Martin Buber

First published Tue Apr 20, 2004; substantive revision Tue Jul 28, 2020

Martin Buber (1878–1965) was a prolific author, scholar, literary translator, and political activist whose writings—mostly in German and Hebrew—ranged from Jewish mysticism to social philosophy, biblical studies, religious phenomenology, philosophical anthropology, education, politics, and art. Most famous among his philosophical writings is the short but powerful book I and Thou (1923) where our relation to others is considered as twofold. The I-it relation prevails between subjects and objects of thought and action; the I-Thou relation, on the other hand, obtains in encounters between subjects that exceed the range of the Cartesian subject-object relation. Though originally planned as a prolegomenon to a phenomenology of religion, I and Thou proved influential in other areas as well, including the philosophy of education. The work of Martin Buber remains a linchpin of qualitative philosophical anthropology and continues to be cited in fields such as philosophical psychology, medical anthropology, and pedagogical theory. Buber’s writings on Jewish national renaissance, Hasidism, and political philosophy made him a major twentieth-century figure in Jewish thought and the philosophy of religion. Buber’s extensive writing on the political dimensions of biblical historiography and prophetic literature not only made contributions to the history of religion but also to contemporary discussions on political theology with an anarchistic bent. His translation, with Franz Rosenzweig, of the Hebrew Bible into German remains a classic in the German language.

1. Biographical Background

The setting of Buber’s early childhood was late-nineteenth-century Vienna, then still the cosmopolitan capital of the Austro-Hungarian Empire, a multiethnic conglomerate whose eventual demise (in the First World War) effectively ended the millennial rule of Catholic princes in Europe. Fin-de-siècle Vienna was the home of light opera and heavy neo-romantic music, French-style boulevard comedy and social realism, sexual repression and deviance, political intrigue and vibrant journalism, a cultural cauldron aptly captured in Robert Musil’s The Man Without Qualities (Der Mann ohne Eigenschaften, 1930–1932).

Buber’s parents, Carl Buber and Elise née Wurgast, separated when Martin was four years old. For the next ten years, he lived with his paternal grandparents, Solomon and Adele Buber, in Lemberg (now: Lviv/Ukraine) who were part of what one might call the landed Jewish aristocracy. Solomon, a “master of the old Haskala” (“[ein] … Meister der alten Haskala”; Buber 1906b, Dedication) who called himself “a Pole of the Mosaic persuasion” (Friedman [1981] p. 11), produced the first modern editions of rabbinic midrash literature yet was also greatly respected in the traditional Jewish community. His reputation opened the doors for Martin when he began to show interest in Zionism and Hasidic literature. The wealth of his grandparents was built on the Galician estate managed by Adele and enhanced by Solomon through mining, banking, and commerce. It provided Martin with financial security until the German occupation of Poland in 1939, when their estate was expropriated. Home-schooled and pampered by his grandmother, Buber was a bookish aesthete with few friends his age, whose major diversion was the play of the imagination. He easily absorbed local languages (Hebrew, Yiddish, Polish, German) and acquired others (Greek, Latin, French, Italian, English). German was the dominant language at home, while the language of instruction at the Franz Joseph Gymnasium was Polish. This multilingualism nourished Buber’s life-long interest in language.

Among the young Buber’s first publications are essays on, and translations into Polish of, the poetry of Arthur Schnitzler and Hugo von Hofmannsthal. Buber’s literary voice may be best understood as probingly personal while seeking communication with others, forging a path between East and West, Judaism and Humanism, national particularity and universal spirit. His deliberate and perhaps somewhat precious diction was nourished by the contrasts between the German classics he read at home and the fervently religious to mildly secular Galician Jewish jargon he encountered on the outside. Reentering the urban society of Vienna, Buber encountered a world brimming with Austrian imperial tradition as well as Germanic pragmatism, where radical new approaches to psychology and philosophy were being developed. This was a place where solutions to the burning social and political issues of city, nation, and empire were often expressed in grandly theatrical oratory (Karl Lueger) and in the aestheticizing rhetoric of self-inscenation (Theodor Herzl). As a student of art history, German literature, and psychology in Vienna, Leipzig, Zürich, and Berlin, Buber made himself at home in a bohemian world of letters.

From 1900 to 1916, Buber and his life-partner, the author Paula Winkler (1877–1958; pen-name: Georg Munk), moved to Berlin where they befriended the anarchist Gustav Landauer (1870–1919) and attended the salon of the Hart brothers, an epicenter of Jugendstil aesthetics. Early on in this period Buber was active in the Zionist movement of Theodor Herzl, who recruited him as the editor of his journal Die Welt. In 1904, the year Herzl died, Buber finished his dissertation on the problem of individuation in Nicholas of Cusa and Jakob Boehme and he took a position as literary editor for Ruetten & Loening, a publishing house whose mid-nineteenth century Jewish founders (Rindskopf and Löwental) had made a fortune with the perennially best-selling Struwwelpeter, a politically incorrect book of drawings about ill-behaved children (Wurm, 1994). At the beginning of the century, the publisher was looking to move beyond the gilded editions of Goethe and Schiller that they were publishing at the time. Buber became their agent of modernization. One of the first books Buber placed here was his retelling of the stories of Rabbi Nachman, one of the great figures of Eastern European Hasidism. The flagship publication edited by Buber was an ambitious forty-volume series of social studies, titled Die Gesellschaft, that appeared between 1906 and 1912. As editor, Buber recruited and corresponded with many of the leading minds of his time.

