Bernard Bolzano

First published Thu Nov 8, 2007; substantive revision Tue Dec 11, 2018

Bernard Bolzano (1781–1848) was a Catholic priest, a professor of the doctrine of Catholic religion at the Philosophical Faculty of the University of Prague, an outstanding mathematician and one of the greatest logicians or even (as some would have it) the greatest logician who lived in the long stretch of time between Leibniz and Frege. As far as logic is concerned, Bolzano anticipated almost exactly 100 years before Tarski and Carnap their semantic definitions of logical truth and logical consequence; and in mathematics he is not only known for his famous Paradoxes of the Infinite, but also for certain results that have become and still are standard in textbooks of mathematics such as the Bolzano-Weierstrass theorem. Bolzano also made important contributions to other fields of knowledge in and outside of philosophy. Due to the versatility of his talents and the various fields to which he made substantial contributions he became one of the last great polymaths in the history of ideas.

The presentation of Bolzano’s personality that is given here would still be incomplete unless it were added that Bolzano was also a great philanthropist. This becomes evident not only by Bolzano’s writings in ethics and political philosophy, but it also manifests itself in practice by his activities for the benefit of the poor, subjugated, discriminated and disadvantaged people. Together with his friends and pupils he supported activities in favor of such things as poorhouses, homes for the blind, loan banks for the working-class, and libraries and elementary schools in the countryside.

The first section of the article deals with Bolzano’s biography, and the second section presents a survey of Bolzano’s main writings; the following sections (3 to 12) are devoted to the different branches of philosophy to which Bolzano made contributions. In the final section (13) Bolzano’s influence on the development of the sciences and on the intellectual life in Bohemia is considered.

1. Bolzano’s Life and Scientific Career

Bernard Bolzano was born on 5 October 1781 in Prague. His father came from Lombardy (hence the Italian surname), though he lived already from childhood in Bohemia; by profession he was a merchant. Bolzano’s mother came from the German speaking family Maurer in Prague. Bernard was the fourth of twelve children altogether, most of whom died young.

When he was ten years old, Bolzano entered the Gymnasium (i.e., a kind of classical secondary school) of the Piarists in Prague, which he attended from 1791 to 1796. He subsequently began his “philosophical studies” at the University of Prague; they lasted three years, roughly corresponding to the higher level of high schools. Included in the “philosophical studies”, besides philosophy itself, were subjects such as history, languages, and biology, but above all also mathematics and physics. In the autumn of 1800 Bolzano began his study of theology at the University of Prague. At that time such a course of studies lasted four years; he finished it in the summer of 1804.

Bolzano got ordained as Roman Catholic priest on 7 April 1805. A few days later, on 17 April 1805, he received his doctorate of philosophy at the University of Prague. Just two days later, on 19 April 1805, he took up the newly established chair for religious doctrine in the Philosophical Faculty at the University of Prague, which had been granted to him provisionally by the Austrian Emperor, Kaiser Franz (Francis I), on 13 February 1805. The definitive occupancy of this chair was followed by his appointment as professor ordinarius on 23 September 1806.

According to a decree of 3 February 1804, the chairs for religious doctrine were established for the sake of “improving religious instruction”. Connected with these professorships was the important assignment to deliver the Sunday homilies, also called ‘exhortations’ or ‘Erbauungsreden’ (‘edifying addresses’), to the students (Bolzano gave them voluntarily also on holidays); the effectiveness of these chairs (whose occupants were therefore also called ‘catechists’ — cf. Bolzano 1836, 31) was thereby essentially enhanced.

Bolzano’s liberal intellectuality and his progressive theological and political ideas, combined with his practical activities and his enormous influence as a priest and as a university professor on people in general and the opinion leaders in Bohemia in particular, were a highly explosive mixture in the political and religious atmosphere in which Bolzano lived. Bohemia and its capital Prague were at his time part of the Austrian empire. Due to Prince Klemens Metternich, a very illiberal and repressive political system was established in the Austrian empire by means of police force and censorship. All kinds of liberal and national movements were suppressed in this political system. No wonder that Bolzano’s progressive political ideas and activities were found to be unacceptable to the political authorities. This situation in combination with personal intrigues resulted in January of 1820 in Bolzano’s removal from his professorship by Emperor Franz (who signed personally all decrees of appointment and dismissals of professors of all the universities in the empire). From that time on Bolzano was forbidden to teach, preach, or publish, and he had to sustain himself on a meager pension that was “graciously granted” to him by the emperor. It came as a blessing in disguise that Bolzano now — “exempted” from teaching duties —  had all the time he needed to elaborate and write his new foundation of logic. It was published in 1837 in four volumes as Theory of Science. After that, Bolzano took great pains to elaborate a new foundation of mathematics. The realization of this project was considerably developed but not yet completed when Bolzano died in 1848.

Small pieces of his voluminous philosophical and mathematical literary remains have been published from time to time. The complete edition of his works that was planned several times had to wait until 1969 when the two most meritorious Bolzano scholars, Eduard Winter and Jan Berg, together with the publisher Günther Holzboog started the Bernard-Bolzano-Gesamtausgabe, which — due to the effort of the three persons — became one of the most distinguished complete editions of the works of a philosopher in our time. 99 volumes of the edition have already appeared, and the next volumes are forthcoming.

2. Bolzano’s Main Writings

Bolzano’s uncommonly versatile work culminated in three extensive main writings in three different areas of knowledge: (1) in theology his four volume Textbook of the Science of Religion (Bolzano 1834), (2) in philosophy the four volume Theory of Science (Bolzano 1837), which provides a new foundation for logic and is at the same time an extensive manual of logic, and (3) in mathematics the Theory of Quantities, conceived of as a monumental work, but not completed.

Bolzano’s teaching was concerned exclusively with fundamental topics of theology; in addition he worked mainly in logic. Nevertheless, his scientific development began in mathematics. Already in 1804 Bolzano’s first scientific publication, namely Considerations on Some Objects of Elementary Geometry appeared; further mathematical publications followed between 1810 and 1817. Bolzano returned ultimately to mathematics in order to create a new foundation on which mathematics as a whole could be built; he succeeded in doing this, however, only in bits and pieces.

3. Logic

Due to the affinity of many ideas of Bolzano’s logic with ideas of modern logic, attempts to reconstruct Bolzano’s logic by means of techniques of modern logic started very early, e.g., with Dubislav 1931 and Scholz 1937. The first overall reconstruction of Bolzano’s logic from the perspective of modern logic was given by Berg 1962, and Berg went into it further in his illuminating introductions to WL in BGA I, 11–14. A new overall survey of Bolzano’s logic was presented in Sebestik 1992, and the most recent one is Casari 2016.

3.1 Bolzano’s Concept of Logic

The term ‘logic’ was understood in Bolzano’s time, as also by Bolzano himself, not in the narrow sense of formal logic, as it is commonly used nowadays, but rather in the broad sense which includes — besides formal logic — also both epistemology and the philosophy of science. Thus Bolzano used instead of ‘logic’ also the term ‘theory of science’. By ‘logic’ or ‘theory of science’ Bolzano means that discipline or science which formulates rules, “according to which we must proceed in the business of dividing the entire realm of truth into single sciences and in the exposition thereof in special textbooks if we want to proceed in a truly expedient fashion” (WL I, 7; cf. also WL I, 19 and 56).

This definition of logic makes a strange impression at first glance and was also often misunderstood. By putting it forward, Bolzano ascribes to logic a task that is generally not included in philosophy at all, but rather in the technique of scientific procedure. Bolzano, however, considered this task to be important enough to subject it to a scientific treatment. Since he did not see how it could otherwise be brought within the purview of a science, he assigned this task to logic which seemed to him to be the best candidate for this. What Bolzano mentions in his definition is, in his own view, by no means the only task of logic. In order to avoid superfluous criteria, Bolzano stated only the most concrete purpose in his definition, for the other tasks are entailed by it. Bolzano’s logic is a composite of the theory of foundations, the theory of elements, the theory of knowledge, the art of discovery (heuristics), and the theory of science proper. Thus, logic is, for Bolzano, an encompassing philosophical discipline, and the “theory of science proper” is only a sort of appendix of his logic.

3.2 Bolzano’s Conception of Logic

Bolzano’s logic was based upon a fundamental view that was the very opposite of the common view of his time. Whereas it was quite common at his time to mix logical with psychological investigations, Bolzano made every effort to separate them. For him logical concepts are concepts of their own, and their definition therefore must be kept free from any psychological admixture (WL I, 61–66). Bolzano’s approach to logic was — long before Frege and Husserl — unmistakably antipsychologistic, even if he did not yet use this term. In order to overcome psychologism and to achieve a strict separation of logic from psychology, Bolzano “opened up” for logic a realm or “world” of its own, different from the world of material objects as well as from the world of mental phenomena, a World 3 to speak with Karl Popper. Bolzano’s motive for postulating such a logical realm of its own obviously was the erroneous belief that logical properties (such as logical truth) and logical relations (such as logical consequence) need purely logical objects as their bearers in order to remain purely logical and free from any psychological admixture themselves. What is more, Bolzano had an unshakeable intuition that there are and must be such purely logical objects, namely “objective sentences” or “sentences in themselves” (Sätze an sich), and their parts, i.e., “objective ideas” or “ideas in themselves” (Vorstellungen an sich). In today’s terminology, Bolzano’s “sentences in themselves” are called ‘propositions’; this term (without any epithet) will be used for them in what follows. (The term ‘sentence’ without epithet, however, will be used in its linguistic sense for certain strings of words or symbols.) Moreover, following Bolzano’s practice, we will use the term ‘idea’ (‘Vorstellung’) without epithet for ‘idea in itself’ (‘Vorstellung an sich’). Propositions and ideas are the objects which can be “grasped” by mental phenomena (subjective propositions, in particular judgments, and subjective ideas) and expressed in language, but — despite their close connection to their mental and linguistic correlates — they must be rigorously distinguished from them.

Due to his conception of logic, Bolzano was “in need” of propositions and ideas and therefore postulated that there are such genuinely logical objects. He himself, however, was convinced that he need not postulate them but can undoubtedly prove that there must be propositions and ideas.

3.3 The Basis of Bolzano’s Logic and of his Whole Philosophy

Something could be true even if nobody knew that it were so. We therefore need a concept of truth that does not require of every truth that someone knows it. For this concept Bolzano introduced the term ‘Wahrheit an sich’ (‘truth in itself’). If something is a truth and no human being knows that it is, then — for Bolzano — it must be a “truth in itself”. A “truth in itself” (Wahrheit an sich) is nothing but a true proposition, i.e., a proposition that has the property of being true. Bolzano takes the proof that there is at least one “truth in itself” to be fundamental not only for logic and for philosophy in general, but for any science. Bolzano offers therefore several arguments such as the following ones for the claim that there must be “truths in themselves”: (i) There are obviously truths that are unknown and therefore (so Bolzano) “truths in themselves”. E.g. one of the two propositions “There are winged snakes” or “There are no winged snakes” must be true, but we do not know which one (WL I, 108); and one of the propositions stating of a specific tree at a specific moment that it bears a certain number of blossoms must be true, even if nobody knows which one (WL I, 112). (ii) The Pythagorean theorem or the Copernican theory that the earth rotates around the sun have not become true by their discoveries but have always been true, i.e. (according to Bolzano), they are “truths in themselves” (Zimmermann 1847, 71 f., 136). (iii) If no thinking being existed, it were true that there exists no thinking being, but this (according to Bolzano) could only be a “truth in itself” (Bolzano 1839, 150). There is one proof for the existence of a “truth in itself” or a true proposition, however, which Bolzano takes to be decisive. It is an improved version of the traditional refutation of scepticism by self-application (RW I, 35, WL I, 145). Before we present and discuss this proof, a terminological remark seems to be in order: The word ‘truth’ (as well as the German word ‘Wahrheit’) is ambiguous insofar as it denotes the property of being true on the one hand and a bearer of this property (a true proposition, a true sentence, a true judgment etc.) on the other hand (WL I, 108 f.). Only the latter can be meant, however, as soon as the word ‘truth’ is preceded by the indefinite article (‘a truth’) or if it is put into the plural form (‘truths’). It is in such clear cases only that we will allow the word ‘truth(s)’ without epithet to be used in the sense of Bolzano’s ‘truth in itself’ or ‘truths in themselves’, but otherwise we will use ‘true proposition(s)’ instead to avoid confusion. In general we will therefore reserve the word ‘truth’ for the property of being true. That being said, we can now turn to Bolzano’s alleged proof for the existence of true propositions:

  1. There is no true proposition (assumption of reductio), i.e.: No proposition is true.
  2. The sense of (1), i.e., of ‘There is no true proposition’, is a proposition.
  3. The proposition which is the sense of (1) is not true (from (1) and (2)).
  4. It is not the case that there is no true proposition (from (3) and (1) — in contradiction to (1)).
  5. There is a (i.e., at least one) true proposition (from (1)–(4) by reductio).

The improvement of Bolzano’s version of this traditional proof consists in Bolzano’s explicitly mentioning premise (2) as indispensable for the deduction (WL I, 145, 151; cf. also WL IV, 282 f.), thus making clear that the proof would not go through if this premise were not accepted. The inference of (4) from (3) and (1) is vindicated by Bolzano’s explication of propositional negation (see section 3.4). Bolzano is not content with having proven (allegedly) that there is at least one true proposition; he wants even to prove by mathematical induction that there are more and even infinitely many true propositions (see section 11.2).

The above derivation is an illustrative example of Bolzano’s importation of proof methods from mathematics — such as the methods of indirect proof and of mathematical induction — into philosophy. (For certain reservations concerning these methods cf. WL IV, 269–285.) Nevertheless, this alleged proof for the existence of a true proposition does not reach its goal for a simple reason: The proof is in no way peculiar for truths in the sense of true propositions as Bolzano needs to have it. If successful at all, it would work in the same way also for proving the existence of true judgments or true sentences (understood as linguistic entities). A proof for the existence of at least one truth in itself, i.e., a true proposition, requires premise (2). In premise (2), however, the existence of a proposition is already presupposed since it is shorthand for what can be explicitly stated as: There is a (i.e., at least one) proposition which is the sense of (1). Thus, if we take the derivation as a proof for the existence of at least one true proposition, we will succumb to an obvious petitio principii. By — correctly — requiring the addition of premise (2) to be necessary for the formal correctness of the proof, Bolzano unwittingly displayed its failure due to an informal fallacy. Bolzano himself, however, was convinced that he had correctly and successfully proven that there are “truths in themselves”. From this it follows that there must be propositions, since “truths in themselves” are a certain kind of propositions (WL I, 111 f.). And since in every proposition ideas are contained as its parts, a further consequence is that there are also ideas. For every proposition there is also another proposition that is its propositional negation. The propositional negation of a true proposition is a false proposition. Therefore, among propositions there must also be false ones. They are often overlooked because a special name such as ‘falsehood in itself’ was never introduced “officially” for them and is at least not customary.

As far as the ontological status of propositions and ideas is concerned, Bolzano stresses again and again their objectivity, i.e., their independence from thinking in general and from the minds and mental phenomena of thinking beings by which they are “grasped” in particular. Bolzano does not only accentuate the objectivity of propositions and ideas, but he also lays particular emphasis on their being not real (wirklich), whereby ‘real’ means, in Bolzano’s terminology, the same as efficacious (wirksam, which derives etymologically from the verb ‘wirken’ from which also ‘wirklich’ is derived). The realm of reality includes everything in space and time and herewith all material objects and events of the physical world (i.e., Popper’s World 1) as well as all mental (or “psychical”) phenomena of our inner world (i.e., World 2). (In addition, Bolzano includes in his realm of reality also God who is outside of space and time.) Propositions and ideas belong to a “third realm” (World 3) outside of Bolzano’s realm of reality which encompasses World 1 and World 2. Unfortunately, Bolzano uses the nouns ‘Existenz’ (‘existence’) and ‘Sein’ (‘being’) synonymously with ‘Wirklichkeit’ (‘reality’); he therefore states again and again that there are (es gibt) propositions and ideas but they do not exist and they do not have being. This peculiar — if not odd — terminology has caused numerous misunderstandings, not only about Bolzano’s views but also for Bolzano himself, e.g., in his discussion about Kant’s dictum that being is not a real predicate. (Despite Bolzano’s terminological convention, we will here use the English word ‘existence’ in general in the broad sense of Bolzano’s ‘es gibt’.)

It is not only for this terminological reason that Bolzano’s characterization of the ontological status of propositions and ideas remains in the last analysis nebulous and has therefore repeatedly evoked criticism. One must of course add, for the sake of doing justice to Bolzano, that no other advocate of such a World 3 — including Husserl, Popper and even Frege — has done better than he had done and has succeeded in saying anything clearer about this than what can already be found in Bolzano’s work. Despite all these deficiencies, Bolzano’s unproven assumption or postulation of propositions and ideas turned out to be extremely fruitful for his own research.

3.4 Bolzano’s Analysis of Propositions (i.e., of his “Sentences in Themselves”)

Although Bolzano contributed many highly interesting and valuable insights to the analysis of propositions, they all are shaped in the subject-predicate scheme. We must explain some of these insights before we discuss Bolzano’s main contributions to logic in the sections 3.6–3.9.

