# Bernard Bolzano

*First published Thu Nov 8, 2007; substantive revision Tue Dec 11, 2018*

Bernard Bolzano (1781–1848) was a Catholic priest, a professor
of the doctrine of Catholic religion at the Philosophical Faculty of
the University of Prague, an outstanding mathematician and one of the
greatest logicians or even (as some would have it) *the*
greatest logician who lived in the long stretch of time between
Leibniz and Frege. As far as logic is concerned, Bolzano anticipated
almost exactly 100 years before Tarski and Carnap their semantic
definitions of logical truth and logical consequence; and in
mathematics he is not only known for his famous *Paradoxes of the
Infinite*, but also for certain results that have become and still
are standard in textbooks of mathematics such as the
Bolzano-Weierstrass theorem. Bolzano also made important contributions
to other fields of knowledge in and outside of philosophy. Due to the
versatility of his talents and the various fields to which he made
substantial contributions he became one of the last great polymaths in
the history of ideas.

The presentation of Bolzano’s personality that is given here would still be incomplete unless it were added that Bolzano was also a great philanthropist. This becomes evident not only by Bolzano’s writings in ethics and political philosophy, but it also manifests itself in practice by his activities for the benefit of the poor, subjugated, discriminated and disadvantaged people. Together with his friends and pupils he supported activities in favor of such things as poorhouses, homes for the blind, loan banks for the working-class, and libraries and elementary schools in the countryside.

The first section of the article deals with Bolzano’s biography, and the second section presents a survey of Bolzano’s main writings; the following sections (3 to 12) are devoted to the different branches of philosophy to which Bolzano made contributions. In the final section (13) Bolzano’s influence on the development of the sciences and on the intellectual life in Bohemia is considered.

- 1. Bolzano’s Life and Scientific Career
- 2. Bolzano’s Main Writings
- 3. Logic
- 3.1 Bolzano’s Concept of Logic
- 3.2 Bolzano’s Conception of Logic
- 3.3 The Basis of Bolzano’s Logic and of his Whole Philosophy
- 3.4 Bolzano’s Analysis of Propositions (i.e., of his “Sentences in Themselves”)
- 3.5 Bolzano’s Theory of Ideas (i.e., of his “Ideas in Themselves”)
- 3.6 Bolzano’s Method of Idea-Variation
- 3.7 Bolzano’s Definition of Logical Truth
- 3.8 Bolzano’s Definition of Material Consequence and of Logical Consequence
- 3.9 Further Applications of the Method of Idea-Variation

- 4. Epistemology and Philosophy of Science
- 5. Ethics
- 6. Aesthetics
- 7. Political and Social Philosophy
- 8. Philosophy of Religion and Theology
- 9. Metaphysics
- 10. Philosophy of Nature and of Physics
- 11. Philosophy of Mathematics
- 12. Metaphilosophy and History of Philosophy
- 13. The So-called Bolzano Circle and Bolzano’s Influence on Intellectual History
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Bolzano’s Life and Scientific Career

Bernard Bolzano was born on 5 October 1781 in Prague. His father came from Lombardy (hence the Italian surname), though he lived already from childhood in Bohemia; by profession he was a merchant. Bolzano’s mother came from the German speaking family Maurer in Prague. Bernard was the fourth of twelve children altogether, most of whom died young.

When he was ten years old, Bolzano entered the *Gymnasium*
(i.e., a kind of classical secondary school) of the Piarists in
Prague, which he attended from 1791 to 1796. He subsequently began his
“philosophical studies” at the University of Prague; they
lasted three years, roughly corresponding to the higher level of high
schools. Included in the “philosophical studies”, besides
philosophy itself, were subjects such as history, languages, and
biology, but above all also mathematics and physics. In the autumn of
1800 Bolzano began his study of theology at the University of Prague.
At that time such a course of studies lasted four years; he finished
it in the summer of 1804.

Bolzano got ordained as Roman Catholic priest on 7 April 1805. A few
days later, on 17 April 1805, he received his doctorate of philosophy
at the University of Prague. Just two days later, on 19 April 1805, he
took up the newly established chair for religious doctrine in the
Philosophical Faculty at the University of Prague, which had been
granted to him provisionally by the Austrian Emperor, Kaiser Franz
(Francis I), on 13 February 1805. The definitive occupancy of this
chair was followed by his appointment as *professor ordinarius*
on 23 September 1806.

According to a decree of 3 February 1804, the chairs for religious
doctrine were established for the sake of “improving religious
instruction”. Connected with these professorships was the
important assignment to deliver the Sunday homilies, also called
‘exhortations’ or ‘*Erbauungsreden*’
(‘*edifying addresses*’), to the students (Bolzano
gave them voluntarily also on holidays); the effectiveness of these
chairs (whose occupants were therefore also called
‘catechists’ — cf. Bolzano 1836, 31) was thereby
essentially enhanced.

Bolzano’s liberal intellectuality and his progressive
theological and political ideas, combined with his practical
activities and his enormous influence as a priest and as a university
professor on people in general and the opinion leaders in Bohemia in
particular, were a highly explosive mixture in the political and
religious atmosphere in which Bolzano lived. Bohemia and its capital
Prague were at his time part of the Austrian empire. Due to Prince
Klemens Metternich, a very illiberal and repressive political system
was established in the Austrian empire by means of police force and
censorship. All kinds of liberal and national movements were
suppressed in this political system. No wonder that Bolzano’s
progressive political ideas and activities were found to be
unacceptable to the political authorities. This situation in
combination with personal intrigues resulted in January of 1820 in
Bolzano’s removal from his professorship by Emperor Franz (who
signed personally all decrees of appointment and dismissals of
professors of all the universities in the empire). From that time on
Bolzano was forbidden to teach, preach, or publish, and he had to
sustain himself on a meager pension that was “graciously
granted” to him by the emperor. It came as a blessing in
disguise that Bolzano now — “exempted” from teaching
duties — had all the time he needed to elaborate and write
his new foundation of logic. It was published in 1837 in four volumes
as *Theory of Science*. After that, Bolzano took great pains to
elaborate a new foundation of mathematics. The realization of this
project was considerably developed but not yet completed when Bolzano
died in 1848.

Small pieces of his voluminous philosophical and mathematical literary
remains have been published from time to time. The complete edition of
his works that was planned several times had to wait until 1969 when
the two most meritorious Bolzano scholars, Eduard Winter and Jan Berg,
together with the publisher Günther Holzboog started the
*Bernard-Bolzano-Gesamtausgabe*, which — due to the
effort of the three persons — became one of the most
distinguished complete editions of the works of a philosopher in our
time. 99 volumes of the edition have already appeared, and the next
volumes are forthcoming.

## 2. Bolzano’s Main Writings

Bolzano’s uncommonly versatile work culminated in three
extensive main writings in three different areas of knowledge: (1) in
*theology* his four volume *Textbook of the Science of
Religion* (Bolzano 1834), (2) in *philosophy* the four
volume *Theory of Science* (Bolzano 1837), which provides a new
foundation for logic and is at the same time an extensive manual of
logic, and (3) in *mathematics* the *Theory of
Quantities*, conceived of as a monumental work, but not
completed.

Bolzano’s teaching was concerned exclusively with fundamental
topics of *theology*; in addition he worked mainly in logic.
Nevertheless, his scientific development began in
*mathematics*. Already in 1804 Bolzano’s first scientific
publication, namely *Considerations on Some Objects of Elementary
Geometry* appeared; further mathematical publications followed
between 1810 and 1817. Bolzano returned ultimately to mathematics in
order to create a new foundation on which mathematics as a whole could
be built; he succeeded in doing this, however, only in bits and
pieces.

## 3. Logic

Due to the affinity of many ideas of Bolzano’s logic with ideas of modern logic, attempts to reconstruct Bolzano’s logic by means of techniques of modern logic started very early, e.g., with Dubislav 1931 and Scholz 1937. The first overall reconstruction of Bolzano’s logic from the perspective of modern logic was given by Berg 1962, and Berg went into it further in his illuminating introductions to WL in BGA I, 11–14. A new overall survey of Bolzano’s logic was presented in Sebestik 1992, and the most recent one is Casari 2016.

### 3.1 Bolzano’s Concept of Logic

The term ‘logic’ was understood in Bolzano’s time, as also by Bolzano himself, not in the narrow sense of formal logic, as it is commonly used nowadays, but rather in the broad sense which includes — besides formal logic — also both epistemology and the philosophy of science. Thus Bolzano used instead of ‘logic’ also the term ‘theory of science’. By ‘logic’ or ‘theory of science’ Bolzano means that discipline or science which formulates rules, “according to which we must proceed in the business of dividing the entire realm of truth into single sciences and in the exposition thereof in special textbooks if we want to proceed in a truly expedient fashion” (WL I, 7; cf. also WL I, 19 and 56).

This definition of logic makes a strange impression at first glance
and was also often misunderstood. By putting it forward, Bolzano
ascribes to logic a task that is generally not included in philosophy
at all, but rather in the technique of scientific procedure. Bolzano,
however, considered this task to be important enough to subject it to
a scientific treatment. Since he did not see how it could otherwise be
brought within the purview of a science, he assigned this task to
logic which seemed to him to be the best candidate for this. What
Bolzano mentions in his definition is, in his own view, by no means
the only task of logic. In order to avoid superfluous criteria,
Bolzano stated only the most concrete purpose in his definition, for
the other tasks are entailed by it. Bolzano’s logic is a
composite of the *theory of foundations*, the *theory of
elements*, the *theory of knowledge*, the *art of
discovery (heuristics)*, and the *theory of science
proper*. Thus, logic is, for Bolzano, an encompassing
philosophical discipline, and the “theory of science
proper” is only a sort of appendix of his logic.

### 3.2 Bolzano’s Conception of Logic

Bolzano’s logic was based upon a fundamental view that was the
very opposite of the common view of his time. Whereas it was quite
common at his time to mix logical with psychological investigations,
Bolzano made every effort to separate them. For him logical concepts
are concepts of their own, and their definition therefore must be kept
free from any psychological admixture (WL I, 61–66).
Bolzano’s approach to logic was — long before Frege and
Husserl — unmistakably antipsychologistic, even if he did not
yet use this term. In order to overcome psychologism and to achieve a
strict separation of logic from psychology, Bolzano “opened
up” for logic a realm or “world” of its own,
different from the world of material objects as well as from the world
of mental phenomena, a World 3 to speak with Karl Popper.
Bolzano’s motive for postulating such a logical realm of its own
obviously was the erroneous belief that logical properties (such as
logical truth) and logical relations (such as logical consequence)
need purely logical objects as their bearers in order to remain purely
logical and free from any psychological admixture themselves. What is
more, Bolzano had an unshakeable intuition that there are and *must
be* such purely logical objects, namely “objective
sentences” or “sentences in themselves”
(*Sätze an sich*), and their parts, i.e., “objective
ideas” or “ideas in themselves” (*Vorstellungen
an sich*). In today’s terminology, Bolzano’s
“sentences in themselves” are called
‘propositions’; this term (without any epithet) will be
used for them in what follows. (The term ‘sentence’
without epithet, however, will be used in its linguistic sense for
certain strings of words or symbols.) Moreover, following
Bolzano’s practice, we will use the term ‘idea’
(‘*Vorstellung*’) without epithet for ‘idea
in itself’ (‘*Vorstellung an sich*’).
Propositions and ideas are the objects which can be
“grasped” by mental phenomena (subjective propositions, in
particular judgments, and subjective ideas) and expressed in language,
but — despite their close connection to their mental and
linguistic correlates — they must be rigorously distinguished
from them.

Due to his conception of logic, Bolzano was “in need” of
propositions and ideas and therefore postulated that there are such
genuinely logical objects. He himself, however, was convinced that he
need not postulate them but can undoubtedly *prove* that there
must be propositions and ideas.

### 3.3 The Basis of Bolzano’s Logic and of his Whole Philosophy

Something could be true even if nobody knew that it were so. We
therefore need a concept of truth that does not require of every truth
that someone knows it. For this concept Bolzano introduced the term
‘*Wahrheit an sich*’ (‘*truth in
itself*’). If something is a truth and no human being knows
that it is, then — for Bolzano — it must be a “truth
in itself”. A “truth in itself” (*Wahrheit an
sich*) is nothing but a true proposition, i.e., a proposition that
has the property of being true. Bolzano takes the proof that there is
at least one “truth in itself” to be fundamental not only
for logic and for philosophy in general, but for any science. Bolzano
offers therefore several arguments such as the following ones for the
claim that there must be “truths in themselves”: (i) There
are obviously truths that are unknown and therefore (so Bolzano)
“truths in themselves”. E.g. one of the two propositions
“There are winged snakes” or “There are no winged
snakes” must be true, but we do not know which one (WL I, 108);
and one of the propositions stating of a specific tree at a specific
moment that it bears a certain number of blossoms must be true, even
if nobody knows which one (WL I, 112). (ii) The Pythagorean theorem or
the Copernican theory that the earth rotates around the sun have not
become true by their discoveries but have always been true, i.e.
(according to Bolzano), they are “truths in themselves”
(Zimmermann 1847, 71 f., 136). (iii) If no thinking being existed, it
were true that there exists no thinking being, but this (according to
Bolzano) could only be a “truth in itself” (Bolzano 1839,
150). There is one proof for the existence of a “truth in
itself” or a true proposition, however, which Bolzano takes to
be decisive. It is an improved version of the traditional refutation
of scepticism by self-application (RW I, 35, WL I, 145). Before we
present and discuss this proof, a terminological remark seems to be in
order: The word ‘truth’ (as well as the German word
‘Wahrheit’) is ambiguous insofar as it denotes the
property of being true on the one hand and a bearer of this property
(a true proposition, a true sentence, a true judgment etc.) on the
other hand (WL I, 108 f.). Only the latter can be meant, however, as
soon as the word ‘truth’ is preceded by the indefinite
article (‘a truth’) or if it is put into the plural form
(‘truths’). It is in such clear cases only that we will
allow the word ‘truth(s)’ without epithet to be used in
the sense of Bolzano’s ‘truth in itself’ or
‘truths in themselves’, but otherwise we will use
‘true proposition(s)’ instead to avoid confusion. In
general we will therefore reserve the word ‘truth’ for the
property of being true. That being said, we can now turn to
Bolzano’s alleged proof for the existence of true
propositions:

- There is no true proposition (assumption of
*reductio*), i.e.: No proposition is true. - The sense of (1), i.e., of ‘There is no true proposition’, is a proposition.
- The proposition which is the sense of (1) is not true (from (1) and (2)).
- It is not the case that there is no true proposition (from (3) and (1) — in contradiction to (1)).
- There is a (i.e., at least one) true proposition (from
(1)–(4) by
*reductio*).

The improvement of Bolzano’s version of this traditional proof consists in Bolzano’s explicitly mentioning premise (2) as indispensable for the deduction (WL I, 145, 151; cf. also WL IV, 282 f.), thus making clear that the proof would not go through if this premise were not accepted. The inference of (4) from (3) and (1) is vindicated by Bolzano’s explication of propositional negation (see section 3.4). Bolzano is not content with having proven (allegedly) that there is at least one true proposition; he wants even to prove by mathematical induction that there are more and even infinitely many true propositions (see section 11.2).

The above derivation is an illustrative example of Bolzano’s
importation of proof methods from mathematics — such as the
methods of indirect proof and of mathematical induction — into
philosophy. (For certain reservations concerning these methods cf. WL
IV, 269–285.) Nevertheless, this alleged proof for the existence
of a true proposition does not reach its goal for a simple reason: The
proof is in no way peculiar for truths in the sense of true
*propositions* as Bolzano needs to have it. If successful at
all, it would work in the same way also for proving the existence of
true judgments or true sentences (understood as linguistic entities).
A proof for the existence of at least one truth *in itself*,
i.e., a true *proposition*, requires premise (2). In premise
(2), however, the existence of a proposition is already presupposed
since it is shorthand for what can be explicitly stated as: There is a
(i.e., at least one) proposition which is the sense of (1). Thus, if
we take the derivation as a proof for the existence of at least one
true *proposition*, we will succumb to an obvious *petitio
principii*. By — correctly — requiring the addition of
premise (2) to be necessary for the formal correctness of the proof,
Bolzano unwittingly displayed its failure due to an informal fallacy.
Bolzano himself, however, was convinced that he had correctly and
successfully proven that there are “truths *in
themselves*”. From this it follows that there must be
propositions, since “truths in themselves” are a certain
kind of propositions (WL I, 111 f.). And since in every proposition
ideas are contained as its parts, a further consequence is that there
are also ideas. For every proposition there is also another
proposition that is its propositional negation. The propositional
negation of a true proposition is a false proposition. Therefore,
among propositions there must also be false ones. They are often
overlooked because a special name such as ‘falsehood in
itself’ was never introduced “officially” for them
and is at least not customary.

