible with our normal understanding of the significance of posthumous events (see Gosseries 2004, ch. iv, sects. 4–5).
A fourth position, the position of surviving duties, is compatible with presupposition (A) and does not rely on any of the criticized views (see Wellman 1995, 155–57). The position of surviving duties is relevantly different from the three positions as introduced above. The idea of surviving duties rests neither on the claim that deceased people can be bearers of interests or rights (contrary to the first position), nor on the claim that we have reason to care about interests that have no current bearers (contrary to the second position). The position of surviving duties does not reject the notion that currently living people can be harmed by what are to them posthumous events (for example, when people learn shortly before their death that a project that they deeply care about is doomed to failure). However, the position of surviving duties is meant to answer a different question, namely, whether present generations can be said to owe something to dead people and, in particular, to those who were victims of past injustices.
According to this position, duties survive the death of the bearer of the right. While the bearer of the right no longer exists, currently living people can stand under the correlative duties. The notion of surviving duties relies on the idea that the reasons for a person’s right imply reasons for a correlative duty under which other people may stand even after the death of the bearer of the right. If it is a moral right, then these reasons will also include general social reasons which are relevant not only for the bearer of the right but also for the bearer(s) of the surviving duty, his contemporaries (and future people). For example, we all have reasons to protect people’s trust that promises be kept and that people have the reputation they deserve. The reasons for the surviving duties also include the reasons that are necessary for showing that a particular person had the moral right.
The position under consideration relies upon the following claims: Some rights are future-oriented in the sense that they impose duties in the future. Such rights can impose surviving duties; they imply duties that are (also) binding after the death of the bearer of the right if the appropriate bearer of the duty is identified. In the following we will comment on these claims by investigating the reasons for surviving duties with the help of an example of a person who wishes to establish posthumously a prize for the sciences. Let us call the person “Alfred Nobel” even though we make no claim that the example resembles Alfred Nobel to whose bequest we owe the Nobel Prize.
“A right implies a duty” means that a proposition about the right’s validity implies a proposition that some duty exists. Such an implication relies upon the claim that the reasons for the right contain (some of) the reasons for the duty. In the case of rights that are future-oriented in the sense indicated, the reasons for the rights of people while alive are sufficient for holding currently living people under a duty, that is, a surviving duty. With respect to moral rights, specifically moral reasons are among these reasons. Such reasons are meant to protect the conditions of a, morally speaking, valuable social life.
Suppose Alfred Nobel kept to himself his wish to establish, posthumously, a prize for the sciences. Although he accumulated the fortune necessary for such, Nobel neglected to write it in his will. Hiking in isolated mountains together with his friend Barbara, Nobel has an accident and both he and Barbara realize that he will die before they can call on somebody for help. Nobel asks his friend to promise him that she will make sure that his fortune will be spent for the establishment of a prize for the sciences and that his wish to this effect will be acknowledged as if it had been written in his will.
Why should Barbara keep the promise? The particular strength of the position under consideration is to be seen in its connecting the surviving duty both to the previous right of the deceased person and to those general moral reasons which are relevant for the bearer of the duty and his contemporaries. First, the particular reasons which ground the right of the no longer existing person imply reasons for the validity of the surviving duty. Some of the reasons for a currently living person to stand under the duty toward the deceased person are implied by the reasons for attributing the corresponding right to the deceased person while alive. This is also the sense in which we stand under surviving duties toward the deceased person. For example, the surviving duty to keep a death-bed promise is valid for, inter alia, the reason that the promise was given to the deceased person—and that is why the latter, while alive, had a moral right that the promise given to him be kept. If the duty is not understood to be binding due to the fact, inter alia, that the deceased person had the future-oriented right, surviving duties could not be distinguished from interpretations of, for example, death-bed promises according to which the duty to keep the promise is owed to our contemporaries alone (and possibly to people living in the future). The position under consideration differs from some consequentialist interpretations of such cases by insisting that a surviving duty necessarily be based upon, inter alia, the reasons for the future-oriented right and that these reasons contain the specific reasons for the attribution of the previous right to the deceased person.