In what follows brackets will be used for the denotation of propositions and ideas. Thus ‘[Socrates has wisdom]’ will denote the proposition expressed by the words ‘Socrates has wisdom’, and ‘[Socrates]’ and ‘[wisdom]’ will denote the ideas expressed by the words ‘Socrates’ and ‘wisdom’, respectively. (Such a notation is not without problems, but this is not the place to discuss them.) Bolzano starts his analysis of propositions by proclaiming the traditional subject-predicate view as a dogma: Despite the variety of their linguistic expressions, all propositions are of the form \([A\) has \(b]\) and therefore have exactly three parts, namely a subject idea \([A]\), a predicate idea \([b]\), and the copula [has], i.e. the idea expressed by the word ‘has’ or another form of ‘to have’ (WL II, 9–17). Bolzano prefers this copula to the copula expressed by a form of ‘to be’ for the following reason: In everyday language we try to avoid abstracts such as ‘wisdom’ and prefer saying ‘Socrates is wise’; but in doing so we attribute a property — namely wisdom — to Socrates. The logical structure of the proposition is therefore best displayed — says Bolzano — by the words ‘Socrates has wisdom’. Due to the stylistic preference of adjectives over abstract nouns, everyday language very often does not even provide us with an abstract noun corresponding to an adjective; in such cases we therefore use the adjective at hand, although we could always easily introduce a corresponding artificial noun into our language.

Since every proposition has the same copula, two propositions can be different only if they have either different subject ideas or different predicate ideas or both. This results in Bolzano’s identity criterion for propositions: Two propositions \([A_1\) has \(b_1]\) and \([A_2\) has \(b_2]\) are identical iff (i.e., if and only if) \([A_1] = [A_2]\) and \([b_1] = [b_2]\). In order for \([A\) has \(b]\) to be a proposition, it will suffice that the predicate idea \([b]\) be an arbitrary idea, in a way at least “pretending” to be an idea of an attribute (WL II, 16–18). In order for \([A\) has \(b]\) to be true, however, it is necessary that the predicate idea \([b]\) is an idea of an attribute (Beschaffenheit). An attribute can be an “inner attribute”, i.e., a property (Eigenschaft) of an object, or an “outer attribute”, i.e., a relation (Verhältnis) among objects. Examples of properties are wisdom or omnipotence, examples of relations are friendship to so-and-so, fatherhood to so-and-so, being twice as long as such-and-such (WL I, 378–389).

The main trouble resulting from the traditional subject-predicate view in general and from Bolzano’s uniform \([A\) has \(b]\) structure of every proposition is that under its subject idea \([A]\) two different cases are concealed insofar as it can be singular (as in the case of [God] or [the sun] or [Bernard Bolzano]) or general (as in the case of [man] or [animal] or [planet]). Due to this duality, Bolzano has to add that \([A\) has \(b]\) or \([A\) have \(b]\) is to be understood (when \([A]\) is general) in the sense of [Every \(A\) has \(b]\) or [All \(A\) have \(b]\), e.g. [Animals have sensitivity] = [Every animal has sensitivity] = [All animals have sensitivity] (WL II, 24 f.).

In order to confirm his thesis that every proposition has the form [(Every) \(A\) has \(b]\), Bolzano shows of all kinds of verbal forms of significant sentences how to transfer them into his standard form (cf. WL II, 38 ff. and 211 ff.). Here are some of the rather important examples of Bolzano’s analysis.

  1. Predicate negation (i.e., “inner” negation): The lack of an attribute \(b\) (such as the lack of omnipotence) is itself a property (WL II, 47) that we can denote by the negation ‘non-\(b\)’ (‘non-omnipotence’). Negative propositions of the form \([A\) has non-\(b]\), e.g. [Bernard Bolzano has non-omnipotence (i.e., lack of omnipotence)], therefore share the general form \([A\) has \(b]\) with all other propositions (WL II, 44–52).
  2. Propositional negation (i.e., “external” negation): From propositions of the form \([A\) has non-\(b]\) we have to distinguish propositions in which another proposition is denied. We can express such propositions by ‘It is not the case that \(A\) has \(b\)’. According to Bolzano, such a proposition is about another proposition and states that this proposition is false, i.e., not true. Its subject idea is therefore an idea of a proposition and its predicate idea is the idea of falsity or lack of truth, i.e., non-truth. Their form is therefore best displayed as [\([A\) has \(b]\) has non-truth] (WL II 62–64).
  3. Subjunctive and disjunctive propositions: The subjunction of two propositions \(s_1\) and \(s_2\) is explained by Bolzano as a proposition of the form \([s_2\) is a consequence of \(s_1]\) (WL II, 198 f., 224–226; Bolzano proposes here also alternative interpretations of ‘if … so’ sentences). An inclusive or exclusive disjunction of two propositions \(s_1\) and \(s_2\) is interpreted by Bolzano as a proposition which attributes to the idea [a true proposition belonging to the collection consisting of \(s_1\) and \(s_2]\) the property of being non-empty or singular, respectively (WL II, 204 f., 228 f.).
  4. Particular propositions and there-is propositions: In view of Bolzano’s identification of \([A\) has \(b]\) with [Every \(A\) has \(b]\) or [All \(A\) have \(b]\) whenever \([A]\) is general, it is of special interest how he deals with particular propositions expressed by ‘Some A have \(b\)’. Bolzano transforms such sentences into there-is sentences of the form ‘There is at least one \(A\) that has \(b\)’. But what about such there-is sentences? In a sentence of the form ‘There is at least one \(A\)’ we attribute, according to Bolzano, not a property to \(A\) itself but to the idea \([A]\), i.e., to the idea of \(A\), namely the property of being non-empty. The form of the corresponding propositions is therefore best given as [\([A]\) has non-emptiness] (WL II, 52–54, 214–218). This analysis is completely in accordance with Kant’s — and of course even more so with Frege’s and Russell’s later on —, although Bolzano never stopped criticizing Kant for his dictum that existence is not a real predicate. Bolzano took this dictum to be about existence in his own narrow sense of ‘existence’ or ‘being’, i.e., in the sense of ‘reality’, and not — as he should have — in the broad sense of his ‘es gibt’. His disagreement with Kant on this point is therefore merely verbal in nature. For Bolzano’s approach, a true negative existential sentence such as ‘There is no round square’ does not pose a problem any more; the proposition expressed by this sentence is [[a round square] has emptiness] (WL II, 54 f.).

In his analysis of propositions Bolzano distinguished clearly different levels in his realm of propositions and ideas. He even introduced a special name for ideas of ideas, such as the idea of the idea \([A]\), i.e., [\([A]\)]; he called them ‘symbolic ideas’ (WL I, 426 ff.). In his efforts to show that all propositions can be shaped into \([A\) has \(b]\), Bolzano makes extensive usage of such symbolic ideas (and also of ideas of propositions) as subject ideas of propositions, as it is exemplified under ii, iii and iv above. Bolzano took pains to systematize his attempts of shaping all propositions into \([A\) has \(b]\). His attempts, however, remained only on the level of examples, since he missed a key for their systematization such as Frege’s function-argument scheme.

For Bolzano every proposition is either true or false, and this forever — or better: timelessly. If we get under certain circumstances the impression that one and the same proposition can sometimes be true and sometimes be false, this is merely due to the fact that we do not talk about a proposition but about an ambiguous linguistic chain of words that expresses two or even more propositions, some of which can be true and others false (WL II, 7). If it is the proposition itself, however, of which we get the impression that it can be true as well as false, this is due to the fact that we take a part of it to be variable (WL II, 77); in this case again we do not consider a single proposition, but a whole set of propositions, i.e., a propositional form. In the expression ‘It is snowing’, e.g., time and place are not determined, and it therefore does not express a proposition, but rather a propositional form, indicated by ‘It is snowing at time \(t\) at place \(l\)’. In order to express a proposition, the variables have to be bound or replaced by constants; Bolzano usually replaces them — for convenience — by indexicals, e.g., ‘It is snowing today and here’ (WL I, 113). Even if Bolzano makes extensive usage of indexicals in the expression of ideas and propositions, there is no place for indexicals within his World 3: There are neither indexical ideas nor indexical propositions; what sometimes seems to be an indexical idea or proposition is in fact merely an indexical expression of an idea or proposition. (See, however, an opposite view defended in Textor 1996.)

Bolzano combines his doctrine that the form \([A\) has \(b]\) is common to all propositions with a correspondence theory of truth, whereby he, like Aristotle, avoids speaking of correspondence or adequation. A proposition \([A\) has \(b]\) is true, according to Bolzano, iff \(A\) has (in fact) \(b\) (WL I, 112). There is an important qualification, however, that Bolzano has thereby in mind, namely that there is at least one \(A\); a proposition \([A\) has \(b]\) can only be true, according to Bolzano, if it is about something and if its subject idea \([A]\) is therefore non-empty (WL II, 16, 328–330, 399 ff.). Formulated more carefully, Bolzano’s truth condition must therefore be stated as follows (WL I, 112, 121–224, WL II, 26 f., 328–330):

\([A\) has \(b]\) is true (or: has truth) iff \([A]\) is non-empty, and for every \(x\) that is an object of \([A]\) there is a \(y\) that is an object of \([b]\) such that \(x\) has \(y\).

Due to this definition of truth and due to Bolzano’s doctrine that every proposition has the form \([A\) has \(b]\), every proposition has existential import for Bolzano. (‘Existential’ must here be taken in the sense of Bolzano’s ‘there is’. It must be kept in mind here that Bolzano’s interpretation transfers many propositions to a meta-level and that in such a case the existential import concerns \([A]\) rather than \(A\) itself; the existence of \([A]\), however, is guaranteed even if \([A]\) is empty and \(A\) itself does not exist.) This peculiar kind of an existential presupposition of Bolzano’s logic makes his theory of syllogisms (which he himself saw as a mere section of his whole logic) an intermediate system between Aristotle and Venn: Whereas Aristotle’s theory of categorical syllogisms does not allow empty terms at all, Bolzano’s logic does so, but they cannot be the subject ideas of true propositions in Bolzano’s logic. As a consequence, the so-called conclusio ad subalternatam is logically valid also for Bolzano, i.e., [Some \(A\) have \(b]\) follows logically from [All \(A\) have \(b]\) (WL II, 114, 399 ff.), but [All \(A\) are \(A]\) or — in Bolzano’s notation — [All \(A\) have \(a]\) is not logically true for him; furthermore [All \(A\) have non-\(b]\) is not convertible, i.e., [All \(B\) have non-\(a]\) does not logically follow from [All \(A\) have non-\(b]\) (WL II, 401 f., 526). Therefore exactly two of the 24 valid Aristotelian syllogisms (namely the modi CAMENES — or CALENTES in Bolzano’s terminology — and CAMENOP of form IV) are invalid in Bolzano’s logic as he himself proved by means of counter-examples (WL II, 415, 558), whereas all other Aristotelian modi (including the weakened ones) are logically valid also in Bolzano’s logic.

3.5 Bolzano’s Theory of Ideas (i.e., of his “Ideas in Themselves”)

The three immediate parts of a proposition are its subject idea, its predicate idea and the copula [has]. In further analyzing the subject and predicate idea of a proposition, we will find out, that in special cases (as, e.g., in the case of the idea [the judgment that God is omnipotent]), a complete proposition will turn out to be a part of an idea  (WL I, 221). In general, however, the parts of an idea are themselves ideas. After careful consideration Bolzano decided against the view to define a proposition as something constructed out of ideas (i.e., as a connection of two arbitrary ideas by means of the copula [has]) (WL II, 18); he rather suggested that we define ideas as those parts of a proposition which are not themselves propositions (WL I, 216, WL II, 18). In this sense he granted priority to propositions over their non-propositional parts (i.e., ideas), thereby anticipating Frege and Wittgenstein. There is a clear demarcation between propositions and ideas: Whereas each proposition is either true or false (WL II, 7), an idea cannot be true or false (WL I, 239 ff.). There are two “dimensions” to be distinguished in each idea: its “internal dimension”, i.e., its divisibility or indivisibility into parts, and its “external dimension”, i.e., its having or not having objects.

As far as the inner structure of ideas is concerned (WL I, 243 ff.), Bolzano distinguishes simple from complex ideas: A simple idea has no proper parts, whereas a complex idea has. The “sum” (Summe) of proper parts of a complex idea is called its ‘content’ (‘Inhalt’). Due to Bolzano’s peculiar usage of the term ‘sum’ that is restricted — like his usage of ‘collection’ in general — to sets with at least two members, he could not apply his concept of content to all ideas, but only to complex ideas. In order to simplify matters, we will use here the modern concept of a set, allowing for a set to be a singleton (i.e., containing only one single member) or even to be empty (i.e., containing no member at all). In what follows we will therefore take the content of an arbitrary idea to be the set of all of its parts (including improper ones, i.e., including itself). The content of a simple idea \(i\) is then the singleton \(\{i\}\) containing \(i\) itself as its only member. Two complex ideas \(i_1\) and \(i_2\) can have the same content, i.e., the same parts, without themselves being identical, because the common parts of \(i_1\) and \(i_2\) can be arranged in different ways in \(i_1\) and \(i_2\). Bolzano’s favorite example is: [an erudite son of an unerudite father] has the same content, but is not identical with [an unerudite son of an erudite father]; the same holds for \([3^5]\) and \([5^3]\) (WL I, 244). In analyzing an idea, we will in all cases eventually come upon simple ideas (WL I, 263–265). Without explicitly expressing it, Bolzano obviously held the view that every idea is recursively constructed out of simple ideas. Two ideas are therefore identical iff they are constructed out of the same simple ideas in the same way. In order to be able to apply this general idea precisely in concrete cases, we would have to be able to identify the simple ideas and the formation rules involved. Unfortunately, Bolzano informs us about both only by hinting at examples here and there. As examples of simple ideas he mentions [something] (WL I, 447), [has] (WL I, 380, WL II, 18), [non] (WL II, 415), [Wirklichkeit], i.e., [reality] (WL II, 60), and [Sollen], i.e., [ought] (WL II, 69, WL IV, 489).

With respect to its “external” dimension, an idea can have several (may be even infinitely many) objects, exactly one object, or no object at all. An idea that has no object at all is an empty idea; Bolzano calls it ‘gegenstandlos’ (‘objectless’). Bolzano puts forward the thesis with particular emphasis that there are empty ideas; his standard examples are ideas such as [nothing], [golden mountain] (WL I, 304 f., WL II, 329) or [winged horse] (WL III, 24). A special kind of empty ideas, viz. contradictory ideas (or, as Bolzano usually prefers to call them, imaginary ideas) cannot even have an object (WL I, 315 ff., WL III, 405 f.), examples being [a round polygon], [a round square], [a triangle that is quadrangular], [a regular pentagon], [a wooden iron tool], [an equilateral rectangular triangle] (WL I, 305, 315, 317, 321, 324, WL II, 329). Non-empty ideas are called ‘gegenständlich’ (‘objectual’) by Bolzano. They can be singular as, e.g., [the philosopher Socrates], [the city of Athens], [the fixed star Sirius] (WL I, 306), [an even integer between 4 and 8] (WL III, 407), [God] (WL III, 408), or general; if general, they can have a finite number of objects, such as [a heir of Genghis-Khan’s Empire] (WL I, 299) or [an integer between 1 and 10] (WL I, 308), or an infinite number of objects, such as [a line] or [an angle] (WL I, 298). For non-empty ideas (and only for them) Bolzano defines their extension (Umfang) (WL I, 297 f.); by using again the modern concept of a set (as we already did with Bolzano’s definition of the content of an idea), we can extend his definition to all ideas including empty ones; the extension of an arbitrary idea \(i\) (or Ext\((i)\), as an abbreviation) is then nothing but the set of all objects of \(i\).

By crossing the “internal” with the “external dimension” of ideas we can get new and interesting “creations”. Combining, e.g., the smallest content with the smallest extension of a non-empty idea results in a new type of idea, viz. in an “intuition in itself” or, as we may say for the sake of brevity, an intuition (Anschauung). An intuition is an idea which is simple, i.e., has no proper part, and at the same time singular, i.e., has only one single object (WL I, 325–330). If an idea is neither itself an intuition nor contains any intuition as a proper part, it is called ‘Begriff’ (‘concept’) by Bolzano; examples of concepts are the simple idea [something] and the complex idea [God] whereby, for Bolzano, [God] = [the real being that has no cause of its being real]. A mixed idea is a complex idea which contains at least one intuition as a proper part (WL I, 330 f.). The distinction between intuitions and concepts plays an important role in Bolzano’s epistemology (cf. section 4.2 where we will also present examples of intuitions).