As far as the ontological status of propositions and ideas is
concerned, Bolzano stresses again and again their objectivity, i.e.,
their independence from thinking in general and from the minds and
mental phenomena of thinking beings by which they are
“grasped” in particular. Bolzano does not only accentuate
the objectivity of propositions and ideas, but he also lays particular
emphasis on their being not *real* (*wirklich*), whereby
‘real’ means, in Bolzano’s terminology, the same as
efficacious (*wirksam*, which derives etymologically from the
verb ‘wirken’ from which also ‘wirklich’ is
derived). The realm of reality includes everything in space and time
and herewith all material objects and events of the physical world
(i.e., Popper’s World 1) as well as all mental (or
“psychical”) phenomena of our inner world (i.e., World 2).
(In addition, Bolzano includes in his realm of reality also God who is
outside of space and time.) Propositions and ideas belong to a
“third realm” (World 3) outside of Bolzano’s realm
of reality which encompasses World 1 and World 2. Unfortunately,
Bolzano uses the nouns ‘*Existenz*’
(*‘existence’*) and *‘Sein*’
(‘*being*’) synonymously with
‘*Wirklichkeit*’ (‘*reality*’);
he therefore states again and again that *there are* (*es
gibt*) propositions and ideas but they do *not exist* and
they do *not have being*. This peculiar — if not odd
— terminology has caused numerous misunderstandings, not only
*about* Bolzano’s views but also for Bolzano himself,
e.g., in his discussion about Kant’s *dictum* that being
is not a real predicate. (Despite Bolzano’s terminological
convention, we will here use the English word ‘existence’
in general in the broad sense of Bolzano’s ‘es
gibt’.)

It is not only for this terminological reason that Bolzano’s characterization of the ontological status of propositions and ideas remains in the last analysis nebulous and has therefore repeatedly evoked criticism. One must of course add, for the sake of doing justice to Bolzano, that no other advocate of such a World 3 — including Husserl, Popper and even Frege — has done better than he had done and has succeeded in saying anything clearer about this than what can already be found in Bolzano’s work. Despite all these deficiencies, Bolzano’s unproven assumption or postulation of propositions and ideas turned out to be extremely fruitful for his own research.

### 3.4 Bolzano’s Analysis of Propositions (i.e., of his “Sentences in Themselves”)

Although Bolzano contributed many highly interesting and valuable insights to the analysis of propositions, they all are shaped in the subject-predicate scheme. We must explain some of these insights before we discuss Bolzano’s main contributions to logic in the sections 3.6–3.9.

In what follows brackets will be used for the denotation of propositions and ideas. Thus ‘[Socrates has wisdom]’ will denote the proposition expressed by the words ‘Socrates has wisdom’, and ‘[Socrates]’ and ‘[wisdom]’ will denote the ideas expressed by the words ‘Socrates’ and ‘wisdom’, respectively. (Such a notation is not without problems, but this is not the place to discuss them.) Bolzano starts his analysis of propositions by proclaiming the traditional subject-predicate view as a dogma: Despite the variety of their linguistic expressions, all propositions are of the form \([A\) has \(b]\) and therefore have exactly three parts, namely a subject idea \([A]\), a predicate idea \([b]\), and the copula [has], i.e. the idea expressed by the word ‘has’ or another form of ‘to have’ (WL II, 9–17). Bolzano prefers this copula to the copula expressed by a form of ‘to be’ for the following reason: In everyday language we try to avoid abstracts such as ‘wisdom’ and prefer saying ‘Socrates is wise’; but in doing so we attribute a property — namely wisdom — to Socrates. The logical structure of the proposition is therefore best displayed — says Bolzano — by the words ‘Socrates has wisdom’. Due to the stylistic preference of adjectives over abstract nouns, everyday language very often does not even provide us with an abstract noun corresponding to an adjective; in such cases we therefore use the adjective at hand, although we could always easily introduce a corresponding artificial noun into our language.

Since every proposition has the same copula, two propositions can be
different only if they have either different subject ideas or
different predicate ideas or both. This results in Bolzano’s
identity criterion for propositions: Two propositions \([A_1\) has
\(b_1]\) and \([A_2\) has \(b_2]\) are identical iff (i.e., if and
only if) \([A_1] = [A_2]\) and \([b_1] = [b_2]\). In order for \([A\)
has \(b]\) to be a *proposition*, it will suffice that the
predicate idea \([b]\) be an arbitrary idea, in a way at least
“pretending” to be an idea of an attribute (WL II,
16–18). In order for \([A\) has \(b]\) to be *true*,
however, it is necessary that the predicate idea \([b]\) is an idea of
an *attribute* (*Beschaffenheit*). An attribute can be
an “inner attribute”, i.e., a *property*
(*Eigenschaft*) of an object, or an “outer
attribute”, i.e., a *relation* (*Verhältnis*)
among objects. Examples of properties are wisdom or omnipotence,
examples of relations are friendship to so-and-so, fatherhood to
so-and-so, being twice as long as such-and-such (WL I,
378–389).

The main trouble resulting from the traditional subject-predicate view
in general and from Bolzano’s uniform \([A\) has \(b]\)
structure of every proposition is that under its subject idea \([A]\)
two different cases are concealed insofar as it can be singular (as in
the case of [God] or [the sun] or [Bernard Bolzano]) or general (as in
the case of [man] or [animal] or [planet]). Due to this duality,
Bolzano has to add that \([A\) has \(b]\) or \([A\) have \(b]\) is to
be understood (when \([A]\) is general) in the sense of
[*Every* \(A\) has \(b]\) or [*All* \(A\) have \(b]\),
e.g. [Animals have sensitivity] = [*Every* animal has
sensitivity] = [*All* animals have sensitivity] (WL II, 24
f.).

In order to confirm his thesis that every proposition has the form [(Every) \(A\) has \(b]\), Bolzano shows of all kinds of verbal forms of significant sentences how to transfer them into his standard form (cf. WL II, 38 ff. and 211 ff.). Here are some of the rather important examples of Bolzano’s analysis.

*Predicate negation*(i.e., “inner” negation): The lack of an attribute \(b\) (such as the lack of omnipotence) is itself a property (WL II, 47) that we can denote by the negation ‘non-\(b\)’ (‘non-omnipotence’). Negative propositions of the form \([A\) has non-\(b]\), e.g. [Bernard Bolzano has non-omnipotence (i.e., lack of omnipotence)], therefore share the general form \([A\) has \(b]\) with all other propositions (WL II, 44–52).*Propositional negation*(i.e., “external” negation): From propositions of the form \([A\) has non-\(b]\) we have to distinguish propositions in which another proposition is denied. We can express such propositions by ‘It is not the case that \(A\) has \(b\)’. According to Bolzano, such a proposition is about another proposition and states that this proposition is false, i.e., not true. Its subject idea is therefore an idea of a proposition and its predicate idea is the idea of falsity or lack of truth, i.e., non-truth. Their form is therefore best displayed as [\([A\) has \(b]\) has non-truth] (WL II 62–64).*Subjunctive and disjunctive propositions*: The subjunction of two propositions \(s_1\) and \(s_2\) is explained by Bolzano as a proposition of the form \([s_2\) is a consequence of \(s_1]\) (WL II, 198 f., 224–226; Bolzano proposes here also alternative interpretations of ‘if … so’ sentences). An inclusive or exclusive disjunction of two propositions \(s_1\) and \(s_2\) is interpreted by Bolzano as a proposition which attributes to the idea [a true proposition belonging to the collection consisting of \(s_1\) and \(s_2]\) the property of being non-empty or singular, respectively (WL II, 204 f., 228 f.).*Particular propositions and there-is propositions*: In view of Bolzano’s identification of \([A\) has \(b]\) with [*Every*\(A\) has \(b]\) or [*All*\(A\) have \(b]\) whenever \([A]\) is general, it is of special interest how he deals with particular propositions expressed by ‘*Some A*have \(b\)’. Bolzano transforms such sentences into there-is sentences of the form ‘There is at least one \(A\) that has \(b\)’. But what about such there-is sentences? In a sentence of the form ‘There is at least one \(A\)’ we attribute, according to Bolzano, not a property to \(A\) itself but to the idea \([A]\), i.e., to the idea of \(A\), namely the property of being non-empty. The form of the corresponding propositions is therefore best given as [\([A]\) has non-emptiness] (WL II, 52–54, 214–218). This analysis is completely in accordance with Kant’s — and of course even more so with Frege’s and Russell’s later on —, although Bolzano never stopped criticizing Kant for his*dictum*that existence is not a real predicate. Bolzano took this*dictum*to be about existence in his own narrow sense of ‘existence’ or ‘being’, i.e., in the sense of ‘reality’, and not — as he should have — in the broad sense of his ‘*es gibt*’. His disagreement with Kant on this point is therefore merely verbal in nature. For Bolzano’s approach, a true negative existential sentence such as ‘There is no round square’ does not pose a problem any more; the proposition expressed by this sentence is [[a round square] has emptiness] (WL II, 54 f.).

In his analysis of propositions Bolzano distinguished clearly different levels in his realm of propositions and ideas. He even introduced a special name for ideas of ideas, such as the idea of the idea \([A]\), i.e., [\([A]\)]; he called them ‘symbolic ideas’ (WL I, 426 ff.). In his efforts to show that all propositions can be shaped into \([A\) has \(b]\), Bolzano makes extensive usage of such symbolic ideas (and also of ideas of propositions) as subject ideas of propositions, as it is exemplified under ii, iii and iv above. Bolzano took pains to systematize his attempts of shaping all propositions into \([A\) has \(b]\). His attempts, however, remained only on the level of examples, since he missed a key for their systematization such as Frege’s function-argument scheme.

For Bolzano every proposition is either true or false, and this
forever — or better: timelessly. If we get under certain
circumstances the impression that one and the same proposition can
sometimes be true and sometimes be false, this is merely due to the
fact that we do not talk about a proposition but about an ambiguous
linguistic chain of words that expresses two or even more
propositions, some of which can be true and others false (WL II, 7).
If it is the proposition itself, however, of which we get the
impression that it can be true as well as false, this is due to the
fact that we take a part of it to be variable (WL II, 77); in this
case again we do not consider a single proposition, but a whole set of
propositions, i.e., a propositional form. In the expression ‘It
is snowing’, e.g., time and place are not determined, and it
therefore does not express a proposition, but rather a propositional
form, indicated by ‘It is snowing at time \(t\) at place
\(l\)’. In order to express a proposition, the variables have to
be bound or replaced by constants; Bolzano usually replaces them
— for convenience — by indexicals, e.g., ‘It is
snowing today and here’ (WL I, 113). Even if Bolzano makes
extensive usage of indexicals in the expression of ideas and
propositions, there is no place for indexicals within his World 3:
There are neither indexical ideas nor indexical propositions; what
sometimes seems to be an indexical idea or proposition is in fact
merely an indexical *expression* of an idea or proposition.
(See, however, an opposite view defended in Textor 1996.)

Bolzano combines his doctrine that the form \([A\) has \(b]\) is common to all propositions with a correspondence theory of truth, whereby he, like Aristotle, avoids speaking of correspondence or adequation. A proposition \([A\) has \(b]\) is true, according to Bolzano, iff \(A\) has (in fact) \(b\) (WL I, 112). There is an important qualification, however, that Bolzano has thereby in mind, namely that there is at least one \(A\); a proposition \([A\) has \(b]\) can only be true, according to Bolzano, if it is about something and if its subject idea \([A]\) is therefore non-empty (WL II, 16, 328–330, 399 ff.). Formulated more carefully, Bolzano’s truth condition must therefore be stated as follows (WL I, 112, 121–224, WL II, 26 f., 328–330):

\([A\) has \(b]\) istrue(or: has truth) iff \([A]\) is non-empty, and for every \(x\) that is an object of \([A]\) there is a \(y\) that is an object of \([b]\) such that \(x\) has \(y\).

Due to this definition of truth and due to Bolzano’s doctrine
that every proposition has the form \([A\) has \(b]\), every
proposition has existential import for Bolzano.
(‘Existential’ must here be taken in the sense of
Bolzano’s ‘there is’. It must be kept in mind here
that Bolzano’s interpretation transfers many propositions to a
meta-level and that in such a case the existential import concerns
\([A]\) rather than \(A\) itself; the existence of \([A]\), however,
is guaranteed even if \([A]\) is empty and \(A\) itself does not
exist.) This peculiar kind of an existential presupposition of
Bolzano’s logic makes his theory of syllogisms (which he himself
saw as a mere section of his whole logic) an intermediate system
between Aristotle and Venn: Whereas Aristotle’s theory of
categorical syllogisms does not allow empty terms at all,
Bolzano’s logic does so, but they cannot be the subject ideas of
true propositions in Bolzano’s logic. As a consequence, the
so-called *conclusio ad subalternatam* is logically valid also
for Bolzano, i.e., [Some \(A\) have \(b]\) follows logically from [All
\(A\) have \(b]\) (WL II, 114, 399 ff.), but [All \(A\) are \(A]\) or
— in Bolzano’s notation — [All \(A\) have \(a]\) is
not logically true for him; furthermore [All \(A\) have non-\(b]\) is
not convertible, i.e., [All \(B\) have non-\(a]\) does not logically
follow from [All \(A\) have non-\(b]\) (WL II, 401 f., 526). Therefore
exactly two of the 24 valid Aristotelian syllogisms (namely the
*modi* CAMENES — or CALENTES in Bolzano’s
terminology — and CAMENOP of form IV) are invalid in
Bolzano’s logic as he himself proved by means of
counter-examples (WL II, 415, 558), whereas all other Aristotelian
*modi* (including the weakened ones) are logically valid also
in Bolzano’s logic.

### 3.5 Bolzano’s Theory of Ideas (i.e., of his “Ideas in Themselves”)

The three immediate parts of a proposition are its subject idea, its
predicate idea and the copula [has]. In further analyzing the subject
and predicate idea of a proposition, we will find out, that in special
cases (as, e.g., in the case of the idea [the judgment that God is
omnipotent]), a complete proposition will turn out to be a part of an
idea (WL I, 221). In general, however, the parts of an idea are
themselves ideas. After careful consideration Bolzano decided against
the view to define a proposition as something constructed out of ideas
(i.e., as a connection of two arbitrary ideas by means of the copula
[has]) (WL II, 18); he rather suggested that we define ideas as those
parts of a proposition which are not themselves propositions (WL I,
216, WL II, 18). In this sense he granted priority to propositions
over their non-propositional parts (i.e., ideas), thereby anticipating
Frege and Wittgenstein. There is a clear demarcation between
propositions and ideas: Whereas each proposition is either true or
false (WL II, 7), an idea cannot be true or false (WL I, 239 ff.).
There are two “dimensions” to be distinguished in each
idea: its “internal dimension”, i.e., its divisibility or
indivisibility into *parts*, and its “external
dimension”, i.e., its having or not having *objects*.

As far as the *inner structure* of ideas is concerned (WL I,
243 ff.), Bolzano distinguishes simple from complex ideas: A
*simple* idea has no proper parts, whereas a *complex*
idea has. The “sum” (*Summe*) of proper parts of a
complex idea is called its ‘*content*’
(‘*Inhalt*’). Due to Bolzano’s peculiar usage
of the term ‘sum’ that is restricted — like his
usage of ‘collection’ in general — to sets with at
least two members, he could not apply his concept of content to all
ideas, but only to complex ideas. In order to simplify matters, we
will use here the modern concept of a set, allowing for a set to be a
singleton (i.e., containing only one single member) or even to be
empty (i.e., containing no member at all). In what follows we will
therefore take the *content* of an arbitrary idea to be the
*set* of all of its parts (including improper ones, i.e.,
including itself). The content of a simple idea \(i\) is then the
singleton \(\{i\}\) containing \(i\) itself as its only member. Two
complex ideas \(i_1\) and \(i_2\) can have the same content, i.e., the
same parts, without themselves being identical, because the common
parts of \(i_1\) and \(i_2\) can be arranged in different ways in
\(i_1\) and \(i_2\). Bolzano’s favorite example is: [an erudite
son of an unerudite father] has the same content, but is not identical
with [an unerudite son of an erudite father]; the same holds for
\([3^5]\) and \([5^3]\) (WL I, 244). In analyzing an idea, we will in
all cases eventually come upon simple ideas (WL I, 263–265).
Without explicitly expressing it, Bolzano obviously held the view that
every idea is recursively constructed out of simple ideas. Two ideas
are therefore identical iff they are constructed out of the same
simple ideas in the same way. In order to be able to apply this
general idea precisely in concrete cases, we would have to be able to
identify the simple ideas and the formation rules involved.
Unfortunately, Bolzano informs us about both only by hinting at
examples here and there. As examples of simple ideas he mentions
[something] (WL I, 447), [has] (WL I, 380, WL II, 18), [non] (WL II,
415), [*Wirklichkeit*], i.e., [reality] (WL II, 60), and
[*Sollen*], i.e., [ought] (WL II, 69, WL IV, 489).