So far we have investigated one type of reason for a person to stand under a duty towards the deceased person. These reasons are implied by the reasons for attributing the corresponding right to the deceased person while alive. However, and second, there are other reasons too. These reasons are general in that they concern the protection or promotion of values important for the quality of social life. With respect to death-bed promises, trust and the protection from betrayal, are at stake. We all have reasons to protect the value of people having confidence that promises be kept. In so far as people can and do have an interest in future posthumous states of affairs of the world, and in so far as pursuing such interests can be of high importance to the well-being of people while alive (Meyer 2005, chs. 4 and 5; Scheffler 2013, esp. 42–43, 52–53), it is important for people that others can bind themselves by promises or contracts to the effect that they will carry out certain actions after the promisee’s death, and that when others have done so, that they can be confident that the promise will be kept. For the practice of such promises, trust is of special importance, for the promisee will not be able to determine whether the promise was kept. Thus, the practice of such promises is particularly dependent upon the protection of the value of people having confidence in promises being kept. At the same time, if such promises have often not been kept, this is likely to undermine the confidence in promises being kept generally. The right of the deceased person that the promise given will be kept is in part based on, among others, these reasons. Although the right and the person who is the bearer of the right have ceased to exist, the moral reasons for honoring the right are still valid and the duty of the person who gave the promise continues to be binding on the basis of these reasons. As these reasons are general moral reasons they are not only relevant for the individual bearer of the right but also for the surviving bearer of the correlative duty and his contemporaries. The death of the bearer of the right leaves these moral reasons unaffected, and the surviving duty is based in part on these reasons in conjunction with the reasons that are implied by the particular reasons for the attribution of the correlative right to the deceased person while alive. Thus, contemporaries of a person who stands under a surviving duty have reason to impose sanctions on the person should he not keep his promise.
One might wonder whether this interpretation of surviving duties is compatible with the presupposition that dead people are bearers of neither interests nor rights and that they cannot be affected by the actions of present persons. At the very least, the position of surviving duties as delineated presupposes the possibility of the attribution of posthumous properties and, more particularly, of their change—an assumption that has been defended as rather unproblematic (see Ruben 1988, 223–31).
5.4 Carrying Out Acts of Symbolic Compensation in Fulfilling a Surviving Duty Towards the Dead Victims
Does the theory of surviving duties contribute to an understanding of the moral significance of the fact that past people were severely wronged? We shall explore the idea that since people (as members of ongoing societies) can be said to have an obligation to compensate surviving and indirect victims of past injustices, they may also have an obligation symbolically to compensate dead victims of past injustices, people who cannot now be affected by our actions.
As argued above, currently living people can stand under surviving duties toward past people even though we can neither change the value to them of any moment of their lives since they cannot be affected by what people do after their death nor can they be thought to be bearers of interests or rights. Until now the entry has discussed duties toward dead people with reference to (variations on) the example of Alfred Nobel and his bequest. Currently living people can act in ways that will constitute a violation of the surviving duties under which they stand owing to the rights the deceased once held. Currently living people stand under particular surviving duties toward the deceased owing to their future-oriented projects, the promises we made to them, or the contractual obligations we entered into with them. However, not all people have the opportunity or the wish to have a specific impact on posthumous states of affairs. Not all people pursue projects that are future-oriented in the relevant way and not all people oblige others to bring about what for them are posthumous states of affairs. Here one suggestion is that currently living people can stand under surviving duties toward dead people owing to the fact that they were victims of historical injustices. In order to show that currently living people can stand under such duties, one will have to assume that people generally have interests with respect to posthumous states of affairs. Indeed, people can generally be thought to be interested in enjoying a good reputation both during their lifetime and posthumously. When people were violated in their rights, and badly so, their posthumous reputation depends upon their being publicly acknowledged as victims of these wrongs, and others being identified as the wrongdoers (see also Margalit 2002, chs. 2–4).