Talking about the “external dimension” of ideas, we made — following Bolzano — intensive usage of a certain relation \(\mathbf{R}\) between ideas and their objects that is basic in Bolzano’s theory of ideas. For ‘\(i \mathbf{R} x\)’ we used phrases such as ‘\(i\) is an idea of \(x\)’ or ‘\(x\) is an object of \(i\)’; other expressions for it are ‘\(i\) represents \(x\)’, ‘\(x\) is subsumed under \(i\)’ or ‘\(x\) falls under \(i\)’ (WL I, 298). The domain of \(\mathbf{R}\) is the set of non-empty ideas, its range being the set of all objects; moreover, \(\mathbf{R}\) has the following properties: it is neither reflexive nor irreflexive (the latter due to counterexamples such as: [idea] \(\mathbf{R}\) [idea]; cf. WL I, 461), it is neither symmetric nor asymmetric, it is neither transitive nor intransitive, and it is neither one-many nor many-one. Since, according to our definition, \(Ext(i) = \{x \mid i \mathbf{R} x\}\), we can express ‘\(i \mathbf{R} x\)’ also in terms of ‘extension’ as ‘\(x \in\) \(Ext(i)\)’.

Bolzano defines a variety of relations between ideas concerning their extensions, such as the following ones: An idea \(i_1\) is compatible with an idea\( i_2\) iff \(i_1\) and \(i_2\) share a common object, i.e. \(Ext(i_1) \cap\) \(Ext(i_2) \ne \varnothing\); and \(i_1\) is included in \(i_2\) (or: \(i_2\) includes \(i_1)\) iff \(i_1\) is compatible with \(i_2\) and every object of \(i_1\) is also an object of \(i_2\), i.e., \(Ext(i_1) \cap\) \(Ext(i_2) \ne \varnothing\), and \(Ext(i_1) \subseteq\) \(Ext(i_2)\). In Bolzano’s theory of ideas, precise correlates are available of basic concepts of set theory such as the empty set as well as the membership relation and the relation of inclusion between sets. Unfortunately, the clear distinction between membership and inclusion in his theory of ideas vanished in his theory of propositions due to the common form \([A\) has \(b]\) of all propositions whereby \([A]\) can be not only a singular, but also a general (or an empty) idea.

Already in his theory of ideas Bolzano used a method which he was very proud to have invented: the method of idea-variation. He made the most fruitful usage of this method, however, by applying it to whole propositions.

3.6 Bolzano’s Method of Idea-Variation

In his analysis of propositions, Bolzano did not break through the traditional paradigms. In another respect, however, namely concerning the definition of basic semantic concepts, he opened wide the gates to modern logic. The main instrument to do so was the method of idea-variation that he invented. He himself took it to be his main contribution to logic that was for himself — who certainly did not suffer from arrogance — of “epoch making importance” (Bolzano 1838, 350).

The basic insight underlying Bolzano’s method of idea-variation is quite simple (WL II, 77 ff.). Let us take as our first example \(S_1\) the proposition [Kant is a German philosopher]. (In order to simplify matters linguistically, we do not adhere to Bolzano’s formulation ‘\(A\) has \(b\)’ but will allow also formulations of the kind ‘\(A\) is (a) \(B\)’. Moreover, we will take in what follows words like ‘German’, ‘French’, ‘European’, ‘American’ etc. in the sense of ‘born in Germany’, ‘born in France’, ‘born in Europe’, ‘born in America’ etc.) The extra-logical ideas that are parts of \(S_1\) are the ideas [Kant], [German], and [philosopher]; we consider now one or more of them to be variable in the sense that we think that they are replaced in \(S_1\) by other ideas fitting to the former ones (i.e., belonging to the same “category”). In this way the idea [Kant] can be “varied” in \(S_1\) and replaced, e.g., by [Hegel]; in other words, we can substitute [Hegel] for [Kant] in \(S_1\). The variation in question is a kind of replacement or substitution. It results in a “new” (or better: in another) proposition, viz. in the true proposition [Hegel is a German philosopher]; we will say that [Hegel is a German philosopher] is the [Hegel]/[Kant]-variant of \(S_1\). A false [Kant]-variant of \(S_1\) is its [Sartre]/[Kant]-variant [Sartre is a German philosopher]. Similarly, [Kant is an European philosopher] is a true and [Kant is an American philosopher] is a false [German]-variant of \(S_1\). The operation of replacement (or substitution) can also be performed on two or more parts of a proposition simultaneously: Replacing [Kant] and [philosopher] in \(S_1\) simultaneously by, e.g., [Gauss] and [mathematician], results in the true ([Gauss], [mathematician]/[Kant], [philosopher])-variant [Gauss is a German mathematician]. A false ([Kant], [philosopher])-variant of \(S_1\) is, e.g., [Sartre is a German musician]. We can also replace all extra-logical parts of \(S_1\) simultaneously: A true ([Kant], [German], [philosopher])-variant of \(S_1\) is [Mozart is an Austrian composer], whereas [Sartre is a Greek mathematician] is a false one. Following Bolzano, we will here use this generalized operation of simultaneous replacement (or variation). Given an arbitrary proposition \(s\) and two sequences \(i_1, i_2 ,\ldots ,i_n\) and \(j_1, j_2 ,\ldots ,j_n\) of ideas, a proposition \(s'\) is uniquely determined by this operation; due to this operation, for each \(k\) \((1 \le k \le n)\), the idea \(i_k\) is replaced in \(s\) uniformly (i.e., wherever it “occurs” in \(s)\) by one and the same corresponding idea \(j_k\). The resulting proposition \(s'\) is the \((j_1, j_2 ,\ldots ,j_n /i_1, i_2 ,\ldots ,i_n)\)-variant of \(s\), or — briefly put — the \(j/i\)-variant of \(s\). (Thereby we take \(i = \langle i_1, i_2 ,\ldots ,i_n\rangle\) and \(j = \langle j_1, j_2 ,\ldots ,j_n\rangle\). Moreover, we are using here ‘\(s\)’, ‘\(s'\)’, ‘\(s_1\)’, ‘\(s_2\)’,… as variables for propositions, ‘\(i_1\)’, ‘\(i_2\)’,…, ‘\(j_1\)’, ‘\(j_2\)’,… as variables for ideas, and ‘\(i\)’ and ‘\(j\)’ as variables for sequences of ideas of the same length.) The close relationship between a variant of a proposition and a substitution instance of a sentence is quite obvious. In order for the \(j/i\)-variant of an arbitrary proposition \(s\) to be uniquely determined and to fulfill certain criteria of adequacy, however, several restrictions are required: (i) Each of the \(i_k\)s \((1 \le k \le n)\) must be simple or at least “relatively” simple (in the sense that in each particular context under consideration they are not further analyzed into parts but “taken” to be simple); (ii) each of the \(i_k\)s is an extra-logical idea; (iii) the \(i_k\)s are pair-wise distinct; moreover (iv), in order to keep the result of the replacement operation “well-formed”, i.e., a genuine proposition, we must require that each \(j_k\) “fits” the corresponding \(i_k\), i.e., is of the same semantic category; and finally (v), we must also require that at least one of the ideas \(i_k\) must be contained in \(s\) as one of its parts so that the operation of replacement is never performed vacuously.

Instead of saying that a \(j/i\)-variant of a proposition \(s\) is true or false (or that it is a true or false variant of \(s)\), Bolzano prefers to say: j macht s hinsichtlich i wahr bzw. falsch (cf. e.g., WL II, 79, 113 ff.), i.e.: \(j\) verifies or falsifies \(s\) with respect to \(i\) (or, more literally: \(j\) makes \(s\) true or false with respect to \(i)\).

As far as our first example \(S_1\) is concerned, there are true as well as false variants of it with respect to every single extra-logical part of it and also with respect to every sequence of such parts. But now let us consider the following expamle \(S_2\): [Every German philosopher is European]. It has true as well as false [German]-variants, [European]-variants, ([German], [philosopher])-variants, ([German], [European])-variants, ([philosopher], [European])-variants and also ([German], [philosopher], [European])-variants. But obviously, all [philosopher]-variants of \(S_2\) must be true — provided, says Bolzano, that their subject idea is non-empty. This proviso is a typical feature of Bolzano’s approach and mentioned by him again and again, since — according to his truth condition — a proposition with an empty subject idea is trivially false. Whenever we perform the operation of variation on the subject idea of a proposition (and sometimes also when we perform it only on certain parts of it), however, we will have variants with empty subject ideas; thus, only in exceptional cases all variants of a proposition will turn out to be true. If all \(i\)-variants of a proposition \(s\) with a non-empty subject idea are true, Bolzano will say that \(s\) is universally valid with respect to \(i\). Hereby we have to take into account, that for Bolzano also in his meta-language words such as ‘all’, ‘every’ or ‘each’ have existential import and that therefore his definition must explicitly stated as follows (WL II, 82):

A proposition \(s\) is universally valid (allgemeingültig) with respect to a sequence \(i\) of ideas iff there is at least one true \(i-\)variant of \(s\), and every \(i\)-variant of \(s\) with a non-empty subject idea is true.

Analogously we can define what it is for a proposition to be universally contravalid:

A proposition \(s\) is universally contravalid (allgemeinungültig) with respect to a sequence i of ideas iff every \(i\)-variant of \(s\) is false.

[Every German philosopher is American] is an example of a proposition that is universally contravalid with respect to [philosopher].

If a proposition is universally valid or universally contravalid with respect to \(i\), Bolzano says that it is analytic with respect to \(i\), otherwise, that it is synthetic with respect to i. If a proposition is analytic (or synthetic) with respect to at least one sequence \(i\), Bolzano calls it ‘analytic’ (or ‘synthetic’, respectively), without further qualification (WL II, 83–89, 331–338). Herewith Bolzano starts a new tradition of usage of the term ‘analytic’ as opposed to that from Kant up to Carnap and Quine: Whereas in this latter tradition the term ‘analytic’ includes exclusively true propositions, in Bolzano’s terminology also all universally contravalid propositions are subsumed under this term; and even a universally valid proposition could be false if it has an empty subject idea but all of its variants with non-empty subject ideas are true. (On this point, however, Bolzano is not always consistent.)

Logical properties of a proposition are — according to a classical view — of a formal character, i.e., they are primarily properties of the form of a proposition rather than of the proposition itself. The formal character of logical properties suggests the following alternative way of presenting Bolzano’s view. Bolzano himself identifies explicitly the form of a proposition with a set of propositions (WL I, 48, WL II, 82):

The form of a proposition s with respect to a sequence i of ideas or (as an abbreviation) the i-form of s is the set of all \(i\)-variants of \(s\), provided that at least one of the \(i_k\)s is contained in \(s\). (For cases in which this proviso is not met, neither an \(i\)-variant of \(s\) nor the \(i\)-form of \(s\) is defined.)

A propositional i-form can therefore be defined as the \(i\)-form of at least one proposition \(s\); and a propositional form is a propositional \(i\)-form with respect to at least one sequence \(i\). Due to the proviso mentioned, a propositional form as defined before can never be empty or a singleton. We can now define universal validity and universal contravalidity first for a propositional form and subsequently for a proposition in the following way:

A propositional form \(F\) is universally valid iff at least one member of \(F\) is true, and every member of \(F\) with a non-empty subject idea is true; \(F\) is universally contravalid iff every member of \(F\) is false.

A proposition \(s\) is universally valid (or universally contravalid, respectively) with respect to a sequence i of ideas iff there is a propositional form \(F\) such that \(F\) is a propositional \(i\)-form which is universally valid (or contravalid, respectively), and \(s\) is a member of \(F\).

\(s\) is analytic with respect to i iff \(s\) is universally valid or universally contravalid with respect to \(i\); \(s\) is synthetic with respect to i iff \(s\) is not analytic with respect to \(i\).

\(s\) is analytic (or synthetic, respectively) iff \(s\) is analytic (or synthetic, respectively) with respect to at least one sequence \(i\).

3.7 Bolzano’s Definition of Logical Truth

The result of applying the operation of variation to a proposition depends essentially on our choice of ideas to be varied in the proposition in question. And it can depend on matters of fact whether or not a proposition is universally valid (or contravalid) with respect to a sequence \(i\) of ideas. Thus, e.g., it is due to the fact that every German is European and no German is American that the proposition [Every German philosopher is European] is universally valid and the proposition [Every German philosopher is American] is universally contravalid with respect to [philosopher]. From a logical point of view, the most interesting results will turn up if all extra-logical parts of a proposition, which are simple (or — as explained before — “relatively” simple), are taken to be variable (WL II, 84). To simplify matters, we will assume for what follows that for any proposition \(s\) there is always fixed a certain alphabetic order of all extra-logical simple ideas contained in it; thereby, for every proposition \(s\), a sequence \(i^{\boldsymbol{s}}\) of all extra-logical simple ideas contained in \(s\) is uniquely determined. It would appear that we now could define the concepts of logico-universal validity and logico-universal contravalidity in the following way: A proposition \(s\) is logico-universally valid, or — put briefly — logically true, iff \(s\) is universally valid with respect to \(i^{\boldsymbol{s}}\); \(s\) is logico-universally contravalid, or — put briefly — logically false, iff \(s\) is universally contravalid with respect to \(i^{\boldsymbol{s}}\); \(s\) is logically analytic iff \(s\) logically true or logically false; and \(s\) is logically synthetic iff\( s\) is not logically analytic.

In proceeding this way, however, we would have to face serious problems concerning purely logical propositions, i.e., propositions all of whose parts are purely logical ideas. Due to our requirement (v) above concerning Bolzano’s replacement operation, neither an \(i\)-variant in general nor an \(i^s\)-variant in particular is defined for a purely logical proposition, since it does not contain any extra-logical idea. In consequence the preceding definitions of logical truth, logical falsity and logical analyticity are not applicable to purely logical propositions, since they do not contain any extra-logical idea. Consider, however, the following three purely logical propositions: [There is something, or it is not the case that there is something], [There is something, and it is not the case that there is something], and [There is something]. The first of these three propositions is obviously logically true, the second one logically false, and the third one is neither logically true nor logically false. Giving up requirement (v), as some would like to have it, results in a purely logical proposition being its only own \(i^{\boldsymbol{s}}\)-variant. That, however, would turn every purely logical proposition either into a logical truth or into a logical falsity according to our definition, in contrast to the fact that the proposition [There is something], i.e. [[something] has non-emptiness], is not logically analytic; it is a truth of logic, but nevertheless not logically true (WL II, 375).

A posssible way out of this dilemma is to choose the alternative procedure sketched above (at the end of section 3.6) by taking these logical properties primarily to be properties of propositional forms. Thereby the logical form of a proposition s is identified with the set of all of its \(i^{\boldsymbol{s}}\)-variants; \(F\) is a logical propositional form therefore iff it is the logical form of at least one proposition. (Please note that according to this approach, the logical form of a purely logical proposition is not even defined; nevertheless, a purely logical proposition can be a member of a logical propositional form.) We will define first the relevant properties for propositional forms:

A propositional form F is logically valid iff \(F\) is a logical propositional form that is universally valid, i.e., at least one of its members is true, and all of its members with non-empty subject ideas are true.

\(F\)is logically contravalid iff \(F\) is a logical propositional form, and all of its members are false.

We then define the corresponding properties for single propositions:

A proposition \(s\) is logically true iff there is a propositional form \(F\) such that \(F\) is logically valid and \(s\) is a member of \(F\).

\(s\) is logically false iff there is a propositional form \(F\) such that \(F\) is logically contravalid and \(s\) is a member of \(F\).

\(s\) is logically analytic iff \(s\) is logically true or logically false.

\(s\) is logically synthetic iff \(s\) is not logically analytic.

It is easy to find an example of each of these kinds of propositions: the proposition [Every German philosopher is German] is logically true, the proposition [Kant is German and Kant is non-German] is logically false, and the proposition [Kant is a German philosopher] is logically synthetic. (Cf. Morscher 2007, 75–99.)

3.8 Bolzano’s Definition of Material Consequence and of Logical Consequence

Bolzano’s logical World 3 includes in addition to ideas and propositions also what we will call ‘arguments’. Bolzano is dealing with arguments at lengths in his Theory of Science (cf., e.g., WL II, 113 ff., 391 ff.), but he does not introduce a name for them. Following the general line of his terminology, he could have called them ‘Schlüsse an sich’ (‘derivations in themselves’ or ‘inferences in themselves’), but he did not; he rather used this term for a certain kind of propositions, namely for propositions stating that a proposition follows (or — in his words — is ableitbar, i.e., derivable) from a set of propositions (WL I, 213, WL II, 200; for another usage of the term ‘Schluß’ by Bolzano cf. section 4.4). A Bolzanian argument consists of two sets of propositions: the set of its premises and the set of its conclusions. In order to simplify matters, we will assume here that an argument has always a single proposition (rather than a whole set of propositions) as its conclusion, and we will identify an argument with an ordered pair \(\langle \sigma , s\rangle\) consisting of a set \(\sigma\) of propositions (i.e., the set of premises) and a single proposition \(s\) (i.e., its conclusion).

Bolzano first explains what it means that a single proposition \(s\) is derivable (ableitbar) from a set \(\sigma\) of propositions with respect to a certain sequence \(i\) of ideas (WL II, 113 ff., 198 ff.). Since Bolzano’s term ‘Ableitbarkeit’ (‘derivability’) is used nowadays in a purely syntactical sense, we use here instead the more common phrases ‘\(s\) follows from \(\sigma\) with respect to \(i\)’ or ‘\(s\) is a consequence of \(\sigma\) with respect to \(i\)’.