With respect to its *“external” dimension*, an idea
can have several (may be even infinitely many) objects, exactly one
object, or no object at all. An idea that has no object at all is an
*empty* idea; Bolzano calls it
‘*gegenstandlos*’ (‘objectless’).
Bolzano puts forward the thesis with particular emphasis that there
are empty ideas; his standard examples are ideas such as [nothing],
[golden mountain] (WL I, 304 f., WL II, 329) or [winged horse] (WL
III, 24). A special kind of empty ideas, viz. *contradictory*
ideas (or, as Bolzano usually prefers to call them, *imaginary*
ideas) *cannot* even have an object (WL I, 315 ff., WL III, 405
f.), examples being [a round polygon], [a round square], [a triangle
that is quadrangular], [a regular pentagon], [a wooden iron tool], [an
equilateral rectangular triangle] (WL I, 305, 315, 317, 321, 324, WL
II, 329). *Non-empty* ideas are called
‘*gegenständlich*’ (‘objectual’)
by Bolzano. They can be *singular* as, e.g., [the philosopher
Socrates], [the city of Athens], [the fixed star Sirius] (WL I, 306),
[an even integer between 4 and 8] (WL III, 407), [God] (WL III, 408),
or *general*; if general, they can have a finite number of
objects, such as [a heir of Genghis-Khan’s Empire] (WL I, 299)
or [an integer between 1 and 10] (WL I, 308), or an infinite number of
objects, such as [a line] or [an angle] (WL I, 298). For non-empty
ideas (and only for them) Bolzano defines their *extension*
(*Umfang*) (WL I, 297 f.); by using again the modern concept of
a set (as we already did with Bolzano’s definition of the
content of an idea), we can extend his definition to all ideas
including empty ones; the extension of an arbitrary idea \(i\) (or
*Ext*\((i)\), as an abbreviation) is then nothing but the set
of all objects of \(i\).

By *crossing the “internal” with the “external
dimension”* of ideas we can get new and interesting
“creations”. Combining, e.g., the smallest content with
the smallest extension of a non-empty idea results in a new type of
idea, viz. in an “intuition in itself” or, as we may say
for the sake of brevity, an *intuition* (*Anschauung*).
An *intuition* is an idea which is simple, i.e., has no proper
part, and at the same time singular, i.e., has only one single object
(WL I, 325–330). If an idea is neither itself an intuition nor
contains any intuition as a proper part, it is called
‘*Begriff*’ (‘*concept*’) by
Bolzano; examples of concepts are the simple idea [something] and the
complex idea [God] whereby, for Bolzano, [God] = [the real being that
has no cause of its being real]. A *mixed* idea is a complex
idea which contains at least one intuition as a proper part (WL I, 330
f.). The distinction between intuitions and concepts plays an
important role in Bolzano’s epistemology (cf. section 4.2 where
we will also present examples of intuitions).

Talking about the “external dimension” of ideas, we made — following Bolzano — intensive usage of a certain relation \(\mathbf{R}\) between ideas and their objects that is basic in Bolzano’s theory of ideas. For ‘\(i \mathbf{R} x\)’ we used phrases such as ‘\(i\) is an idea of \(x\)’ or ‘\(x\) is an object of \(i\)’; other expressions for it are ‘\(i\) represents \(x\)’, ‘\(x\) is subsumed under \(i\)’ or ‘\(x\) falls under \(i\)’ (WL I, 298). The domain of \(\mathbf{R}\) is the set of non-empty ideas, its range being the set of all objects; moreover, \(\mathbf{R}\) has the following properties: it is neither reflexive nor irreflexive (the latter due to counterexamples such as: [idea] \(\mathbf{R}\) [idea]; cf. WL I, 461), it is neither symmetric nor asymmetric, it is neither transitive nor intransitive, and it is neither one-many nor many-one. Since, according to our definition, \(Ext(i) = \{x \mid i \mathbf{R} x\}\), we can express ‘\(i \mathbf{R} x\)’ also in terms of ‘extension’ as ‘\(x \in\) \(Ext(i)\)’.

Bolzano defines a variety of relations between ideas concerning their
extensions, such as the following ones: An idea \(i_1\) is
*compatible* with an idea\( i_2\) iff \(i_1\) and \(i_2\) share
a common object, i.e. \(Ext(i_1) \cap\) \(Ext(i_2) \ne \varnothing\);
and \(i_1\) *is included in* \(i_2\) (or: \(i_2\) includes
\(i_1)\) iff \(i_1\) is compatible with \(i_2\) and every object of
\(i_1\) is also an object of \(i_2\), i.e., \(Ext(i_1) \cap\)
\(Ext(i_2) \ne \varnothing\), and \(Ext(i_1) \subseteq\) \(Ext(i_2)\).
In Bolzano’s theory of ideas, precise correlates are available
of basic concepts of set theory such as the empty set as well as the
membership relation and the relation of inclusion between sets.
Unfortunately, the clear distinction between membership and inclusion
in his theory of ideas vanished in his theory of propositions due to
the common form \([A\) has \(b]\) of all propositions whereby \([A]\) can
be not only a singular, but also a general (or an empty) idea.

Already in his theory of ideas Bolzano used a method which he was very proud to have invented: the method of idea-variation. He made the most fruitful usage of this method, however, by applying it to whole propositions.

### 3.6 Bolzano’s Method of Idea-Variation

In his analysis of propositions, Bolzano did not break through the traditional paradigms. In another respect, however, namely concerning the definition of basic semantic concepts, he opened wide the gates to modern logic. The main instrument to do so was the method of idea-variation that he invented. He himself took it to be his main contribution to logic that was for himself — who certainly did not suffer from arrogance — of “epoch making importance” (Bolzano 1838, 350).

The basic insight underlying Bolzano’s method of idea-variation is quite simple (WL II, 77 ff.). Let us take as our first example \(S_1\) the proposition [Kant is a German philosopher]. (In order to simplify matters linguistically, we do not adhere to Bolzano’s formulation ‘\(A\) has \(b\)’ but will allow also formulations of the kind ‘\(A\) is (a) \(B\)’. Moreover, we will take in what follows words like ‘German’, ‘French’, ‘European’, ‘American’ etc. in the sense of ‘born in Germany’, ‘born in France’, ‘born in Europe’, ‘born in America’ etc.) The extra-logical ideas that are parts of \(S_1\) are the ideas [Kant], [German], and [philosopher]; we consider now one or more of them to be variable in the sense that we think that they are replaced in \(S_1\) by other ideas fitting to the former ones (i.e., belonging to the same “category”). In this way the idea [Kant] can be “varied” in \(S_1\) and replaced, e.g., by [Hegel]; in other words, we can substitute [Hegel] for [Kant] in \(S_1\). The variation in question is a kind of replacement or substitution. It results in a “new” (or better: in another) proposition, viz. in the true proposition [Hegel is a German philosopher]; we will say that [Hegel is a German philosopher] is the [Hegel]/[Kant]-variant of \(S_1\). A false [Kant]-variant of \(S_1\) is its [Sartre]/[Kant]-variant [Sartre is a German philosopher]. Similarly, [Kant is an European philosopher] is a true and [Kant is an American philosopher] is a false [German]-variant of \(S_1\). The operation of replacement (or substitution) can also be performed on two or more parts of a proposition simultaneously: Replacing [Kant] and [philosopher] in \(S_1\) simultaneously by, e.g., [Gauss] and [mathematician], results in the true ([Gauss], [mathematician]/[Kant], [philosopher])-variant [Gauss is a German mathematician]. A false ([Kant], [philosopher])-variant of \(S_1\) is, e.g., [Sartre is a German musician]. We can also replace all extra-logical parts of \(S_1\) simultaneously: A true ([Kant], [German], [philosopher])-variant of \(S_1\) is [Mozart is an Austrian composer], whereas [Sartre is a Greek mathematician] is a false one. Following Bolzano, we will here use this generalized operation of simultaneous replacement (or variation). Given an arbitrary proposition \(s\) and two sequences \(i_1, i_2 ,\ldots ,i_n\) and \(j_1, j_2 ,\ldots ,j_n\) of ideas, a proposition \(s'\) is uniquely determined by this operation; due to this operation, for each \(k\) \((1 \le k \le n)\), the idea \(i_k\) is replaced in \(s\) uniformly (i.e., wherever it “occurs” in \(s)\) by one and the same corresponding idea \(j_k\). The resulting proposition \(s'\) is the \((j_1, j_2 ,\ldots ,j_n /i_1, i_2 ,\ldots ,i_n)\)-variant of \(s\), or — briefly put — the \(j/i\)-variant of \(s\). (Thereby we take \(i = \langle i_1, i_2 ,\ldots ,i_n\rangle\) and \(j = \langle j_1, j_2 ,\ldots ,j_n\rangle\). Moreover, we are using here ‘\(s\)’, ‘\(s'\)’, ‘\(s_1\)’, ‘\(s_2\)’,… as variables for propositions, ‘\(i_1\)’, ‘\(i_2\)’,…, ‘\(j_1\)’, ‘\(j_2\)’,… as variables for ideas, and ‘\(i\)’ and ‘\(j\)’ as variables for sequences of ideas of the same length.) The close relationship between a variant of a proposition and a substitution instance of a sentence is quite obvious. In order for the \(j/i\)-variant of an arbitrary proposition \(s\) to be uniquely determined and to fulfill certain criteria of adequacy, however, several restrictions are required: (i) Each of the \(i_k\)s \((1 \le k \le n)\) must be simple or at least “relatively” simple (in the sense that in each particular context under consideration they are not further analyzed into parts but “taken” to be simple); (ii) each of the \(i_k\)s is an extra-logical idea; (iii) the \(i_k\)s are pair-wise distinct; moreover (iv), in order to keep the result of the replacement operation “well-formed”, i.e., a genuine proposition, we must require that each \(j_k\) “fits” the corresponding \(i_k\), i.e., is of the same semantic category; and finally (v), we must also require that at least one of the ideas \(i_k\) must be contained in \(s\) as one of its parts so that the operation of replacement is never performed vacuously.

Instead of saying that a \(j/i\)-variant of a proposition \(s\) is
true or false (or that it is a true or false variant of \(s)\),
Bolzano prefers to say: *j macht s hinsichtlich i wahr bzw.
falsch* (cf. e.g., WL II, 79, 113 ff.), i.e.: \(j\) verifies or
falsifies \(s\) with respect to \(i\) (or, more literally: \(j\) makes
\(s\) true or false with respect to \(i)\).

As far as our first example \(S_1\) is concerned, there are true as
well as false variants of it with respect to every single
extra-logical part of it and also with respect to every sequence of
such parts. But now let us consider the following expamle \(S_2\):
[Every German philosopher is European]. It has true as well as false
[German]-variants, [European]-variants, ([German],
[philosopher])-variants, ([German], [European])-variants,
([philosopher], [European])-variants and also ([German],
[philosopher], [European])-variants. But obviously, all
[philosopher]-variants of \(S_2\) must be true — provided, says
Bolzano, that their subject idea is non-empty. This proviso is a
typical feature of Bolzano’s approach and mentioned by him again
and again, since — according to his truth condition — a
proposition with an empty subject idea is trivially false. Whenever we
perform the operation of variation on the subject idea of a
proposition (and sometimes also when we perform it only on certain
parts of it), however, we will have variants with empty subject ideas;
thus, only in exceptional cases *all* variants of a proposition
will turn out to be true. If all \(i\)-variants of a proposition \(s\)
with a non-empty subject idea are true, Bolzano will say that \(s\) is
universally valid with respect to \(i\). Hereby we have to take into
account, that for Bolzano also in his meta-language words such as
‘all’, ‘every’ or ‘each’ have
existential import and that therefore his definition must explicitly
stated as follows (WL II, 82):

A proposition \(s\) isuniversally valid (allgemeingültig) with respect to a sequence \(i\) of ideasiff there is at least one true \(i-\)variant of \(s\), and every \(i\)-variant of \(s\) with a non-empty subject idea is true.

Analogously we can define what it is for a proposition to be universally contravalid:

A proposition \(s\) isuniversally contravalid (allgemeinungültig) with respect to a sequence i of ideasiff every \(i\)-variant of \(s\) is false.

[Every German philosopher is American] is an example of a proposition that is universally contravalid with respect to [philosopher].

If a proposition is universally valid or universally contravalid with
respect to \(i\), Bolzano says that it is *analytic with respect
to* \(i\), otherwise, that it is *synthetic with respect to
i*. If a proposition is analytic (or synthetic) with respect to at
least one sequence \(i\), Bolzano calls it ‘analytic’ (or
‘synthetic’, respectively), without further qualification
(WL II, 83–89, 331–338). Herewith Bolzano starts a new
tradition of usage of the term ‘analytic’ as opposed to
that from Kant up to Carnap and Quine: Whereas in this latter
tradition the term ‘analytic’ includes exclusively true
propositions, in Bolzano’s terminology also all universally
contravalid propositions are subsumed under this term; and even a
universally valid proposition could be false if it has an empty
subject idea but all of its variants with non-empty subject ideas are
true. (On this point, however, Bolzano is not always consistent.)

Logical properties of a proposition are — according to a
classical view — of a formal character, i.e., they are primarily
properties of the *form* of a proposition rather than of the
proposition itself. The formal character of logical properties
suggests the following alternative way of presenting Bolzano’s
view. Bolzano himself identifies explicitly the *form* of a
proposition with a set of propositions (WL I, 48, WL II, 82):

The

form of a proposition s with respect to a sequence i of ideasor (as an abbreviation) thei-form of sis the set of all \(i\)-variants of \(s\), provided that at least one of the \(i_k\)s is contained in \(s\). (For cases in which this proviso is not met, neither an \(i\)-variant of \(s\) nor the \(i\)-form of \(s\) is defined.)

A *propositional i-form* can therefore be defined as the
\(i\)-form of at least one proposition \(s\); and a *propositional
form* is a propositional \(i\)-form with respect to at least one
sequence \(i\). Due to the proviso mentioned, a propositional form as
defined before can never be empty or a singleton. We can now define
universal validity and universal contravalidity first for a
propositional form and subsequently for a proposition in the following
way:

A

propositional form\(F\) isuniversally validiff at least one member of \(F\) is true, and every member of \(F\) with a non-empty subject idea is true; \(F\) isuniversally contravalidiff every member of \(F\) is false.A

proposition\(s\) isuniversally valid(oruniversally contravalid, respectively)with respect to a sequence i of ideasiff there is a propositional form \(F\) such that \(F\) is a propositional \(i\)-form which is universally valid (or contravalid, respectively), and \(s\) is a member of \(F\).\(s\) is

analytic with respect to iiff \(s\) is universally valid or universally contravalid with respect to \(i\); \(s\) issynthetic with respect to iiff \(s\) is not analytic with respect to \(i\).\(s\) is

analytic(orsynthetic, respectively) iff \(s\) is analytic (or synthetic, respectively) with respect to at least one sequence \(i\).

### 3.7 Bolzano’s Definition of Logical Truth

The result of applying the operation of variation to a proposition
depends essentially on our choice of ideas to be varied in the
proposition in question. And it can depend on matters of fact whether
or not a proposition is universally valid (or contravalid) with
respect to a sequence \(i\) of ideas. Thus, e.g., it is due to the
fact that every German is European and no German is American that the
proposition [Every German philosopher is European] is universally
valid and the proposition [Every German philosopher is American] is
universally contravalid with respect to [philosopher]. From a logical
point of view, the most interesting results will turn up if *all
extra-logical parts* of a proposition, which are simple (or
— as explained before — “relatively” simple),
are taken to be variable (WL II, 84). To simplify matters, we will
assume for what follows that for any proposition \(s\) there is always
fixed a certain alphabetic order of all extra-logical simple ideas
contained in it; thereby, for every proposition \(s\), a sequence
\(i^{\boldsymbol{s}}\) of all extra-logical simple ideas contained in
\(s\) is uniquely determined. It would appear that we now could define
the concepts of logico-universal validity and logico-universal
contravalidity in the following way: A proposition \(s\) is
logico-universally valid, or — put briefly — *logically
true*, iff \(s\) is universally valid with respect to
\(i^{\boldsymbol{s}}\); \(s\) is logico-universally contravalid, or
— put briefly — *logically false*, iff \(s\) is
universally contravalid with respect to \(i^{\boldsymbol{s}}\); \(s\)
is *logically analytic* iff \(s\) logically true or logically
false; and \(s\) is *logically synthetic* iff\( s\) is not
logically analytic.

In proceeding this way, however, we would have to face serious problems concerning purely logical propositions, i.e., propositions all of whose parts are purely logical ideas. Due to our requirement (v) above concerning Bolzano’s replacement operation, neither an \(i\)-variant in general nor an \(i^s\)-variant in particular is defined for a purely logical proposition, since it does not contain any extra-logical idea. In consequence the preceding definitions of logical truth, logical falsity and logical analyticity are not applicable to purely logical propositions, since they do not contain any extra-logical idea. Consider, however, the following three purely logical propositions: [There is something, or it is not the case that there is something], [There is something, and it is not the case that there is something], and [There is something]. The first of these three propositions is obviously logically true, the second one logically false, and the third one is neither logically true nor logically false. Giving up requirement (v), as some would like to have it, results in a purely logical proposition being its only own \(i^{\boldsymbol{s}}\)-variant. That, however, would turn every purely logical proposition either into a logical truth or into a logical falsity according to our definition, in contrast to the fact that the proposition [There is something], i.e. [[something] has non-emptiness], is not logically analytic; it is a truth of logic, but nevertheless not logically true (WL II, 375).

