# Bolzano’s Logic

*First published Sun Sep 23, 2007; substantive revision Tue Oct 12, 2021*

Bernard Bolzano (1781–1848), of Italian-German origin, was
born and died in Prague. He spent his entire life in Bohemia (today
part of the Czech Republic), which remained part of the Austrian
Empire until 1918. He studied philosophy, mathematics and theology and
became a Catholic priest and professor of the science of religion at
the University of Prague. He devoted his life to the reform of the
backward semi-feudal Austrian society and of the *a priori*
sciences: logic, mathematics and theology. Because of his unorthodox
views on the constitution and the government, he was removed in 1819
from the University and spent the rest of his life in retirement
writing treatises on the theory of science (1837), mathematics
(*Grössenlehre*, manuscript not yet completely
published), *Science of Religion* (1834), a utopia *On the
Best State* (published only in 1932) and the posthumous *Paradoxes of the
infinite* (1851).

Bolzano’s presentation of logic is embedded in the vast *Theory
of Science* (henceforth *TS*). His logic is based on the
abstract concepts of propositions and ideas in themselves (*an
sich*), which are independent of thought and language. His logic
of ideas contains a new treatment of their content and extension and,
among other things, provides an analysis of ideas without objects. A
purely logical definition of intuitions as simple singular ideas
allowed Bolzano to distinguish them from concepts and to characterize
the traditional epistemological distinction between *a priori*
and *a posteriori* in terms of the logical distinction between
conceptual and empirical propositions (and sciences). The main
innovations of Bolzano’s logic consist in the definitions of validity,
analyticity and logical truth, and the creation of a complete system
of extensional relations between propositions, the most important of
these being compatibility, deducibility (= consequence), and
equivalence. Bolzano discovered the link between deducibility and
conditional probability, according to which deducibility and
incompatibility appear as two limit cases of conditional probability
(this idea was taken over or reinvented by Wittgenstein in
the *Tractatus*). Deductive logic is thus extended to inductive
logic based on probability. Bolzano’s theory of the grounding relation
(*Abfolge*) leading to a hierarchical order of theorems is the
first modern study of axiomatic systems. Morover, the thorough
discussions of concepts of logic and many other insights contribute to
make the *TS* one of the classical works in logic and
epistemology, on a par with those of Aristotle, Leibniz, and Frege.
The extensive historical notes contained in it are a unique source for
the history of logic. Although written in natural language, Bolzano’s
logic represents a decisive breakthrough in the development of modern
logic.

- 1. Towards a new logic
- 2. Logic as Theory of Science
- 3. Some fundamental concepts
- 4. Propositions and truths in themselves
- 5. Ideas and relations between ideas
- 6. The method of variation
- 7. The objective connection among truths: grounding (
*Abfolge*) - 8. Inferences
- 9. Conclusion
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Towards a new logic

In 1810, Bolzano published a booklet entitled *Contributions to
a better founded presentation of mathematics* (Bolzano 1810;
Bolzano 2004b) where he developed his views about the unsatisfactory
state of the mathematics of his time and the need for its reform. He
proposed a new definition of mathematics as “the science which
deals with the general laws (forms) to which things must conform in
their existence” (Bolzano 1810, I, §8; Bolzano 2004b: 94),
a new division of mathematics into universal mathematics (arithmetic,
algebra, analysis and elements of his future theory of collections)
and particular mathematical disciplines (mathematical theory of time,
geometry and mechanics), and also put forth some considerations on
logic. As with Leibniz, logic is again seen as closely connected with
mathematics.

The logical theory of the *Contributions* is still fairly
traditional, sometimes Kantian in spite of Bolzano’s criticisms, but
it contains some important innovations. Following Aristotle, Bolzano
distinguished two sorts of proofs: those which show *that*
something is the case and those which also show *why* it is
so. He called the former “certifications” (Bolzano 2004b:
254: “confirmations”) [*Gewissmachungen*], the
latter “groundings” [*Begründungen*]. The
concept of grounding reflects the “objective dependence among
truths” [*objektiver Zusammenhang der Wahrheiten*]. It
would later become the fundamental concept in Bolzano’s treatment of
axiomatic theories in the *TS*. Another innovation consisted in
the criteria for the correctness of proofs and in the treatment of
simple, undefinable concepts. On one hand, already in
the *Betrachtungen* Bolzano pointed out that he “could
never be satisfied with a completely strict proof *if it were not
derived from the same concepts* which the *thesis* to be
proved contained” (Bolzano 2004b: 32). On the other hand,
“[…] in any correct proof of [the] proposition all
characteristics of the subject must be used, i.e., they must be
applied in the derivation of the predicate” (Bolzano 1810, II,
§28; Bolzano 2004b: 122–123). With Aristotle, Bolzano
prohibits crossing from one genus to another in demonstrations. Proofs
of theorems of mathematical analysis such as his proof of the
intermediate value theorem (Bolzano 1817; Bolzano 2004b:
252–277) must not contain concepts alien to the domain of
investigation; in the case of this theorem, one must not introduce
geometrical or kinematic considerations to prove a theorem of
universal (pure) mathematics.

According to Bolzano, a mathematical theory should be presented in the form of an axiomatic theory, whose propositions are deduced from previous propositions according to their objective dependence and eventually from the axioms. Axioms are not necessarily evident truths and intuition has no place either in the proofs or the axioms. An axiom is simply an indemonstrable proposition from which other propositions may be deduced. A science thus becomes an autonomous, ordered system of propositions, independent of the human mind; the goal of foundational research is to discover and to reproduce this objective order.

A further important innovation consists in the treatment of simple, undefinable concepts. How do we understand them? Our understanding

is brought about by mentioning several sentences, in which the concept in question, designated by its own word, appears in various combinations. From the comparison of these sentences, the reader is able to abstract which determinate concept the word designates. […] This means is well known as that by which each of us learned the first meanings of words in our mother tongue (Bolzano 1810, II, §8; Bolzano 2004b: 107; here Rusnock’s 2000 translation).

Bolzano called such circumlocutions “paraphrases” or
“circumscriptions” [*Umschreibungen*]. His method
points to a solution of the paradox of definition according to which
all concepts are ultimately defined in terms of simple concepts, but
these remain undefined and thus devoid of meaning.

## 2. Logic as Theory of Science

Bolzano’s new logic responded to the needs of both mathematics and
the “science of religion” which Bolzano taught from 1805
to 1819. In 1812, profoundly dissatisfied with the state of logic,
Bolzano conceived the project of a new logic which would lead to a
“total transformation of the *a priori*
sciences”. The idea of the “objective connection of
truths”, based on the grounding relation of consequence
[*Abfolge*] was the core of the project. The *Theory of
Science*, published in 1837, marks the realization of the project,
enlarged in the broader context of general epistemology and
methodology of science.

Bolzano defined the theory of science by its ultimate goal, which is the division of human knowledge into disciplines and the composition of scientific treatises. According to the definition, the theory of science is

the collection of all rules which we must follow, if we want to do a competent piece of work, when we divide the total domain of truths into individual sciences, and present them in their respective treatises. (

TS, I, §1, 9; Bolzano 1973: 38)

Bolzano calls this last part of the *TS*
the Theory of Science Proper.

This definition presupposes a whole sequence of disciplines
involved in the construction of a science, each of which is founded on
the preceding. The ultimate discipline in this sequence deals with the
classification of sciences and the principles of style of scientific
writing that should lead to the composition of a series of scientific
treatises forming an encyclopedia. Bolzano hoped that, following the
Great Encyclopedia of Diderot and D’Alembert, the ideal of the
Enlightenment, the effort to spread scientifically organized useful
knowledge would again find its finest expression in the completion of
an encyclopedia. In this way, the *TS*, would contribute to the
general well-being.

In order to divide truths into different disciplines and present
them in particular treatises, we first have to discover them. Such is
the goal of *The Art of Discovery* [*Erfindungskunst*]
or *Heuristics*, which yields the rules for finding new truths.
Heuristics presupposes the possibility of recognizing truths, which is
the object of *The Theory of Knowledge*
[*Erkenntnislehre*]. Now, the decisive step in the exploration
of the layers of science leads to the most important part of
the *TS*, *The Theory of Elements*, which analyses the
objective conditions of the subjective activity of knowing, namely the
theory of ideas, propositions and deduction, in short: formal
logic. The *Theory of Fundamentals* shows that these elements
are propositions in themselves and ideas in themselves, that there are
infinitely many truths in themselves and that we can know at least
some of them. Taking all the disciplines of the *TS* in the due
order, we obtain the following structure:

- Theory of Fundamentals (
*Fundamentallehre*, vol. I, §§17–45), - Theory of Elements (
*Elementarlehre*), i.e., formal logic (vol. I-II, §§46–268), - Theory of Knowledge (
*Erkenntnislehre*, vol. III, §§269–321), - Heuristics (
*Erfindungskunst oder Heuristik*, vol. III, §§322–391), - Theory of Science Proper (
*eigentliche Wissenschaftslehre*), i.e., the theory of the division of the truths into particular sciences and the principles of composition for scientific treatises (vol. IV, §§392–718).

## 3. Some fundamental concepts

Bolzano’s terminology often differs from current logical usage. For a proper understanding of Bolzano’s logic, it is thus necessary to keep in mind Bolzano’s fundamental distinctions and definitions. This is why the presentation of Bolzano’s logic must begin with the examination of several preliminary concepts.

The expression “in itself” [*an sich*] is
applied only to propositions and ideas, never to things or
metaphysical objects such as the soul or God. Only logical objects are
“in themselves”. The determination “in itself”
or “as such” (a translation proposed recently by Jan Berg)
with its synonym “objective” means that we take an object
without any other qualification, independently of its being thought or
expressed linguistically. Bolzano’s term for ideas in themselves is
‘representations in themselves’ [*Vorstellungen an
sich*], and he even speaks of intuitions in themselves; he is
aware of the incongruity of such a designation, but he has no other
term to propose.

For what we call—after Tarski—logical consequence,
Bolzano uses the word *deducibility* (*Ableitbarkeit*,
literally derivability, but it is a sort of semantical relation). He
calls *consequence* or *entailment* [*Abfolge*]
the ground-consequence relation [*Grund und Folge*]; with
Rusnock (Bolzano 2004a), I translate *Abfolge*
by *grounding.* In English, the same word *grounding* is
also used for *Begründung* which is the objective
proof, *objektiver Beweis*, carried out by means of the
grounding relation [*Abfolge*]. Thus, *grounding*
translates both the *Abfolge* relation between the ground and
the consequence, and *Begründung*, the complete objective
proof.

Bolzano has two words to designate
properties: *Beschaffenheit* and *Eigenschaft*. In
translation, the difference often disappears, but it is possible to
capture it by translating *Beschaffenheit* by
“attribute”. An *Eigenschaft* is a property in the
strict sense; “attribute” is the general term for both
properties and relations, and also covers the states and structure of
an object. The ‘*Beschaffenheit*’ of a thing means
how it is *beschaffen*, made, organized, arranged, structured,
constituted. Nevertheless, often *Beschaffenheit* simply
designates an *Eigenschaft*, a property.