We have explained Bolzano’s method of idea-variation in section 3.6 with respect to single propositions. In order to apply it also to arguments, we have now to extend our original definitions to whole sets of propositions. In applying the operation of variation to a set \(\sigma\) of propositions, each member of \(\sigma\) is replaced by its corresponding variant: The j/i-variant of a set \(\sigma\) of propositions is the set of all the \(j/i\)-variants of the members of \(\sigma\). Moreover we will say of a set \(\sigma\) of propositions that it is true iff each of its members is true; and we will say that a sequence \(j\) of ideas verifies a set \(\sigma\) of propositions with respect to \(i\) iff \(j\) verifies each member of \(\sigma\) with respect to \(i\), i.e., iff the \(j/i\)-variant of each member of \(\sigma\) is true. A proposition \(s\) follows from a set \(\sigma\) of propositions (or, in other words, \(s\) is a consequence of \(\sigma)\) with respect to a sequence \(i\) of ideas iff every sequence \(j\) of ideas that verifies \(\sigma\) with respect to \(i\) verifies \(s\) as well with respect to \(i\).

In transferring this formulation into a formal definition, we have to bear in mind again that ‘each’ and ‘every’ has existential import also in Bolzano’s meta-language. The formal definition has therefore to be stated as follows:

s follows from \(\sigma\) with respect to \(i\) (or: \(s\) is a consequence of \(\sigma\) with respect to \(i)\) iff there is a sequence \(j\) of ideas such that \(j\) verifies \(\sigma\) with respect to \(i\), and every sequence \(j\) of ideas which verifies \(\sigma\) with respect to \(i\), verifies \(s\) likewise with respect to \(i\).

In this sense, e.g., the proposition [Kant is European] follows from the set {[Kant is a philosopher], [Every philosopher is German]} with respect to the idea [philosopher]. The conclusion follows, so to speak, “materially” from the premises, or is a “material” consequence of the premises, due to the fact that every German is European. This is not enough, of course, for an argument to be logically correct. In order to be logically correct, the conclusion \(s\) of an argument \(\langle \sigma , s\rangle\) must logically follow from \(\sigma\), i.e., \(s\) must be a logical consequence of \(\sigma\) (WL II, 391–395; the similarity with the distinction between material and formal consequence in Tarski 1956, 419, is obvious). A simple definition of logical consequence seems to suggest itself: \(s\) follows logically from \(\sigma\) (or: \(s\) is a logical consequence of \(\sigma)\) iff \(s\) follows from \(\sigma\) with respect to the sequence \(i^{\sigma \cup \{s\}}\) of all extra-logical simple ideas contained in \(\sigma\) or \(s\).

This simple answer, however, faces the same problems as the corresponding answer with respect to logical truth (cf. section 3.7). As we have done with logical truth and for the same reason, here too, we must give priority to the logical form of an argument and then proceed by this means to define the concept of logical consequence for particular arguments.

3.9 Further Applications of the Method of Idea-Variation

Beyond the usage of the method of idea-variation for his truly pioneering definitions of logical truth and logical consequence and related concepts (such as the concepts of satisfiability and compatibility), Bolzano made use of this method also for a series of other purposes, above all in his development of the theory of probability (WL II, 77–82, 171–191, 509–514, WL III, 136–138, 263–288, 559–568, RW II, 39–49, 57–61, 66–71). Bolzano’s theory of probability is based on his distinction of different degrees of validity of a proposition \(s\) with respect to a sequence \(i\) of ideas. This degree of validity of s with respect to i is representable as a fractional number \(\bfrac{m}{n}\) where \(n\) is the number of all possible variants of \(s\) with respect to \(i\) and \(m\) is the number of true variants of \(s\) with respect to \(i\). If all variants of \(s\) with respect to \(i\) with non-empty subject ideas are true, \(m = n\) and \(\bfrac{m}{n} = 1\), i.e., \(s\) is universally valid with respect to \(i\); if all variants are false, \(m = 0\) and \(\bfrac{m}{n} = 0\), i.e., \(s\) is universally contravalid with respect to \(i\) (WL II, 81 f.). The logical degree of validity of s is thus the degree of validity of \(s\) with respect to \(i^s\), i.e., with respect to a certain sequence of all simple extra-logical ideas contained in \(s\).

In order to be able to apply these notions in a useful way, we have to explain how to count the variants of a proposition, since for each variant of a proposition (as for each proposition in general) there are infinitely many others that are logically equivalent to it (e.g., due to replacing a part \([b]\) of the proposition by [non-non-\(b]\), [non-non-non-non-\(b]\) etc.). If we would count all of them, the resulting fractional number would not be very informative. Bolzano was completely aware of this problem (WL II, 79 f.), and he was very creative in developing methods for solving it as well as many other puzzling problems.

Bolzano is not content with this concept of probability simpliciter but rather continues to develop an even more important relative concept of probability. What is at stake here is the probability of a proposition \(s\) relative to a set \(\sigma\) of propositions with respect to a sequence \(i\) of ideas, and in particular with respect to \(i^{\sigma \cup \{s\}}\), i.e., the sequence of all simple extra-logical ideas contained in \(s\) or \(\sigma\). Its degree can again be represented by a fractional number \(0 \le^m /_n \le 1\), where \(n\) is the number of cases where \(\sigma\) comes out true and \(m\) is the number of cases where \(\sigma \cup \{s\}\) comes out true (WL II, 171–191; for a careful reconstruction of Bolzano’s theory of probability see Berg 1962, 148–150).

In his Tractatus (5.15) Ludwig Wittgenstein came so close to Bolzano’s definition of probability that Georg Henrik von Wright felt it to be appropriate “to speak of one definition of probability here and call it the Bolzano-Wittgenstein definition” (Wright 1982, 144 f.).

Bolzano’s work on probability was not only of purely theoretical interest to him but also had interesting practical consequences with respect to problems in the philosophy of science (cf. section 4) and in particular also with respect to religious questions (cf. section 8).

4. Epistemology and Philosophy of Science

Bolzano strove for objectivity in “pure logic” in the sense that the concepts and laws of logic are mind-independent. In “applied logic”, in particular in epistemology, however, we have to take into account also the real, i.e., empirical, conditions of the human mind and thinking according to Bolzano (WL I, 66 f.). Nevertheless, he defined  the basic concepts of epistemology primarily on the level of ideas and propositions. This gave rise to the misunderstanding that his investigations are worthless for epistemology proper or even that there is no epistemology proper at all in Bolzano’s work. The fact that this is by no means the case, will — hopefully — emerge from the following survey of Bolzano’s epistemology.

4.1 “Appearances” of Propositions and Ideas in Human Minds

In epistemology, we are primarily and directly not concerned with propositions and ideas, but rather with their appearances (Erscheinungen) in the minds of thinking beings (“im Gemüt von geistigen bzw. denkenden Wesen”). One and the same proposition or idea can, as Bolzano says, appear in the minds of different thinking beings or also at different times in the mind of one and the same thinking being, without thereby being multiplied (WL I, 217, WL III, 13, 112). Bolzano says, in such a case, that the thinking being and its mind “grasp” the proposition or idea in question (the corresponding German word being ‘erfassen’ or ‘auffassen’). What happens in such a case is that in the mind of the thinking being under consideration a mental phenomenon occurs, or a mental process takes place in it, that is called by Bolzano a ‘Gedanke’ (‘thought’); it can be a subjective idea or a subjective proposition, depending on whether an idea or a proposition “appears” in it.

In contrast to ideas and propositions (i.e., “objective” ideas and “objective” propositions), subjective ideas and subjective propositions belong to the real world, in particular to World 2 of mental phenomena and mental processes. For Bolzano, a subjective idea as well as a subjective proposition is a real property (or “adherence”) of the thinking being in whose mind it appears, or rather of this being’s mind or “soul” itself (WL III, 6, 10 f., 109). A subjective idea is a mental phenomenon — i.e., an attribute of a mind — that “grasps” an idea (in the “objective” sense of the word); and a mental phenomenon that “grasps” a proposition is called ‘Urteil’ (‘judgment’) by Bolzano (WL III, 108). In addition to judgments, there is a second kind of subjective propositions, viz. propositions that are “merely thought” (bloß gedacht); a “merely thought proposition” is in fact a subjective idea of a proposition, i.e. a mental phenomenon which grasps an idea whose object is a proposition (WL I, 155). Merely having a subjective idea of a proposition does not require that we assert the truth of the proposition in question, whereas a judgment is an act (Handlung) of asserting the truth of the proposition grasped by the judgment (WL III, 108, 199).

When we say of a subjective idea or a judgment that it “grasps” an idea or proposition, respectively, the word ‘grasp’ is used in a more restrictive sense than before, where it was a thinking being or its mind of which it was said that it “grasps” an idea or proposition. This stricter relation of “grasping”, holding between subjective ideas and ideas, and between judgments and propositions is fundamental for Bolzano’s epistemology. Instead of saying in this sense ‘\(p\) grasps \(o\)’, Bolzano will synonymously also use the phrase ‘\(o\) is the “material” (Stoff) of \(p\)’. Both formulations, however, are — as Bolzano emphasizes — to be understood merely metaphorically (Bolzano 1935, 84 f.). The corresponding relation is introduced as a primitive concept in Bolzano’s epistemology. Let us use the symbol ‘\(\mathbf{G}\)’ for this relation, whereby ‘\(p \mathbf{G} o\)’ is to be read as ‘\(p\) grasps \(o\)’ or, alternatively, ‘\(o\) is the “material” of \(p\)’.

In terms of ‘\(\mathbf{G}\)’, i.e., the strict relation of “grasping”, the weaker relation of “grasping” between a thinking being and an idea or proposition can be defined as follows: a thinking being \(x\) “grasps” (in the weaker sense of this word) an idea or proposition \(o\) iff there is a subjective idea or a judgment \(p\) in \(x\)’s mind such that \(p \mathbf{G} o\). The relation \(\mathbf{G}\) is the link between the mental phenomena of World 2 on the one hand and the World 3 of ideas and propositions on the other hand. Via relation \(\mathbf{G}\), items of World 3 can have a certain, non-causal influence on the mental phenomena of World 2, and these on their part stand in causal relations to other mental phenomena and also to the physical phenomena of World 1.

Due to the domain and the range of \(\mathbf{G}\) being disjunctive sets, the relation \(\mathbf{G}\) has the following formal features: it is irreflexive, asymmetric, and (trivially) transitive; moreover, \(\mathbf{G}\) is many-one, but not one-many. Due to \(\mathbf{G}\)’s being many-one, by each subjective idea and each judgment an idea or a proposition, respectively, is uniquely determined as its material (WL III, 8 f., 108). Most of the important properties, relations and distinctions, which were defined by Bolzano primarily for ideas and propositions, can therefore easily be transferred from the sphere of ideas and propositions to the sphere of subjective ideas and judgments. We therefore will say of a subjective idea that it is simple or complex, empty, singular or general, an intuition, a concept or “mixed” according as the idea grasped by it has the corresponding property; and the same goes for judgments. 

4.2 Subjective Intuitions and Subjective Concepts

An intuition is for Bolzano an idea that is simple and singular (cf. section 3.5). The question arises immediately whether such an intuition exists after all and — if so — what it can contribute to epistemology. Both questions are answered by Bolzano at once: In order to show that there are intuitions, he hints at subjective ideas (ideas in our minds) that grasp “objective” intuitions as defined before; and since these subjective intuitions exist in our actual world, the corresponding “objective” intuitions must exist (in the sense of ‘es gibt’) in the logical realm of World 3. What are the examples of subjective intuitions, however, that Bolzano can put forward in support of his claim? It is subjective ideas such as the subjective idea of the change in our mind that is the immediate reaction on an outer object (such as a rose) that stimulates our senses. In everyday language we usually express such an idea only by the word ‘that’ (‘dieses’ or — in Bolzano’s old-fashioned orthography — ‘dieß’). Bolzano’s rather long-winded explication (in WL I, 326 f.) reveals subjective ideas of a particular sensation or sense-datum as his favorite examples of subjective intuitions (cf. also WL III, 21 f.). The object and the cause of a subjective intuition of this kind is itself a mental phenomenon such as a subjective idea or a judgment (WL III, 85). If a subjective intuition is directly caused by an “outer” object, Bolzano calls it an ‘outer intuition’. Also in the case of an outer intuition, its proper object is not the “outer” cause of it but an “inner” mental event; human beings are capable only of having subjective intuitions whose proper object is a change in their mind (WL III, 89). In other passages Bolzano seems to be less cautious and claims also of an idea such as [Vesuvius] (WL II, 38) or [Socrates] (WL I, 346, in explicit contradiction to WL III, 89) to be a pure intuition whose appearance in the mind of a thinking being is a subjective intuition. This would obviously result in taking each rigid designator (in today’s terminology) to express an intuition.

In the same way in which a subjective intuition is defined as a subjective idea that “grasps” (in the sense of \(\mathbf{G})\) an “objective” intuition, we can also define subjective concepts and “mixed” subjective ideas (WL III, 21–23).

4.3 Judgments A Priori and A Posteriori

Using the distinction between intuitions and other ideas, Bolzano is now able to draw an important epistemological distinction among propositions and in particular also among true propositions: A proposition is a conceptual proposition iff it does not contain any intuition but consists exclusively of concepts, such as the propositions [God is omnipotent], [Gratefulness is a duty], or [\(\sqrt{2}\) is irrational]; all the other propositions are called ‘empirical propositions’ (or also ‘perceptual propositions’) by Bolzano, e.g. [That is a flower], or [Socrates was an Athenian] (WL II, 33 f.). There is no problem in transferring this distinction from the sphere of propositions to the sphere of judgments, since (as already mentioned) by every judgment a certain proposition is uniquely determined (via relation \(\mathbf{G})\) as its “material” (WL III, 115).

At first glance, this objective distinction among propositions seems to be far away from the Kantian distinction between judgments a priori and a posteriori. Nevertheless, the two distinctions are closely interrelated, and they almost coincide (WL II, 36); hence, Bolzano warns against confusing them (WL IV, 451 f.). The close relationship of the two distinctions becomes obvious as soon as we ask ourselves how to discover of a conceptual or an empirical proposition whether or not it is true: In the case of conceptual propositions, it is mere reflection, i.e., an inner “inspection” of our subjective concepts, without any experience, that is required to find out whether or not it is true, whereas in the case of an empirical proposition experience is indispensable for judging its truth or falsity (WL II, 36). This Kantian distinction of the different ways of recognizing the truth or falsity of such judgments, however, as important as it is, must be based on the more fundamental objective distinction between conceptual and empirical propositions on Bolzano’s view.

Empirical propositions contain at least one intuition. Most important are those empirical propositions whose subject idea is an intuition. These are propositions about perceptions or sensations, i.e., in Bolzano’s words, about certain changes in our minds, caused by other inner events or by external sensory stimuli. The subject idea of a “private” empirical proposition of this kind is usually expressed by a word such as ‘that’, denoting, e.g., a certain color sensation. No wonder that the indexicals ‘that’ and ‘I’ play such a prominent role in Bolzano’s epistemology (in WL III) although they do not have a place in his logical World 3 (cf. section 3.4). The reason for this seems to be that our empirical knowledge is based on immediate perceptual judgments, i.e., judgments that “grasp” (in the sense of \(\mathbf{G})\) a certain kind of an empirical proposition. The subjective subject idea of such an immediate perceptual judgment is a subjective intuition for whose expression an indexical such as ‘that’ or ‘I’ seems to be indispensable.

Bolzano quite clearly faced the problem of how to get from these immediate perceptual judgments, whose objects are completely “private” phenomena which we usually denote by means of indexicals, to an objective description of our world. His epistemology therefore reminds us in many respects of the discussions concerning protocol sentences among the representatives of phenomenalism and physicalism in the Vienna Circle, and even more of Bertrand Russell’s program in his Inquiry into Meaning and Truth (1940). The highly interesting similarities between Bolzano’s and Russell’s program still await further investigation.

4.4 Immediate and Mediated Judgments

Judgments are psychical phenomena and they belong therefore not to World 3 but to our real world. Each judgment is an act or event that takes place at a certain time in a certain mind and is herewith part of a causal network. As a part of our real world, each judgment comes into being in time (and will pass away later on). From an epistemological point of view it is of particular relevance whether a judgment is caused or mediated by other judgments or whether this is not the case, i.e., whether the judgment is “immediate” (WL III, 123 ff.). If a judgment \(m\) is caused or mediated by a set \(\mu\) of judgments, Bolzano calls the mind’s transition from \(\mu\) to \(m\) ‘Schluss’ (‘inference’), as distinct from the usage of this term explained in section 3.8. An inference in this sense is a mental process (belonging to World 2) of inferring a judgment \(m\) from a set \(\mu\) of others; we can represent it by \(\langle \mu , m\rangle\). Such an inference — as opposed to an “inference in itself” or an argument — is a causal process, to be clear. Since by each of the judgments involved in an inference — by the members of \(\mu\) as well as by \(m\) — a proposition is uniquely determined (due to \(\mathbf{G})\) as its “material”, by every inference \(\langle \mu , m\rangle\) an argument \(\langle \sigma , s\rangle\) is uniquely determined, for which Bolzano has defined what it means, e.g., that \(s\) is a logical consequence of \(\sigma\), or that \(s\) has a certain logical probability \(\gt \bfrac{1}{2}\) relative to \(\sigma\). (These concepts can then be applied indirectly to the inference \(\langle \mu , m\rangle\) and used for its evaluation, as we will see in the following section 4.5.)