A posssible way out of this dilemma is to choose the alternative
procedure sketched above (at the end of section 3.6) by taking these
logical properties primarily to be properties of propositional
*forms*. Thereby the *logical form of a proposition s*
is identified with the set of all of its
\(i^{\boldsymbol{s}}\)-variants; \(F\) is a *logical propositional
form* therefore iff it is the logical form of at least one
proposition. (Please note that according to this approach, the logical
form of a purely logical proposition is not even defined;
nevertheless, a purely logical proposition can be a *member* of
a logical propositional form.) We will define first the relevant
properties for propositional forms:

Apropositional form F is logically validiff \(F\) is a logical propositional form that is universally valid, i.e., at least one of its members is true, and all of its members with non-empty subject ideas are true.\(F\)

is logically contravalidiff \(F\) is a logical propositional form, and all of its members are false.

We then define the corresponding properties for single propositions:

A proposition \(s\) islogically trueiff there is a propositional form \(F\) such that \(F\) is logically valid and \(s\) is a member of \(F\).\(s\) is

logically falseiff there is a propositional form \(F\) such that \(F\) is logically contravalid and \(s\) is a member of \(F\).\(s\) is

logically analyticiff \(s\) is logically true or logically false.\(s\) is

logically syntheticiff \(s\) is not logically analytic.

It is easy to find an example of each of these kinds of propositions: the proposition [Every German philosopher is German] is logically true, the proposition [Kant is German and Kant is non-German] is logically false, and the proposition [Kant is a German philosopher] is logically synthetic. (Cf. Morscher 2007, 75–99.)

### 3.8 Bolzano’s Definition of Material Consequence and of Logical Consequence

Bolzano’s logical World 3 includes in addition to ideas and
propositions also what we will call ‘arguments’. Bolzano
is dealing with arguments at lengths in his *Theory of Science*
(cf., e.g., WL II, 113 ff., 391 ff.), but he does not introduce a name
for them. Following the general line of his terminology, he could have
called them ‘*Schlüsse an sich*’
(‘derivations in themselves’ or ‘inferences in
themselves’), but he did not; he rather used this term for a
certain kind of propositions, namely for propositions stating that a
proposition follows (or — in his words — is
*ableitbar*, i.e., derivable) from a set of propositions (WL I,
213, WL II, 200; for another usage of the term
‘Schluß’ by Bolzano cf. section 4.4). A Bolzanian
argument consists of two sets of propositions: the set of its premises
and the set of its conclusions. In order to simplify matters, we will
assume here that an argument has always a single proposition (rather
than a whole set of propositions) as its conclusion, and we will
identify an *argument* with an ordered pair \(\langle \sigma ,
s\rangle\) consisting of a set \(\sigma\) of propositions (i.e., the
set of premises) and a single proposition \(s\) (i.e., its
conclusion).

Bolzano first explains what it means that a single proposition \(s\)
is derivable (*ableitbar*) from a set \(\sigma\) of
propositions with respect to a certain sequence \(i\) of ideas (WL II,
113 ff., 198 ff.). Since Bolzano’s term
‘*Ableitbarkeit*’ (‘derivability’) is
used nowadays in a purely syntactical sense, we use here instead the
more common phrases ‘\(s\) follows from \(\sigma\) with respect
to \(i\)’ or ‘\(s\) is a consequence of \(\sigma\) with
respect to \(i\)’.

We have explained Bolzano’s method of idea-variation in section
3.6 with respect to single propositions. In order to apply it also to
arguments, we have now to extend our original definitions to whole
*sets* of propositions. In applying the operation of variation
to a set \(\sigma\) of propositions, each member of \(\sigma\) is
replaced by its corresponding variant: The *j/i*-variant of a
set \(\sigma\) of propositions is the set of all the \(j/i\)-variants
of the members of \(\sigma\). Moreover we will say of a set \(\sigma\)
of propositions that it is true iff each of its members is true; and
we will say that a sequence \(j\) of ideas verifies a set \(\sigma\)
of propositions with respect to \(i\) iff \(j\) verifies each member
of \(\sigma\) with respect to \(i\), i.e., iff the \(j/i\)-variant of
each member of \(\sigma\) is true. A proposition \(s\)
*follows* from a set \(\sigma\) of propositions (or, in other
words, \(s\) is a *consequence* of \(\sigma)\) with respect to
a sequence \(i\) of ideas iff every sequence \(j\) of ideas that
verifies \(\sigma\) with respect to \(i\) verifies \(s\) as well with
respect to \(i\).

In transferring this formulation into a formal definition, we have to bear in mind again that ‘each’ and ‘every’ has existential import also in Bolzano’s meta-language. The formal definition has therefore to be stated as follows:

s follows from\(\sigma\)with respect to\(i\) (or: \(s\)is a consequence of\(\sigma\)with respect to\(i)\) iff there is a sequence \(j\) of ideas such that \(j\) verifies \(\sigma\) with respect to \(i\), and every sequence \(j\) of ideas which verifies \(\sigma\) with respect to \(i\), verifies \(s\) likewise with respect to \(i\).

In this sense, e.g., the proposition [Kant is European] follows from
the set {[Kant is a philosopher], [Every philosopher is
German]} with respect to the idea [philosopher]. The conclusion
follows, so to speak, “materially” from the premises, or
is a “material” consequence of the premises, due to the
fact that every German is European. This is not enough, of course, for
an argument to be *logically* correct. In order to be logically
correct, the conclusion \(s\) of an argument \(\langle \sigma ,
s\rangle\) must *logically* follow from \(\sigma\), i.e., \(s\)
must be a *logical* consequence of \(\sigma\) (WL II,
391–395; the similarity with the distinction between material
and formal consequence in Tarski 1956, 419, is obvious). A simple
definition of logical consequence seems to suggest itself: \(s\)
*follows logically* from \(\sigma\) (or: \(s\) is a *logical
consequence* of \(\sigma)\) iff \(s\) follows from \(\sigma\) with
respect to the sequence \(i^{\sigma \cup \{s\}}\) of all extra-logical
simple ideas contained in \(\sigma\) or \(s\).

This simple answer, however, faces the same problems as the
corresponding answer with respect to logical truth (cf. section 3.7).
As we have done with logical truth and for the same reason, here too,
we must give priority to the *logical form* of an argument and
then proceed by this means to define the concept of logical
consequence for particular arguments.

### 3.9 Further Applications of the Method of Idea-Variation

Beyond the usage of the method of idea-variation for his truly
pioneering definitions of logical truth and logical consequence and
related concepts (such as the concepts of satisfiability and
compatibility), Bolzano made use of this method also for a series of
other purposes, above all in his development of the theory of
probability (WL II, 77–82, 171–191, 509–514, WL III,
136–138, 263–288, 559–568, RW II, 39–49,
57–61, 66–71). Bolzano’s theory of probability is
based on his distinction of different degrees of validity of a
proposition \(s\) with respect to a sequence \(i\) of ideas. This
*degree of validity of s with respect to i* is representable as
a fractional number \(\bfrac{m}{n}\) where \(n\) is the number of all
possible variants of \(s\) with respect to \(i\) and \(m\) is the
number of true variants of \(s\) with respect to \(i\). If all
variants of \(s\) with respect to \(i\) with non-empty subject ideas
are true, \(m = n\) and \(\bfrac{m}{n} = 1\), i.e., \(s\) is
universally valid with respect to \(i\); if all variants are false,
\(m = 0\) and \(\bfrac{m}{n} = 0\), i.e., \(s\) is universally
contravalid with respect to \(i\) (WL II, 81 f.). The *logical
degree of validity of s* is thus the degree of validity of \(s\)
with respect to \(i^s\), i.e., with respect to a certain sequence of
all simple extra-logical ideas contained in \(s\).

In order to be able to apply these notions in a useful way, we have to explain how to count the variants of a proposition, since for each variant of a proposition (as for each proposition in general) there are infinitely many others that are logically equivalent to it (e.g., due to replacing a part \([b]\) of the proposition by [non-non-\(b]\), [non-non-non-non-\(b]\) etc.). If we would count all of them, the resulting fractional number would not be very informative. Bolzano was completely aware of this problem (WL II, 79 f.), and he was very creative in developing methods for solving it as well as many other puzzling problems.

Bolzano is not content with this concept of probability
*simpliciter* but rather continues to develop an even more
important *relative* concept of probability. What is at stake
here is the probability of a proposition \(s\) relative to a set
\(\sigma\) of propositions with respect to a sequence \(i\) of ideas,
and in particular with respect to \(i^{\sigma \cup \{s\}}\), i.e., the
sequence of all simple extra-logical ideas contained in \(s\) or
\(\sigma\). Its degree can again be represented by a fractional number
\(0 \le^m /_n \le 1\), where \(n\) is the number of cases where
\(\sigma\) comes out true and \(m\) is the number of cases where
\(\sigma \cup \{s\}\) comes out true (WL II, 171–191; for a
careful reconstruction of Bolzano’s theory of probability see
Berg 1962, 148–150).

In his *Tractatus* (5.15) Ludwig Wittgenstein came so close to
Bolzano’s definition of probability that Georg Henrik von Wright
felt it to be appropriate “to speak of *one* definition
of probability here and call it the Bolzano-Wittgenstein
definition” (Wright 1982, 144 f.).

Bolzano’s work on probability was not only of purely theoretical interest to him but also had interesting practical consequences with respect to problems in the philosophy of science (cf. section 4) and in particular also with respect to religious questions (cf. section 8).

## 4. Epistemology and Philosophy of Science

Bolzano strove for objectivity in “pure logic” in the sense that the concepts and laws of logic are mind-independent. In “applied logic”, in particular in epistemology, however, we have to take into account also the real, i.e., empirical, conditions of the human mind and thinking according to Bolzano (WL I, 66 f.). Nevertheless, he defined the basic concepts of epistemology primarily on the level of ideas and propositions. This gave rise to the misunderstanding that his investigations are worthless for epistemology proper or even that there is no epistemology proper at all in Bolzano’s work. The fact that this is by no means the case, will — hopefully — emerge from the following survey of Bolzano’s epistemology.

### 4.1 “Appearances” of Propositions and Ideas in Human Minds

In epistemology, we are primarily and directly not concerned with
propositions and ideas, but rather with their appearances
(*Erscheinungen*) in the minds of thinking beings
(“*im Gemüt von geistigen bzw. denkenden
Wesen*”). One and the same proposition or idea can, as
Bolzano says, appear in the minds of different thinking beings or also
at different times in the mind of one and the same thinking being,
without thereby being multiplied (WL I, 217, WL III, 13, 112). Bolzano
says, in such a case, that the thinking being and its mind
“grasp” the proposition or idea in question (the
corresponding German word being ‘*erfassen*’ or
‘*auffassen*’). What happens in such a case is that
in the mind of the thinking being under consideration a mental
phenomenon occurs, or a mental process takes place in it, that is
called by Bolzano a ‘*Gedanke*’
(‘*thought*’); it can be a *subjective idea*
or a *subjective proposition*, depending on whether an idea or
a proposition “appears” in it.

In contrast to ideas and propositions (i.e., “objective”
ideas and “objective” propositions), subjective ideas and
subjective propositions belong to the real world, in particular to
World 2 of mental phenomena and mental processes. For Bolzano, a
subjective idea as well as a subjective proposition is a real property
(or “adherence”) of the thinking being in whose mind it
appears, or rather of this being’s mind or “soul”
itself (WL III, 6, 10 f., 109). A subjective idea is a mental
phenomenon — i.e., an attribute of a mind — that
“grasps” an idea (in the “objective” sense of
the word); and a mental phenomenon that “grasps” a
proposition is called ‘*Urteil*’
(‘*judgment*’) by Bolzano (WL III, 108). In
addition to judgments, there is a second kind of subjective
propositions, viz. propositions that are “merely thought”
(*bloß gedacht*); a “merely thought
proposition” is in fact a subjective idea of a proposition, i.e.
a mental phenomenon which grasps an idea whose object is a proposition
(WL I, 155). Merely having a subjective idea of a proposition does not
require that we assert the truth of the proposition in question,
whereas a judgment is an act (*Handlung*) of asserting the
truth of the proposition grasped by the judgment (WL III, 108,
199).

When we say of a subjective idea or a judgment that it
“grasps” an idea or proposition, respectively, the word
‘grasp’ is used in a more restrictive sense than before,
where it was a thinking being or its mind of which it was said that it
“grasps” an idea or proposition. This stricter relation of
“grasping”, holding between subjective ideas and ideas,
and between judgments and propositions is fundamental for
Bolzano’s epistemology. Instead of saying in this sense
‘\(p\) grasps \(o\)’, Bolzano will synonymously also use
the phrase ‘\(o\) is the “material” (*Stoff*)
of \(p\)’. Both formulations, however, are — as Bolzano
emphasizes — to be understood merely metaphorically (Bolzano
1935, 84 f.). The corresponding relation is introduced as a primitive
concept in Bolzano’s epistemology. Let us use the symbol
‘\(\mathbf{G}\)’ for this relation, whereby ‘\(p
\mathbf{G} o\)’ is to be read as ‘\(p\) grasps
\(o\)’ or, alternatively, ‘\(o\) is the
“material” of \(p\)’.

In terms of ‘\(\mathbf{G}\)’, i.e., the strict relation of “grasping”, the weaker relation of “grasping” between a thinking being and an idea or proposition can be defined as follows: a thinking being \(x\) “grasps” (in the weaker sense of this word) an idea or proposition \(o\) iff there is a subjective idea or a judgment \(p\) in \(x\)’s mind such that \(p \mathbf{G} o\). The relation \(\mathbf{G}\) is the link between the mental phenomena of World 2 on the one hand and the World 3 of ideas and propositions on the other hand. Via relation \(\mathbf{G}\), items of World 3 can have a certain, non-causal influence on the mental phenomena of World 2, and these on their part stand in causal relations to other mental phenomena and also to the physical phenomena of World 1.

Due to the domain and the range of \(\mathbf{G}\) being disjunctive sets, the relation \(\mathbf{G}\) has the following formal features: it is irreflexive, asymmetric, and (trivially) transitive; moreover, \(\mathbf{G}\) is many-one, but not one-many. Due to \(\mathbf{G}\)’s being many-one, by each subjective idea and each judgment an idea or a proposition, respectively, is uniquely determined as its material (WL III, 8 f., 108). Most of the important properties, relations and distinctions, which were defined by Bolzano primarily for ideas and propositions, can therefore easily be transferred from the sphere of ideas and propositions to the sphere of subjective ideas and judgments. We therefore will say of a subjective idea that it is simple or complex, empty, singular or general, an intuition, a concept or “mixed” according as the idea grasped by it has the corresponding property; and the same goes for judgments.

### 4.2 Subjective Intuitions and Subjective Concepts

An intuition is for Bolzano an idea that is simple and singular (cf.
section 3.5). The question arises immediately whether such an
intuition exists after all and — if so — what it can
contribute to epistemology. Both questions are answered by Bolzano at
once: In order to show that there are intuitions, he hints at
subjective ideas (ideas in our minds) that grasp
“objective” intuitions as defined before; and since these
subjective intuitions exist in our actual world, the corresponding
“objective” intuitions must exist (in the sense of
‘*es gibt*’) in the logical realm of World 3. What
are the examples of subjective intuitions, however, that Bolzano can
put forward in support of his claim? It is subjective ideas such as
the subjective idea of the change in our mind that is the immediate
reaction on an outer object (such as a rose) that stimulates our
senses. In everyday language we usually express such an idea only by
the word ‘that’ (‘*dieses*’ or —
in Bolzano’s old-fashioned orthography —
‘*dieß*’). Bolzano’s rather long-winded
explication (in WL I, 326 f.) reveals subjective ideas of a particular
sensation or sense-datum as his favorite examples of subjective
intuitions (cf. also WL III, 21 f.). The object and the cause of a
subjective intuition of this kind is itself a mental phenomenon such
as a subjective idea or a judgment (WL III, 85). If a subjective
intuition is directly caused by an “outer” object, Bolzano
calls it an ‘outer intuition’. Also in the case of an
outer intuition, its proper *object* is not the
“outer” cause of it but an “inner” mental
event; human beings are capable only of having subjective intuitions
whose proper object is a change in their mind (WL III, 89). In other
passages Bolzano seems to be less cautious and claims also of an idea
such as [Vesuvius] (WL II, 38) or [Socrates] (WL I, 346, in explicit
contradiction to WL III, 89) to be a pure intuition whose appearance
in the mind of a thinking being is a subjective intuition. This would
obviously result in taking each rigid designator (in today’s
terminology) to express an intuition.