There are two fundamental kinds of objects in Bolzano’s ontology:
the real ones, localized in space and time and subject to causality,
and the non-real, logical and mathematical objects. Real objects are
further divided into external and internal, subjective (mental
events). Thus, we have the first world of external, material things,
the second world of subjective states (mental events) and the third
realm of abstract meanings and mathematical objects; nevertheless, the
ultimate ontological division is between the *real* world
containing substances, their collections, states and properties, and
the *abstract* realm of logical and mathematical objects.

One can only say of real objects that they exist or have being in
the proper sense [*Existenz, Dasein, Sein*]. Bolzano marks the
difference in the modes of being of real and non-real objects by
saying that “there are [*es gibt*] non-real
objects”, although they do not *exist*. With Bergmann
(1970) and other critics
who stress that we do not have different concepts of existence
according to the nature of the objects, I shall in both cases use the
word “exist”.

Both kinds of being, real and non real, can nevertheless be
expressed by means of an important second-level concept: objectuality
[*Gegenständlichkeit*], a property of ideas expressing
existential quantification, the property of having an object. The idea
of a function is just as objectual as the idea of a horse, but in the
case of the idea of a horse, one may add that it is an idea of a real
being. The idea of a round square is objectless, without object, not
instantiated, because the existence of round squares implies a
contradiction. The idea of a golden mountain is objectless for
empirical reasons.

Surprisingly, Bolzano lacks a theory of quantification. He knows better than other mathematicians of his time how to treat quantifiers in his mathematical work (he was, for example, the first to give a viable definition of continutity, and to formulate the Bolzano-Cauchy criterion for the convergence of infinite series) but he gives no theoretical treatment of quantifiers in his logic. He considers that it is not necessary to prefix a universal quantifier to universal propositions. “Man is mortal” differs from “All men are mortal” only in grammatical expression; both sentences express the same proposition. Existential quantification is reduced to objectuality, a property of second order. “There are inhabitants on other planets” becomes “The idea of an inhabitant on other planets is objectual”.

## 4. Propositions and truths in themselves

Bolzano’s first important innovation in the *TS*, which is
at the same time the most controversial, aims at the transformation of
the domain of logic. According to him, logic is not a theory of ideas
and judgments in our mind, it is not an *art de pensée*
in the sense of Arnauld’s and Nicole’s *Port-Royal Logic* or
an exposition of the laws of thought. Logic is the theory of formal
relations between propositions in themselves (*Sätze an
sich*; Bolzano also uses as a synonym “objective
propositions”; here I shall simply use the term
“proposition”). Bolzano does not succeed in defining what
objective propositions are; he can only characterize them by a set of
specific properties (see Berg 1962: 46–47). In contradistinction
to judgments, which are mental acts, and to sentences, which are
sequences of signs of a language, propositions form the
“matter” of a thought or of a judgment as well as the
meaning or sense (*Sinn*) of a sentence. Bolzano points out
that ‘to be in itself’ is not a new property of
propositions or ideas; it means simply to take a proposition or an
idea as it is, independently of its being grasped or expressed by a
human being. Conversely, thinking and speaking involve
‘grasping’ (in the metaphorical sense) the meaning and
expressing it.

One will gather what I mean by proposition as soon as I remark that I do not call a proposition in itself or an objective proposition that which the grammarians call a proposition, namely, the linguistic expression, but rather simply the meaning of this expression, which must be exactly one of the two, true or false; and that accordingly I attribute existence to the grasping of a proposition, to thought propositions as well as to the judgments made in the mind of a thinking being (existence, namely, in the mind of the one who thinks this proposition and who makes the judgment); but the mere proposition in itself (or the objective proposition) I count among the kinds of things that do not have any existence whatsoever, and never can attain existence. (Bolzano 2004a: 40–41)

Like mathematical objects, propositions are non-mental and non-linguistic intensional entities; they do not belong to the real world, but rather, as Bolzano puts it, to “the realm of those things which make no claim to reality but only to possibility” (Bolzano 2004b: §13, 607). Contrary to other intensional objects, each proposition has a truth value, true or false. The best approach to Bolzano’s concept of proposition (and of idea in itself) is to consider them as forming the universal realm of abstract meanings, from which each language selects specific meanings and associates signs with them.

Against psychologism, especially that of Kant, Herbart, and others, Bolzano propounded the concept of a proposition in order to prevent the interpretation of logical objects as mental entities. Bolzano’s arguments in favor of the existence of propositions invoke the existence of unknown truths or of truths that nobody except God will ever know (a truth is simply a true proposition). Such is, for instance, the truth that a certain tree had determinate number of flowers last spring. But God’s knowledge of that number does not mean that propositions depend on his mind: propositions and truths, not being real, are not created by him.

Something is true not because God knows that it is so; on the contrary, God knows that it is so because in fact it is so. (

TSI: §25, 113–115)

The proposition “God exists” is not true because God thinks it; God thinks this because it is true.

The most plausible argument in favor of the existence of propositions deals with mathematical truths: the Pythagorean theorem, for example, is true independently of the language in which it is formulated, and does not even depend on the existence of thinking beings. According to Morscher (1973: 278), Bolzano wanted to guarantee the objectivity and universality of logic by means of propositions.

Already during his life, Bolzano was obliged to defend his theory of propositions against the attacks of Franz Exner, who wrote to Bolzano:

Every truth exists only in the consciousness of an individual, in an individual understanding, nowhere else and in no other way. (Bolzano 2004a: 85)

Exner also speaks of the “ghostly being” of propositions. He objected that Bolzano’s theory of propositions makes it a mystery how human beings, who belong to the real world, grasp immaterial meanings. Bolzano replied that

the word “grasp” as well as all similar words [… ] are only

figurativeexpressions used in the hope that anyone who understands the language can gather from the whole context which simple [or almost simple] concepts

are designated with these words (Bolzano 2004a: 162). Against Exner, again and again he puts forward as argument the existence of unknown truths and the existence of meanings independent of any particular language.

Much later, Frege, the early Husserl, Heinrich Scholz, Alonzo Church, and Jerrold Katz advanced ideas similar to those of Bolzano, while Wittgenstein, Schlick, Patočka, Quine and others presented objections based on the analysis of human, subjective representations and the use of language. For Patočka, who echoes Exner’s criticism, Bolzano’s doctrine

does not represent a solution.[…]. Bolzano’s problem can be solved only if the first place in the sequence of the layers of science is occupied not by the mythical propositions in themselves, but by the critical doctrine of knowledge as a progressing and historical process. (1958: 120)

On the other hand, in his *Metaphysics of Meaning*
(1990), Katz exposed an
essentially Bolzanian theory showing how to respond to Wittgensteinian
and Quinian arguments. According to Katz, his critics mix up
the *language* with the *use* of the language. The
meanings constitute a universal field from which every language
selects its own meanings, not necessarily the same for all
languages. A balanced position is expressed in Rusnock (2000:
115):

[…] the question may fairly be asked whether Bolzano’s view on logical objects can be usefully adapted to the modern setting—that is […] whether the notion of proposition is still useful. […] In my opinion, this question turns mainly on the issue of whether or not formal language theory is judged to have given an exhaustive description of possible forms of meaningfulness. If so, it would seem that propositions as entities over and above formal expressions would yield nothing that one did not already possess in a more precise form. On the other hand, if the question of analysis of possible forms of meaning remains open, then Bolzano’s position, suitably adapted, becomes more reasonable. And the latter, it seems to me, is closer to the truth. […] when considerations of tractability, perspicuity, elegance, etc. are introduced, the question becomes once again interestingly open.

Bolzano’s concept of proposition also includes orders, questions
and expressions of desire. A question like “Is Newton’s law of
universal gravitation an *a priori* truth?” means
“I want to know if Newton’s law of universal gravitation is
an *a priori* truth” and it has a truth value. Here and
in similar cases, Bolzano confuses the question of truth with the
sincerity of the speaker.

What is truth? Truths are true propositions. Bolzano’s theory is
essentially Aristotelian: true propositions “state things as
they are” (*TS* I: §25, 112; 1972: 32). A
proposition is true if it says how things are. More precisely,

A proposition is true when it attributes to a subject a predicate that it possesses, or (in other words) when every object that stands under the subject concept of the proposition has an attribute that stands under the predicate concept. I do not usually like to speak of

agreementon such occasions. (Bolzano 2004a (letter to Exner): 167)

This formulation is linked to the canonical form of all
propositions “*A* has (the attribute) *b*” (see
below). Moreover, empirical propositions must contain determinations
of space and time. Without these determinations, the sentence
“It is snowing” has no truth value, it is just a
propositional form which does not correspond to a complete
proposition;

in order to be true, such propositions require the addition of such specifications as to time (and oftentimes also a location), “In this place, it is snowing today”. (

TSI: §25, 113; Bolzano 1973: 57)

There are infinitely many truths in themselves. Bolzano proposed
several proofs for this claim, the simplest being the following. Let
us take as a first proposition *p*, e.g., that “there is no
truth”. Then if *p* is true, it is our first truth;
if *p* is false, some other proposition is true, e.g.,
non-*p*. Thus there is at least one truth. Now,
“*p* is true” is our second truth,
different from the first one, because it has a different subject and
different predicate than those of *p*;
“ ‘*p* is true’ is true” is
our third truth, and so on *ad infinitum*. If *p* if
false, we have the same argument starting with non-*p*. Other
proofs, by complete induction, are more sophisticated, but hardly more
convincing.

## 5. Ideas and relations between ideas

Traditional logic begins with concepts or ideas, moves on to
judgments and ends with reasoning (syllogisms, arguments). Bolzano
reversed this order with regard to ideas and
propositions. Propositions are composed of ideas, but for Bolzano,
propositions are primary, undefined objects, and ideas in themselves
[*Vorstellungen an sich*; hereafter just *ideas* in
contradistinction to subjective ideas] are defined as parts of
propositions that are not themselves propositions. This is an
important innovation, which appears already in Kant (see Coffa 1991),
because it allows one to grasp the meaning of a term in a sentence
from the context of the whole sentence, and authorizes concept
formation from sentential forms obtained from propositions by
declaring one or several of its components variable.

Ideas do not have truth values. They can nevertheless contain whole
propositions as parts, e.g., the idea of “the astronomer who discovered
that the planets have elliptic orbits”. They have the same
ontological status as propositions: they are the “stuff”
of subjective ideas, they do not belong to the real world, they can
only be grasped by a mind and thus be thought by means of subjective
ideas. To every subjective idea belongs an objective one which is what
is thought by the subjective idea (see *TS* I: §48,
158).

### 5.1 The content of an idea

Ideas can be simple or composed of other ideas. The non-ordered set
or the sum of the parts of a complex idea is its *content*.
The parts of an idea form a sum, i.e., according to Bolzano’s
definition, a collection in which “the parts of a part are parts
of the whole”. His definition means that the content of an idea
is invariant with respect to substitutions of the system or sequence
of simpler parts of a part for that part. Thus, substituting
“divisible by 2” for “even” in “even
number”, we obtain “number divisible by 2” which has
the same content.

On the other hand, two different ideas may have the same content.
“The learned son of an unlearned father” and “the
unlearned son of a learned father” for instance have the same
content. An idea is therefore not determined solely by its content.
Its complete determination requires its content and the order of the
parts. In their ultimate form, many ideas are systems or sequences of
simple ideas which form their content. Nevertheless, in certain ideas
having the form “*A* which has the properties \(b, b',
b'',\ldots\)”, no linear ordering is supposed between the parts
\(b, b', b'',\ldots\).