From the obvious existence of mediated judgments, however, it follows that there must also be immediate judgments (WL III, 125, 138–139). Immediate judgments cannot be false and must therefore be certain (WL III, 212, 229, 263). Certainty has thereby not to be taken in its objective sense in which a proposition \(s\) is certain relative to a set \(\sigma\) of propositions iff the logical probability of \(s\) relative to \(\sigma\) is 1, i.e., iff \(s\) is a logical consequence of \(\sigma\) (WL II, 173). In the present context, certainty must rather be taken in a subjective sense in which it is primarily a property of a judgment; if two judgments grasp one and the same proposition, one of them can be certain (in this subjective sense of the term) whereas the other one is not (WL III, 263 f.). As the two most important kinds of immediate judgments among the empirical ones Bolzano mentions judgments of the form “I — have — an appearance \(X\)” and “That (what I just now perceive of) — has — property \(b\)” (WL I, 181, WL III, 131, 139, 229). Judgments of these two kinds are called ‘(immediate) perceptual judgments’, whereas the term ‘empirical judgment’ is normally used only for mediated judgments containing a subjective intuition (WL III, 131 f.). The propositions “grasped” by these immediate perceptual judgments are empirical propositions whose subject ideas are intuitions that are usually expressed by means of the indexicals ‘I’ and ‘that’. Bolzano’s philosophy of science can thus be found to be empiricist, founded on a phenomenalist basis.

With respect to all judgments \(m\) mediated by a set \(\mu\) of judgments, it is of high relevance whether the argument \(\langle \sigma , s\rangle\) corresponding to \(\langle \mu , m\rangle\) fulfills certain criteria. In the sections 3.8 and 3.9 we have already dealt with two logical relations which can obtain between the conclusion \(s\) and the set \(\sigma\) of premises of an argument \(\langle \sigma , s\rangle\) and which can easily be transferred to \(\langle \mu , m\rangle\): it is on the one hand the peculiar feature of \(s\) being a logical consequence of \(\sigma\), and on the other hand the peculiar feature of \(s\) having a certain degree of logical probability \(\gt \bfrac{1}{2}\) relative to \(\sigma\). With respect to empirical judgments, considerations of probability are in the foreground. Logical consequence “transfers” certainty, also in its subjective sense, from the premises to the conclusion of an inference. That is to say, if each member of a set \(\mu\) of judgments is certain for a person \(A\) (as is the case for each immediate judgment), and if a judgment \(m\) is mediated or caused by \(\mu\) insofar as it is inferred by \(A\) from \(\mu\) as a logical consequence of it, then \(m\) is also certain for \(A\) (WL III, 264 f.). In order for this to be the case, it is of course not enough for the argument \(\langle \sigma , s\rangle\) corresponding to \(\langle \mu , m\rangle\) to be logically correct, but it is required that \(A\) infers \(m\) from \(\mu\) in virtue (kraft) of the logical correctness of this argument.

Error and uncertainty have two possible sources according to Bolzano: either the premises that one presupposes are uncertain (or even false), or one has used a mere probability inference (WL III, 265 f.), i.e., an inference whose conclusion asserts the truth of a proposition \(s\) itself instead of merely asserting the truth of the proposition [\(s\) is probable] (WL I, 182 ff., WL II, 510, WL III, 212 f.). Considerations of this kind amount to quite a refined epistemological system of subjective probability, in which Bolzano distinguishes degrees of credibility and of assurance by using his probability theory (WL III, 274–288). Unfortunately, these investigations are little known, since they are only developed in the third volume of his Theory of Science which receives far less attention than it deserves.

4.5 The Entailment Relation

a) Explication of the Entailment Relation: In addition to logical consequence and probability, there is a third category, however, that is brought into play by Bolzano within this context: it is the relation which obtains between a set \(\sigma\) of propositions and a proposition \(s\) iff \(\sigma\) is the “objective ground” of \(s\) or — in other words — iff \(s\) “follows objectively” from \(\sigma\); in today’s terminology we say instead that \(\sigma\) entails \(s\) or that \(s\) is entailed by \(\sigma\). This relation of entailment (Abfolge) is — to be clear — primarily not an epistemological relation but — like (logical) consequence and (logical) probability — a relation between a set of propositions and a single proposition (WL II, 339 ff., WL III, 495 f.).

Bolzano’s favorite way of explaining this concept is by means of two inferences whose corresponding arguments are \(\langle \sigma_1, s_1\rangle\) and \(\langle \sigma_2, s_2\rangle\) such that the following holds: \(s_1\) describes the rising of a thermometer at a certain moment of time at a certain place, and \(s_2\) describes the rising of the temperature at the same place and time. \(\sigma_1\) contains the law that from the rising of temperature the extension of a liquid (in the thermometer) will follow, plus the required antecedent conditions, whereas \(\sigma_2\) contains the (statistically confirmed) proposition that, if a functioning thermometer at a certain time and place rises, then also the temperature there will rise, plus the corresponding antecedent conditions. (Sometimes Bolzano also uses an analogous example with atmospheric pressure and a barometer.) Let us assume that we have constructed the two arguments in such a way both that \(s_1\) is a logical consequence of \(\sigma_1\) and that \(s_2\) is a logical consequence of \(\sigma_2\). Nevertheless, Bolzano argues, there is an essential difference between the two examples insofar as \(\sigma_1\) is the \(_{}\)objective ground for \(s_1\), and \(s_1\) is therefore entailed by \(\sigma_1, _{}\)whereas this is not true for \(\langle \sigma_2, s_2\rangle\) (WL II, 192 f., 340, WL IV, 580 f., Bolzano 1975, 81 f.).

b) Inferring in virtue of Entailment: In inferring \(s_1\) from \(\sigma_1\) we show why \(s_1\) is true, whereas in inferring \(s_2\) from \(\sigma_2\) we merely show that \(s_2\) is true, as it was already formulated by Aristotle (Analytica posteriora I, chap. 13) to whom Bolzano refers back in this context again and again (cf., e.g., WL II, 341, WL IV, 15, 262). Hereby, however, we quietly switch from inferences in themselves, represented by \(\langle \sigma_1, s_1\rangle\) and \(\langle \sigma_2, s_2\rangle\), to the corresponding mental processes of inferring, represented by \(\langle \mu_1, m_1\rangle\) and \(\langle \mu_2, m_2\rangle\), respectively, where the judgement \(m_1\) (grasping \(s_1)\) or \(m_2\) (grasping \(s_2)\), respectively, is inferred from the set of judgements \(\mu_1\) (whose members grasp the members of \(\sigma_1)\) or \(\mu_2\) (whose members grasp those of \(\sigma_2)\), respectively. Since in our example \(m_1\) as well as \(m_2\) is a true judgement or an act of knowledge (an Erkenntnis, as Bolzano calls it), \(\mu_1\) as well as \(\mu_2\) are reasons or grounds of knowledge (Erkenntnisgründe) for \(m_1\) or \(m_2\), respectively. Whereas \(\mu_2\) is a mere ground of knowledge (bloßer Erkenntnisgrund) for \(m_2\), however, \(\mu_1\) is an objective ground (objektiver Grund) for \(m_1\). Strictly speaking, however, \(\mu_1\) and \(\mu_2\) are not grounds at all, but rather causes of \(m_1\) and \(m_2\), respectively, as Bolzano specifies in WL III, 231 (see also WL II, 304, 340 f., 365, WL III, 267). Bolzano calls the inference \(\langle \mu_1, m_1\rangle\) an objective proof (objektiver Beweis) or an objective justification (objektive Begründung), while he calls the inference \(\langle \mu_2, m_2\rangle\) a mere subjective proof (subjektiver Beweis) or a mere “certification” (bloße Gewißmachung) (RW I, 6 f., WL II, 341, WL IV, 261–263, Bolzano 1975, 83–85). Ideas quite similar to these can be found in discussions on the concept of scientific explanation within modern philosophy of science (cf., e.g., Wolfgang Stegmüller, Probleme und Resultate der Wissenschaftstheorie und Analytischen Philosophie, Vol. 1, Heidelberg-New York: Springer, 193, Adolf Grünbaum, Philosophical Problems of Space and Time, New York: Alfred A. Knopf, 309 f., or M. Scriven “Explanation and Predication in Evolutionary Theory”, Science 130 (1959), 477–482, cf. 480). Although only objective proofs are strictly scientific proofs for Bolzano (RW I, 7, WL IV, 261–263), his definition of a scientific textbook does not require that its proofs must be strictly scientific (WL I, 4, WL IV, 10 f., 15, 32). The duty to present objective proofs can be recognized, however, according to Bolzano from his concept of a science (WL IV, 10; cf. also WL IV, 32–34).

The argument \(\langle \sigma_2, s_2\rangle\), mentioned before, provides us with an instance of a proposition \(s\) being a logical consequence of a set \(\sigma\) of propositions without being entailed by \(\sigma\). Can a proposition \(s\) also conversely be entailed by \(\sigma\) without being a logical consequence of \(\sigma\)? Bolzano guesses that this is possible but he is not definite about it (WL III, 346–348). The two relations are clearly distinct from one another anyway, since the entailment relation is — unlike the relation of logical consequence — asymmetrical and irreflexive.

c) Entailment in various Areas of Knowledge: Whenever Bolzano touches on the topic of entailment, he introduces it by examples such as those mentioned above, viz. \(\langle \sigma_1, s_1\rangle\). In these examples, what is described by \(\sigma_1\) is the cause of the phenomenon described by \(s_1\). The entailment relation is not restricted, however, to these cases where it mirrors causality of our real world on the level of propositions in World 3; for Bolzano there are also obvious examples of the entailment relation in mathematics (e.g., RW I, 160 f., WL II, 191 f., 350, 361, 368, WL IV, 34, 262 f., 448, Bolzano 1841, 106 f., Bolzano 1842, 433, Bolzano 1975, 82), ethics (e.g., WL II, 339, 348, 359, 361), metaphysics (e.g., WL II 354, WL IV, 33) and theology (e.g., RW I, 6 f., 13, WL II, 354, 361, 368). Although the majority of examples Bolzano gives for the entailment relation in WL are taken from natural sciences, he himself worked for much of his life, with great originality and success, inspired by the search for strict entailment proofs of major results in mathematics.

d) Entailment and Proof Theory: The idea of using the concept of entailment and of developing it further emerged for Bolzano originally, in fact, in connection with his mathematical studies. He criticised in his first publication (Bolzano 1804) some classical proofs for the theory of triangles and parallels for using inappropriate concepts such as motion and the plane. With hindsight we could say he thought such proofs could not express the entailment relations needed to give the objective grounds for the propositions to be proved and that they are therefore not — as they sould be — objective justifications but merely subjective proofs or certifications. The motivation of searching for such objective proofs in many areas of mathematics led to many original and fruitful concepts not appreciated, or re-discovered, until many decades later. No wonder then that Bolzano developed special rules for the relation of entailment in cases where it obtains between (sets of) conceptual propositions (Begriffssätze) as in mathematics and metaphysics: if a proposition \(s\) is a member of the set \(\sigma\) which is the objective ground of a conceptual proposition \(s', s\) must not contain more conceptual parts than \(s'\) (WL II, 384); when Bolzano says “not more”, however, he means rather “no other simple concepts than those contained also in \(s\)”.

The relation of entailment between (sets of) conceptual truths has the characteristic feature that, according to it, from the smallest number of premisses the largest number of conclusions will follow none of which has simple components which are not also contained in its premisses (WL II, 386). Ideas such as these sound akin to Gerhard Gentzen’s characterization of normal proofs: “They do not make a detour. They do not introduce concepts which are not contained in its final result and must therefore be used necessarily in order to get it” (Gerhard Gentzen, “Untersuchungen über das logische Schliessen”, Mathematische Zeitschrift 39, 1934/35: 176–200, 405–431, see p.177). It has been pointed out, therefore, by several commentators, that there are interesting parallels between Bolzano’s semantic notion of entailment and Gentzen’s syntactic concept of “normal proofs” (cf. Buhl 1958, 85 f., Berg 1962, 151–164, and, more recently, Rumberg 2012), and that Bolzano in a certain sense anticipated Gentzen’s Hauptsatz (Berg 1987, 41). (In Schröter 1955, 60–61, 85–86, and Schröter 1958, 32–34, Gentzen’s consequence relation is compared with Bolzano’s relation of Ableitbarkeit, but, unfortunately, Bolzano’s relation of entailment (Abfolge) is not taken into consideration in this context by Schröter.)

In spite of a certain lack of clarity in Bolzano’s explication, it is obvious that his concept of entailment is of great relevance not only for the philosophy of the empirical sciences but also with respect to proof theory. It is hard, however, to see how to reconcile the characteristic features of the entailment relation in its application to causality (in the empirical sciences) with those in its application to proof theory.

e) Entailment and Grounding: Also the recent philosophical “movement” on grounding has an obvious affinity to Bolzano’s theory of entailment, as witnessed by numerous publications such as Schnieder & Correia 2012, Rumberg 2012, or Roski 2017.

5. Ethics

In addition to his trail blazing works in logic, Bolzano made valuable contributions to other subdisciplines of philosophy, in particular to ethics. Ethical considerations entered, to be sure, into various works of Bolzano, especially of course into the ones concerning the science of religion, but also (which is perhaps to be expected less) into his logical works. These ethical considerations of Bolzano were, however, never published together.

5.1 Critique of Kant’s Categorical Imperative

Bolzano’s main objection against the Categorical Imperative was that we cannot derive from it alone — as Kant supposed — whether a given act ought to be done or not. Kant’s instruction to ask ourselves of a maxim whether we can will without contradicting ourselves that it should become a universal law is of no use, according to Bolzano, since for him there is no practical proposition or ought proposition whose contradictory opposite is self-contradictory. This, however, is not a decisive argument against Kant’s Categorical Imperative for several reasons. Nevertheless, Bolzano refused to accept the Categorical Imperative strictly and replaced it with the utilitarian principle of “the advancement of the general welfare”, as he proudly reports in his autobiography (Bolzano 1836, 23).

5.2 Bolzano’s Supreme Moral Law

The supreme moral law that Bolzano put in place of Kant’s Categorical Imperative was by no means original. Bolzano, however, modified and justified it in an original way and consistently applied it to many different areas. By the supreme moral law Bolzano means “a practical truth [i.e., a true ought proposition] from which every other practical truth […] can be derived objectively, i.e., as the consequence from its ‘ground’” (RW I, 228; cf. also RW I, 44, 244, 256, RW IV, 27, 217, 221, and WL II, 348, WL IV, 178). Thus, on the basis of the asymmetry of Bolzano’s entailment relation (Abfolge), the supreme moral law must be an ought proposition that does not objectively follow from (i.e., it is not entailed by) any other ought proposition. It must therefore be a basic truth, i.e., a truth that does not have an objective “ground”, but can only \(be\) an objective “ground” of other (practical) truths (WL II, 375, RW I, 229, RW IV, 207).

Bolzano’s supreme moral law consists in the utilitarian requirement of advancing the general welfare (RW IV, 206, 227, 236; Bolzano 1836, 23, 43; WL IV, 26 f., 178). Briefly, this supreme moral law is formulated thus: “Strive to bring about the greatest amount of happiness” (RW I, 250), or: “Always act as the best for all or the welfare of the whole demands” (RW IV, 216, also 218, 221, and 229). On the basis of careful considerations, Bolzano arrives at the following definitive version of his supreme moral law:

Always choose from all actions that are possible for you the one which, all consequences considered, most advances the welfare of the whole, in whatever parts (RW I, 236; cf. WL IV, 119).

Bolzano specifies the content of the thus obtained formulation of the supreme moral law in several respects (RW I, 235). His explanations exhibit a remarkable awareness of problems. Thus, he points out that all sentient beings are equal and must be equally involved in the increase of happiness or decrease of suffering (RW I, 235). The addendum that this goes for beings “for whom there are no varying degrees of virtue” indicates that Bolzano would allow for certain distinctions in the case of beings which are capable of being virtuous (and for which there are consequently also differences of degree in regard to kinds of happiness which other beings cannot appreciate). The capacity of being virtuous is therefore — no less than sentience — a morally relevant quality for him. In this Bolzano agrees with considerations in contemporary ethics, according to which the quality of personhood is, in addition to sentience, morally relevant.

Bolzano stresses that, in assessing an action according to the principle of advancing the general welfare, one must “not only look at its proximate consequences, but also at further ones” (RW I, 237). Since we can never know all the consequences of an action, the principle of advancing the general welfare demands that we always decide in favor of the action which seems most conducive to the welfare of the whole according to those consequences thereof which we can foresee arising from it (RW I, 241). With a similar argument Bolzano replies to the objection that according to his principle the moral value of our actions would depend on mere chance, as the following example seems to show: “If someone with the intention of killing his neighbor drew a dagger against him, but accidentally only opened a boil and this were now healed thereby, he would have performed a good work”. This view, however, rests on a misunderstanding, according to Bolzano, since for him “the moral goodness of an action (i.e., its claim to being rewardable) is always a matter of whether the action has been undertaken with a view to agreeing with the law” (RW I, 240).