In the same way in which a subjective intuition is defined as a subjective idea that “grasps” (in the sense of \(\mathbf{G})\) an “objective” intuition, we can also define subjective concepts and “mixed” subjective ideas (WL III, 21–23).

### 4.3 Judgments A Priori and A Posteriori

Using the distinction between intuitions and other ideas, Bolzano is
now able to draw an important epistemological distinction among
propositions and in particular also among true propositions: A
proposition is a *conceptual proposition* iff it does not
contain any intuition but consists exclusively of concepts, such as
the propositions [God is omnipotent], [Gratefulness is a duty], or
[\(\sqrt{2}\) is irrational]; all the other propositions are called
‘*empirical propositions*’ (or also
‘perceptual propositions’) by Bolzano, e.g. [That is a
flower], or [Socrates was an Athenian] (WL II, 33 f.). There is no
problem in transferring this distinction from the sphere of
propositions to the sphere of judgments, since (as already mentioned)
by every judgment a certain proposition is uniquely determined (via
relation \(\mathbf{G})\) as its “material” (WL III,
115).

At first glance, this objective distinction among propositions seems
to be far away from the Kantian distinction between judgments *a
priori* and *a posteriori*. Nevertheless, the two
distinctions are closely interrelated, and they almost coincide (WL
II, 36); hence, Bolzano warns against confusing them (WL IV, 451 f.).
The close relationship of the two distinctions becomes obvious as soon
as we ask ourselves how to discover of a conceptual or an empirical
proposition whether or not it is true: In the case of conceptual
propositions, it is mere reflection, i.e., an inner
“inspection” of our subjective concepts, without any
experience, that is required to find out whether or not it is true,
whereas in the case of an empirical proposition experience is
indispensable for judging its truth or falsity (WL II, 36). This
Kantian distinction of the different ways of recognizing the truth or
falsity of such judgments, however, as important as it is, must be
based on the more fundamental objective distinction between conceptual
and empirical *propositions* on Bolzano’s view.

Empirical propositions contain at least one intuition. Most important are those empirical propositions whose subject idea is an intuition. These are propositions about perceptions or sensations, i.e., in Bolzano’s words, about certain changes in our minds, caused by other inner events or by external sensory stimuli. The subject idea of a “private” empirical proposition of this kind is usually expressed by a word such as ‘that’, denoting, e.g., a certain color sensation. No wonder that the indexicals ‘that’ and ‘I’ play such a prominent role in Bolzano’s epistemology (in WL III) although they do not have a place in his logical World 3 (cf. section 3.4). The reason for this seems to be that our empirical knowledge is based on immediate perceptual judgments, i.e., judgments that “grasp” (in the sense of \(\mathbf{G})\) a certain kind of an empirical proposition. The subjective subject idea of such an immediate perceptual judgment is a subjective intuition for whose expression an indexical such as ‘that’ or ‘I’ seems to be indispensable.

Bolzano quite clearly faced the problem of how to get from these
immediate perceptual judgments, whose objects are completely
“private” phenomena which we usually denote by means of
indexicals, to an objective description of our world. His epistemology
therefore reminds us in many respects of the discussions concerning
protocol sentences among the representatives of phenomenalism and
physicalism in the Vienna Circle, and even more of Bertrand
Russell’s program in his *Inquiry into Meaning and Truth*
(1940). The highly interesting similarities between Bolzano’s
and Russell’s program still await further investigation.

### 4.4 Immediate and Mediated Judgments

Judgments are psychical phenomena and they belong therefore not to
World 3 but to our real world. Each judgment is an act or event that
takes place at a certain time in a certain mind and is herewith part
of a causal network. As a part of our real world, each judgment comes
into being in time (and will pass away later on). From an
epistemological point of view it is of particular relevance whether a
judgment is caused or mediated by other judgments or whether this is
not the case, i.e., whether the judgment is “immediate”
(WL III, 123 ff.). If a judgment \(m\) is caused or mediated by a set
\(\mu\) of judgments, Bolzano calls the mind’s transition from
\(\mu\) to \(m\) ‘*Schluss*’
(‘*inference*’), as distinct from the usage of this
term explained in section 3.8. An *inference* in this sense is
a mental process (belonging to World 2) of inferring a judgment \(m\)
from a set \(\mu\) of others; we can represent it by \(\langle \mu ,
m\rangle\). Such an inference — as opposed to an
“inference in itself” or an argument — is a causal
process, to be clear. Since by each of the judgments involved in an
inference — by the members of \(\mu\) as well as by \(m\)
— a proposition is uniquely determined (due to \(\mathbf{G})\)
as its “material”, by every inference \(\langle \mu ,
m\rangle\) an argument \(\langle \sigma , s\rangle\) is uniquely
determined, for which Bolzano has defined what it means, e.g., that
\(s\) is a logical consequence of \(\sigma\), or that \(s\) has a
certain logical probability \(\gt \bfrac{1}{2}\) relative to
\(\sigma\). (These concepts can then be applied indirectly to the
inference \(\langle \mu , m\rangle\) and used for its evaluation, as
we will see in the following section 4.5.)

From the obvious existence of mediated judgments, however, it follows that there must also be immediate judgments (WL III, 125, 138–139). Immediate judgments cannot be false and must therefore be certain (WL III, 212, 229, 263). Certainty has thereby not to be taken in its objective sense in which a proposition \(s\) is certain relative to a set \(\sigma\) of propositions iff the logical probability of \(s\) relative to \(\sigma\) is 1, i.e., iff \(s\) is a logical consequence of \(\sigma\) (WL II, 173). In the present context, certainty must rather be taken in a subjective sense in which it is primarily a property of a judgment; if two judgments grasp one and the same proposition, one of them can be certain (in this subjective sense of the term) whereas the other one is not (WL III, 263 f.). As the two most important kinds of immediate judgments among the empirical ones Bolzano mentions judgments of the form “I — have — an appearance \(X\)” and “That (what I just now perceive of) — has — property \(b\)” (WL I, 181, WL III, 131, 139, 229). Judgments of these two kinds are called ‘(immediate) perceptual judgments’, whereas the term ‘empirical judgment’ is normally used only for mediated judgments containing a subjective intuition (WL III, 131 f.). The propositions “grasped” by these immediate perceptual judgments are empirical propositions whose subject ideas are intuitions that are usually expressed by means of the indexicals ‘I’ and ‘that’. Bolzano’s philosophy of science can thus be found to be empiricist, founded on a phenomenalist basis.

With respect to all judgments \(m\) mediated by a set \(\mu\) of
judgments, it is of high relevance whether the argument \(\langle
\sigma , s\rangle\) corresponding to \(\langle \mu , m\rangle\)
fulfills certain criteria. In the sections 3.8 and 3.9 we have already
dealt with two logical relations which can obtain between the
conclusion \(s\) and the set \(\sigma\) of premises of an argument
\(\langle \sigma , s\rangle\) and which can easily be transferred to
\(\langle \mu , m\rangle\): it is on the one hand the peculiar feature
of \(s\) being a logical consequence of \(\sigma\), and on the other
hand the peculiar feature of \(s\) having a certain degree of logical
probability \(\gt \bfrac{1}{2}\) relative to \(\sigma\). With
respect to empirical judgments, considerations of probability are in
the foreground. Logical consequence “transfers” certainty,
also in its subjective sense, from the premises to the conclusion of
an inference. That is to say, if each member of a set \(\mu\) of
judgments is certain for a person \(A\) (as is the case for each
immediate judgment), and if a judgment \(m\) is mediated or caused by
\(\mu\) insofar as it is inferred by \(A\) from \(\mu\) as a logical
consequence of it, then \(m\) is also certain for \(A\) (WL III, 264
f.). In order for this to be the case, it is of course not enough for
the argument \(\langle \sigma , s\rangle\) corresponding to \(\langle
\mu , m\rangle\) to be logically correct, but it is required that
\(A\) infers \(m\) from \(\mu\) *in virtue* (*kraft*) of
the logical correctness of this argument.

Error and uncertainty have two possible sources according to Bolzano:
either the premises that one presupposes are uncertain (or even
false), or one has used a mere probability inference (WL III, 265 f.),
i.e., an inference whose conclusion asserts the truth of a proposition
\(s\) itself instead of merely asserting the truth of the proposition
[\(s\) is probable] (WL I, 182 ff., WL II, 510, WL III, 212 f.).
Considerations of this kind amount to quite a refined epistemological
system of subjective probability, in which Bolzano distinguishes
degrees of credibility and of assurance by using his probability
theory (WL III, 274–288). Unfortunately, these investigations
are little known, since they are only developed in the third volume of
his *Theory of Science* which receives far less attention than
it deserves.

### 4.5 The Entailment Relation

a) *Explication of the Entailment Relation*: In addition to
logical consequence and probability, there is a third category,
however, that is brought into play by Bolzano within this context: it
is the relation which obtains between a set \(\sigma\) of propositions
and a proposition \(s\) iff \(\sigma\) is the “objective
ground” of \(s\) or — in other words — iff \(s\)
“follows objectively” from \(\sigma\); in today’s
terminology we say instead that \(\sigma\) entails \(s\) or that \(s\)
is entailed by \(\sigma\). This relation of *entailment*
(*Abfolge*) is — to be clear — primarily not an
epistemological relation but — like (logical) consequence and
(logical) probability — a relation between a set of propositions
and a single proposition (WL II, 339 ff., WL III, 495 f.).

Bolzano’s favorite way of explaining this concept is by means of
two inferences whose corresponding arguments are \(\langle \sigma_1,
s_1\rangle\) and \(\langle \sigma_2, s_2\rangle\) such that the
following holds: \(s_1\) describes the rising of a thermometer at a
certain moment of time at a certain place, and \(s_2\) describes the
rising of the temperature at the same place and time. \(\sigma_1\)
contains the law that from the rising of temperature the extension of
a liquid (in the thermometer) will follow, plus the required
antecedent conditions, whereas \(\sigma_2\) contains the
(statistically confirmed) proposition that, if a functioning
thermometer at a certain time and place rises, then also the
temperature there will rise, plus the corresponding antecedent
conditions. (Sometimes Bolzano also uses an analogous example with
atmospheric pressure and a barometer.) Let us assume that we have
constructed the two arguments in such a way both that \(s_1\) is a
logical consequence of \(\sigma_1\) and that \(s_2\) is a logical
consequence of \(\sigma_2\). Nevertheless, Bolzano argues, there is an
essential difference between the two examples insofar as \(\sigma_1\)
is the \(_{}\)*objective ground* for \(s_1\), and \(s_1\) is
therefore *entailed* by \(\sigma_1, _{}\)whereas this is not
true for \(\langle \sigma_2, s_2\rangle\) (WL II, 192 f., 340, WL IV,
580 f., Bolzano 1975, 81 f.).

b) *Inferring in virtue of Entailment*: In inferring \(s_1\)
from \(\sigma_1\) we show *why* \(s_1\) is true, whereas in
inferring \(s_2\) from \(\sigma_2\) we merely show *that*
\(s_2\) is true, as it was already formulated by Aristotle
(*Analytica posteriora* I, chap. 13) to whom Bolzano refers
back in this context again and again (cf., e.g., WL II, 341, WL IV,
15, 262). Hereby, however, we quietly switch from inferences in
themselves, represented by \(\langle \sigma_1, s_1\rangle\) and
\(\langle \sigma_2, s_2\rangle\), to the corresponding mental
processes of inferring, represented by \(\langle \mu_1, m_1\rangle\)
and \(\langle \mu_2, m_2\rangle\), respectively, where the judgement
\(m_1\) (grasping \(s_1)\) or \(m_2\) (grasping \(s_2)\),
respectively, is inferred from the set of judgements \(\mu_1\) (whose
members grasp the members of \(\sigma_1)\) or \(\mu_2\) (whose members
grasp those of \(\sigma_2)\), respectively. Since in our example
\(m_1\) as well as \(m_2\) is a true judgement or an act of knowledge
(an *Erkenntnis*, as Bolzano calls it), \(\mu_1\) as well as
\(\mu_2\) are reasons or grounds of knowledge
(*Erkenntnisgründe*) for \(m_1\) or \(m_2\), respectively.
Whereas \(\mu_2\) is a *mere* ground of knowledge
(*bloßer Erkenntnisgrund*) for \(m_2\), however,
\(\mu_1\) is an *objective* ground (*objektiver Grund*)
for \(m_1\). Strictly speaking, however, \(\mu_1\) and \(\mu_2\) are
not *grounds* at all, but rather *causes* of \(m_1\) and
\(m_2\), respectively, as Bolzano specifies in WL III, 231 (see also
WL II, 304, 340 f., 365, WL III, 267). Bolzano calls the inference
\(\langle \mu_1, m_1\rangle\) an objective proof (*objektiver
Beweis*) or an objective justification (*objektive
Begründung*), while he calls the inference \(\langle \mu_2,
m_2\rangle\) a mere subjective proof (*subjektiver Beweis*) or
a mere “certification” (*bloße
Gewißmachung*) (RW I, 6 f., WL II, 341, WL IV,
261–263, Bolzano 1975, 83–85). Ideas quite similar to
these can be found in discussions on the concept of scientific
explanation within modern philosophy of science (cf., e.g., Wolfgang
Stegmüller, *Probleme und Resultate der Wissenschaftstheorie
und Analytischen Philosophie*, Vol. 1, Heidelberg-New York:
Springer, 193, Adolf Grünbaum, *Philosophical Problems of
Space and Time*, New York: Alfred A. Knopf, 309 f., or M. Scriven
“Explanation and Predication in Evolutionary Theory”,
*Science* 130 (1959), 477–482, cf. 480). Although only
objective proofs are strictly scientific proofs for Bolzano (RW I, 7,
WL IV, 261–263), his definition of a scientific textbook does
not require that its proofs must be strictly scientific (WL I, 4, WL
IV, 10 f., 15, 32). The duty to present objective proofs can be
recognized, however, according to Bolzano from his concept of a
science (WL IV, 10; cf. also WL IV, 32–34).

The argument \(\langle \sigma_2, s_2\rangle\), mentioned before, provides us with an instance of a proposition \(s\) being a logical consequence of a set \(\sigma\) of propositions without being entailed by \(\sigma\). Can a proposition \(s\) also conversely be entailed by \(\sigma\) without being a logical consequence of \(\sigma\)? Bolzano guesses that this is possible but he is not definite about it (WL III, 346–348). The two relations are clearly distinct from one another anyway, since the entailment relation is — unlike the relation of logical consequence — asymmetrical and irreflexive.

c) *Entailment in various Areas of Knowledge*: Whenever Bolzano
touches on the topic of entailment, he introduces it by examples such
as those mentioned above, viz. \(\langle \sigma_1, s_1\rangle\). In
these examples, what is described by \(\sigma_1\) is the cause of the
phenomenon described by \(s_1\). The entailment relation is not
restricted, however, to these cases where it mirrors causality of our
real world on the level of propositions in World 3; for Bolzano there
are also obvious examples of the entailment relation in mathematics
(e.g., RW I, 160 f., WL II, 191 f., 350, 361, 368, WL IV, 34, 262 f.,
448, Bolzano 1841, 106 f., Bolzano 1842, 433, Bolzano 1975, 82),
ethics (e.g., WL II, 339, 348, 359, 361), metaphysics (e.g., WL II
354, WL IV, 33) and theology (e.g., RW I, 6 f., 13, WL II, 354, 361,
368). Although the majority of examples Bolzano gives for the
entailment relation in WL are taken from natural sciences, he himself
worked for much of his life, with great originality and success,
inspired by the search for strict entailment proofs of major results
in mathematics.

d) *Entailment and Proof Theory*: The idea of using the concept
of entailment and of developing it further emerged for Bolzano
originally, in fact, in connection with his mathematical studies. He
criticised in his first publication (Bolzano 1804) some classical
proofs for the theory of triangles and parallels for using
inappropriate concepts such as motion and the plane. With hindsight we
could say he thought such proofs could not express the entailment
relations needed to give the objective grounds for the propositions to
be proved and that they are therefore not — as they sould be
— objective justifications but merely subjective proofs or
certifications. The motivation of searching for such objective proofs
in many areas of mathematics led to many original and fruitful
concepts not appreciated, or re-discovered, until many decades later.
No wonder then that Bolzano developed special rules for the relation
of entailment in cases where it obtains between (sets of)
*conceptual* propositions (*Begriffssätze*) as in
mathematics and metaphysics: if a proposition \(s\) is a member of the
set \(\sigma\) which is the objective ground of a *conceptual*
proposition \(s', s\) must not contain more conceptual parts than
\(s'\) (WL II, 384); when Bolzano says “not more”,
however, he means rather “no other simple concepts than those
contained also in \(s\)”.