All complex ideas can in principle be analyzed into their ultimate
parts which are simple. Bolzano does not give a list of simple ideas
but occasionally conjectures that a given idea is simple. Among
others, the following ideas are claimed to be simple:
“something”, “attribute”, “being”,
“composition” (*Zusammengesetzheit*, which is the
primitive idea allowing one to define collections and sets as
“something which has composition”), “to grasp or
apprehend”, “not”, “ought”.

### 5.2 Definitions

There are a variety of ways of conveying the meaning of
expressions. Definitions in a broad sense start with explanations,
and explanations are divided into contextual definitions of simple
concepts (or of concepts that we are not able to define) and
definitions in the strict sense, namely the decompositions of a
concept into its parts. Each concept has a unique definition. A given
decomposition may or may not attain the ultimate parts, but different
partial decompositions and the complete decomposition into ultimate
parts define the same concept. As we have seen, already before
Gergonne and Jeremy Bentham, Bolzano advanced the idea of contextual
definitions in the *Contributions* (1810): we grasp the meaning
of a sign designating a simple idea “from its use” or
“from the context” (Bolzano 2004b: 107; the quotation is
from *TS* IV: §668, 547). Complete determinations are
similar to definitions: they state an exclusive, characteristic
property of an object and yield thus a concept equivalent to the
defined concept.

Another important division concerns the division of attributes
[*Beschaffenheiten*] into internal properties, expressed by
monadic predicates, and external properties, i.e., relations, which in
fact correspond to internal properties of the whole composed from the
related parts. In the fundamental idiom, which approximates closely
the structure of propositions, “*A* is the father
of *B*” should be translated as “The whole which
contains *A* and *B* has the following property: the
first element is the father of the second”. In fact, Bolzano
transfers the weight of the relation to the predicate. Here are two
examples of something which looks like a property but is in fact a
relation: the attribute of being prime, which is a relation between a
prime number and all other natural numbers, and sensible qualities,
which are not internal properties but relations between external
things and sense organs. Thus, “*a* is red” becomes
“in relation to our sense organ of vision, *a* is
red”.

Two theorems, or rather simply observations, govern Bolzano’s
theory of ideas. They invalidate theories of some of Bolzano’s
contemporaries or predecessors by means of counterexamples. (1) The
parts of an idea are not necessarily the ideas of the *parts*
of their object. In the example “roof of a house”, the
idea “house” is not the idea of a part of the roof of the
house. (2) The parts of an idea are not always ideas of
the *properties* of their object. The idea
“\(\sqrt{2}\)”, for instance has parts such as
“root”, “square”, “of” and
“2”, but none of the infinity of its properties is
represented by any of these parts. In any case, many complex ideas
contain also logical particles (e.g., “which”,
“of”) that connect their parts and can be neither ideas of
the parts nor ideas of the properties of the object. Both observations
show that the traditional formation of concepts by mere agglomeration
of characters does not exhaust the multiple ways that concepts are
formed. Moreover, both refute not only all naive picture theories of
knowledge, but also, as Joëlle Proust (1999: 370–377) has noted, the
Leibnizian idea of isomorphism between signs and things. The examples
quoted by Bolzano show that there is no direct correspondence between
the composition of things and the compositions of the ideas that
represent them. Ideas are not images of their objects.

### 5.3 Ideas and objects

The relation of an idea to its object is primitive, hence
indefinable relation. Ideas may have or represent or refer to one or
more objects; these are called objectual
[*gegenständlich*]. Others represent no object, they are
objectless, empty [*gegenstandslos, leer*]. Bolzano supposes
that for any object there is an idea that represents it uniquely. An
idea of an idea is called symbolic.

Examples of the first kind: ideas like “Greek” (each Greek is one of its objects), “black”, “universe”, “prime number”; of the second kind are ideas like “nothing”, “round square”, “regular pentahedron”, “golden mountain” (empirically empty), logical particles such as “has” or “which”, and curiously also ideas of “imaginary” (complex) numbers like \(\sqrt{-1}\). Objects of ideas may be real, e.g., real beings or their properties (“man”, “virtue”), but also not real, as in the case of logical and mathematical objects (“proposition”, “deducibility”, “number”, “function”). Altogether, we have the following relations:

*subsumption*, a primitive relation between an object and an idea (an object is subsumed under an idea if that idea represents it, e.g., Socrates is subsumed under the idea “philosopher”),*subordination*, a relation between ideas defined in terms of subsumption (an idea is subordinate to another idea if all objects subsumed under the former idea are subsumed under the latter but not conversely, e.g., “Greek” is subordinate to “European”),*part relation*between ideas, an idea is a part of another idea (e.g., “rational” is a part of the idea “rational animal”),*grasping relation*, a primitive relation between minds, and ideas and propositions (e.g., Plato grasps the idea of the supreme good, Bolzano grasps the proposition “Some continuous functions are not differentiable.”).

Before Frege, Husserl and others, Bolzano carefully distinguished between subsumption (in set-theoretical terminology: to be an element of a set) and subordination (to be a subset).

### 5.4 Extension

Loosely speaking, the *extension* of an idea is “the
collection of all the objects falling under it” (Bolzano 2004a:
46), but strictly speaking, it is “that particular attribute of
an idea by virtue of which it represents only those and no other
objects” (*TS* I, §66, 298; Bolzano 1973: 104). That particular
internal property mediates the association of a collection (the
extension) with an idea. In this manner, Bolzano wants to stress the
internal link between ideas and their extensions, and the uniqueness
of the extension of each idea; moreover, simple ideas are individuated
by their extensions (*ibid.*, 299; Bolzano 1973: 105).

The fact that the idea of prime number represents all prime numbers is thus an internal property of this idea, that is, it is not a relation (the concept of prime number is a relational one, but its extension is a property). In practice, however, Bolzano takes the extension of an idea to be a collection of all its objects.

Each objectual idea has a unique extension, and only objectual ideas have an extension (in other words, Bolzano does not recognize the empty collection or set).

Objectual ideas are divided into singular (e.g., “God”, “universe”, “Aristotle”, “my actual intuition of the pleasant fragrance of this rose”, “even prime number”) and general (“animal”, “substance”, “quantity”).

Against the law of inverse relation between content and extension
of ideas, advocated by logicians since Arnauld and
Nicole’s *Port-Royal Logic*, Bolzano invokes the existence of
redundant ideas (e.g., “triangular figure which has
angles”) and of contradictory ideas, which have content, but no
extension. The following example aroused criticism and even provoked a
controversy (see Šebestik 1992: 151–152): the idea “man
who knows all living European languages” has at the same time a
larger content and a larger extension than the idea “man who
knows all European languages”. Rusnock (2000) proposed a less
controversial example: the idea “1” has both smaller
content and smaller extension than the idea “solution of the
equation \(x^2 - 1= 0\)”. The rule of the inverse relation between
content and extension nevertheless holds in the case of concepts
formed by the conjunction of characteristics.

### 5.5 Intuitions and concepts

Bolzano takes over Kant’s distinction between two kinds of ideas,
intuitions and concepts, but rejects Kant’s definitions. For Bolzano,
a pure concept is an idea that is not an intuition and does not
contain an intuition as a part. To these two kinds, Bolzano adds a
third: the *mixed* ideas, which contain both concepts and
intuitions as parts. As pure concepts play an important role in
Bolzano’s theory of science, mathematics, for example, being a purely
conceptual science, everything depends on how intuitions are
defined.

Although many subjective intuitions are indirectly produced by the
action of an external object that causes a sensation in us, they
correspond to ideas in themselves. There are intuitions in themselves
because intuitions can be parts of propositions and thus have the same
objective status as other ideas. For this reason, Bolzano cannot
define them by means of subjective intuitions, which are mental
events. He advances a definition in purely objective terms: an
intuition is nothing other than a *simple singular idea*,
simple with respect to content, singular with respect to
extension.

According to Kant, intuitions are singular (subjective) representations, but according to his definition, even ideas expressed by a proper name like “Alexander the Great” or “Sirius” would be intuitions. Bolzano’s subjective intuitions are just ideas of the immediate effect of an external object on our sensibility; they represent the change aroused in ourselves on that occasion. Subjective intuitions are representations of sensations and other mental events, and intuitions in themselves their objective counterparts. The object of an intuition is always real, but one should not confuse it with the external object. The singular idea of a physical object, e.g., the idea “Alexander the Great”, cannot be an intuition, because it contains both intuitions and concepts. In fact, we infer the existence of an external object from the intuitions we receive due to its causal action.

[…] we infer that there is an outer object acting on us only because a certain change in our inner self takes place, a change that we interpret as the object’s effect on us. (Bolzano 2004a: 50)

Expressed in words, an intuition is the idea of “this, which
occurs in me just now, which I just now see or hear or feel” and
its object is just “that change that then takes place in
us” and nothing else (*ibid.*). The uniqueness of that
change means that its idea is singular.

Despite the fact that verbal expressions of intuitions usually
contain several words, intuitions are simple ideas. In fact, the only
word that designates an intuition is the demonstrative
“this” [*dies*], the rest of the expression being
just a redundancy, because “the object that it represents
remains throughout the same single one, whether we think the additions
or not” (*ibid.* 51). Thus, in the idea “this
red”, the part “red” does nothing to narrow the
extension; the remaining part, “this”, is simple and,
being singular, is an intuition.

As a consequence, concepts may be singular, but complex (e.g., “God”, “7”), or simple, but either objectless or general (i.e., having no object at all or more than one) (“round square” has no object, “proposition” has infinitely many objects). Proper names, which can be expressed by means of definite descriptions, always designate mixed ideas; the intuitions present in the idea “Socrates”, for example, might represent the sounds of which the name is composed.

Propositions containing only pure concepts are called conceptual
propositions; those containing intuitions are called empirical
propositions. This classification of propositions, founded only on the
structural properties of ideas, is the logical counterpart of Kant’s
distinction between *a priori* and *a posteriori*
judgments, which is relative to the origin of the ideas that occur in
them and is defined in subjective terms
(*TS* II,
§§133, 306).

### 5.6 Extensional relations between ideas: the logic of classes

Of the two main parts of Bolzano’s formal logic, the extensional
logic of ideas (the logic of classes) and the extensional logic of
propositions, the first part comes from a long tradition beginning
with Boethius (and derived from Aristotelian syllogistic) and
ending — in Bolzano’s times — with Gergonne. Bolzano did not
take his logic of ideas from Gergonne or Euler, the most influential
authors in their time, but rather from a small booklet *Outline of
Logic* (*Grundriss
der Logik*) by a now completely forgotten logician, J.G.E. Maass,
published in 1793.

Bolzano’s fundamental schema of extensional relations between ideas
can already be found in Maass’ *Logic*. Bolzano made some
modifications and generalized it to relations between classes of ideas
and also to relations between empty (objectless) ideas. This last
generalization is important for Bolzano’s propositional logic: the
relations between empty ideas are defined by means of the method of
variation that appears here for the first time in the *TS*.