5.3 Bolzano’s Ethics as a “Mixed” Normative Theory

Bolzano developed his ethics in explicit opposition to Kant’s moral philosophy. Nevertheless, Bolzano’s ethics contains also essential elements of Kantian ethics, and there is even a basic coincidence between Bolzano’s and Kant’s ethics. The only thing that can be regarded as good without qualification, according to Kant, is a good will (Grundlegung zur Metaphysik der Sitten, 1785, 1). Yet (as we will see in section 5.4), it is a basic postulate of Bolzano’s deontic logic that an ought always primarily refers to a willing: You ought to will to act such that the welfare of the whole, due to the consequences foreseeable by you and intended by your action, undergoes the greatest possible advancement among all possible alternative actions. Bolzano himself infers from this: The supreme moral law demands “properly only a willing, not the accomplishment” (RW IV, 207).

What is primarily judged as obligatory or forbidden is not the act, but a willing or decision, as Bolzano emphasizes. An action that is willed must thus be assessed according to those consequences which the agent thereby intends or wills to achieve: For an action to be morally good it is not enough, as we have already seen (at the end of section 5.2), that it is in accordance with the moral law, but it must be undertaken also with the intention for it to be so (RW IV, 266), i.e., due to the moral law (RW IV, 269). In this manner Bolzano abandons the scope of the purely consequentialist position which claims that the moral assessment of an action or of the willing-an-action as being obligatory, permissible or forbidden depends solely on its consequences. Bolzano’s utilitarianism is consequently not a purely consequentialist normative theory, but rather a mixed theory. In presenting such a mixed ethical theory, Bolzano came already close to a modern conception of ethics (such as, e.g., that outlined in William K. Frankena’s Ethics, 2nd edition, 1973, 43 ff.) which is very common within today’s applied ethics.

5.4 Bolzano’s Deontic Logic

Bolzano developed a particular logic for ought propositions which — without today’s formalism — comes already close to modern deontic logic in certain respects. The primitive form of an ought proposition is \([A\) — has — an ought of \(X]\) or, more accurately, \([A\) — has — an ought to will to do \(X]\) (WL II, 70; slightly different in RW I, 228). The concept [ought] is simple (WL II, 69, WL IV, 489), but its usage underlies certain principles stated explicitly by Bolzano:

(P1) It is not the case that \((A\) ought to will to do \(X\) and \(A\) ought not to will to do \(X)\).
(P2) If \(A\) ought to will to do \(X\), then \(A\) is permitted to will to do \(X\).
(P3) If \(A\) ought to will to do \(X\) and \(A\) ought to will to do \(Y\), then \(A\) ought to will to do \(X\) and \(Y\).
(P4) If \(A\) ought to will to do \(X\), then \(A\) can will to do \(X\).
(P5) If \(A\) ought to will to do \(X\) and willing to do \(X\) entails willing to do \(Y\), then \(A\) ought to will to do \(Y\).

(P1) is a deontic principle of non-contradiction (RW IV, 264 f.); (P2) is the principle that “ought implies permitted” (RW I, 236); (P3) is a kind of combination principle for ought (RW I, 229 f.); (P4) is the “ought implies can” principle (RW I, 230, 257, RW IV, 214, and WL II, 348); and (P5) is a deontic entailment principle (RW I, 229, WL II, 339, 348).

When it comes to the question of how to interpret ought sentences, Bolzano — like most of his contemporaries — was obviously not aware of the fundamental problem involved in this question. Bolzano took ought sentences in his standard formulation without further ado as expressions of propositions, and he took it therefore for granted that they are true or false in the usual sense of these words, as explained by his definitions of truth and of falsity. He thus clearly held a cognitivist metaethical position, probably even a naturalistic one, using his utilitarian principle as a meaning postulate for ought sentences. In support of this understanding of Bolzano’s position, it can be put forward that Bolzano interpreted also other kinds of linguistic sentences in a simple naturalistic way. Even questions, e.g., are interpreted by Bolzano not as sentences expressing a wish for information but as describing such a wish and therefore being true or false in the usual sense of these words (WL I, 88, WL II, 71–76, 194–196).

The most important field in which Bolzano applied his ethical views was political and social philosophy. Before we switch to this topic (in section 7) we will deal with Bolzano’s aesthetics.

6. Aesthetics

Bolzano published two treatises in aesthetics: “On the Concept of the Beautiful” (Bolzano 1843b) appeared while he was alive, while the other one, entitled “On the Division of the Fine Arts” (Bolzano 1849b), was presented by him in the Royal Bohemian Society of Sciences in 1847 but was published only posthumously.

In the first of these two aesthetic essays Bolzano proposes the following definition of the concept of the beautiful:

The beautiful must be an object whose contemplation can give to all human beings properly developed in their cognitive faculties a pleasure, and the reason for this is that, upon apprehending some of the object’s properties, neither is it too easy for them nor does it cause for them the effort of distinct thinking, to form a concept of this object which allows them to guess the other properties that are apprehended only by further contemplation and thereby gives them at least an obscure intuition of the proficiency of their cognitive faculties (Bolzano 1843b, 27 and 30).

It is hard to see how, according to this definition, there could be beautiful objects if there did not exist certain human dispositions; and, obviously, there can be human dispositions only if there are human beings. Bolzano’s definition seems therefore to make beauty ontologically dependent on the existence of human beings as possible beholders of beautiful objects. This makes Bolzano’s aesthetics in a certain sense subjectivist. By taking Bolzano’s definition to be a conditional definition in today’s sense, we could avoid this consequence; but in this case beauty would not be defined for a world without human beings, and in such a world there were no beautiful objects. Bolzano himself, however, did not draw such conclusions from his definition, but quite on the contrary: He claimed explicitly that there would be beautiful objects in the world even if no human being existed (Bolzano 1843b,  67). Be that as it may, Bolzano does by no means advocate an extreme form of subjectivism in aesthetics. For him, the beauty of an object depends also, and even primarily, on certain inner properties, in particular on certain regularities of the object itself which give rise to its possible effects on the beholders. This puts Bolzano’s basic aesthetic view in a middle position between extreme subjectivism and extreme objectivism. In any case, Bolzano’s essay on the concept of the beautiful includes a quite subtle psychological analysis of phenomena that are relevant for aesthetics and play an important role in today’s aesthetic research.

In his second aesthetic treatise (Bolzano 1849b), Bolzano explains his understanding of fine arts and of works of fine art, and he presents a classification of fine arts based on an ontological analysis of the works of fine art.

7. Political and Social Philosophy

In a series of writings Bolzano was concerned also with political, social, national, economic questions and generally with philosophy of state. The central one of these writings was no doubt his “booklet” On the Best State (Bolzano 1932). Therein he summarized his political philosophy systematically and developed his conception of an ideal state. For Bolzano, the main question to be answered in this connection is: How can we eliminate or at least reduce human suffering and evil in the world most effectively? It was the question which, according to Bolzano’s own statement, occupied him with the greatest frequency, intensity and enthusiasm above all others (Bolzano 1932, III). Some suffering of human beings and some evil in the world are unavoidable, due to our finite nature, and therefore cannot be excluded even in an ideal state with optimal arrangements. Much suffering and evil, however, could be prevented by means of expedient political arrangements (Bolzano 1932, 3 f.). It is the fault of poor arrangements in all civil constitutions thus far, according to Bolzano, that the human condition is so deplorable. In On the Best State, Bolzano therefore devotes himself to the question as to how a state would have to be most expediently arranged or how a perfect state would have to look (Bolzano 1932, V, 1). The leading principle that Bolzano applies in answering this question is his supreme moral law: The political arrangements are to be made in such a manner that the general welfare or virtue and happiness are all advanced as far as possible (Bolzano 1932, III, 7 f.). From it he tried to derive all the rules and regulations needed in a well-organized state.

In 28 chapters Bolzano describes how the best state looks and therefore also how the currently existing states should be arranged. In these chapters Bolzano treats the following topics: 1. the citizens of the state, its size and its divisions; 2. legislation; 3. government; 4. compulsory institutions; 5. liberty; 6. equality; 7. freedom of thought and of religion; 8. education and instruction; 9. care for health and for life; 10. property; 11. money; 12. occupations and life styles; 13. productive activities; 14. trade; 15. scholars; 16. books and censorship; 17. fine arts; 18. nourishment; 19. clothing; 20. housing; 21. gender specific institutions; 22. satisfaction of the pursuit for honor; 23. travels; 24. enjoyments; 25. disputes among citizens; 26. taxes and state expenditures; 27. rewards and punishments; 28. death.

A mere comparison of the chapters in terms of their size is revealing: The longest chapter by far is the tenth, concerning property, followed by the chapter on taxes and state expenditures and the chapter on rewards and punishments. From this it is clear that the unequal division of possessions was Bolzano’s greatest concern; it was for him the main root of evil, which was to be removed by means of a just redistribution. Bringing about a certain equality regarding the rights and duties of citizens is an important concern for Bolzano. How little Bolzano cares for the principle of liberty, however, becomes manifest already by the fact that the chapter on liberty is the second shortest chapter in his booklet (the shortest being the one on travelling). The constitution of Bolzano’s best state turns out to be a very ambivalent mixture of regulations which make an impression of being very progressive with respect to the desired equality for the citizens, but extremely objectionable with respect to the liberties conceded to them.

Bolzano did not shy away from taking up also practical problems in publications and writing about them, for instance, about the improvement of poorhouses and about the elimination of misery and poverty in the population of Prague. Bolzano treated these and many other questions of practical relevance also in his “edifying addresses” (Erbauungsreden), of which the first collection was published already in 1813 (in a second edition 1839), and five volumes were published posthumously. The first volume of the complete critical edition of all of Bolzano’s Erbauungsreden appeared in 2007 (Bolzano 2007a).

8. Philosophy of Religion and Theology

In questions concerning the science of religion and theology, Bolzano exhibited views with which he was in part far ahead of his time and which sound very current at present. It is no wonder that he encountered rejection and resistance on certain points in which his departure from the church doctrine at that time was too great.

Bolzano’s main work in theology is his four volume Textbook of the Science of Religion, which was published in 1834 by his pupils — without any mention of the author — from their very deficient lecture notes (much to Bolzano’s displeasure). What is meant by ‘science of religion’ (also ‘philosophy of religion’ or ‘philosophical doctrine of religion’), according to Bolzano, is the “science of the most perfect religion” (RW I, 3). Here Bolzano presupposes a concept of religion that is, to be sure, interesting, but not unproblematic from the Catholic standpoint. Bolzano starts with religion in the subjective sense, i.e., the religion of a person; this is, according to Bolzano, the set of religious opinions of this person. The content or “material” (Stoff) of a religion in the subjective sense is a religion in the objective sense. Thus, a religion in the objective sense is a set of propositions which can be grasped (in the sense of \(\mathbf{G}\) as explained in section 4.1) by a religion in the subjective sense. Bolzano’s concept of religion is consequently based on his definition of religious propositions or religious opinions: A proposition (and analogously also a subjective proposition or a judgment, an opinion etc.) is on Bolzano’s view religious iff it is both (generally) important and moral. A proposition is (generally) important iff it generally exerts influence on our virtue and happiness (RW I, 51 f.); and a proposition is moral iff “there is in the nature of man a reason for the temptation, without being justified in this, to acknowledge it either as true or as false” (RW I, 58). Thus, as a summary of Bolzano’s definition of the concept of religion in the subjective sense, the following may be stated: The religion of a person is “the collection of all those opinions of this person which manifest either an advantageous or a disadvantageous influence on his virtue or his happiness and are at the same time such that there was a special temptation, without any sufficient reason, to decide either in favor of or against them” (RW I, 60 f.).

Closely connected with this concept of religion is Bolzano’s view that many doctrines of the Christian religion, e.g. the doctrine of the descent of all human beings from a single parental couple or the doctrine of original sin, are only metaphorical in character. Original sin is for him not real sin, but rather it bears this name only insofar as it has its origin in Adam’s sin and insofar as it displeases God (RW IV, 47 f.). As regards the question of descent, what is of importance in this doctrine is not its truth but only that all human beings are essentially equal in such a way as if they had descended from one and the same parental couple, whereas it does not matter whether they are also really descendent from only a single couple (RW IV, 17). The image of the common descent of all human beings is, independently of its truth content, very important “in order to maintain the sentiments of brotherly love among us” (RW IV, 18).

Here Bolzano’s non-cognitivist (i.e., emotive and directive) interpretation of religious language is especially clear. This conception goes back to the key experience in his religious development, whereby he was able to overcome his religious doubts, and which essentially influenced his decision to become a priest: From Marian Mika, his professor in pastoral theology, he came to the conviction that a religious doctrine is justified, independently of its truth content, only insofar as the belief in it is morally advantageous.

A question in regard to which Bolzano adopted an especially interesting position was the problem of miracles. According to the traditional view, they are supernatural events or even immediate effects of God. Sometimes this is understood in the sense that miracles are events which are not explainable by means of the laws of nature or even incompatible with these laws. This view, however, has to face serious problems as Bolzano has painfully made clear (cf. RW I, 422–439, especially 424–436). Bolzano rejects these definitions mainly for the following reason: “If by the laws of nature one here meant laws a priori, no divergence from them would be possible; if, by contrast, one meant empirical laws of nature, a departure from these is nothing but what has been called an unusual occurrence” (RW I, 436). Being an “unusual occurrence” is on Bolzano’s own view a necessary (though not a sufficient) characteristic of a miracle (RW I, 437). An unusual event, however, is simply an event that is improbable (RW II, 68), hence an event whose intrinsic probability is \(\lt \bfrac{1}{2}\) (Bolzano 1838, 383). It can happen, however, that in every possible explanation for a fact certain unusual events would have to be presupposed, and that in such a case the assumption of a miracle, of which we receive a report, is the least improbable and consequently the most probable explanation (RW II, 69). Such circumstances do not, however, detract from the divinity of miracles and revelation but rather can have certain advantages, for these miracles thus become credible (RW I, 441 f.).

A careful treatment of this problem therefore requires bringing into play considerations of probability theory. This makes understandable what could otherwise be seen as very strange for a theological textbook: Bolzano’s Textbook of the Science of Religion contains a section on mathematical probability theory (RW II, 39 ff.). However, also the choice of certain examples and the focus on certain methodological questions in The Theory of Science can better be understood if one sees that they are theologically motivated. Quite interesting in this respect are Bolzano’s investigations into the discovery and credibility of testimonies and into the degree of credibility of a proposition with respect to testimonies that are in favor of it as well as of testimonies against it (WL III, 555–568); he used these investigations as a basis for his theory of the divine revelation. The special treatment of proofs, “which are only to show that the probability of a proposition exceeds a given magnitude” (WL IV, 294–296), is closely connected with the topic of miracles: In order to prove that an event \(E\) is an unusual event and thus qualifies to be a miracle, one must demonstrate that the intrinsic probability of the assumption that \(E\) has not occurred is \(\gt \bfrac{1}{2}\) and therefore exceeds a certain magnitude. The specification of a particular degree of probability, however, is not required for this. Bolzano’s digression into probability theory in his Textbook of the Science of Religion and his careful use of probability theory in the discussion of miracles are obviously directed towards arguments brought forward by David Hume, although Bolzano does not mention his name in this context.

Two questions discussed during Bolzano’s time and once again topical at present are those concerning the indissolubility of marriage and concerning celibacy. Bolzano advocated the indissolubility of marriage without restrictions or exceptions (RW IV, 356 ff.). This, however, is not an article of faith but merely a disciplinary prescription of the Catholic Church that is subject to change, as he points out in other writings (Bolzano 1813, 221, Bolzano 1845, 98, 374). This view even allows in certain cases, e.g., in the case of demonstrated adultery, the annulment of a marriage (Bolzano 1845, 98, 374, Bolzano 1932, 101). Bolzano’s position regarding celibacy bore the stamp of his own experience which he quite openly depicts in his autobiography (Bolzano 1836, 25). While Bolzano earlier (in RW IV, 371, 388 f.) expressed himself cautiously concerning celibacy (that he has not yet adopted a definitive opinion about it), he later explicitly favors the elimination of celibacy (in Bolzano 1845, 93 f., 258, 367) and declares celibacy to be “harmful and inappropriate” (cf. Fesl’s note in Bolzano 1836, 94 f.).

9. Metaphysics

Bolzano’s most important metaphysical doctrines are found in his Athanasia (Bolzano 1827), in the Paradoxes of the Infinite (Bolzano 1851), and in his writings that he left unpublished; Bolzano’s pupil Příhonský, moreover, gave an exposition of Bolzano’s Atomism (Příhonský1857). Athanasia was first published anonymously (in 1827), its second edition appeared in 1838 with a statement of authorship. Its full title “Athanasia or Reasons for the Immortality of the Soul” makes clear that the book pursues a theoretical goal. Bolzano combines with this theoretical goal of the book a practical purpose as well; it is also a “book of consolation” or (as the subtitle of the second edition says) “a book for every educated person who wants peace of mind regarding this matter”.