The relation of entailment between (sets of) conceptual truths has the
characteristic feature that, according to it, from the smallest number
of premisses the largest number of conclusions will follow none of
which has simple components which are not also contained in its
premisses (WL II, 386). Ideas such as these sound akin to Gerhard
Gentzen’s characterization of normal proofs: “They do not
make a detour. They do not introduce concepts which are not contained
in its final result and must therefore be used necessarily in order to
get it” (Gerhard Gentzen, “Untersuchungen über das
logische Schliessen”, *Mathematische Zeitschrift* 39,
1934/35: 176–200, 405–431, see p.177). It has been pointed
out, therefore, by several commentators, that there are interesting
parallels between Bolzano’s semantic notion of entailment and
Gentzen’s syntactic concept of “normal proofs” (cf.
Buhl 1958, 85 f., Berg 1962, 151–164, and, more recently,
Rumberg 2012), and that Bolzano in a certain sense anticipated
Gentzen’s *Hauptsatz* (Berg 1987, 41). (In Schröter
1955, 60–61, 85–86, and Schröter 1958, 32–34,
Gentzen’s consequence relation is compared with Bolzano’s
relation of *Ableitbarkeit*, but, unfortunately,
Bolzano’s relation of entailment (*Abfolge*) is not taken
into consideration in this context by Schröter.)

In spite of a certain lack of clarity in Bolzano’s explication, it is obvious that his concept of entailment is of great relevance not only for the philosophy of the empirical sciences but also with respect to proof theory. It is hard, however, to see how to reconcile the characteristic features of the entailment relation in its application to causality (in the empirical sciences) with those in its application to proof theory.

e) *Entailment and Grounding*: Also the recent philosophical
“movement” on grounding has an obvious affinity to
Bolzano’s theory of entailment, as witnessed by numerous
publications such as Schnieder & Correia 2012, Rumberg 2012, or
Roski 2017.

## 5. Ethics

In addition to his trail blazing works in logic, Bolzano made valuable
contributions to other subdisciplines of *philosophy*, in
particular to ethics. *Ethical* considerations entered, to be
sure, into various works of Bolzano, especially of course into the
ones concerning the science of religion, but also (which is perhaps to
be expected less) into his logical works. These ethical considerations
of Bolzano were, however, never published together.

### 5.1 Critique of Kant’s Categorical Imperative

Bolzano’s main objection against the Categorical Imperative was that we cannot derive from it alone — as Kant supposed — whether a given act ought to be done or not. Kant’s instruction to ask ourselves of a maxim whether we can will without contradicting ourselves that it should become a universal law is of no use, according to Bolzano, since for him there is no practical proposition or ought proposition whose contradictory opposite is self-contradictory. This, however, is not a decisive argument against Kant’s Categorical Imperative for several reasons. Nevertheless, Bolzano refused to accept the Categorical Imperative strictly and replaced it with the utilitarian principle of “the advancement of the general welfare”, as he proudly reports in his autobiography (Bolzano 1836, 23).

### 5.2 Bolzano’s Supreme Moral Law

The supreme moral law that Bolzano put in place of Kant’s
Categorical Imperative was by no means original. Bolzano, however,
modified and justified it in an original way and consistently applied
it to many different areas. By the supreme moral law Bolzano means
“a practical truth [i.e., a true ought proposition] from which
every other practical truth […] can be derived
*objectively*, i.e., as the consequence from its
‘ground’” (RW I, 228; cf. also RW I, 44, 244, 256,
RW IV, 27, 217, 221, and WL II, 348, WL IV, 178). Thus, on the basis
of the asymmetry of Bolzano’s entailment relation
(*Abfolge*), the supreme moral law must be an ought proposition
that does not objectively follow from (i.e., it is not entailed by)
any other ought proposition. It must therefore be a basic truth, i.e.,
a truth that does not *have* an objective “ground”,
but can only \(be\) an objective “ground” of other
(practical) truths (WL II, 375, RW I, 229, RW IV, 207).

Bolzano’s supreme moral law consists in the utilitarian
requirement of advancing the general welfare (RW IV, 206, 227, 236;
Bolzano 1836, 23, 43; WL IV, 26 f., 178). Briefly, this supreme moral
law is formulated thus: “Strive to bring about the greatest
amount of happiness” (RW I, 250), or: “Always act as the
best for all or the welfare of the whole demands” (RW IV, 216,
also 218, 221, and 229). On the basis of careful considerations,
Bolzano arrives at the following *definitive version* of his
supreme moral law:

Always choose from all actions that are possible for you the one which, all consequences considered, most advances the welfare of the whole, in whatever parts(RW I, 236; cf. WL IV, 119).

Bolzano specifies the content of the thus obtained formulation of the supreme moral law in several respects (RW I, 235). His explanations exhibit a remarkable awareness of problems. Thus, he points out that all sentient beings are equal and must be equally involved in the increase of happiness or decrease of suffering (RW I, 235). The addendum that this goes for beings “for whom there are no varying degrees of virtue” indicates that Bolzano would allow for certain distinctions in the case of beings which are capable of being virtuous (and for which there are consequently also differences of degree in regard to kinds of happiness which other beings cannot appreciate). The capacity of being virtuous is therefore — no less than sentience — a morally relevant quality for him. In this Bolzano agrees with considerations in contemporary ethics, according to which the quality of personhood is, in addition to sentience, morally relevant.

Bolzano stresses that, in assessing an action according to the
principle of advancing the general welfare, one must “not only
look at its proximate consequences, but also at further ones”
(RW I, 237). Since we can never know all the consequences of an
action, the principle of advancing the general welfare demands that we
always decide in favor of the action which seems most conducive to the
welfare of the whole according to those consequences thereof *which
we can foresee arising from it* (RW I, 241). With a similar
argument Bolzano replies to the objection that according to his
principle the moral value of our actions would depend on *mere
chance*, as the following example seems to show: “If someone
with the intention of killing his neighbor drew a dagger against him,
but accidentally only opened a boil and this were now healed thereby,
he would have performed a good work”. This view, however, rests
on a misunderstanding, according to Bolzano, since for him “the
*moral goodness* of an action (i.e., its claim to being
rewardable) is always a matter of whether the action has been
undertaken with a *view* to agreeing with the law” (RW I,
240).

### 5.3 Bolzano’s Ethics as a “Mixed” Normative Theory

Bolzano developed his ethics in explicit opposition to Kant’s
moral philosophy. Nevertheless, Bolzano’s ethics contains also
essential elements of Kantian ethics, and there is even a basic
coincidence between Bolzano’s and Kant’s ethics. The only
thing that can be regarded as good without qualification, according to
Kant, is a good will (*Grundlegung zur Metaphysik der Sitten*,
1785, 1). Yet (as we will see in section 5.4), it is a basic postulate
of Bolzano’s deontic logic that an ought always primarily refers
to a willing: You ought to *will* to act such that the welfare
of the whole, due to the consequences foreseeable by you and intended
by your action, undergoes the greatest possible advancement among all
possible alternative actions. Bolzano himself infers from this: The
supreme moral law demands “properly only a willing, not the
accomplishment” (RW IV, 207).

What is primarily judged as obligatory or forbidden is not the act,
but a willing or decision, as Bolzano emphasizes. An action that is
willed must thus be assessed according to those consequences which the
agent thereby *intends* or *wills* to achieve: For an
action to be morally good it is not enough, as we have already seen
(at the end of section 5.2), that it is in accordance with the moral
law, but it must be undertaken also *with the intention* for it
to be so (RW IV, 266), i.e., *due to the moral law* (RW IV,
269). In this manner Bolzano abandons the scope of the purely
consequentialist position which claims that the moral assessment of an
action or of the willing-an-action as being obligatory, permissible or
forbidden depends solely on its consequences. Bolzano’s
utilitarianism is consequently not a purely consequentialist normative
theory, but rather a *mixed* theory. In presenting such a mixed
ethical theory, Bolzano came already close to a modern conception of
ethics (such as, e.g., that outlined in William K. Frankena’s
*Ethics*, 2nd edition, 1973, 43 ff.) which is very common
within today’s applied ethics.

### 5.4 Bolzano’s Deontic Logic

Bolzano developed a particular logic for ought propositions which — without today’s formalism — comes already close to modern deontic logic in certain respects. The primitive form of an ought proposition is \([A\) — has — an ought of \(X]\) or, more accurately, \([A\) — has — an ought to will to do \(X]\) (WL II, 70; slightly different in RW I, 228). The concept [ought] is simple (WL II, 69, WL IV, 489), but its usage underlies certain principles stated explicitly by Bolzano:

(P1) | It is not the case that \((A\) ought to will to do \(X\) and \(A\) ought not to will to do \(X)\). |

(P2) | If \(A\) ought to will to do \(X\), then \(A\) is permitted to will to do \(X\). |

(P3) | If \(A\) ought to will to do \(X\) and \(A\) ought to will to do \(Y\), then \(A\) ought to will to do \(X\) and \(Y\). |

(P4) | If \(A\) ought to will to do \(X\), then \(A\) can will to do \(X\). |

(P5) | If \(A\) ought to will to do \(X\) and willing to do \(X\) entails willing to do \(Y\), then \(A\) ought to will to do \(Y\). |

(P1) is a deontic principle of non-contradiction (RW IV, 264 f.); (P2) is the principle that “ought implies permitted” (RW I, 236); (P3) is a kind of combination principle for ought (RW I, 229 f.); (P4) is the “ought implies can” principle (RW I, 230, 257, RW IV, 214, and WL II, 348); and (P5) is a deontic entailment principle (RW I, 229, WL II, 339, 348).

When it comes to the question of how to interpret ought sentences,
Bolzano — like most of his contemporaries — was obviously
not aware of the fundamental problem involved in this question.
Bolzano took ought sentences in his standard formulation without
further ado as expressions of propositions, and he took it therefore
for granted that they are true or false in the usual sense of these
words, as explained by his definitions of truth and of falsity. He
thus clearly held a cognitivist metaethical position, probably even a
naturalistic one, using his utilitarian principle as a meaning
postulate for ought sentences. In support of this understanding of
Bolzano’s position, it can be put forward that Bolzano
interpreted also other kinds of linguistic sentences in a simple
naturalistic way. Even questions, e.g., are interpreted by Bolzano not
as sentences *expressing* a wish for information but as
*describing* such a wish and therefore being true or false in
the usual sense of these words (WL I, 88, WL II, 71–76,
194–196).

The most important field in which Bolzano applied his ethical views was political and social philosophy. Before we switch to this topic (in section 7) we will deal with Bolzano’s aesthetics.

## 6. Aesthetics

Bolzano published two treatises in aesthetics: “On the Concept of the Beautiful” (Bolzano 1843b) appeared while he was alive, while the other one, entitled “On the Division of the Fine Arts” (Bolzano 1849b), was presented by him in the Royal Bohemian Society of Sciences in 1847 but was published only posthumously.

In the first of these two aesthetic essays Bolzano proposes the following definition of the concept of the beautiful:

The beautiful must be an object whose contemplation can give to all human beings properly developed in their cognitive faculties a pleasure, and the reason for this is that, upon apprehending some of the object’s properties, neither is it too easy for them nor does it cause for them the effort of distinct thinking, to form a concept of this object which allows them to guess the other properties that are apprehended only by further contemplation and thereby gives them at least an obscure intuition of the proficiency of their cognitive faculties (Bolzano 1843b, 27 and 30).

It is hard to see how, according to this definition, there could be beautiful objects if there did not exist certain human dispositions; and, obviously, there can be human dispositions only if there are human beings. Bolzano’s definition seems therefore to make beauty ontologically dependent on the existence of human beings as possible beholders of beautiful objects. This makes Bolzano’s aesthetics in a certain sense subjectivist. By taking Bolzano’s definition to be a conditional definition in today’s sense, we could avoid this consequence; but in this case beauty would not be defined for a world without human beings, and in such a world there were no beautiful objects. Bolzano himself, however, did not draw such conclusions from his definition, but quite on the contrary: He claimed explicitly that there would be beautiful objects in the world even if no human being existed (Bolzano 1843b, 67). Be that as it may, Bolzano does by no means advocate an extreme form of subjectivism in aesthetics. For him, the beauty of an object depends also, and even primarily, on certain inner properties, in particular on certain regularities of the object itself which give rise to its possible effects on the beholders. This puts Bolzano’s basic aesthetic view in a middle position between extreme subjectivism and extreme objectivism. In any case, Bolzano’s essay on the concept of the beautiful includes a quite subtle psychological analysis of phenomena that are relevant for aesthetics and play an important role in today’s aesthetic research.

In his second aesthetic treatise (Bolzano 1849b), Bolzano explains his understanding of fine arts and of works of fine art, and he presents a classification of fine arts based on an ontological analysis of the works of fine art.

## 7. Political and Social Philosophy

In a series of writings Bolzano was concerned also with political,
social, national, economic questions and generally with philosophy of
state. The central one of these writings was no doubt his
“booklet” *On the Best State* (Bolzano 1932).
Therein he summarized his political philosophy systematically and
developed his conception of an ideal state. For Bolzano, the main
question to be answered in this connection is: How can we eliminate or
at least reduce human suffering and evil in the world most
effectively? It was the question which, according to Bolzano’s
own statement, occupied him with the greatest frequency, intensity and
enthusiasm above all others (Bolzano 1932, III). Some suffering of
human beings and some evil in the world are unavoidable, due to our
finite nature, and therefore cannot be excluded even in an ideal state
with optimal arrangements. Much suffering and evil, however, could be
prevented by means of expedient political arrangements (Bolzano 1932,
3 f.). It is the fault of poor arrangements in all civil constitutions
thus far, according to Bolzano, that the human condition is so
deplorable. In *On the Best State*, Bolzano therefore devotes
himself to the question as to how a state would have to be most
expediently arranged or how a perfect state would have to look
(Bolzano 1932, V, 1). The leading principle that Bolzano applies in
answering this question is his supreme moral law: The political
arrangements are to be made in such a manner that the general welfare
or virtue and happiness are all advanced as far as possible (Bolzano
1932, III, 7 f.). From it he tried to derive all the rules and
regulations needed in a well-organized state.

In 28 chapters Bolzano describes how the best state looks and
therefore also how the currently existing states *should* be
arranged. In these chapters Bolzano treats the following topics: 1.
the citizens of the state, its size and its divisions; 2. legislation;
3. government; 4. compulsory institutions; 5. liberty; 6. equality; 7.
freedom of thought and of religion; 8. education and instruction; 9.
care for health and for life; 10. property; 11. money; 12. occupations
and life styles; 13. productive activities; 14. trade; 15. scholars;
16. books and censorship; 17. fine arts; 18. nourishment; 19.
clothing; 20. housing; 21. gender specific institutions; 22.
satisfaction of the pursuit for honor; 23. travels; 24. enjoyments;
25. disputes among citizens; 26. taxes and state expenditures; 27.
rewards and punishments; 28. death.

A mere comparison of the chapters in terms of their size is revealing: The longest chapter by far is the tenth, concerning property, followed by the chapter on taxes and state expenditures and the chapter on rewards and punishments. From this it is clear that the unequal division of possessions was Bolzano’s greatest concern; it was for him the main root of evil, which was to be removed by means of a just redistribution. Bringing about a certain equality regarding the rights and duties of citizens is an important concern for Bolzano. How little Bolzano cares for the principle of liberty, however, becomes manifest already by the fact that the chapter on liberty is the second shortest chapter in his booklet (the shortest being the one on travelling). The constitution of Bolzano’s best state turns out to be a very ambivalent mixture of regulations which make an impression of being very progressive with respect to the desired equality for the citizens, but extremely objectionable with respect to the liberties conceded to them.

Bolzano did not shy away from taking up also practical problems in
publications and writing about them, for instance, about the
improvement of poorhouses and about the elimination of misery and
poverty in the population of Prague. Bolzano treated these and many
other questions of practical relevance also in his “edifying
addresses” (*Erbauungsreden*), of which the first
collection was published already in 1813 (in a second edition 1839),
and five volumes were published posthumously. The first volume of the
complete critical edition of all of Bolzano’s
*Erbauungsreden* appeared in 2007 (Bolzano 2007a).

## 8. Philosophy of Religion and Theology

In questions concerning the science of religion and theology, Bolzano exhibited views with which he was in part far ahead of his time and which sound very current at present. It is no wonder that he encountered rejection and resistance on certain points in which his departure from the church doctrine at that time was too great.