Bolzano defined a system of relations between the extensions of
ideas. The first relations he defines are compatibility
[*Verträglichkeit*] and its negation, incompatibility.
Two ideas *A* and *B* are compatible if they have
(represent) at least one object in common, i.e., if at least one
object falls under both *A* and *B*. In the case in which
not only some but all objects represented by *A* are also
represented by *B*, *A* is included in *B*. If this
relation is reciprocal, i.e., if *A* is included in *B*
and *B* included in *A*, the ideas *A* and *B* are
equivalent (coextensive). Further, we have two special cases: proper
compatibility, i.e., compatibility where neither *A* is included
in *B*, nor *B* in *A*; this relation is called by
Bolzano overlapping or linking [*Verschlungenheit oder
Verkettung*]. Another is subordination [*Unterordnung*]
which is proper inclusion, without reciprocity.

The negative cases give rise to three kinds of incompatibility:
exclusion (omnilateral incompatibility), contradiction and contrariety
(incompatibility without contradiction). Exclusion
[*Ausschliessung*] differs from incompatibility only in
comparing three or more ideas or collections of ideas: the
ideas *A*, *B*, *C*, … exclude each other if
they are incompatible and if not even two of them are compatible with
each other. The ideas *A* and *B* are contradictory if *B* "will have an extension that includes everything that does not stand under the idea *A*" (*TS* II, §103, 477), i.e. if *B* is equivalent to *not-A*. Contrary to Bolzano, who defines contradiction only for objectual ideas whose extension is not of the greatest extent, I simplify his system admitting also universal ideas such as “something in general” [*Etwas überhaupt*], objectless ideas and their extensions (for Bolzano, objectless ideas have no extension).

As all these relations are derived from compatibility and its negation, it is possible to represent both the relations between ideas and those between propositions in the form of a genealogical tree (see Šebestik 1992: 174 and 238). Here are only the definitions of the most important of them for pairs of objectual ideas, written in our symbolic language.

\(A \textrm{ is } \textit{compatible} \textrm{ with } B \) | \( =_{\textrm{df}} \) | \(\ext A \cap \ext B \not= \emptyset\) |

\(A \textrm{ is }\textit{incompatible}\textrm{ with } B\) | \(=_{\textrm{df}}\) | \(\ext A \cap \ext B = \emptyset\) |

\(A\textrm{ is }\textit{included}\textrm{ in } B\) | \(=_{\textrm{df}}\) | \(A\) is compatible with \(B\) and \(\ext A \subset \ext B\) |

\(A\textrm{ is }\textit{contradictory}\textrm{ with } B\) | \(=_{\textrm{df}}\) | \(A\) is incompatible with \(B\) and \( \ext A \cup \ext B = \textrm{universal class}\) |

\(A\textrm{ is }\textit{equivalent}\textrm{ to }B\) | \(=_{\textrm{df}}\) | \(A\) is included in \(B\) and \(B\) is included in \(A\) |

\(A\) is contrary to \(B\) |
\(=_{\textrm{df}}\) | \(A\) and \(B\) are incompatible but not contradictory. |

## 6. The method of variation

### 6.1 Propositions and propositional forms

Bolzano’s logic of extensional relations between propositions represents a major innovation which has no equivalent in traditional logic. It is based on what is called the method of variation. Its fundamental concepts are defined by means of propositional or rather sentential forms.

The method of variation consists in the substitution of appropriate
ideas for variables at the places indicated by some sentential form
and the examination of the truth values of the resulting
propositions. According to Bolzano, logical relations imply some
variation in the propositions which they connect. The sentential form
[*Satzform*] is a linguistic expression obtained from a
proposition, or rather from a sentence which expresses it, by
considering some of its parts variable.

This characteristic Bolzanian concept has, so to speak, two faces.
Sometimes, Bolzano expresses it by means of letters: “*A*
has [the property] *b*” or “*A*
is *B*”. But very often, he simply writes “Caius has
wisdom and in this proposition, the idea *Caius* is
variable”. These two ways of writing correspond to two different
levels. On the first, linguistic level, we deal with proper sentential
forms, i.e., with expressions containing variables, which become
sentences (and express propositions) after appropriate substitutions
are made. When we write sentential forms, we do not write incomplete
propositions, because there are no such entities. We write only
“*satzähnliche Verbindungen*”, combinations of
signs which resemble propositions. The second level is the level of
propositions and ideas in themselves, the level of meaning. Here,
Bolzano cannot use variables, letters or other indeterminate signs.
In the realm of the propositions and ideas in themselves, there are no
indeterminate entities that would correspond to sentential forms;
there are only propositions, true or false. This might be the reason
for Bolzano’s cumbersome way of speaking about “the
idea *Caius* considered variable”. For Bolzano, the use
of genuine sentential forms is just a convenient linguistic procedure
yielding results which can be interpreted in terms of propositions.
Speaking of substitutions in sentential forms is then nothing more
than a *façon de parler* about atemporal relations
between species of propositions. Bolzano’s loose manner of speaking
about substitutions of ideas in a sentential form instead of speaking
about their linguistic expressions is adopted in what follows. To
consider one or several ideas in a given proposition variable means to
take the class of all propositions which have the same structure and
contain the same ideas except at places occupied by the
“variable ideas”. This is the sense of Bolzano’s
identification of a propositional form with a species or class of
propositions, proposed already in the *Contributions* in 1810,
and confirmed by several passages of the *TS*. A sentential
form, or equivalently the corresponding proposition “in which
certain ideas are considered variable”, can generate a whole
class of propositions if appropriate ideas are substituted for the
variable ideas. A proposition which results from such a substitution
performed on the given proposition (on the given sentential form) is
called a *variant*. As in the case of mathematical functions,
Bolzano insists that speaking about variation is only metaphorical.
There is no actual variation, no change in time, only atemporal
relations between a proposition, the class of ideas admitted for
substitution, and the class of propositions resulting from the
successive substitutions. Simultaneous substitutions for several
“variable ideas” in the same proposition also have their
place in Bolzano’s logic.

Which ideas are admitted for variation? Siebel thinks that

in Bolzano, the variable and the constant ideas may come from the logical domain as well as from the non-logical domain. (1996: 195)

If, however, we take into account Bolzano’s *practice*, we
notice that Bolzano *never* varies logical and mathematical
ideas other than ideas of numbers and quantities, although he never
forbids it (one could for instance conceive of the variation of some
propositional connectives, others staying constant).

Another critical point of Bolzano’s theory requires elucidation: the notion of “appropriate” substitution (substitution of appropriate ideas). Bolzano’s only explicit criterion is the objectual character of the resulting proposition (i.e., the objectuality of its subject-idea). Some other constraints are needed in his logic of probability: the set of ideas admitted for substitution in a proposition must contain only non-equivalent ideas.

The ideas admitted for substitution cannot transform an objectual proposition into an empty (non-objectual) one. In the proposition “the man Caius is mortal”, I may substitute “Sempronius”, “Titus”, etc. for “Caius” and obtain true propositions.

On the other hand, if we take some other idea, e.g., “rose” or “triangle”, then the proposition that emerges not only has no truth, it does not even have objectuality, (

TSII: §147, 79; Bolzano 1973: 189)

because their subject-ideas “the man rose” and “the man triangle” are empty. If we begin with the proposition “Caius is mortal”, by contrast, the substitution of “rose” for “Caius” yields an objectual proposition which is moreover true.

Validity and other logical properties and relations are defined only under the assumption of admissible substitutions.

### 6.2 Validity and analyticity

Two concepts prepare the construction of the logical system:
validity and analyticity. When the method of variation is applied to a
proposition, three different cases may arise: either the class of
propositions obtained by substitution contains only true propositions,
or it contains only false propositions, or it contains both true and
false propositions. In the first case, the initial proposition is
called *universally valid* (relative to given variables), in
the second *universally invalid*. Bolzano does not give a name
to the third case; such propositions could be called neutral. Here are
some examples:

The man Caius is mortal

is universally valid relative to the variable idea “Caius” because each appropriate substitution generates a true proposition, or alternatively, because all its objectual variants are true.

The man Caius is omniscient

is universally invalid relative to the same variable idea “Caius”, because all its variants are false.

The same proposition

The man Caius is omniscient

is neutral relative to the variable idea “omniscient”, because some of its variants are true (e.g., the first example quoted) while others are false (the second example).

The degree of validity [*Grad der Gültigkeit*] of a
proposition relative to chosen variables is the ratio of the number
of *true* propositions obtained by variation to the number
of *all* propositions obtained. There may be an infinity of
propositions in either case, but here, constraints on the admissible
substitutions apply and above all, Bolzano only considers propositions
having a finite number of variants. As an example, let us take the
proposition “2, which is a number between 1 and 10, is
prime” and vary 2: its degree of validity is 2/5. The degree of
validity of a proposition is a number from the closed interval
[0,1]. It is 1 for valid propositions, 0 for invalid propositions and
a proper fraction for other propositions.

Properly speaking, Bolzano’s concept of universal validity is not a
logical notion. It depends on specifically chosen variables. To obtain
what we call a logical truth (Bolzano used the term ‘logically
analytic’), he defined another preliminary notion:
analyticity. Bolzano’s analyticity is not our analyticity, and can be
explained as a generalization of his notion of validity (Bolzano’s
term is “universal validity” [*allgemeine
Gültigkeit*]; as this notion is relative to ideas considered
variable, I prefer to use simply the term “validity”).
Valid propositions are those whose variants relative to the given
variables are all true. Analytic propositions are those which contain
at least one variable idea such that the resulting variants are either
all true (analytically true propositions) or all false (analytically
false propositions). Such a definition implies a very broad conception
of analyticity, as is shown by the following example:

A morally evil man enjoys eternal happiness.

It is analytically false, because it contains the idea “man” relative to which all the variants are false.

Beside its own merits (mathematics is full of such propositions),
this kind of analyticity is an intermediate step towards logical
analyticity. After quoting such examples as “*A*
is *A*”, “*A* which is *B*
is *A*”, “Every object is *B* or
not *B*”, Bolzano also defines logically analytic
propositions. They are propositions whose only invariable parts are
logical ideas. The logically analytic true propositions are instances
of logical laws.

Bolzano does not give a definition or a list of logical concepts permitting to separate them from non-logical ideas. He simply says

that nothing is necessary for judging the analytic nature of [the previous examples] besides logical knowledge, because the concepts that make up the invariant part of these propositions all belong to logic. (

TSII: §148.3, 84; Bolzano 1973: 193)

Nevertheless, he is aware of the difficulty to separate logical and
non-logical ideas: the “domain of concepts belonging to logic is
not circumscribed to the extent that controversies could not arise at
times” (*ibid.*). The main problems arise from the
confrontation of Bolzano’s definition with his examples. He declares
some of them analytic by means of problematic definitions (example:
“every effect has a cause”). The examples of §447 are
analytically true: “the soul of Socrates is a simple
substance” (the variable idea being “Socrates”),
“the angles of an equilateral triangle make altogether two right
angles” (analytic with the variable idea
“equilateral”), “if \(a^2/2=b\), then \(a = \pm
\sqrt{2b}\)” (the variable idea is “2”), but the
general truths from which they follow are synthetic: “every soul
is a simple substance” (even though a soul is defined as a kind
of simple substance), “the angles of each triangle make
altogether two right angles”, “if \(a^2/c = b\), then \(a
= \pm\sqrt{cb}\)”.