In acknowledging past individuals as victims of egregious wrongs we cannot affect their well-being. Also, such acknowledgement cannot be expressed face to face with the dead victims, but only vis-à-vis currently living people in light of the wrongs past people suffered. However, if it is true that we stand under surviving duties toward past victims of historical injustice owing to the wrongs they suffered, then our fulfilling the duty by publicly acknowledging the past injustices they suffered will change the relation between us and the dead victims of historical injustice. It will be true of the past victims of these injustices that they have the posthumous property that we fulfilled our surviving duty toward them. To be sure, a change of the relation between an existent person and a dead person does not bring about a real change to the latter. Rather, the relational change is based upon the real change of the person who carries out the act.
For currently living people to bring about public acknowledgment of past people as victims of historical injustice can require different measures under different circumstances. They can express their acknowledgement of past people as victims of past wrongs in an indirect way, namely, by providing compensation for those who are worse off than they should be owing to the effects of the past injustices suffered by their predecessors or by conferring benefits on living people in whose well-being as members of a group we assume the dead victims of past wrongs had an interest. The message of such compensation can contain the acknowledgment that past people were victims of past wrongs. Here I would like to suggest that we can understand efforts at appropriate commemoration of past victims as symbolic compensation and restitution.
Establishing a memorial is the typical course of action where the effort is made to realize the symbolic value of compensating those victims who are no longer living. A memorial may be a public speech, a day in the official calendar, a conference, a public space or a monument—for example, a sculpture or an installation. Often these memorials are meant to commemorate crimes that previous members committed in the name of a political society whose currently living members now want to carry out actions of public symbolic compensation or restitution for these crimes toward the victims and their descendants. Such acts have been carried out since the 1970s in Germany, and there is evidence of an international practice of symbolic compensation.
How can we understand this practice of symbolic compensation? One interpretation relies on the following basic idea: the value of real compensation—the rectification or compensation at which we would aim if only it were possible—is imputed, at least in part, to the act of symbolic compensation (see Nozick 1993, chs. 1 and 2). The imputation of the value of real compensation to the acts of symbolic compensation is partly based upon the expressive value of acts of symbolic compensation. For those who carry out acts of symbolic compensation these acts make it possible to express attitudes toward the past victims—attitudes that are constitutive of acts of compensation. Acts of symbolic compensation make it possible for those who carry them out to act in such a way as to express an understanding of themselves as people who wish to, and would, carry out acts of real compensation if this were only possible. If successful they will have firmly expressed an understanding of themselves as persons who would provide real compensation to the previously living person or people if this were only possible. They will also have expressed a firm commitment to prevent the repetition of such injustices.
Acts of symbolic compensation can thus be valuable for those who perform them, since doing so helps express attitudes that are important for their self-understanding and identity. Those involved understand themselves to be persons committed to support the just claims of those who have been injured and to be persons prepared to contribute to the establishment and maintenance of a just political society. This is a real consequence of such acts and can be of great importance to those carrying out the acts.
However, those carrying out these acts will not succeed in bringing about these consequences if they aim to bring about these consequences as such. Carrying out an act of symbolic value as a means of bringing about certain consequences will change the character of the act and, thus, the reasons that speak on behalf of carrying out the act in the first place. It is not the case that we will become a person of a certain identity simply by carrying out an act that a person of this identity would have performed. While the consequences for self-understanding just outlined can be an important factor in explaining why a person acts as she does, in choosing what to do the person cannot herself explicitly take into account this type of consequence without thereby diminishing or undermining this very effect of her act (see Anderson 1993, chs. 2 and 4; Raz 1986, ch. 12).
Acts of symbolic compensation will have consequences for others as well, particularly surviving and indirect victims of past injustices. Acts of symbolic compensation can have consequences for such persons and groups: the public acknowledgment of the suffering of past people who were wronged by, say, a genocidal policy cannot be separated from the acknowledgment of those who survived the same policy and consequently continue to suffer, or from those who continue to suffer as indirect victims of the policy. Those who carry out acts of symbolic compensation will want to provide some real compensation to those who currently suffer as a result of the same past wrongs, to help those who currently are victims of similar injustices, and to prevent such injustices from happening again. The reasons for acts of symbolic compensation provide reasons for real compensation where this is possible. Symbolic compensation belongs to the measures likely to have the effect of providing surviving victims or groups with assistance in recovering or regaining membership and recognition in their respective societies, such that they are once again able to lead lives under conditions of justice.