Bolzano’s main work in theology is his four volume *Textbook
of the Science of Religion*, which was published in 1834 by his
pupils — without any mention of the author — from their
very deficient lecture notes (much to Bolzano’s displeasure).
What is meant by ‘science of religion’ (also
‘philosophy of religion’ or ‘philosophical doctrine
of religion’), according to Bolzano, is the “science of
the most perfect religion” (RW I, 3). Here Bolzano presupposes a
concept of religion that is, to be sure, interesting, but not
unproblematic from the Catholic standpoint. Bolzano starts with
religion in the subjective sense, i.e., the religion of a person; this
is, according to Bolzano, the set of religious opinions of this
person. The content or “material” (*Stoff*) of a
religion in the subjective sense is a religion in the objective sense.
Thus, a religion in the objective sense is a set of propositions which
can be grasped (in the sense of \(\mathbf{G}\) as explained in section
4.1) by a religion in the subjective sense. Bolzano’s concept of
religion is consequently based on his definition of religious
propositions or religious opinions: A proposition (and analogously
also a subjective proposition or a judgment, an opinion etc.) is on
Bolzano’s view *religious* iff it is both (generally)
important and moral. A proposition is (generally) *important*
iff it generally exerts influence on our virtue and happiness (RW I,
51 f.); and a proposition is *moral* iff “there is in the
nature of man a reason for the temptation, without being justified in
this, to acknowledge it either as true or as false” (RW I, 58).
Thus, as a summary of Bolzano’s definition of the concept of
religion in the subjective sense, the following may be stated: The
religion of a person is “the collection of all those opinions of
this person which manifest either an advantageous or a disadvantageous
influence on his virtue or his happiness and are at the same time such
that there was a special temptation, without any sufficient reason, to
decide either in favor of or against them” (RW I, 60 f.).

Closely connected with this concept of religion is Bolzano’s
view that many doctrines of the Christian religion, e.g. the doctrine
of the descent of all human beings from a single parental couple or
the doctrine of original sin, are only metaphorical in character.
Original sin is for him *not real sin*, but rather it bears
this name only insofar as it has its origin in Adam’s sin and
insofar as it displeases God (RW IV, 47 f.). As regards the question
of descent, what is of importance in this doctrine is not its truth
but only *that all human beings are essentially equal* in such
a way as if they had descended from one and the same parental couple,
whereas it does not matter whether they are also really descendent
from only a single couple (RW IV, 17). The image of the common descent
of all human beings is, independently of its truth content, very
important “in order to maintain the sentiments of brotherly love
among us” (RW IV, 18).

Here Bolzano’s non-cognitivist (i.e., emotive and directive) interpretation of religious language is especially clear. This conception goes back to the key experience in his religious development, whereby he was able to overcome his religious doubts, and which essentially influenced his decision to become a priest: From Marian Mika, his professor in pastoral theology, he came to the conviction that a religious doctrine is justified, independently of its truth content, only insofar as the belief in it is morally advantageous.

A question in regard to which Bolzano adopted an especially
interesting position was the problem of miracles. According to the
traditional view, they are supernatural events or even immediate
effects of God. Sometimes this is understood in the sense that
miracles are events which are not explainable by means of the laws of
nature or even incompatible with these laws. This view, however, has
to face serious problems as Bolzano has painfully made clear (cf. RW
I, 422–439, especially 424–436). Bolzano rejects these
definitions mainly for the following reason: “If by the laws of
nature one here meant laws *a priori*, no divergence from them
would be possible; if, by contrast, one meant empirical laws of
nature, a departure from these is nothing but what has been called an
*unusual occurrence*” (RW I, 436). Being an
“unusual occurrence” is on Bolzano’s own view a
necessary (though not a sufficient) characteristic of a miracle (RW I,
437). An unusual event, however, is simply an event that is improbable
(RW II, 68), hence an event whose intrinsic probability is \(\lt
\bfrac{1}{2}\) (Bolzano 1838, 383). It can happen, however, that in
every possible explanation for a fact certain unusual events would
have to be presupposed, and that in such a case the assumption of a
miracle, of which we receive a report, is the least improbable and
consequently the most probable explanation (RW II, 69). Such
circumstances do not, however, detract from the divinity of miracles
and revelation but rather can have certain advantages, for these
miracles thus become credible (RW I, 441 f.).

A careful treatment of this problem therefore requires bringing into
play considerations of probability theory. This makes understandable
what could otherwise be seen as very strange for a theological
textbook: Bolzano’s *Textbook of the Science of Religion*
contains a section on mathematical probability theory (RW II, 39 ff.).
However, also the choice of certain examples and the focus on certain
methodological questions in *The Theory of Science* can better
be understood if one sees that they are theologically motivated. Quite
interesting in this respect are Bolzano’s investigations into
the discovery and credibility of testimonies and into the degree of
credibility of a proposition with respect to testimonies that are in
favor of it as well as of testimonies against it (WL III,
555–568); he used these investigations as a basis for his theory
of the divine revelation. The special treatment of proofs,
“which are only to show that the probability of a proposition
exceeds a given magnitude” (WL IV, 294–296), is closely
connected with the topic of miracles: In order to prove that an event
\(E\) is an unusual event and thus qualifies to be a miracle, one must
demonstrate that the intrinsic probability of the assumption that
\(E\) has not occurred is \(\gt \bfrac{1}{2}\) and therefore exceeds a
certain magnitude. The specification of a particular degree of
probability, however, is not required for this. Bolzano’s
digression into probability theory in his *Textbook of the Science
of Religion* and his careful use of probability theory in the
discussion of miracles are obviously directed towards arguments
brought forward by David Hume, although Bolzano does not mention his
name in this context.

Two questions discussed during Bolzano’s time and once again
topical at present are those concerning the indissolubility of
marriage and concerning celibacy. Bolzano advocated the
*indissolubility of marriage* without restrictions or
exceptions (RW IV, 356 ff.). This, however, is not an article of faith
but merely a disciplinary prescription of the Catholic Church that is
subject to change, as he points out in other writings (Bolzano 1813,
221, Bolzano 1845, 98, 374). This view even allows in certain cases,
e.g., in the case of demonstrated adultery, the annulment of a
marriage (Bolzano 1845, 98, 374, Bolzano 1932, 101). Bolzano’s
position regarding *celibacy* bore the stamp of his own
experience which he quite openly depicts in his autobiography (Bolzano
1836, 25). While Bolzano earlier (in RW IV, 371, 388 f.) expressed
himself cautiously concerning celibacy (that he has not yet adopted a
definitive opinion about it), he later explicitly favors the
elimination of celibacy (in Bolzano 1845, 93 f., 258, 367) and
declares celibacy to be “harmful and inappropriate” (cf.
Fesl’s note in Bolzano 1836, 94 f.).

## 9. Metaphysics

Bolzano’s most important metaphysical doctrines are found in his
*Athanasia* (Bolzano 1827), in the *Paradoxes of the
Infinite* (Bolzano 1851), and in his writings that he left
unpublished; Bolzano’s pupil Příhonský,
moreover, gave an exposition of Bolzano’s *Atomism*
(Příhonský1857). *Athanasia* was first
published anonymously (in 1827), its second edition appeared in 1838
with a statement of authorship. Its full title “Athanasia or
Reasons for the Immortality of the Soul” makes clear that the
book pursues a theoretical goal. Bolzano combines with this
theoretical goal of the book a practical purpose as well; it is also a
“book of consolation” or (as the subtitle of the second
edition says) “a book for every educated person who wants peace
of mind regarding this matter”.

From traditional metaphysics Bolzano adopts the doctrine that everything real is either a substance or an adherence (cf. Schnieder 2002). Substances are either themselves simple or composed of simple substances; simple substances (i.e., monads, according to Leibniz) are called ‘atoms’ by Bolzano. The soul is a simple substance. Bolzano attempts to prove that no simple substance can begin or cease to be (in time). This attempt at a proof on Bolzano’s part, however, is deficient, as he himself observed. From this brief sketch it is already evident that Bolzano’s metaphysical views bore a definite stamp from the tradition, especially from Leibniz. In contrast with Leibniz’s doctrine of the “windowlessness” of the monads and of the pre-established harmony that this requires, however, Bolzano assumes an interaction among the finite atoms or monads. (Cf. Bolzano 1827, 48–50, 67, 92 f., 114 f., 2nd edition: 421, 441; Bolzano 1851, reprint 1975: 112 f., 118, E: Russ 2004, 666 f., 670; Příhonský 1857, 7.)

Every attribute of a real object is itself something real. An adherence is an attribute of something real, i.e., of a substance or of another adherence. The adherences of a human being or of a mind must therefore themselves belong to World 2 or World 1. They are therefore particulars and not universals. This view is supported by Bolzano’s claim that each “private” mental phenomenon, such as a feeling, a desire, a volition or a thought (i.e., a subjective idea or a subjective proposition), is an attribute of the individual mind that “has” it, where ‘has’ expresses the copula (WL II, 69). It is a particular attribute of an individual (or, in today’s terminology, a trope) that cannot be shared by any other individual: if both, \([A_1\) has \(b]\) and \([A_2\) has \(b]\), are true and \(b\) is a subjective idea or any other mental phenomenon, then \(A_1\) must be identical with \(A_2\). Bolzano’s theory of propositions, however, conveys the impression that attributes are universals. For in the standard examples he gives for a true proposition \([A\) has \(b]\), the attribute \(b\) is a universal, such as erudition, that can be shared by different objects (WL I, 130). Obviously, we must admit that some of Bolzano’s attributes are universals and others are particulars. In this case, however, the word ‘has’, which expresses the copula of each proposition according to Bolzano, is used ambiguously by him.

Bolzano connected his metaphysical views with the physical doctrines
of his time (see section 10). Nevertheless his metaphysical doctrines
strike us — at least at first glance — as rather backward.
This reproach seems to be justified with respect to the
*Athanasia*. In his other writings (in particular in his
*Theory of Science*), however, Bolzano developed quite modern
metaphysical ideas that come close to views of today’s analytic
ontology (cf. Berg 1992) and mereology (cf. Krickel 1995). For
example, according to the analysis of propositions that Bolzano
developed in his theory of science, a time qualification is required
in the subject idea of every proposition whose subject (i.e., the
object of its subject idea) is a real thing (WL I, 113, 202, 364 f.,
WL II, 15). This condition is required in order to avoid
“Hegelian” contradictions in cases where the object the
proposition is about (i.e., its subject) undergoes a change. Sometimes
Bolzano restricts this requirement to propositions in which a
non-permanent property is attributed to a changeable substance (WL II,
239), since this is sufficient for avoiding the aforementioned
contradictions. Due to this proposal, the proposition [Cajus at time
\(t_1\) has erudition] and the proposition [Cajus at time \(t_2\) has
lack of erudition] can both be true as long as \(t_1\) and \(t_2\) are
different; for if \(t_1\) is different from \(t_2\), then the ideas
[Cajus at time \(t_1\)] and [Cajus at time \(t_2\)] have different
objects (WL I, 202, 365). These remarks indicate that Bolzano
conceived of changeable substances such as Cajus as four-dimensional
objects, extended in space and time. An idea such as [Cajus at time
\(t_1\)] can pick out a time slice of the four-dimensional Cajus; such
a time slice or momentary object as Cajus at time \(t_1\) is also an
object for Bolzano, but ontologically it is secondary. Considerations
such as these result in Bolzano’s proposal to use this property
for the definition of time: Time is for Bolzano the condition or
qualification that is required in order to make a proposition about a
(changeable) real object true or false (WL I, 365).

## 10. Philosophy of Nature and of Physics

It is but a small step from some of Bolzano’s rather traditional metaphysical views into the realm of the philosophy of nature and of physics. Bolzano introduces a force of attraction among substances (Bolzano 1827, 48) and later also a force of repulsion (Bolzano 1851, reprint 1975: 121, 123 f., E: Russ 2004, 671 f., 673). For the force of attraction Bolzano attempts to prove the Newtonian law that it is inversely proportional to the square of the distance (Bolzano 1827, 50, Bolzano 1851, reprint 1975: 121 f., E: Russ 2004, 671 f.), and further that the force of attraction of two substances is related proportionally to the set (i.e., presumably, to the product of the numbers) of atoms contained in these substances.

Starting from these metaphysical questions concerning the foundations
of physics, Bolzano then occupied himself in several works also with
concrete questions in *natural science* (e.g. in Bolzano 1842,
1843c, and 1851), and in particular with *physical* and
*astronomical* questions. Although he was not able to aim at
new and enduring results in these areas, his writings nonetheless show
that he was also seriously occupied with such questions and could be
“conversant” in the status of these disciplines during his
day. To be mentioned here are especially his work on the composition
of forces (Bolzano 1842) and two essays in the *Annals of Physics
and Chemistry*, in which he was concerned with the writings and
theories of Christian Doppler (Bolzano 1843a and 1847). A summary of
Bolzano’s contributions to the philosophy of nature and to
physics can be found in Berg 2003.

## 11. Philosophy of Mathematics

### 11.1 Early mathematical works

Bolzano began his mathematical investigations with a work in geometry
(Bolzano 1804) and continued with publications in the area of
analysis. He essentially formulated the modern criterion of
convergence in his *Purely Analytic Proof* (Bolzano 1817, 11
f.) already four years prior to Cauchy’s *Course
d’analyse* (1821). This work already contains the so-called
Bolzano-Weierstrass theorem, which again occurs in Bolzano’s
posthumously edited *Theory of Functions* (Bolzano 1930, 28 f.,
BGA IIA, 10/1: 47 f.). Here (Bolzano 1930, 66–70, 98 f., BGA
IIA, 10/1: 79–82, 103) we find also for the first time an
example of a continuous and still non-differentiable function; for a
long time, Weierstrass had been regarded as the first one who
discovered such functions, until historical justice was done by Karel
Rychlík’s investigations.

### 11.2 Preparatory Writings in Set Theory

In his *Paradoxes of the Infinite* (Bolzano 1851) and in the
*Theory of Quantity* Bolzano took the first steps towards the
development of set theory and anticipated many of its important ideas.
In this connection mention is especially often made of Bolzano’s
grasp of the “paradoxical” fact that an infinite set can
and must be equipollent with one of its proper subsets, i.e., is
“reflexive”. This special feature of infinite sets was
later used for their definition by Dedekind. For Bolzano, equipollence
and “having exactly the same kind of construction”
(*die ganz gleiche Entstehungsart haben*) are taken together as
a sufficient condition for infinite sets being equinumerous or having
the same cardinal number. This view, however, contradicts the
unrestricted application of the classical Euclidean principle that the
whole is greater than each of its parts. Bolzano was aware of this
conflict and therefore restricted the principle to finite sets. From
here the step is not far to Dedekind’s view that equipollence is
a sufficient condition for equinumerosity.

Bolzano’s proof for the existence of an infinite set is well
known among mathematicians, and there are references to it even in
Cantor 1883/84, Dedekind 1888, and Russell 1903. Bolzano proves by
mathematical induction that there are infinitely many “truths in
themselves”, i.e., true propositions. For the induction basis,
i.e., that there is at least one true proposition, he uses an indirect
proof (as shown already in section 3.3). Bolzano’s induction
hypothesis is the assumption that there are at least \(n\) true
propositions which we can enumerate as \(S_1, S_2 ,\ldots ,S_n\).
Bolzano proves that there must be at least \(n+1\) true propositions
by *reductio* again: If there were not at least \(n+1\) true
propositions, i.e., if there were at most \(n\) true propositions,
then — according to the induction hypothesis — \(S_1, S_2
,\ldots ,S_n\) would be the only true propositions; but then there
would be another true proposition \(S_{n+1}\), viz. [\(S_1,
S_2,\ldots\) and \(S_n\) are the only true propositions], and \(S_1,
S_2 ,\ldots ,S_n\) would therefore not be the only true propositions
(WL I, 146 f.). Bolzano proposes also a second way for proving this by
constructing a series of true propositions in which we add to any true
proposition \(S_n\) another true proposition [\(S_n\) is true] that is
(due to Bolzano’s criterion for the identity of propositions)
different from \(S_n\). Given any true proposition \(S\) whose
existence is proved by the induction basis, this will result in an
infinite series of true propositions of the following kind: \(S\),
[\(S\) is true], [[\(S\) is true] is true] etc. (WL I, 147, Bolzano
1851, § 13). In constructing this series, Bolzano uses a relation
\(T\) that can be defined as follows:

\(Txy \text{ iff } y = [x \text{ is true}].\)

‘\(Txy\)’ is here an abbreviation for: \(y\) is the proposition that the proposition \(x\) is true. The relation \(T\) has the following properties:

- \(\forall x\exists yTxy\) (i.e., \(T\) is serial)
- \(\forall x\forall y(Txy \rightarrow \forall z(Txz \rightarrow y = z))\) (i.e., \(T\) is a many-one relation)
- \(\forall x\forall y(Tyx \rightarrow \forall z(Tzx \rightarrow y = z))\) (i.e., \(T\) is a one-many relation)
- \(\exists x\forall y\neg Tyx\)

The statement that a relation with the properties (1)–(4) exists
is Alonzo Church’s infinity axiom \(\infty 3\) (in
*Introduction to Mathematical Logic*, Vol. I, 1956, 343).

### 11.3 New Foundations of Mathematics

All these interesting achievements of Bolzano regarding details nonetheless seem insignificant in view of his epochal attempt, which he unfortunately could not complete, to put all of mathematics on new foundations. The fact alone that Bolzano sensed the necessity of such a new grounding of mathematics shows his mathematical instinct, although this program could only much later be realized.