From traditional metaphysics Bolzano adopts the doctrine that everything real is either a substance or an adherence (cf. Schnieder 2002). Substances are either themselves simple or composed of simple substances; simple substances (i.e., monads, according to Leibniz) are called ‘atoms’ by Bolzano. The soul is a simple substance. Bolzano attempts to prove that no simple substance can begin or cease to be (in time). This attempt at a proof on Bolzano’s part, however, is deficient, as he himself observed. From this brief sketch it is already evident that Bolzano’s metaphysical views bore a definite stamp from the tradition, especially from Leibniz. In contrast with Leibniz’s doctrine of the “windowlessness” of the monads and of the pre-established harmony that this requires, however, Bolzano assumes an interaction among the finite atoms or monads. (Cf. Bolzano 1827, 48–50, 67, 92 f., 114 f., 2nd edition: 421, 441; Bolzano 1851, reprint 1975: 112 f., 118, E: Russ 2004, 666 f., 670; Příhonský 1857, 7.)

Every attribute of a real object is itself something real. An adherence is an attribute of something real, i.e., of a substance or of another adherence. The adherences of a human being or of a mind must therefore themselves belong to World 2 or World 1. They are therefore particulars and not universals. This view is supported by Bolzano’s claim that each “private” mental phenomenon, such as a feeling, a desire, a volition or a thought (i.e., a subjective idea or a subjective proposition), is an attribute of the individual mind that “has” it, where ‘has’ expresses the copula (WL II, 69). It is a particular attribute of an individual (or, in today’s terminology, a trope) that cannot be shared by any other individual: if both, \([A_1\) has \(b]\) and \([A_2\) has \(b]\), are true and \(b\) is a subjective idea or any other mental phenomenon, then \(A_1\) must be identical with \(A_2\). Bolzano’s theory of propositions, however, conveys the impression that attributes are universals. For in the standard examples he gives for a true proposition \([A\) has \(b]\), the attribute \(b\) is a universal, such as erudition, that can be shared by different objects (WL I, 130). Obviously, we must admit that some of Bolzano’s attributes are universals and others are particulars. In this case, however, the word ‘has’, which expresses the copula of each proposition according to Bolzano, is used ambiguously by him.

Bolzano connected his metaphysical views with the physical doctrines of his time (see section 10). Nevertheless his metaphysical doctrines strike us — at least at first glance — as rather backward. This reproach seems to be justified with respect to the Athanasia. In his other writings (in particular in his Theory of Science), however, Bolzano developed quite modern metaphysical ideas that come close to views of today’s analytic ontology (cf. Berg 1992) and mereology (cf. Krickel 1995). For example, according to the analysis of propositions that Bolzano developed in his theory of science, a time qualification is required in the subject idea of every proposition whose subject (i.e., the object of its subject idea) is a real thing (WL I, 113, 202, 364 f., WL II, 15). This condition is required in order to avoid “Hegelian” contradictions in cases where the object the proposition is about (i.e., its subject) undergoes a change. Sometimes Bolzano restricts this requirement to propositions in which a non-permanent property is attributed to a changeable substance (WL II, 239), since this is sufficient for avoiding the aforementioned contradictions. Due to this proposal, the proposition [Cajus at time \(t_1\) has erudition] and the proposition [Cajus at time \(t_2\) has lack of erudition] can both be true as long as \(t_1\) and \(t_2\) are different; for if \(t_1\) is different from \(t_2\), then the ideas [Cajus at time \(t_1\)] and [Cajus at time \(t_2\)] have different objects (WL I, 202, 365). These remarks indicate that Bolzano conceived of changeable substances such as Cajus as four-dimensional objects, extended in space and time. An idea such as [Cajus at time \(t_1\)] can pick out a time slice of the four-dimensional Cajus; such a time slice or momentary object as Cajus at time \(t_1\) is also an object for Bolzano, but ontologically it is secondary. Considerations such as these result in Bolzano’s proposal to use this property for the definition of time: Time is for Bolzano the condition or qualification that is required in order to make a proposition about a (changeable) real object true or false (WL I, 365).

10. Philosophy of Nature and of Physics

It is but a small step from some of Bolzano’s rather traditional metaphysical views into the realm of the philosophy of nature and of physics. Bolzano introduces a force of attraction among substances (Bolzano 1827, 48) and later also a force of repulsion (Bolzano 1851, reprint 1975: 121, 123 f., E: Russ 2004, 671 f., 673). For the force of attraction Bolzano attempts to prove the Newtonian law that it is inversely proportional to the square of the distance (Bolzano 1827, 50, Bolzano 1851, reprint 1975: 121 f., E: Russ 2004, 671 f.), and further that the force of attraction of two substances is related proportionally to the set (i.e., presumably, to the product of the numbers) of atoms contained in these substances.

Starting from these metaphysical questions concerning the foundations of physics, Bolzano then occupied himself in several works also with concrete questions in natural science (e.g. in Bolzano 1842, 1843c, and 1851), and in particular with physical and astronomical questions. Although he was not able to aim at new and enduring results in these areas, his writings nonetheless show that he was also seriously occupied with such questions and could be “conversant” in the status of these disciplines during his day. To be mentioned here are especially his work on the composition of forces (Bolzano 1842) and two essays in the Annals of Physics and Chemistry, in which he was concerned with the writings and theories of Christian Doppler (Bolzano 1843a and 1847). A summary of Bolzano’s contributions to the philosophy of nature and to physics can be found in Berg 2003.

11. Philosophy of Mathematics

11.1 Early mathematical works

Bolzano began his mathematical investigations with a work in geometry (Bolzano 1804) and continued with publications in the area of analysis. He essentially formulated the modern criterion of convergence in his Purely Analytic Proof (Bolzano 1817, 11 f.) already four years prior to Cauchy’s Course d’analyse (1821). This work already contains the so-called Bolzano-Weierstrass theorem, which again occurs in Bolzano’s posthumously edited Theory of Functions (Bolzano 1930, 28 f., BGA IIA, 10/1: 47 f.). Here (Bolzano 1930, 66–70, 98 f., BGA IIA, 10/1: 79–82, 103) we find also for the first time an example of a continuous and still non-differentiable function; for a long time, Weierstrass had been regarded as the first one who discovered such functions, until historical justice was done by Karel Rychlík’s investigations.

11.2 Preparatory Writings in Set Theory

In his Paradoxes of the Infinite (Bolzano 1851) and in the Theory of Quantity Bolzano took the first steps towards the development of set theory and anticipated many of its important ideas. In this connection mention is especially often made of Bolzano’s grasp of the “paradoxical” fact that an infinite set can and must be equipollent with one of its proper subsets, i.e., is “reflexive”. This special feature of infinite sets was later used for their definition by Dedekind. For Bolzano, equipollence and “having exactly the same kind of construction” (die ganz gleiche Entstehungsart haben) are taken together as a sufficient condition for infinite sets being equinumerous or having the same cardinal number. This view, however, contradicts the unrestricted application of the classical Euclidean principle that the whole is greater than each of its parts. Bolzano was aware of this conflict and therefore restricted the principle to finite sets. From here the step is not far to Dedekind’s view that equipollence is a sufficient condition for equinumerosity.

Bolzano’s proof for the existence of an infinite set is well known among mathematicians, and there are references to it even in Cantor 1883/84, Dedekind 1888, and Russell 1903. Bolzano proves by mathematical induction that there are infinitely many “truths in themselves”, i.e., true propositions. For the induction basis, i.e., that there is at least one true proposition, he uses an indirect proof (as shown already in section 3.3). Bolzano’s induction hypothesis is the assumption that there are at least \(n\) true propositions which we can enumerate as \(S_1, S_2 ,\ldots ,S_n\). Bolzano proves that there must be at least \(n+1\) true propositions by reductio again: If there were not at least \(n+1\) true propositions, i.e., if there were at most \(n\) true propositions, then — according to the induction hypothesis — \(S_1, S_2 ,\ldots ,S_n\) would be the only true propositions; but then there would be another true proposition \(S_{n+1}\), viz. [\(S_1, S_2,\ldots\) and \(S_n\) are the only true propositions], and \(S_1, S_2 ,\ldots ,S_n\) would therefore not be the only true propositions (WL I, 146 f.). Bolzano proposes also a second way for proving this by constructing a series of true propositions in which we add to any true proposition \(S_n\) another true proposition [\(S_n\) is true] that is (due to Bolzano’s criterion for the identity of propositions) different from \(S_n\). Given any true proposition \(S\) whose existence is proved by the induction basis, this will result in an infinite series of true propositions of the following kind: \(S\), [\(S\) is true], [[\(S\) is true] is true] etc. (WL I, 147, Bolzano 1851, § 13). In constructing this series, Bolzano uses a relation \(T\) that can be defined as follows:

\(Txy \text{ iff } y = [x \text{ is true}].\)

‘\(Txy\)’ is here an abbreviation for: \(y\) is the proposition that the proposition \(x\) is true. The relation \(T\) has the following properties:

  1. \(\forall x\exists yTxy\) (i.e., \(T\) is serial)
  2. \(\forall x\forall y(Txy \rightarrow \forall z(Txz \rightarrow y = z))\) (i.e., \(T\) is a many-one relation)
  3. \(\forall x\forall y(Tyx \rightarrow \forall z(Tzx \rightarrow y = z))\) (i.e., \(T\) is a one-many relation)
  4. \(\exists x\forall y\neg Tyx\)

The statement that a relation with the properties (1)–(4) exists is Alonzo Church’s infinity axiom \(\infty 3\) (in Introduction to Mathematical Logic, Vol. I, 1956, 343).

11.3 New Foundations of Mathematics

All these interesting achievements of Bolzano regarding details nonetheless seem insignificant in view of his epochal attempt, which he unfortunately could not complete, to put all of mathematics on new foundations. The fact alone that Bolzano sensed the necessity of such a new grounding of mathematics shows his mathematical instinct, although this program could only much later be realized.

12. Metaphilosophy and History of Philosophy

In the well known work What is Philosophy? Bolzano elucidated his concept of philosophy and of philosophizing and put forward his view of the task of philosophy (Bolzano 1849a). Philosophizing is not restricted to a certain area of knowledge, according to Bolzano. As soon as you ask for reasons, you are philosophizing, and this can be done in any discipline, also outside of the genuine fields of philosophy. Bolzano does not conclude from this, however, as later Ludwig Wittgenstein, Moritz Schlick and Rudolf Carnap did, that there is no proper realm of philosophical problems and philosophical subject matters. Quite to the contrary, he adhered to the traditional division of philosophy into subdisciplines according to the different subject matters that are concerned.

Moreover, Bolzano was also learned in the history of philosophy; he had great historical knowledge which he injected into his various works. Thus in the second edition of Athanasia, for instance, there is added an extensive appendix with a “critical survey of the literature concerning immortality since 1827”, and Bolzano’s essay on the concept of beauty contains a detailed list of definitions of the concept of the beautiful, which were proposed by a variety of philosophers (1843b, 45–92); likewise the Theory of Science contains in the notes a wealth of historical material, which makes it a great source for the historian of logic.

13. The So-called Bolzano Circle and Bolzano’s Influence on Intellectual History

13.1 The So-called Bolzano Circle

Already at an early time Bolzano came to be surrounded by a circle of friends and pupils who spread his thoughts about and stayed connected with their teacher, in spite of all reprisals. Michael Josef Fesl (1788–1864) and Franz Příhonský (1788–1859) were Bolzano’s closest collaborators in many cases and responsible for the edition of his writings (which Bolzano could not himself publish due to the ban of publication hanging over his head). They wrote in addition various works (introductions to editions of works, reviews and discussions of books, and replies to unfavorable reviews), for which Bolzano himself often provided the outline. Only Robert Zimmermann (1824–1898), whom Bolzano had privately taught philosophy and mathematics, had a career as a professional philosopher. In 1859 he was called, under Minister Thun, to the philosophical chair of the University of Vienna, which he took up in 1861. (Franz Brentano became his colleague there.) Zimmermann was, however, mainly concerned with aesthetics and turned more and more away from Bolzano’s philosophy to Herbart’s.

13.2 Bolzano’s Influence on Intellectual History

Bolzano was a forerunner of important theories and ideas in various areas of knowledge. Many of Bolzano’s ideas had to be discovered anew since Bolzano’s preparatory work remained unknown in many cases and has come to light only from historical research. Superficially speaking, it seems as if Bolzano had hardly any direct influence at all in the proper sense on the development of the sciences, although he accomplished significant research. This may of course in large part be due to the special circumstances under which Bolzano had to work and publish. His writings thus often appeared anonymously and were for this reason often generally unknown — at least not known under his name. Although Bolzano did not directly influence modern developments — in the area of logic, for instance —, he obviously did achieve a very tangible “indirect” and subliminal effect. For Bolzano’s views were familiar to very many who passed them on, partly with the mention of his name and partly without any such mention. Thus, Bolzano’s philosophy has not remained completely ineffectual: We know that Twardowski was well familiar with Bolzano (Twardowski 1894), and we know that Łukasiewicz was well acquainted with Bolzano’s method of idea-variation, as a section in his book on Logical Foundations of Probability Theory (Łukasiewicz 1913, § 24) shows. It is to be suspected that the whole famous Polish school of logic was thereby indirectly influenced by Bolzano without knowing exactly the places where this influence was exerted, and without Bolzano being mentioned in a way which would have been appropriate. Franz Brentano had studied with particular interest, as he himself confessed, the Paradoxes of the Infinite; he was not, however, as well familiar with Bolzano’s philosophy as one often suspected. Nevertheless, it seems improbable that this familiarity with Bolzano, as little as is was, could have remained without any effect on his pupils such as Marty, Meinong, and Stumpf, although some of whom were “outcasts” from the orthodox Brentanian circle. Bolzano’s influence on Husserl, however, is well-known, and Husserl himself made no secret of it.

Bolzano had also effect upon some great figures of Bohemian cultural life such as Palacký, Havliček, and Čelakovský; this effect was based mainly on his moral, social and political views — hence, all things considered, on those views for which he could not claim any particular originality. The offshoots of Bolzano’s ethical and political ideas reached and influenced, however, even the Charta 77 movement in the former Czechoslovakia some of whose representatives appealed explicitly to Bolzano.


The complete edition of Bolzano’s works (Bernard-Bolzano-Gesamtausgabe) was founded by Jan Berg and Eduard Winter together with the publisher Günther Holzboog, and it started in 1969. Since then 99 volumes have already appeared, and about 37 more are forthcoming. The editors were, apart from Jan Berg and Eduard Winter, Friedrich Kambartel, Jaromir Loužíl, Edgar Morscher and Bob van Rootselaar. The acting editor is Edgar Morscher.

In this bibliography the following abbreviations will be used:

[BGA] Bernard-Bolzano-Gesamtausgabe, with a Roman numeral for the series and Arabic numerals for the volumes; if a volume consists of two or more parts, the reference to them will appear after a dash in Arabic numerals. The BGA is published by Friedrich Frommann Verlag–Günther Holzboog in Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt.
[RW] Bolzano 1834, with Roman numerals for the volumes and Arabic numerals for the pages of the original edition.
[WL] Bolzano 1837, with Roman numerals for the volumes and Arabic numerals for the pages of the original edition.
[BBF] Beiträge zur Bolzano-Forschung, 28 volumes so far. The BBF are published by Academia Verlag in Sankt Augustin and edited by Edgar Morscher and Otto Neumaier; from vol.23 on: edited by Winfried Löffler and Otto Neumaier.
[E] English translation (or edition).

This bibliography is divided into two parts: Bolzano’s writings and Secondary literature.