Symbolic compensation as understood here demonstrates that we can recognize past people as victims of injustices without presupposing that they can be current bearers of interests or rights. Insofar as people generally have an interest and a just claim to enjoy the reputation they deserve while alive, and insofar as the reasons for their just claim can oblige us even after the bearer of the interest and the just claim has ceased to exist, our carrying out acts of symbolic compensation can be understood as fulfilling a surviving duty toward dead people who were wronged in the past, namely the duty of restoring to them the posthumous reputation they deserve.
Present generations stand under two types of obligations of intergenerational justice: They are obliged (i) not to violate the rights of future generations (Section 2) and (ii) (at least some presently living people might well be obliged) to provide compensation to contemporaries with respect to harms victims in the past suffered at the hands of past perpetrators (Section 5). By employing a threshold notion of harm which may be understood as a central element of a sufficientarian conception of intergenerational justice, but could also be an element of other substantive understandings of intergenerational justice (Section 4), we can justify conclusions about both types of present generations’ duties. The threshold notion of harm can be understood as a constitutive element of a complex understanding of harm (disjunctive notion) (Section 3, and, in particular, 3.4).
The special features of our relations to (remote) future people—especially the lack of particular knowledge, the impossibility of cooperation, and the permanent asymmetry of influence (Section 1)—do not stand in the way of attributing rights to them that ground corresponding duties owed by us (Sections 2 and 3). The fact that past wrongs are among the necessary conditions for the existence and identity of people currently alive is compatible with the view that these persons have rights to compensation owing to the impact of these past wrongs on their well-being, and that these rights can ground corresponding duties owed by their contemporaries (forward-looking understanding of the significance of past injustices) (Section 5.1). Even when we allow for the possibility of the ongoing impact of past injustices to be just today, namely owing to a change of circumstances, we will have to investigate the extent to which the conditions for such a supersession of claims to restitution or compensation are met for each case (Section 5.2).
Rights-based considerations of intergenerational justice bear not only upon “same people choices” but also upon both types of “different people choices” that Parfit distinguishes, including what he calls “different number choices” (Sections 2 and 3). However, widely shared concerns for the continuation of human life and at a high level of well-being cannot be accounted for solely by rights-based considerations (Section 4.5). Also, the moral significance of past wrongs should not be interpreted solely in terms of the impact of these injustices on present and future people’s well-being. If we allow that intergenerational relations are not exclusively governed by duties with correlative rights, the notion that we can stand under surviving duties towards dead people who cannot be bearers of rights vis-à-vis present people (Sections 5.3–4) is compatible with the forward-looking understanding of the significance of historical injustice. Also, the notion that we stand under an obligation towards future people to which no rights of future people correspond—namely, under the obligation not to destroy willfully the goods inherited from our predecessors and the conditions that are constitutive of persons’ pursuit of future-oriented projects (Section 4.5)—is compatible with the view that we do stand under some obligations of intergenerational justice to which the rights of future people correspond.
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For detailed comments and criticisms on a number of drafts I would like to thank Thomas Pogge. For discussion of early drafts of most sections I am grateful to Brian Barry and David Heyd. Rachel Brown edited my English of the first version of the entry and improved the presentation of the arguments in numerous ways. I would also like to thank Brian Bix, Tony Daniel and Barbara Reiter.
For detailed and extremely helpful comments on the (2008) version of the entry I would like to thank Thomas Pogge. I would also like to thank James Nickel as well as Michael Edward Ravvin and Dominic Roser.
Pranay Sanklecha made very helpful suggestions on the (2015) version of the entry. I would also like to thank Tim Waligore, Naemi Dubbels, and especially Kiley Kost. An anonymous reviewer is thanked for comments and suggestions that helped improve and clarify the article.