The construction of the system is based on the method of variation: the different logical relations between propositions or classes of propositions are defined by means of relations between classes of their true variants. As in the case of validity, these relations are first defined relative to given variables; afterwards, in some particularly important cases such as deducibility, Bolzano defines them in an absolute way, i.e., relative to all non-logical ideas.

Bolzano’s system of extensional propositional logic is closely connected with his extensional logic of ideas. In most cases, the same terminology is used for relations between ideas as for relations between propositions: this is the case for compatibility, subordination, equivalence, exclusion, contradiction, contrariety and others. Moreover, in a crucial passage, Bolzano sets up a correspondence between the truth values of propositions and the objectuality and emptiness of ideas:

With ideas, the crucial question was whether or not a certain object is indeed represented by them; the corresponding question for propositions is whether or not they are true. Just as I have called ideas compatible or incompatible with each other, depending on whether or not they have certain objects in common, so I call propositions compatible or incompatible, depending on whether or not there are certain ideas which make all of them true. (

TSII: §154, 101; Bolzano 1973: 198–199)

How are extensional relations between propositions obtained from
those between ideas? In order to transfer the relations between ideas
to propositions, Bolzano has to resort to the method of variation: to
the *referring relation* between an idea and its object will
then correspond the *verifying relation* between an idea and a
propositional form (or, in the fundamental idiom, between one or more
ideas and a proposition in which one or more ideas are considered
variable).

Now Bolzano can define compatibility for propositions in complete
analogy with compatibility for ideas: The
propositions *A*, *B*, *C*, *D*, … are all
mutually compatible with respect to the variable
ideas *i*, *j*, … common to all of them if there is a
sequence of ideas which, substituted for the
variables *i*, *j*, …, makes all these propositions
true (*ibid.*). To the existence (or non-existence) of an object
represented by each of the compatible (or incompatible) ideas
corresponds the existence (or non-existence) of an idea or a sequence
of ideas which make each of the compatible (or incompatible)
propositions true.

The examples quoted by Bolzano suggest a simplification of the
correspondence between ideas and propositions by applying a concept
used by Bolzano on several occasions, though not systematically: the
concept of the *system of ideas whose substitution for i,
j…, makes all of A, B, C, D… true*
(“*Inbegriff von Vorstellungen, welche die Sätze A, B,
C, D, … wahr machen*”; *TS* II: §155,
114, 122, and §156, 133). More precisely, such a system of
verifying ideas \(\mathbf{VA}(\mathbf{i})\) for the sentential forms
\(\mathbf{A}(\mathbf{i}) = (A(i, j, \ldots), B(i, j, \ldots), C(i, j,
\ldots), \ldots)\) is the set of the sequences of ideas that make the
sentential forms \(\mathbf{A}(\mathbf{i})\) true (bold letters
represent sets or sequences, ordinary letters single predicates or
variables). Two examples: the system of verifying ideas for the
proposition *A* “Caesar was a good citizen”,
relative to the variable “Caesar”, is \(\mathbf{V}A\)
(Caesar) = {Socrates, Aristeides, …}. Such a system for the
proposition “Romeo loves Juliet” or, alternatively, for
the sentential form “Loves (*i*, *j*)” is
\(\mathbf{V}L(i, j) = \{\langle\)Othello, Desdemona\(\rangle,
\langle\)Romeo, Juliet\(\rangle, \langle\)Juliet, Romeo\(\rangle,
\langle\)Goethe, Lotte\(\rangle, \ldots\}\).

Bolzano’s examples of compatible propositions are like the
following: let *A* be “a lion is a
mammal”, *B* “a lion has two
wings”. Then *A* and *B* are compatible with
respect to the variable idea “lion”. There is indeed an
idea which makes both *A* and *B* true; the system of
verifying ideas of *A* and the system of verifying ideas
of *B* contain both the idea “bat”:

**V***A*(lion) = {man, dog, lion, bat, …},

**V***B*(lion) = {swallow, eagle, bat, …}

In this example, the two propositions are compatible because the same idea “bat” makes both true. Bolzano’s compatibility is our simultaneous realizability or satisfiability.

Now it is possible to propose the following definition of
compatible propositions: Two propositions *A* and *B*
are *compatible* if their systems of verifying ideas are
compatible in the sense of the logic of classes:

*A*(**i**) and *B*(**i**) are compatible if
\(\mathbf{V} A(\mathbf{i}) \cap
\mathbf{V}B(\mathbf{i}) \not= \emptyset\).

All extensional logical relations between propositions can now be
constructed by means of elementary set-theoretical relations between
their systems of verifying ideas. The result is a genealogical tree
whose fundamental structure is exactly the same as the structure of
the tree representing the relations between ideas. In order to stress
the correspondence between ideas and propositions Bolzano uses the
same terms (except deducibility) for the relations between ideas and
those between propositions. As before, **i** is the
sequence of variable ideas
(*i*, *j*…); **A**(**i**)
=
(*A*(**i**), *B*(**i**), *C*(**i**),
…); **M**(**i**) =
(*M*(**i**), *N*(**i**), *O*(**i**),
…). In the following definitions, variables are omitted; the
reader may supply them or may consider the defined relations as
logical relations *strict sense*, all non-logical terms being
taken as variables; the systems of verifying ideas have to be adapted
accordingly. As in the case of the logic of classes, Bolzano
constructed the complete system of extensional relations between
propositions; here only the most important ones are given.

**A** is compatible with **M**

\((\mathbf{VA} \cap \mathbf{VM} \not= \emptyset)\)

**M** is deducible [*ableitbar*]
from **A**

(the sets of
propositions **A** and **M** are compatible
and \(\mathbf{VA} \subset \mathbf{VM}\))

**A** is equivalent to **M**

(**A** is deducible from **M**
and **M** is deducible from **A**, i.e.,
\(\mathbf{VA} = \mathbf{VM}\))

**A** is incompatible with **M**

\((\mathbf{VA} \cap \mathbf{VM} = \emptyset)\)

**A** and **M** are contradictory

(\(\neg\mathbf{A}\) is equivalent to **M**
and **A** equivalent to \(\neg\mathbf{M}\), i.e.,
\(\mathbf{VA} = \mathbf{V} \neg\mathbf{M}\) and
\(\mathbf{V}\neg\mathbf{A}= \mathbf{VM}\))

Bolzano’s system of relations between propositions is constructed from the extensional relations between ideas as defined in the Maass-Bolzano logic of classes. The concept of a system of verifying ideas plays a crucial role in the systematic reconstruction of Bolzano’s variation logic.

Both the class-logical relations and the relations between
propositions are constructed from the initial relation of
compatibility by adding specific conditions to previously defined
relations. Compatibility is thus the basic relation of Bolzano’s
extensional logic. It is embedded in the very foundations of his
system and all other relations (with the exception of different cases
of disjunction, *TS* II, §160), deducibility included, are special cases
of it.

### 6.3 Deducibility

Bolzano considered the relation of deducibility “the most important concept of logic”.

One especially noteworthy case occurs, however, if not just some, but

allof the ideas that, when substituted fori,j,… inA,B,C, … make all these true, also make all ofM,N,O, …. true […] with respect to the variable partsi,j, …. (Bolzano 2004: 54)

Note that Bolzano’s definition, in agreement with Aristotle but contrary to the modern concept of logical consequence, requires compatibility.

For Bolzano, it is impossible to deduce anything from contradictory premises (see Berg 1962 and 1992: 82); in particular, nothing follows from the premise \(A\not=A\). It is nevertheless possible to deduce from false non-contradictory premises.

In the general case, Bolzano’s deducibility is a triadic relation between the premises, the conclusion and the variable ideas. Our logic focuses immediately on the variation of all and only non-logical elements, but Bolzano’s concept is very useful allowing one to make deductions in a domain whose non-logical concepts are not submitted to variation.

Let us examine some examples:

The relation of deducibility in the *general* sense holds
between the premise:

“Leipzig is north of Dresden (both places being in the northern hemisphere)”

and the conclusion:

“In winter, the days are shorter in Leipzig than in Dresden”.

Such a deduction works with two variable ideas, “Leipzig” and “Dresden”, and depends also on astronomical knowledge.

The next example shows *logical* deducibility where the only
invariable ideas are logical concepts:

All A are B |

It is false that all not-C are not-A |

It is false that all C are not-B |

Notice that Bolzano uses the predicate “it is false that” as a synonym for the logical particle “not”. He has no concept of metalanguage and in the same sentence or formula may appear concepts that we would qualify as belonging to metalanguage. This distinction is immaterial for singular sentences, but it becomes relevant for sequences of propositions:

when it comes to propositional sequences of more than one term, we have to distinguish between False(S) and non-S. (Berg 1962: 134; see also p. 138).

Bolzano’s adherence to Aristotelian tradition has some slight
drawbacks. The requirement that the premises be compatible complicates
some inferences. Against Herbart and Fries, Bolzano thinks that
contraposition requires a supplementary premise: From
“all *X* are *Y*”, it is possible to deduce
“all not-*Y* are not-*X*” only if we add as
premise “the idea not-*Y* is not empty”.

### 6.4 Bolzano’s deducibility and Tarski’s logical consequence

Tarski’s concept of logical consequence is close to Bolzano’s
logical deducibility. Tarski’s first formulation in terms of
substitution is even simply a paraphrase of Bolzano’s
definition. Tarski speaks about the replacement of all non-logical
constants by any other constants in the sentences of the class
\(\mathbf{K}\) and in the sentence *X*, the result of these
replacements being \(\mathbf{K}'\) and \(X'\), and states that
“the sentence \(X'\) must be true provided only that all
sentences of the class \(\mathbf{K}'\) are true” (Tarski
1936 [1983]: 415). This preliminary formulation must, however, be
abandoned, if “the language we are dealing with does not
posses a sufficient stock of extra-logical constants”
(*ibid.*). Bolzano escapes this objection, because his
logic deals with ideas in themselves and not with linguistic
expressions, and because he assumes that for every object there is
an idea that represents it (the difficulties involved with this
assumption were discussed in detail by Simons (1987: 42) and Siebel
(1996: 216–223); briefly, the
price for this hypothesis seems too high for a contemporary
logician). Tarski, who did not make Bolzano’s assumption with
respect to languages, stated his definitive formulation in terms
of models, or the satisfaction of sentential functions by
sequences of objects.

There are three main differences between Bolzano’s and Tarski’s concepts.

- Tarski defined logical consequence for formalized languages, while Bolzano’s deducibility holds for propositions and ideas in themselves expressed in natural language. According to Berg (1973: 21), “this difference is of vital importance for the study of the relationship between consequence and other logical notions”, which resulted e.g., in the equivalence between logical consequence and syntactic derivability in first order logic and, in general, the separation of syntax and semantics. Nevertheless, fundamentally, Bolzano’s deducibility is a semantic notion because it operates with the idea of “making true a propositional form”. Above all, slightly modified, Bolzano’s relevant theorems remain true in Tarski’s system.
- Tarski, as other authors before him, rejected the condition of compatibility of the premises. It is precisely this condition which makes Bolzano’s system cumbersome and more complicated than ours. We shall see that this condition was essential for Bolzano’s concept of probability and for the link between deductive and inductive logic.
- Bolzano’s method of variation operates within
*one*universe, while in modern semantics, we generalize both over interpretations and domains (Berg 1973: 21).