Bolzano’s Writings

(1804) Betrachtungen über einige Gegenstände der Elementargeometrie, Prague:  Karl Barth; E: “Considerations on Some Objects of Elementary Geometry”, in Russ 2004, 25–81.
(1810) Beyträge zu einer begründeteren Darstellung der Mathematik. Erste Lieferung, Prague: Caspar Widtmann; reprint: Darmstadt: Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft, 1974; E: “Contributions to a Better-Grounded Presentation of Mathematics”, in Russ 2004, 83–137.
(1813) Erbauungsreden für Akademiker, Prague: Caspar Widtmann; BGA I, 2; 2nd improved and enlarged edition: Sulzbach: J. E. v. Seidel, 1839.
(1817) Rein analytischer Beweis des Lehrsatzes, dass zwischen je zwey Werthen, die ein entgegengesetztes Resultat gewähren, wenigstens eine reelle Wurzel der Gleichung liege, Prague: Gottlieb Haase; reprints: 1894 and 1905; E: “Purely Analytic Proof of the Theorem that between any two Values, which give Results of Opposite Sign, there lies at least one real Root of the Equation”, in Russ 2004, 251–277.
(1827) [anonymous] Athanasia oder Gründe für die Unsterblichkeit der Seele, Sulzbach: J. E. v. Seidel; 2nd improved and enlarged edition (no longer anonymous): Sulzbach: J. E. v. Seidel, 1838; reprint: Frankfurt/M.: Minerva, 1970.
(1834) [anonymous]  Lehrbuch der Religionswissenschaft, ein Abdruck der Vorlesungshefte eines ehemaligen Religionslehrers an einer katholischen Universität, von einigen seiner Schüler gesammelt und herausgegeben, 3 parts in 4 volumes, Sulzbach: J. E. v. Seidel; BGA I, 6–8; E of selected parts in Bolzano 2007b, 171–229.
(1836) Lebensbeschreibung des Dr. B. Bolzano, Sulzbach: J. E. v. Seidel; 2nd edition: Vienna: Wilhelm Braumüller, 1875.
(1837) Wissenschaftslehre. Versuch einer ausführlichen und grösstentheils neuen Darstellung der Logik mit steter Rücksicht auf deren bisherige Bearbeiter, 4 volumes, Sulzbach: J. E. v. Seidel; 2nd improved edition: Leipsic: Felix Meiner, 1929, 1929, 1930, and 1931; reprints: Aalen: Scientia, 1970 and 1981; BGA I, 11–14; E (complete translation): Theory of Science. Translated by Rolf George and Paul Rusnock, 4 vols., Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2014.
(1838) [anonymous] Review of Bolzano 1837, Freimüthige Blätter über Theologie und Kirchenthum, New series 11: 331–401; BGA IIA, 12/1: 101–147.
(1839) [anonymous]  Dr. Bolzano und seine Gegner. Ein Beitrag zur neuesten Literaturgeschichte, Sulzbach: J. E. v. Seidel; reprint: Amsterdam: Rodopi, 1970; BGA I, 16/1: 13–153.
(1841) [anonymous] Bolzano’s Wissenschaftslehre und Religionswissenschaft in einer beurtheilenden Uebersicht, Sulzbach: J. E. v. Seidel.
(1842) Versuch einer objectiven Begründung der Lehre von der Zusammensetzung der Kräfte, Prague: Kronberger and Řivnáč; BGA I, 18: 9–60.
(1843a) “Ein Paar Bemerkungen über die neue Theorie in Herrn Professor Chr. Doppler’s Schrift: ‘Ueber das farbige Licht der Doppelsterne und einiger anderer Gestirne des Himmels’”, Annalen der Physik und Chemie, 60: 83–88; BGA I, 18: 77–85.
(1843b) Abhandlungen zur Ästhetik. Über den Begriff des Schönen. Eine phi\(loso\)phische Abhandlung, Prague: Borrosch et André; BGA I, 18: 87–238.
(1843c) Versuch einer objectiven Begründung der Lehre von den drei Dimensionen des Raumes, Prague: Kronberger & Řiwnač; BGA I, 18: 219–238.
(1845) [anonymous] Ueber die Perfectibilität des Katholicismus. Streitschriften zweier katholischer Theologen; zugleich ein Beitrag zur Aufhellung einiger wichtigen Begriffe aus Bolzano’s Religionswissenschaft, Leipsic: Leopold Voss [Bolzano’s contributions: pp. 50–117 and 247–399]; BGA I, 19/1–2.
(1847) “Christ. Doppler’s neueste Leistungen auf dem Gebiete der physikalischen Apparatenlehre, Akustik, Optik und optischen Astronomie”, Annalen der Physik und Chemie, 72: 530–555.
(1849a) Was ist Philosophie?, Vienna: Wilhelm Braumüller; reprints: 1960, 1961, 1964, 1965, 1969; BGA IIA, 12/3: 13–33.
(1849b) Über die Eintheilung der schönen Künste. Eine ästhetische Abhandlung, Prague: J. G. Calve; Gottlieb Haase.
(1851) Paradoxien des Unendlichen, ed. by Franz Přihonský, Leipsic: C. H. Reclam sen.; reprints: 1889, 1920, 1955, 1964 and 1975; E: Paradoxes of the Infinite, ed. by Donald A. Steele, London: Routledge and Kegan Paul, and New Haven: Yale University Press, 1950; and in Russ 2004, 591–678.
(1930) Functionenlehre, ed. by Karel Rychlík, Prague: Royal Bohemian Society of Sciences; BGA IIA, 10/1: 23–165; E: “Theory of Functions with Improvements and Additions to the Theory of Functions”, in Russ 2004, 429–589.
(1932) Von dem besten Staate, ed. by Arnold Kowalewski, Prague: Royal Bohemian Society of Sciences; BGA IIA, 14: 19–144; E: “The little book on the best state or Thoughts of a friend of mankind on the most suitable institutions for civil society”, in Bolzano 2007b, 235–356.
(1935) Der Briefwechsel B. Bolzano’s mit F. Exner, ed. by Eduard Winter, Prague: Royal Bohemian Society of Sciences; BGA III, 4/1; E: “Selections from the Bolzano–Exner Correspondence”, in Bolzano 2004, 83–174.
(1944) Der Bolzanoprozess. Dokumente zur Geschichte der Prager Karlsuniversität im Vormärz, ed. by Eduard Winter, Brno-Munich-Vienna: Rudolf M. Rohrer.
(1965) Wissenschaft und Religion im Vormärz. Der Briefwechsel Bernard Bolzanos mit Michael Josef Fesl 1822–1848, ed. by Eduard Winter and Wilhelm Zeil, Berlin: Akademie-Verlag; BGA III, 2/1 (three more volumes will follow).
(1975) Einleitung zur Grössenlehre. Erste Begriffe der allgemeinen Grössenlehre, ed. by Jan Berg, Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Frommann-Holzboog [BGA IIA, 7]; E of pp. 23–78: “On the Mathematical Method”, in Bolzano 2004, 40–82.
(1977) Miscellanea Mathematica 1803–1844, Issues 1–24, ed. by Bob von Rootselaar and Anna van der Lugt, Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Frommann-Holzboog, 1977 ff., not yet completed [BGA IIB, 2–13, IIB 12/2, 13/1 and 13/2 not yet published].
(1979) Philosophische Tagebücher, ed. by Jan Berg, Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Frommann-Holzboog, 1979 ff., not yet completed [BGA IIB, 14–18].
(2004a) The Mathematical Works of Bernard Bolzano, translated and ed. by Steve Russ, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
(2004b) On the Mathematical Method and Correspondence with Exner, ed. by Paul Rusnock and Rolf George, Amsterdam-New York/NY: Rodopi.
(2005) Briefe an František Příhonský 1824–1848, ed. by Jan Berg, Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Frommann-Holzboog [BGA III, 3/1–3].
(2007a) Erbauungsreden der Studienjahre 1804/05 bis 1819/20, ed. by Edgar Morscher and Kurt F. Strasser, Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Frommann-Holzboog, 2007–2017 [BGA IIA, 15–25].
(2007b) Selected Writings on Ethics and Politics, translated by Paul Rusnock and Rolf George, Amsterdam-New York/NY: Rodopi.
(2016) Beiträge zu Bolzanos Biographie von Josef Hoffmann und Anton Wisshaupt sowie vier weiteren Zeitzeugen, ed. by Edgar Morscher and Anneliese Müller, Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Frommann-Holzboog [BGA IV, 1/3].
(2017) Briefwechsel mit Franz Exner 1833–1844, ed. by Edgar Morscher, Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Frommann-Holzboog [BGA III, 4/1].

Secondary Literature

  • Benthem, Johan van, 1984, Lessons from Bolzano, Stanford: Center for the Study of Language and Information [Series: Report, no. CSLI–84–6].
  • Berg, Jan, 1962, Bolzano’s Logic, Stockholm-Göteborg-Uppsala: Almqvist & Wiksell.
  • –––, 1987, Einleitung des Herausgebers. BGA I, 12/1, 9–62.
  • –––, 1992, Ontology without Ultrafilters and Possible Worlds. An Examination of Bolzano’s Ontology, Sankt Augustin: Academia [BBF 1].
  • –––, 2003, “Bolzanos Naturphilosophie und ihre Beziehung zur Physik”, in Morscher 2003, 137–149.
  • Berg, Jan & Ganthaler, Heinrich & Morscher, Edgar, 1987, “Bolzanos Biographie in tabellarischer Übersicht”, in  Morscher 1987, 353–372.
  • Berg, Jan & Morscher, Edgar, (eds.), 2002, Bernard Bolzanos Bibliothek, 2 volumes, Sankt Augustin: Academia [BBF 14 and 15].
  • Bergmann, Shmuel Hugo, 1909, Das philosophische Werk Bernard Bolzanos mit Benutzung ungedruckter Quellen kritisch untersucht, Halle/S.: Max Niemeyer; reprint: Hildesheim-New York: Georg Olms, 1970.
  • Bolzano-Symposium, 1974, Bolzano-Symposium “Bolzano als Logiker”, Vienna: Österreichische Akademie der Wissenschaften.
  • Buhl, Günter, 1958, Ableitbarkeit und Abfolge in der Wissenschaftstheorie Bolzanos, Cologne: Kölner Universitätsverlag [PhD Thesis, Mainz 1958].
  • Cantor, Georg, 1883/84, “Ueber unendliche, lineare Punktmannichfaltigkeiten”, no. 5 and 6, Mathematische Annalen, 21: 545–591, see especially  pp. 560 f., 576; and  Mathematische Annalen, 23: 453–488, see especially p. 455.
  • Casari, Ettore, 2016, Bolzano’s Logical System, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Centrone, Stefania, 2015, Studien zu Bolzano, Sankt Augustin: Academia [BBF 26].
  • Coffa, J. Alberto, 1991, The  Semantic Tradition from Kant to Carnap. To the Vienna Station, ed. by Linda Wessels, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press; reprint 1993.
  • Dedekind, Richard, 1888, Was sind und was sollen die Zahlen?, Braunschweig: Friedrich Vieweg; 2nd edition: Braunschweig: Friedrich Vieweg, 1893, pp. XVI and 17.
  • Dubislav, Walter, 1931,  “Bolzano als Vorläufer der mathematischen Logik”, Philosophisches Jahrbuch, 44: 448–456.
  • Etchemendy, John, 1990, The Concept of Logical Consequence, Cambridge/MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Føllesdal, Dagfinn, 1997, “Bolzano’s Legacy”, in Künne & Siebel & Textor 1997, 1–11.
  • George, Rolf, 1992, “Concepts of Consequence”, in Wissenschaftslehre 1992, 3–26.
  • Hieke, Alexander & Neumaier, Otto, (eds.), 2003, Philosophie im Geiste Bolzanos, anlässlich des 222.Geburtstages von Bernard Bolzano Edgar Morscher gewidmet, Sankt Augustin: Academia.
  • Kraus, Lukas Benedikt, 2014, Der Begriff des Kontinuums bei Bernard Bolzano, Sankt Augustin: Academia [BBF 25].
  • Krickel, Frank, 1995, Teil und Inbegriff, Bernard Bolzanos Mereologie, Sankt Augustin: Academia [BBF 5].
  • Künne, Wolfgang, 2008, Versuche über Bolzano – Essays on Bolzano, Sankt Augustin: Academia [BBF 21].
  • Künne, Wolfgang & Siebel, Mark & Textor, Mark, (eds.), 1997, Bolzano and Analytic Philosophy, Amsterdam: Rodopi.
  • Lapointe, Sandra, 2011, Bolzano’s Theoretical Philosophy: An Introduction, Basingstoke-New York: Palgrave Macmillan. 
  • Löffler, Winfried, 1999, (ed.), 2002a, Bernard Bolzanos Religionsphilosophie und Theologie, Sankt Augustin: Academia [BBF 12].
  • Łukasiewicz, Jan, 1913, Die logischen Grundlagen der Wahrscheinlichkeitsrechnung, Krakau: Akademie der Wissenschaften–Viktor Osławski’scher Fonds, pp. 58–69: “§ 24. Bolzano’s Begriff der Gültigkeit”, and p. 74.
  • Morscher, Edgar, 1968, Das logische An-sich bei Bernard Bolzano, Ph.D. Thesis, Innsbruck; printed version with revisions: Salzburg-Munich: Anton Pustet, 1973.
  • –––, (ed.), 1987, Bolzano-Studien, Meisenheim/Glan: Anton Hain [Series: Philosophia Naturalis, Vol. 24, Issue 4].
  • –––, (ed.), 1999, Bernard Bolzanos geistiges Erbe für das 21. Jahrhundert, Sankt Augustin: Academia [BBF 11].
  • –––, (ed.), 2003, Bernard Bolzanos Leistungen in Logik, Mathematik und Physik, Sankt Augustin: Academia [BBF 16].
  • –––, 2007, Studien zur Logik Bernard Bolzanos, Sankt Augustin: Academia [BBF 20].
  • –––, 2008, Bernard Bolzano’s Life and Work, Sankt Augustin: Academia [BBF 22].
  • –––, 2016, Bernard Bolzanos Lehre von Grund und Folge. Eine axiomatische Rekonstruktion, Sankt Augustin: Academia [BBF 27].
  • Příhonský, Franz, 1850, Neuer Anti-Kant oder Prüfung der Kritik der reinen Vernunft nach den in Bolzano’s Wissenschaftslehre niedergelegten Begriffen, Bautzen: A. Weller; new edition: 2003 [BBF 9: 1–184].
  • –––, 1857, Atomenlehre des sel. Bolzano, Budissin: E. M. Monse; new edition: 2003 [BBF 9: 233–251].
  • Roski, Stefan, 2017, Bolzano’s Conception of Grounding, Frankfurt/M.: Klostermann.
  • Rumberg, Antje, 2013, “Bolzano’s Concept of Grounding (Abfolge) Against the Background of Normal Proofs”, Review of Symbolic Logic, 6: 424–459.
  • Rusnock, Paul, 2000,  Bolzano’s Philosophy and the Emergence of Modern Mathematics, Amsterdam-Atlanta/GA: Rodopi.
  • Russ, Steve, 2004, The Mathematical Works of Bernard Bolzano, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Russell, Bertrand, 1903, The Principles of Mathematics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press; 2nd edition: New York: W. W. Norton, and London: George Allen & Unwin and McLeod, 1937.
  • Schnieder, Benjamin, 2002, Substanz und Adhärenz. Bolzanos Ontologie des Wirklichen, Sankt Augustin: Academia [BBF 13].
  • Schnieder, Benjamin & Correia, Fabrice, (eds.), 2012, Metaphysical Grounding, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Scholz, Heinrich, 1937,  “Die Wissenschaftslehre Bolzanos. Eine Jahrhundert-Betrachtung”, Abhandlungen der Fries’schen Schule, New series 6: 399–472.
  • Schröter, Karl, 1955,  “Theorie des logischen Schliessens I”, Zeitschrift für mathematische Logik und Grundlagen der Mathematik, 1: 37–86.
  • –––, 1958,  “Theorie des logischen Schliessens II”, Zeitschrift für mathematische Logik und Grundlagen der Mathematik, 4: 10–65.
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  • Simons, Peter M., 1992, Philosophy and Logic in Central Europe from Bolzano to Tarski. Selected Essays, Dordrecht-Boston-London: Kluwer.
  • Tarski, Alfred, 1936, “Über den Begriff der logischen Folgerung”, Actualités scientifiques et industrielles, 394: 1–11; E: “On the Concept of Logical Consequence”, in Tarski 1956, 409–420, see especially p. 417.
  • –––, 1956, Logic, Semantics, Metamathematics. Papers from 1923 to 1938, Oxford: Clarendon Press; 2nd edition, ed. by John Corcoran: Indianapolis/IN: Hackett, 1983.
  • Tatzel, Armin, 2002, “Bolzano’s Theory of Ground and Consequence”, Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic, 43: 1–25.
  • Textor, Mark, 1996, Bolzanos Propositionalismus, Berlin-New York: Walter de Gruyter; PhD Thesis, Hamburg 1993.  
  • Twardowski, Kasimir, 1894, Zur Lehre vom Inhalt und Gegenstand der Vorstellungen. Eine psychologische Untersuchung, Vienna: Alfred Hölder; reprint: Munich-Vienna: Philosophia, 1982. 
  • Winter, Eduard, 1933, Bernard Bolzano und sein Kreis, Leipsic: Jakob Hegner.
  • –––, 1949, Leben und geistige Entwicklung des Sozialethikers und Mathematikers Bernard Bolzano 1781–1848, Halle/S.: Max Niemeyer.
  • –––, 1969, Bernard Bolzano. Ein Lebensbild, Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Frommann-Holzboog [BGA E, 1].
  • Wissenschaftslehre, 1992, Bolzano’s Wissenschaftslehre 1837–1987, Firenze: Leo S. Olschki.
  • Wright, Georg Henrik von, 1982, Wittgenstein, Basil Blackwell: Oxford.
  • Zeithammer, Gregor, 1997, Biographie Bolzanos, ed. by Gerhard Zwerschke, Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Frommann-Holzboog [BGA IV, 2].
  • Zimmermann, Robert, 1852, Philosophische Propaedeutik für Obergymnasien. Erste Abtheilung: Empirische Psychologie für Obergymnasien, Vienna: Wilhelm Braumüller.
  • –––, 1853, Philosophische Propaedeutik für Obergymnasien. Zweite Abtheilung: Formale Logik für Obergymnasien, Vienna: Wilhelm Braumüller.  
  • –––, 1860, Philosophische Propaedeutik, 2nd revised edition, Vienna: Wilhelm Braumüller; 3rd edition: Vienna: Wilhelm Braumüller, 1867.

Other Internet Resources


I am indebted to Maria Reicher, Robin Rollinger, Steve Russ, Peter Simons, and to Anneliese Mueller for their help in preparing this article, and in particular to the subject and administrative editors of Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy for their valuable corrections and improvements.

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Edgar Morscher <>

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