## 12. Metaphilosophy and History of Philosophy

In the well known work *What is Philosophy?* Bolzano elucidated
his concept of philosophy and of philosophizing and put forward his
view of the task of philosophy (Bolzano 1849a). Philosophizing is not
restricted to a certain area of knowledge, according to Bolzano. As
soon as you ask for reasons, you are philosophizing, and this can be
done in any discipline, also outside of the genuine fields of
philosophy. Bolzano does not conclude from this, however, as later
Ludwig Wittgenstein, Moritz Schlick and Rudolf Carnap did, that there
is no proper realm of philosophical problems and philosophical subject
matters. Quite to the contrary, he adhered to the traditional division
of philosophy into subdisciplines according to the different subject
matters that are concerned.

Moreover, Bolzano was also learned in the *history of
philosophy*; he had great historical knowledge which he injected
into his various works. Thus in the second edition of
*Athanasia*, for instance, there is added an extensive appendix
with a “critical survey of the literature concerning immortality
since 1827”, and Bolzano’s essay on the concept of beauty
contains a detailed list of definitions of the concept of the
beautiful, which were proposed by a variety of philosophers (1843b,
45–92); likewise the *Theory of Science* contains in the
notes a wealth of historical material, which makes it a great source
for the historian of logic.

## 13. The So-called Bolzano Circle and Bolzano’s Influence on Intellectual History

### 13.1 The So-called Bolzano Circle

Already at an early time Bolzano came to be surrounded by a circle of friends and pupils who spread his thoughts about and stayed connected with their teacher, in spite of all reprisals. Michael Josef Fesl (1788–1864) and Franz Příhonský (1788–1859) were Bolzano’s closest collaborators in many cases and responsible for the edition of his writings (which Bolzano could not himself publish due to the ban of publication hanging over his head). They wrote in addition various works (introductions to editions of works, reviews and discussions of books, and replies to unfavorable reviews), for which Bolzano himself often provided the outline. Only Robert Zimmermann (1824–1898), whom Bolzano had privately taught philosophy and mathematics, had a career as a professional philosopher. In 1859 he was called, under Minister Thun, to the philosophical chair of the University of Vienna, which he took up in 1861. (Franz Brentano became his colleague there.) Zimmermann was, however, mainly concerned with aesthetics and turned more and more away from Bolzano’s philosophy to Herbart’s.

### 13.2 Bolzano’s Influence on Intellectual History

Bolzano was a forerunner of important theories and ideas in various
areas of knowledge. Many of Bolzano’s ideas had to be discovered
anew since Bolzano’s preparatory work remained unknown in many
cases and has come to light only from historical research.
Superficially speaking, it seems as if Bolzano had hardly any direct
influence at all in the proper sense on the development of the
sciences, although he accomplished significant research. This may of
course in large part be due to the special circumstances under which
Bolzano had to work and publish. His writings thus often appeared
anonymously and were for this reason often generally unknown —
at least not known under his name. Although Bolzano did not directly
influence modern developments — in the area of logic, for
instance —, he obviously did achieve a very tangible
“indirect” and subliminal effect. For Bolzano’s
views were familiar to very many who passed them on, partly with the
mention of his name and partly without any such mention. Thus,
Bolzano’s philosophy has not remained completely ineffectual: We
know that Twardowski was well familiar with Bolzano (Twardowski 1894),
and we know that Łukasiewicz was well acquainted with
Bolzano’s method of idea-variation, as a section in his book on
*Logical Foundations of Probability Theory* (Łukasiewicz
1913, § 24) shows. It is to be suspected that the whole famous
Polish school of logic was thereby indirectly influenced by Bolzano
without knowing exactly the places where this influence was exerted,
and without Bolzano being mentioned in a way which would have been
appropriate. Franz Brentano had studied with particular interest, as
he himself confessed, the *Paradoxes of the Infinite*; he was
not, however, as well familiar with Bolzano’s philosophy as one
often suspected. Nevertheless, it seems improbable that this
familiarity with Bolzano, as little as is was, could have remained
without any effect on his pupils such as Marty, Meinong, and Stumpf,
although some of whom were “outcasts” from the orthodox
Brentanian circle. Bolzano’s influence on Husserl, however, is
well-known, and Husserl himself made no secret of it.

Bolzano had also effect upon some great figures of Bohemian cultural life such as Palacký, Havliček, and Čelakovský; this effect was based mainly on his moral, social and political views — hence, all things considered, on those views for which he could not claim any particular originality. The offshoots of Bolzano’s ethical and political ideas reached and influenced, however, even the Charta 77 movement in the former Czechoslovakia some of whose representatives appealed explicitly to Bolzano.

## Bibliography

The complete edition of Bolzano’s works
(*Bernard-Bolzano-Gesamtausgabe*) was founded by Jan Berg and
Eduard Winter together with the publisher Günther Holzboog, and
it started in 1969. Since then 99 volumes have already appeared, and
about 37 more are forthcoming. The editors were, apart from Jan Berg
and Eduard Winter, Friedrich Kambartel, Jaromir Loužíl,
Edgar Morscher and Bob van Rootselaar. The acting editor is Edgar
Morscher.

In this bibliography the following abbreviations will be used:

[BGA] | Bernard-Bolzano-Gesamtausgabe, with a Roman numeral for
the series and Arabic numerals for the volumes; if a volume consists
of two or more parts, the reference to them will appear after a dash
in Arabic numerals. The BGA is published by Friedrich Frommann
Verlag–Günther Holzboog in Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt. |

[RW] | Bolzano 1834, with Roman numerals for the volumes and Arabic numerals for the pages of the original edition. |

[WL] | Bolzano 1837, with Roman numerals for the volumes and Arabic numerals for the pages of the original edition. |

[BBF] | Beiträge zur Bolzano-Forschung, 28 volumes so far.
The BBF are published by Academia Verlag in Sankt Augustin and edited
by Edgar Morscher and Otto Neumaier; from vol.23 on: edited by
Winfried Löffler and Otto Neumaier. |

[E] | English translation (or edition). |

This bibliography is divided into two parts: Bolzano’s writings and Secondary literature.

### Bolzano’s Writings

(1804) | Betrachtungen über einige Gegenstände der
Elementargeometrie, Prague: Karl Barth; E:
“Considerations on Some Objects of Elementary Geometry”,
in Russ 2004, 25–81. |

(1810) | Beyträge zu einer begründeteren Darstellung der
Mathematik. Erste Lieferung, Prague: Caspar Widtmann; reprint:
Darmstadt: Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft, 1974; E:
“Contributions to a Better-Grounded Presentation of
Mathematics”, in Russ 2004, 83–137. |

(1813) | Erbauungsreden für Akademiker, Prague: Caspar
Widtmann; BGA I, 2; 2nd improved and enlarged edition: Sulzbach: J. E.
v. Seidel, 1839. |

(1817) | Rein analytischer Beweis des Lehrsatzes, dass zwischen je
zwey Werthen, die ein entgegengesetztes Resultat gewähren,
wenigstens eine reelle Wurzel der Gleichung liege, Prague:
Gottlieb Haase; reprints: 1894 and 1905; E: “Purely Analytic
Proof of the Theorem that between any two Values, which give Results
of Opposite Sign, there lies at least one real Root of the
Equation”, in Russ 2004, 251–277. |

(1827) | [anonymous] Athanasia oder Gründe für die
Unsterblichkeit der Seele, Sulzbach: J. E. v. Seidel; 2nd
improved and enlarged edition (no longer anonymous): Sulzbach: J. E.
v. Seidel, 1838; reprint: Frankfurt/M.: Minerva, 1970. |

(1834) | [anonymous] Lehrbuch der Religionswissenschaft, ein
Abdruck der Vorlesungshefte eines ehemaligen Religionslehrers
an einer katholischen Universität, von einigen seiner
Schüler gesammelt und herausgegeben, 3 parts in 4 volumes,
Sulzbach: J. E. v. Seidel; BGA I, 6–8; E of selected parts in
Bolzano 2007b, 171–229. |

(1836) | Lebensbeschreibung des Dr. B. Bolzano, Sulzbach: J. E.
v. Seidel; 2nd edition: Vienna: Wilhelm Braumüller, 1875. |

(1837) | Wissenschaftslehre. Versuch einer ausführlichen und
grösstentheils neuen Darstellung der Logik mit steter
Rücksicht auf deren bisherige Bearbeiter, 4 volumes,
Sulzbach: J. E. v. Seidel; 2nd improved edition: Leipsic: Felix
Meiner, 1929, 1929, 1930, and 1931; reprints: Aalen: Scientia, 1970
and 1981; BGA I, 11–14; E (complete translation): Theory of
Science. Translated by Rolf George and Paul Rusnock, 4 vols.,
Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2014. |

(1838) | [anonymous] Review of Bolzano 1837, Freimüthige
Blätter über Theologie und Kirchenthum, New series 11:
331–401; BGA IIA, 12/1: 101–147. |

(1839) | [anonymous] Dr. Bolzano und seine Gegner. Ein
Beitrag zur neuesten Literaturgeschichte, Sulzbach: J. E. v.
Seidel; reprint: Amsterdam: Rodopi, 1970; BGA I, 16/1:
13–153. |

(1841) | [anonymous] Bolzano’s Wissenschaftslehre und
Religionswissenschaft in einer beurtheilenden Uebersicht,
Sulzbach: J. E. v. Seidel. |

(1842) | Versuch einer objectiven Begründung der Lehre von der
Zusammensetzung der Kräfte, Prague: Kronberger and
Řivnáč; BGA I, 18: 9–60. |

(1843a) | “Ein Paar Bemerkungen über die neue Theorie in Herrn
Professor Chr. Doppler’s Schrift: ‘Ueber das farbige Licht
der Doppelsterne und einiger anderer Gestirne des
Himmels’”, Annalen der Physik und Chemie, 60:
83–88; BGA I, 18: 77–85. |

(1843b) | Abhandlungen zur Ästhetik. Über den Begriff des
Schönen. Eine phi\(loso\)phische Abhandlung,
Prague: Borrosch et André; BGA I, 18: 87–238. |

(1843c) | Versuch einer objectiven Begründung der Lehre von den
drei Dimensionen des Raumes, Prague: Kronberger &
Řiwnač; BGA I, 18: 219–238. |

(1845) | [anonymous] Ueber die Perfectibilität des
Katholicismus. Streitschriften zweier katholischer Theologen; zugleich
ein Beitrag zur Aufhellung einiger wichtigen Begriffe aus
Bolzano’s Religionswissenschaft, Leipsic: Leopold Voss
[Bolzano’s contributions: pp. 50–117 and 247–399];
BGA I, 19/1–2. |

(1847) | “Christ. Doppler’s neueste Leistungen auf dem
Gebiete der physikalischen Apparatenlehre, Akustik, Optik und
optischen Astronomie”, Annalen der Physik und Chemie,
72: 530–555. |

(1849a) | Was ist Philosophie?, Vienna: Wilhelm Braumüller;
reprints: 1960, 1961, 1964, 1965, 1969; BGA IIA, 12/3:
13–33. |

(1849b) | Über die Eintheilung der schönen Künste. Eine
ästhetische Abhandlung, Prague: J. G. Calve; Gottlieb
Haase. |

(1851) | Paradoxien des Unendlichen, ed. by Franz
Přihonský, Leipsic: C. H. Reclam sen.; reprints: 1889,
1920, 1955, 1964 and 1975; E: Paradoxes of the Infinite, ed.
by Donald A. Steele, London: Routledge and Kegan Paul, and New Haven:
Yale University Press, 1950; and in Russ 2004, 591–678. |

(1930) | Functionenlehre, ed. by Karel Rychlík, Prague:
Royal Bohemian Society of Sciences; BGA IIA, 10/1: 23–165; E:
“Theory of Functions with Improvements and Additions to the
Theory of Functions”, in Russ 2004, 429–589. |

(1932) | Von dem besten Staate, ed. by Arnold Kowalewski,
Prague: Royal Bohemian Society of Sciences; BGA IIA, 14: 19–144;
E: “The little book on the best state or Thoughts of a friend of
mankind on the most suitable institutions for civil society”, in
Bolzano 2007b, 235–356. |

(1935) | Der Briefwechsel B. Bolzano’s mit F. Exner, ed.
by Eduard Winter, Prague: Royal Bohemian Society of Sciences; BGA III,
4/1; E: “Selections from the Bolzano–Exner
Correspondence”, in Bolzano 2004, 83–174. |

(1944) | Der Bolzanoprozess. Dokumente zur Geschichte der Prager
Karlsuniversität im Vormärz, ed. by Eduard Winter,
Brno-Munich-Vienna: Rudolf M. Rohrer. |

(1965) | Wissenschaft und Religion im Vormärz. Der Briefwechsel
Bernard Bolzanos mit Michael Josef Fesl 1822–1848, ed. by
Eduard Winter and Wilhelm Zeil, Berlin: Akademie-Verlag; BGA III, 2/1
(three more volumes will follow). |

(1975) | Einleitung zur Grössenlehre. Erste Begriffe der
allgemeinen Grössenlehre, ed. by Jan Berg, Stuttgart-Bad
Cannstatt: Frommann-Holzboog [BGA IIA, 7]; E of pp. 23–78:
“On the Mathematical Method”, in Bolzano 2004,
40–82. |

(1977) | Miscellanea Mathematica 1803–1844, Issues
1–24, ed. by Bob von Rootselaar and Anna van der Lugt,
Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Frommann-Holzboog, 1977 ff., not yet
completed [BGA IIB, 2–13, IIB 12/2, 13/1 and 13/2 not yet
published]. |

(1979) | Philosophische Tagebücher, ed. by Jan Berg,
Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Frommann-Holzboog, 1979 ff., not yet
completed [BGA IIB, 14–18]. |

(2004a) | The Mathematical Works of Bernard Bolzano, translated
and ed. by Steve Russ, Oxford: Oxford University Press. |

(2004b) | On the Mathematical Method and Correspondence with
Exner, ed. by Paul Rusnock and Rolf George, Amsterdam-New
York/NY: Rodopi. |

(2005) | Briefe an František Příhonský
1824–1848, ed. by Jan Berg, Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt:
Frommann-Holzboog [BGA III, 3/1–3]. |

(2007a) | Erbauungsreden der Studienjahre 1804/05 bis 1819/20,
ed. by Edgar Morscher and Kurt F. Strasser, Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt:
Frommann-Holzboog, 2007–2017 [BGA IIA, 15–25]. |

(2007b) | Selected Writings on Ethics and Politics, translated by
Paul Rusnock and Rolf George, Amsterdam-New York/NY: Rodopi. |

(2016) | Beiträge zu Bolzanos Biographie von Josef Hoffmann und
Anton Wisshaupt sowie vier weiteren Zeitzeugen, ed. by Edgar
Morscher and Anneliese Müller, Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt:
Frommann-Holzboog [BGA IV, 1/3]. |

(2017) | Briefwechsel mit Franz Exner 1833–1844, ed. by
Edgar Morscher, Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Frommann-Holzboog [BGA III,
4/1]. |

### Secondary Literature

- Benthem, Johan van, 1984,
*Lessons from Bolzano*, Stanford: Center for the Study of Language and Information [Series:*Report*, no. CSLI–84–6]. - Berg, Jan, 1962,
*Bolzano’s Logic*, Stockholm-Göteborg-Uppsala: Almqvist & Wiksell. - –––, 1987, Einleitung des Herausgebers. BGA I, 12/1, 9–62.
- –––, 1992,
*Ontology without Ultrafilters and Possible Worlds. An Examination of Bolzano’s Ontology*, Sankt Augustin: Academia [BBF 1]. - –––, 2003, “Bolzanos Naturphilosophie und ihre Beziehung zur Physik”, in Morscher 2003, 137–149.
- Berg, Jan & Ganthaler, Heinrich & Morscher, Edgar, 1987, “Bolzanos Biographie in tabellarischer Übersicht”, in Morscher 1987, 353–372.
- Berg, Jan & Morscher, Edgar, (eds.), 2002,
*Bernard Bolzanos Bibliothek*, 2 volumes, Sankt Augustin: Academia [BBF 14 and 15]. - Bergmann, Shmuel Hugo, 1909,
*Das philosophische Werk Bernard Bolzanos mit Benutzung ungedruckter Quellen kritisch untersucht*, Halle/S.: Max Niemeyer; reprint: Hildesheim-New York: Georg Olms, 1970. - Bolzano-Symposium, 1974,
*Bolzano-Symposium “Bolzano als Logiker”*, Vienna: Österreichische Akademie der Wissenschaften. - Buhl, Günter, 1958,
*Ableitbarkeit und Abfolge in der Wissenschaftstheorie Bolzanos*, Cologne: Kölner Universitätsverlag [PhD Thesis, Mainz 1958]. - Cantor, Georg, 1883/84, “Ueber unendliche, lineare
Punktmannichfaltigkeiten”, no. 5 and 6,
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## Other Internet Resources

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- Bernard Bolzano Page, Mac Tutor History of Mathematics archive, University of St. Andrews.

### Acknowledgments

I am indebted to Maria Reicher, Robin Rollinger, Steve Russ, Peter Simons, and to Anneliese Mueller for their help in preparing this article, and in particular to the subject and administrative editors of Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy for their valuable corrections and improvements.