Marc Siebel tried to show that “the resemblances between
Bolzanian deducibility and Tarski’s logical consequence are quite
limited (*sehr gering*)” (1996: 185–223),
considering the distance that separates Bolzano’s and Tarski’s
concepts. I agree with Siebel that it is a question of appraisal
(*eine Ermessungsfrage*). If we take into account not the
initial Bolzanian concept of deducibility relative to given variable
ideas, but logical derivability, and either adapt or cancel the
requirement of consistency of the premises, the distance seems rather
short. For me, the main reasons for thinking the two conceptions to be
quite similar are the facts that in all logical literature between
Bolzano and Tarski (with the possible exception of Carnap), we cannot
find anything else so close to Tarski, and that many of Bolzano’s
theorems about deducibility may be easily translated into Tarski’s
idiom and remain true.

### 6.5 Exact deducibility

Bolzano tried to refine the concept of deducibility by adapting it
to the then-current inferential practices in science. The result is
the concept of *exact* or strict, adequate,
irredundant *deducibility* (*genaue, genau bemessene
Ableitbarkeit*) or deducibility in the narrower sense, where there
are no idle elements. The proposition *M* is *exactly
deducible* from the premises *A*, *B*, *C*,
… if *M* is deducible from those premises and
“when the same does not hold for any part of the [set of]
propositions *A*, *B*, *C*, …” and
(Bolzano 2004a: 54) “we cannot leave out a single constituent of
the first two propositions, let alone an entire
proposition”. (*TS* II: §155.26, 2, 123; Bolzano
1973: 213). Bolzano proves that the premises of an exact inference are
independent and one can prove that in cases of exact deducibility, the
premises and the conclusion must share at least one variable (see
George 1983). A deduction which is not exact is
called *redundant* (*überfüllt*). In exact
deducibility the conclusion cannot be deduced from any proper subset
of the premises. The syllogism *Barbara* (i.e., All *A*
are *B*, All *B* are *C*, so All *A*
are *C*) is an exact deduction, while the deduction of
“Some *B* are *A*” from the same two
premises is redundant. Exact deducibility requires that *all*
the premises and *all* the ideas contained in them are
necessary to draw the conclusion; this condition is the translation
into logical terms of the condition of analytic proofs. Propositions
of degree 0 or 1 (e.g., universally invalid or universally valid
propositions) are excluded both from the premises and the
conclusion. Bolzano’s exact deducibility thus anticipates the logic of
relevance of Anderson and Belnap (1975) in certain respects.

### 6.6 Some theorems

- Deducibility is asymmetrical and transitive, but because of the condition of compatibility of premises, it is reflexive only for compatible propositions;
- from
**A**, a class of compatible premises, it is possible to deduce \(\neg M\) iff**A**is incompatible with*M*; - if one can deduce
**M**from**A**,**X**as well as from**A**, \(\neg\mathbf{X}\), one can deduce**M**from**A**alone; - contraposition, if the degree of validity of the premise and the conclusion are neither 1 nor 0;
- if all propositions deducible from the premises
**A**are true,**A**is true; - a case of Gentzen’s cut-rule:
if from
**A**, one can deduce**M**and from**M**,**R**, one can deduce**X**, then from**A**,**R**one can deduce**X**; - deduction theorem (
*TS*II: §224.2, p. 396; Bolzano 1973: 297):

If the inference:*A*,*B*,*C*,*E*,*F*,*G*, …*M*,*N*,*O*, …is valid, then so is:

*A*,*B*,*C*, …if *E*,*F*,*G,*… are true, then*M*,*N*,*O*, … are also true.

### 6.7 Deducibility and probability

One of the main reasons why Bolzano’s notion of deducibility
presupposes the compatibility of the premises is that it renders
possible the extension of deductive logic to inductive logic via
probability. He defines the *conditional probability* (or
relative validity) of a proposition *M*(**i**)
with respect to a class of premises or
hypotheses **A**(**i**) and
variables **i**, as the ratio of the number of cases in
which all the propositions of the class as well
as *M*(**i**) are true to the number of cases in
which only the propositions **A**(**i**) are
all true. In other words, it is the ratio of the number of true
variants of **A**(**i**)
and *M*(**i**) to the number of true variants
of **A**(**i**). (As with the concept of
degree of validity, Bolzano’s definition applies only if the number of
variants is finite.) As a consequence, the probability
of *M*(**i**) relative
to **A**(**i**) is a fraction in the closed
interval [0,1]. Bolzano’s conditional probability is objective, *an
sich*. In probability inferences, only one idea from each
collection of equivalent (coextensive) ideas is admitted for
substitutions, because if for each variable idea we admit ideas
equivalent to it, “the totality of the true as well as false
propositions which can be generated from a given proposition will be
infinitely large” (*TS* II: §147, 79; Bolzano 1973:
189), and the probability relation might not be well determined.

One can immediately see why the premises of a probable deduction
must be compatible: the probability of *M*(**i**)
is defined only if the denominator of the fraction is not zero, which
means that the premises **A**(**i**) are
compatible. On the other hand, the number of ideas that make
both **A**(**i**)
and *M*(**i**) true cannot be greater than the
number of ideas that make true *M*(**i**); as a
consequence, the conditional probability
of *M*(**i**) cannot be greater than 1. It is 1
exactly when the number of ideas that make true
both **A**(**i**)
and *M*(**i**) is equal to the number of ideas
that make true **A**(**i**) alone, which
means that all substitutions of ideas that make
true **A**(**i**) also make
true *M*(**i**), i.e.,
if *M*(**i**) is *deducible*
from **A**(**i**). In other words,
if *M*(**i**) is deducible
from **A**(**i**), its probability relative
to **A**(**i**) is equal to 1, which means
that the probability equals certainty. The probability is zero if no
ideas make both **A**(**i**)
and *M*(**i**) true, i.e.,
if **A**(**i**)
and *M*(**i**) are incompatible. Incompatibility
and certainty are thus two extreme cases of probability with values of
0 and 1.

This is an extraordinary achievement. Bolzano’s approach yields the
first logical definition of probability. For the first time deductive
logic and inductive logic are united in a global theory and the former
appears as a limit case of the latter. It is possible that in
his *Tractatus* 5.15, Wittgenstein took over Bolzano’s
treatment of probability, perhaps through the mediation of the 1st
edition of the *Philosophical Propedeutic* of R. Zimmermann
(1853). Carnap’s regular confirmation functions, too, are strongly
reminiscent of Bolzano’s approach.

Bolzano adds proofs of some standard theorems, and also defines subjective probability and different important probabilistic notions such as the degree of confidence, the credibility of a witness, etc. He gives the formula of the degree of credibility of an event reported by independent testimonies as a function of the number of witnesses, of the number of testimonies, and of the number of true and false propositions stated by each witness. All these concepts play an important role in the chapter “on the nature of historical knowledge, particularly concerning miracles” in Bolzano 1834.

## 7. The objective connection among truths: grounding (*Abfolge*)

The idea of a reform of logic already appeared in 1810 under the
heading “objective connection among truths” in
the *Contributions*. Developed in the *TS*, it
represents the last stage of the development of formal logic in
Bolzano and at the same time the first modern study of axiomatic
systems. Although the logical relations studied in the previous
sections of the *TS* include relations among collections of
truths, they do not take into account the relationship
of *Abfolge* (explained below), which is necessary to transform
a simple collection of truths into a theory.

Bolzano’s idea of an objective order among truths has its origin in
the Aristotelian distinction between proofs of the *fact* and
those that yield the *reason* of the fact. Bolzano’s problem is
that of providing precise criteria for distinguishing the two types of
proofs. Proofs of facts, which Bolzano considers to be simple
subjective proofs or certifications, may, if correct, be used in
science, but they are not explanatory, for they do not capture the
objective connections among truths. The goal of a science is to order
its theorems according their relations of objective dependence, to
ground such theorems objectively in previous theorems and eventually
in axioms. Objective proofs are assumed to be explanatory and Bolzano
calls them grounding proofs [*Begründungen*].

Are *indirect proofs* (apagogical, proofs by reduction to
absurdity) explanatory? Bolzano definitely preferred direct proofs,
because in indirect proofs the “false conclusion could never
have been produced if all the premises from which we derive it were
true” (Bolzano 2004a: 78). Hafner (1999: 387) showed that
Bolzano’s objections to indirect proofs were not related to the
compatibility requirement or the concept of deducibility, but only to
the concept of grounding, which requires true premises.

At several places both in the

Wissenschaftslehreand in theEinleitung zur Grössenlehre[=On the Mathematical Method, Bolzano 2004] Bolzano urges that—whenever possible—we put forwardgroundingproofs and don’t contend ourselves with proofs yielding merely certainty. In other words, he demands that we always aim at proofs that represent a genuineAbfolgerelation between propositions (Hafner 1999: 392).

According to Hafner, Bolzano prefers direct proofs for two reasons:
(1) indirect proofs proceed by a detour [*Umweg*] and contain
redundant premises, (2) indirect proofs always contain a false premise
which cannot be admitted as the ground of other truths. Bolzano thinks
that indirect proofs can be transformed into direct proofs through the
simplification of the false propositions contained in
them. Nevertheless, for pragmatic reasons, namely the simplicity of
expression, in his *Theory of Magnitudes*
[*Grössenlehre*, see bibliography], he also sometimes
accepts “here and there” indirect proofs as (approximate)
groundings.

Bolzano calls the ground-consequence relation *Abfolge*
(translated as “consequence” or “entailment”,
more recently as *grounding*; I shall take *grounding
relation* and *ground-consequence* [*Grund und
Folge*] *relation* as synonyms: *Abfolge*
= *Grund und Folge Verhältnis*). It must not be confused
with the purely logical relation of deducibility. It has no exact
equivalent in our logic because it is a “material”
relation in the sense that it depends on the “particular
character of ideas” that occur in it (*TS* II: §200,
348). The notion of grounding is central to Bolzano’s theory; however,
Bolzano acknowledges that his analysis of grounding is incomplete and
tentative, merely a first attempt to circumscribe the new
concept. “Almost everything I advance in this part is tinged
with uncertainty, on many topics I have not reached any decision, and
at best my inquiries are only fragments and suggestions which will
have attained their goal if they provide others with the stimulus to
reflect further on these matters” (*TS* II: §195,
327–8). For a recent exhaustive analysis of the notion
of *grounding*, see Roski 2014, one of the best pieces of
Bolzano literature.

According to Bolzano, the *ground-consequence* relation
holds only between truths, not between propositions in general. He has
no definite answer as to whether the relation is simple or
definable. He tries to characterize it implicitly by its properties
expressed in a series of theorems. In order to obtain a general
concept valid for all disciplines, he takes examples from various
sciences: metaphysics, morals, physics, mathematics, and
logic. Despite his initial conjecture that the ground-consequence
relation might be simple and thus undefinable, at the end of his
investigation, he conjectures that grounding might well be a formal
relation definable in terms of deducibility in an axiomatic
system.

The grounding relation holds between a set of truths and their
immediate consequences. “There is only one [grounding] for each
truth, because the objective ground can only be a single ground”
(*TS* IV: §528, 266). If a truth is the consequence of
several truths, they constitute its total ground while each true
premise is a partial ground.

Bolzano begins by comparing the grounding relation to deducibility
and causality. Contrary to grounding, deducibility can hold also
between false propositions. It can be reciprocal (equivalence) and it
is transitive and reflexive for propositions of degree of validity
\(\not= 0\). Moreover, deducibility presupposes the notions of
sentential form and of variable. On the other hand, grounding is
neither reflexive nor transitive; it is anti-symmetrical and (in some
cases at least) connects truths independently of all variation. The
two relations are compatible, however: the same proposition may be at
the same time deduced from and grounded in its premise. Hence there
are two kinds of grounding: *formal* grounding that is at the
same time deducibility and *material* grounding that holds
without deducibility.

Mechanics, particularly the theorem of the composition of forces
(see Bolzano 1842), yields a causal model of grounding. It is
causality that confers the particular character on the grounding
relation but eventually, causality is absorbed by it. Finally, for
Bolzano, the proposition “*A* is the cause
of *B*” means that the proposition “*A*
exists” contains the ground of the proposition “*B*
exists”. As causality holds only between actual things, it is
reduced to propositions about the grounding relation between real
objects.

Let us take an example. The propositions “it is warmer in
summer than in winter” and “the thermometer stands higher
in summer than in winter” are equivalent (one is deducible from
the other) relative to the variables “summer” and
“winter”, but “only the latter can be considered as
a consequence of the former”
(*TS* II:
§162, 192; Bolzano 1973: 256).

The different examples Bolzano considers show the difficulty if not the impossibility of constructing a general concept of grounding which is valid for all disciplines. The situation is different in purely conceptual sciences. If we take the following example:

Socrates was Athenian |

Socrates was a philosopher |

Socrates was Athenian and a philosopher, |

we have a grounding relation, because the premises are simpler than
the conclusion. Bolzano invokes the same argument against Euclid’s
parallel postulate, which is a proposition too complex to merit the
title of axiom or ground and should be replaced by the principle of
similarity. The Socrates example relates to the simple/complex
opposition, but in general, simplicity is not a sufficient condition
of the ground. According to the *Contributions*, all axioms
have simple subject- and predicate-concepts, although, conversely, a
proposition containing only simple concepts is not necessarily an
axiom; no such criterion is present in the *TS* (perhaps he
knew better by then). Thence, simplicity would be the primary but not
exclusive principle ordering axiomatic theories. The binomial theorem
\((1 + x)^n\) with an imaginary or real exponent is more general than
with a positive integral exponent, but the former is considerably more
complex and cannot be considered an objective ground of the latter
which should be demonstrated first. In other examples taken from
geometry the general theorem has priority. In his *Purely
analytical proof* (1817), too, Bolzano proves first the general
theorem for two continuous functions (Bolzano 2004b: §15, 274)
and only in §18 (p. 276–7) for one continuous function. In
these cases, Bolzano puts forward the argument of the greater
generality of the grounds relative to their consequences, even though
the consequences are simpler.

The grounding relation in the purely conceptual sciences has the following properties:

- Only truths may be related by the ground-consequence relation.
- The grounding relation is irreflexive and anti-symmetrical.
- The complete ground may consist of one or several truths (each of them is called a partial ground), while the complete consequence contains always several truths (partial consequences).
- No conceptual truth can be grounded in an empirical truth, but a conceptual truth may be a partial ground of an empirical one.
- The grounds are more general than their consequences, where generality is understood in terms of broader extension of the subject or of the predicate.
- Often but not always, the grounding relation induces an order among theorems according to the degree of complexity (the number of simple concepts occurring in a truth).
- “The simpler truth must be stated in advance of the more complex and, where there is an equal complexity, the more general must always be stated before the more particular” (Bolzano 2004a: 79). This property, too, admits exceptions.
- In case of conflict between the criterion of simplicity and that of generality, simplicity is prior to generality.
- The search for the grounds of a truth ends with basic truths (= axioms).

Bolzano distinguishes between *principles* of a
science, *Grundsätze*, which may be demonstrated in
another science, and *basic* truths, *Grundwahrheiten*,
which have no ground and are true axioms. With Bolzano, the status of
axioms changes: instead of being evident, objects of intuition, they
become the starting points of proofs in a deductive theory. Sometimes
even the evidence of theorems is superior to that of axioms, but even
evident theorems need a proof. The role of proofs, too, is
transformed: they have not only to provide subjective certainty, but
above all to integrate the theorems into the whole conceptual system.
The crucial elements of science are proofs exhibiting the objective
connection among truths. In the *TS* we also witness the
appearance, for the first time in the history of logic, of proof
trees, i.e., diagrams showing the dependence of theorems on their
grounds, axioms and auxiliary truths.

For Bolzano, a grounding agument should also be explanatory. So it is, if

it contains the most general premises from which the conclusion is deducible (each of these premises may be less general than the conclusion, though). (Roski 2014: 370)

Roski’s maint point is to analyse the principles of formal grounding, i.e., the relations between grounding and deducibility. He prefers to read them

as partial answers to the question under what conditions a deductive argument is explanatory […] On what I took to be the most charitable reading of them, Bolzano’s principles essentially boil down to the claim that a logically valid argument is explanatory,

only ifthere is no argument with fewer premises, for none of the premises there is a logically equivalent proposition that is simpler, and none of the premises is more complexe than the conclusion.[…] These principles, I have maintained, can be considered to be an explication of the idea that every premise and every concept in an explanatory argument is deductively relevant. More importantly, they can be considered to be an explication of the idea that explanation ought to go in hand with some kind of theoretical economy. (ibid.)

Indeed, at the end of his enquiry, Bolzano considers a set of propositions that may be both demonstrated from and grounded in given axioms. He thinks that from the point of view of pure deduction, not taking grounding into account, there are several possible partitions of such a set into theorems and initial hypotheses. Is not one of these partitions privileged by the grounding relation?

It results from the condition of simplicity that

the number of propositions which we must accept outright (i.e., without deduction from others) will be the smallest if we arrange the propositions according to their objective connection. (

TSII: §221, 386; Bolzano 1973: 260)

In other words, the ratio between the theorems and the hypotheses is the greatest when we separate them according to the objective connection among truths.

Pursuing this line of thought, Bolzano finally arrives at a possible definition of the grounding relation in terms of the whole axiomatic system:

I occasionally doubt whether the concept of ground and consequence, which I have above claimed to be simple, is not complex after all; it may turn out to be none other than the concept of an ordering of truths which allows us to deduce from the smallest number of simple premises the largest possible number of the remaining truths as conclusions. (

TSII: §221, 388 note; Bolzano 1973: 292)

Some conclusions may be drawn from this passage (even if Bolzano did not draw them). The notion of a basic truth would have to be transformed: a basic truth would now be one that belongs to a minimal set of hypotheses which allows the most efficient deduction of all the other truths of the system. At the same time, instead of being a particular relation between the ground and its consequence, the concept of grounding in deductive sciences should become a property of the whole system of propositions. Grounding, being no more a simple concept and defined in terms of deducibility by the optimal partition between axioms and theorems, becomes a global property of a deductive theory.

Mancosu (1999: 452) pointed out the difficulties of Bolzano’s
conjectural definition. In particular, Bolzano’s geometrical examples
“fail to provide sufficient intuitive evidence for
distinguishing grounds from consequences” (*ibid.*). On
the other hand, the holistic model of the optimal partition provides
simply “an arbitrary axiomatic system with the extra condition
of optimality” (*ibid.*), which, he argues, is irrelevant
for the difference between explanatory and non-explanatory
proofs. Nevertheless, “Bolzano had the great merit of singling
out the problem of mathematical explanation as central to the
philosophy of mathematics” even if “his attempted
solution(s) do not satisfactorily answer the issues he cleverly
raised” (*ibid.*).

## 8. Inferences (*Schlusslehre*)

The theory of inferences, the part IV of the Theory of Elements, is
the *parent pauvre* of research on Bolzano. Only three
important studies treat the subject: Fedorov 1980 (Russian), who
offers five formal systems of the *Schlusslehre*, Berg 1988 and
Berka 1992. Even if Bolzano’s theory does not bring piercing
innovations, it contains nevertheless a systematic presentation of the
most general rules of inference. Though Bolzano lets the reader skip
this entire part because of its dryness, some passages belong to the
best of what Bolzano has written. Thus when he writes about the
difference between *deducibility* in the wide sense, where some
non logical ideas do not vary, and *logical deducibility*,
where *all* non logical ideas are submitted to variation, he
explains it in the following way:

In the first case,

from the proposition “This is a triangle” we may deduce the following proposition “This is a figure the sum of whose angles equals two right angles” (with respect to the idea “this”), and from the proposition “Caius is a man”, we can deduce the proposition “Caius has an immortal soul” (with respect to the idea “Caius”). For whenever we replace the indicated idea by some other idea, the conclusions become true whenever the premises are true. But to realise this, we must know two truths, namely that the sum of the angles in any triangle equals two right angles, and that the souls of all men are immortal. Since these are truths which are not at all concerned with logical matters, i.e., with the nature of concepts and propositions, or rules according to which we must proceed in scientific exposition, nobody will demand that logic should teach deductions of that sort. Hence, what can be expected in this place is only the description of those modes of deduction whose correctness can be shown from logical concepts alone or, what comes to the same thing, which can be expressed in the form of truths, in which nothing is mentioned except concepts, propositions and other logical objects.

So the inference about Caius needs a second premise saying that all men have immortal souls, and two new variable ideas: “man” and “soul”.

To see the correctness of this deduction nothing is required save the knowledge of the general truth that from two propositions of the form “A is B” and “B is C” a third proposition of the form “A is C” is deducible. But we can see this without knowing anything at all about the nature of man, of death, etc. (

TSII: §223, 392.)

The concept of exact (adequate) inference finds its application in
Bolzano’s deductive system: “[i]t would be misguided and
excessive to consider anything here but *exact*
inferences” (*TS* II: §223, 393).
Under the condition of the greatest possible simplicity of the
premises and the conclusion, *all* forms of inference of
the *Schlusslehre* are *formale Abfolgen*, i.e. grounded
inferences. In short, the Theory of inferences (altogether 123 pages)
contains only *logical, exact* and *grounded*
inferences.

As from any proposition one may infer an infinity of them, the system
contains only general rules of inference, not between the
propositions themselves, but between their forms. Bolzano defines
inference not as a conclusion or an act, but as a *statement of
deduction*, so that behind all inference is the relation of
deducibility. When he treats extensional relations among propositions
(compatibility, deducibility, etc.), he never considers the internal
structure of propositions while he does it systematically in his
theory of inference. For easier reading, I shall use the standard
notation *A is B* instead of the Bolzanese expressions *A
has (the property) b* or * Whatever has (the property) a has
(the property) b*; Bolzano himself does it in several
sections. Let us also remind that such universal categorical
propositions have existential import and that a subject-idea of a
true proposition must be objectual. Whole propositions may be subject
to variation, too. Contrary to Aristotle, he admits also objectless
ideas (e.g., the idea *blue virtue* or the idea *x such
that \(x\not =x\)*) and ideas having the greatest extension
(e.g., the idea *something* or the idea *x such that
\(x=x\)*). Sometimes Bolzano uses metalanguage in
prefixing *false* in front of a proposition where we would
simply put a negation.

The condition of objectuality of ideas raises sometimes a problem. As Bolzano does not take into account all possibilities of the logical square (he does not exploit all its diagonals), Fedorov (1980: 120) deems that its limitations

suggest the idea of the syllogistic without the law of excluded middle.[…] For example, we discover that in Bolzano’s logic, the judgments of the form

SePcannot be simply converted.

If we take *No P is S*, i.e., *all P is not-S* and
substitute *round square* for *P*, and the name of any
geometrical object (e.g of a cube), we obtain *All round squares
are non-cubes* and, taking into account the existential import of
universal propositions, *there are round squares which are
non-cubes*, so that *there are round squares*.

### 8.1 The deductive system

For Berka (1992: 142), Bolzano’s theory of inference

represents a relevant contribution to natural deduction, […] although he used it only intuitively. As an introduction to his theory, Bolzano begins with three general rules “on how conclusions to given premises can be found” (

TSII: §224, 395–396):

- Transitivity of the deduction,
- A specific form of the theorem of deduction (see section 6.6),
*Reductio ad absurdum*.

The rules of inference are divided into 13 sections arranged
according to growing complexity. Section I begins with inferences from
one premise, which can be *A is B* or *No A is B*. From
the former, one can obtain following conclusions: *A is
not-not-B*; *if every A is B, then A not-B is
objectless*; *ext B is not contained in ext A*, so
that *B* is higher or equivalent to *A*; contraposition
under the condition that the extension of *B* is neither
universal nor empty, and other. From the latter, e.g., *The
proposition that some A are B is false*.

Other inferences are obtained from the combination of several premises of the previous forms, e.g., the deduction theorem quoted in the section 6.6, and the following:

A is B |

B is A |

A and B are equivalent ideas. |

In §227 Bolzano treats nine Aristotelian modes of syllogism; ten additional modes are treated in §235. Bolzano has less modes, because in Bolzanese several different forms of inferences merge.

In section II Bolzano works with the negations of the previous
forms I (inferences *modo tollente*). An example: from
*(A is B) is false*, one may obtain that *A is
empty* or that *A not-B has objectuality* (is not
empty). Section III treats inferences from the objectuality of an idea
or from its denial, e.g., the inferences from \(\exists xAx\) to
\(\neg\forall x\neg Ax\), and from \(\neg\exists xAx\) to \(\forall
x\neg Ax\). If we combine the proposition: *the idea X which is
not- A + not-B + … has no objectuality*, with
several propositions of the forms:

A is M,B is M, … or instead with the more restricted propositionsXA is M,XB is M, …, we obtain the conclusionEvery X is M.

Other sections deal with *singular ideas* (section IV,
example: if A is a singular idea, not-A has an infinity of objects; in
this section, Bolzano also combines inferences from all forms)
and *general ideas*. Important is the section VI which
contains, under the heading *Determination of the width of an
idea*, the determination of *numbers*. Such is the
inference which from *The totality of A is = n* and *A is
B* concludes to *The totality of B is certainly no less than
n*.

Section VII has as premises extensional relations
between *ideas*, e.g., from *A is included in B*, we
conclude to the equivalence of this premise with *A is B*. The
following sections treat extensional relations
between *propositions* (compatibility, deducibility, etc.) and
the last one, XIII (§253), the relation
of *probability*. Here one finds the following important
theorem:

If the probability of the proposition

Mrelative to the assumptionsA,B,C, … and with respect to the variablesi,j, … is equal tom, then the probability ofnot-Mrelative to the same assumptions and the same variables is equal to 1−m.

### 8.2 Induction

In the same paragraph 253, which concludes the exposition of
Bolzano’s logic, the author states the inference of *incomplete
induction* which contains two premises; 1) *A propery which
belongs to all A that has so far been observed probably belongs to all
A in general* and adds that “The probability depends in part
on the absolute number of observed A, in part on the proportion
between observed A and all A” (*TS* II: §253,
511). 2) The second premise states that *b* is such an
attribute; in the conclusion that attribute *b* is assigned
to *A* with a certain degree of probability.

Special cases of incomplete induction are arguments
from *analogy* or *similarity*, where the premises
are:

The major: “We surmise with a greater or lesser degree of probability that an attribute which we have always or almost always found whenever we found the attributes

a,b,c, … united shall also be found in every object where the attributesa,b,c, … are all present (where the probabillity increases with the number of mutually independent attributesa,b,c, …, and also with the number of times this attribute has been present where the others were, and with the probability on other grounds that this attribute is a consequence ofa,b,c, …, etc.” (ibid.),The minor:

xis is an attribute andMan object, as described in the major,and the conclusion is:

xbelongs probably toM.We have an example with the famous inference by means of which we appeal to the many attributes the earth has in common with other heavenly bodies and the fact that the earth is inhabited to infer that the others are as well (

ibid., 513).

Are inductive inferences just empirical generalisations? Bolzano replies that, contrary to the opinion of important logicians (and contrary to Husserl’s criticism (1939, p. 326) directed against Bolzano’s alleged “empiricism”), the validity of these two rules does not depend on experience, but that they are

absolutely valid, purely conceptual truths, just like the rules of inference for ordinary syllogisms or subalternation. We do not have to consult experience to find out if these rules hold; rather, we must presuppose their validity to learn from experience in the first place(

ibid.).

## 9. Conclusion

Bolzano’s *TS* is a turning point not only in logic, but
also in epistemology. The author examines human knowledge in its most
accomplished forms, realised in scientific knowledge. According to
Cavaillès (2008: 35),

for the first time perhaps, science is not considered as only mediating between the human mind and the being in itself, dependent on both and having no proper reality, but as an object

sui generis, original in its essence, autonomous in its movement.

Science is defined by its structure “which
not only is demonstration, but which merges together with
demonstration” (*ibid.*, 39). Stressing the fundamental
role of demonstrations in scientific knowledge, Bolzano presented a
viable alternative to Kant’s philosophy of mathematics based on
constructions in pure intuition.

A truly scientific proof should

groundthe theorem, i.e., to integrate it into a scientific theory organised according to the “objective connection of truths”, starting with axioms and fundamental concepts.[…]. These ideas indicate the direction of future research: the notion of normal proof in the sense of Gentzen, the proof trees, König lemma (Šebestik 1992: 478).

Mathematicians were the first to respond to Bolzano’s
appeal. While at least some of Bolzano’s mathematical works drew the
attention the greatest German mathematicians (Weierstrass, Cantor, and
Dedekind), until the end of the XIXth century his logic met for the
most part with indifference and incomprehension. In mathematics,
Bolzano proved some of the fundamental theorems of analysis, sketched
the first theory of real numbers, produced an extraordinary theory of
real functions, introduced the concept of set and that of the actual
infinite, and stated the characteristic condition of infinite
sets. Even his friend Exner, who had had the benefit of additional
detailed explanations, was unable to understand his reform of logic.
He was not happy with the *TS* because of Bolzano’s concepts of
proposition and intuition in itself and of his criticisms of
Herbart. Bolzano’s treatment of logic was so radically new that only
at the end of the 19^{th} century, did philosophers of the
Brentano school begin to understand some of its parts, starting with
Kerry, Twardowski, Meinong and Husserl. Some of the most important
logical ideas of Bolzano spread among Austrian secondary school
students through the first edition of Zimmermann’s textbook (1853),
which contained a summary of Bolzano’s logic. Being accused of
plagiarism, Zimmermann omitted these passages from Bolzano in the
second edition. Wittgenstein might have taken inspiration from them
in writing his *Tractatus*. Russell knew the *Paradoxes of
the infinite* and some of his thoughts on logic are parallel to
Bolzano’s. Curiously, Frege, whose ideas were often so close to those
of Bolzano and who in his time was the only logician capable of
understanding him, never mentioned him. He was confronted with
Bolzano’s ideas three times: in one of Kerry’s articles, in the
correspondence with Husserl, and later in the controversy with Korselt
(see Sundholm 2000); he never reacted to their allusions. It is quite
possible that he never laid hands on any of Bolzano’s works (see
Kreiser 1981), apart, perhaps, from the *Paradoxes of the
infinite*. (In §530 of *TS*, Bolzano presents a
theorem to the effect that every indirect proof can be transformed
into a direct proof. Mancosu (1996, 110-117 and note 69, p. 234)
points out the striking similarity of this claim with a claim to the
same effect presented by Frege in one of his posthumous writings
(“Logic in Mathematics”). In addition, Bolzano and Frege
used the very same example to exemplify their claims, Euclid I.19.)

After Twardowski (1894), it was chiefly Husserl who drew philosophers’
attention to Bolzano with his memorable words about *TS* (1970,
I: 222),

a work which, in its treatment of the logical ‘theory of elements’, far surpasses everything that the world-literature has to offer in the way of a systematic sketch of logic. Bolzano did not, of course, expressedly discuss or support any independent demarcation of pure logic in our sense, but he provided one

de factoin the first two volumes of his work, in his discussion of what underlay aWissenschaftslehreor theory of science in the sense of his conception; he did so with such purity and scientific strictness, and with such a rich store of original, scientifically confirmed and ever fruitful thoughts, that we must count him as one of the greatest logicians of all time.

Neveretheless, he always insisted on the originality of his own
phenomenological method. Between the two wars, Bolzano’s logic and
philosophy of mathematics inspired Heinrich Scholz and Jean
Cavaillès. At the same time Tarski discovered the concept of
logical consequence independently of Bolzano, but Tarski discovered
the affinity between his work and Bolzano’s only after Scholz pointed
it out to him. However, already in Twardowski (1894), the founder of
the Polish Lvov-Warsaw school, Bolzano’s ideas are discussed and
criticized at length, and some of them might have become the common
ground of the Polish school (some of Bolzano’s expressions are found
literally in Tarski). In 1920, Hans Hahn edited the *Paradoxes of
the infinite* with important critical notes, comparing Bolzano
with Cantor. Karl Menger might have taken inspiration for his theory
of dimension not only from Poincaré, but also from the
*Paradoxes*. Neurath praised Bolzano as one of the ancestors of
the Vienna Circle, because of the conciseness of his style and the
rejection of Kant’s philosophy. Some important Bolzanian ideas are
also found in the work of Quine. All these currents are indebted to
Bolzano for the lesson of intellectual rigor and of analytic power. It
is Bolzano who is the true founder of the kind of analytical
philosophy whose core is logic and which is impregnated with
science. His logic has archaic aspects, but he introduced not only new
concepts, methods and theories, new themes and new problems, but above
all a new spirit that has pervaded philosophy ever since.

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*Rein analytischer Beweiss des Lehrsatzes, dass zwischen je zwey Werthen, die ein engegengesetztes Resultat gewähren, wenigstens eine reelle Wurzel der Gleichung liege (Purely analytic proof of the theorem that between any two values which give results of opposite sign, there lies at least one real root of the equation)*, Prague (English transl. Bolzano 2004b; French transl. Bolzano 2010). - 1834,
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### Acknowledgments

I wish to thank Paul Rusnock for his acute criticism and helpful suggestions.