In 1916, Martin and Paula moved to Heppenheim/Bergstrasse, half-way between Frankfurt/Main and Heidelberg. At that time, his friend Gustav Landauer severely criticized Buber’s enthusiasm for the salutary effect that, as Buber saw it, the war was having on a hitherto fragmented society (Gesellschaft), transforming it into a national community (Gemeinschaft). Buber later claimed that it was at this time that he began to draft the book that was to become I and Thou. In Frankfurt, Buber met Franz Rosenzweig (1886–1929) with whom he was to develop a close intellectual companionship. In the early nineteen twenties, Rosenzweig recruited Buber as a lecturer for his unaffiliated (“free”) Jewish adult education center (Freies jüdisches Lehrhaus) and he managed Buber’s appointment as university lecturer in Jewish religious studies and ethics, a position endowed by a Jewish community that initially opposed Buber as too radical. Rosenzweig also became Buber’s chief collaborator in the project, initiated by the young Christian publisher Lambert Schneider, to produce a new translation of the Bible into German, a project he continued after Rosenzweig’s death. Dismissed by the Nazis from the university in 1933, Buber served as the architect of German Jewish teacher re-education through the so-called Mittelstelle für jüdische Erwachsenenbildung (Simon, 1959). In 1937 Buber received a long-coveted call to teach at the Hebrew University in Jerusalem (officially founded in 1925), an institution whose creation he had promoted since 1902 and that he represented as a member of its board of overseers. In Jerusalem, Buber returned to the field of social philosophy, an academic appointment the university administration wrested from a faculty that deemed the “Schriftsteller Dr. Martin Buber” neither a genuine scholar of religion nor sufficiently educated as a specialist in Jewish studies. World-famous in his later years, Buber traveled and lectured extensively in Europe and the United States.

Buber’s wide range of interests, his literary abilities, and the general appeal of his philosophical orientation are reflected in the far-flung correspondence he conducted over the course of his long life. As the editor of Die Gesellschaft, Buber corresponded with Georg Simmel, Franz Oppenheimer, Ellen Key, Lou Andreas-Salomé, Werner Sombart, and many other academics and intellectuals. Among the poets of his time with whom he exchanged letters were Hugo von Hofmannsthal, Hermann Hesse, and Stefan Zweig. He was particularly close to the socialist and Zionist novelist Arnold Zweig. With poet Chaim Nachman Bialik and the later Nobel laureate Sh. Y. Agnon Buber shared a deep interest in the revival of Hebrew literature. He published the works of the Jewish Nietzschean story-teller Micha Josef Berdiczewsky. He was a major inspiration to the young Zionist cadre of Prague Jews (Hugo Bergmann, Max Brod, Robert Weltsch), and the Jewish adult education system he organized under the Nazis inadvertently provided a last bastion for the free exchange of ideas for non-Jews as well. Buber’s name is intimately linked with that of Franz Rosenzweig and his circle (Eugen Rosenstock-Huessy, Hans Ehrenberg, Rudolf Ehrenberg, Viktor von Weizsäcker, Ernst Michel, etc.), an association that manifested itself, among others, in the journal Die Kreatur (1926–29). The journal Der Jude, founded and edited by Buber from 1916 until 1924, and several editions of his speeches on Judaism made Buber a central figure of the Jewish cultural renaissance of the early twentieth century. Buber’s work awakened many young intellectuals from highly assimilated families, such as Ernst Simon, to the possibility of embracing Judaism as a living faith. Others, among them Franz Rosenzweig, Gershom Scholem, and Leo Strauss, developed their scholarly and philosophical agendas in critical appreciation of Buber without giving in to the seductions of “Buberism.” Buber counted among his friends and admirers Christian theologians such as Karl Heim, Friedrich Gogarten, Albert Schweitzer, and Leonard Ragaz. His philosophy of dialogue entered into the discourse of psychoanalysis through the work of Hans Trüb, and is today among the most popular approaches to educational theory in German-language studies of pedagogy.

2. Philosophical Influences

Among Buber’s early philosophical influences were Kant’s Prolegomena, which he read at the age of fourteen, and Nietzsche’s Zarathustra. Haunted by the seeming infinity of space and time, Buber found solace in Kant’s understanding that space and time are mere forms of perception that structure the manifold of sensory impressions. At the same time, Kant allows to think of being as transcending the pure forms of human intellection. Buber’s mildly religious reading of Kant, which seems both conventional and autodidactic, seems to have been untrammeled by the debates between the various schools of neo-Kantianism that developed since the 1860’s and came to dominate much of the academic teaching of philosophy across Germany until the First World War. From Nietzsche and Schopenhauer Buber learned the importance of the will, the power to project oneself heroically into a fluid and malleable world, and to do so according to one’s own measure and standard. Though Buber’s philosophy of dialogue is a decisive step away from Nietzschean vitalism, the focus on lived experience and embodied human wholeness, as well as the prophetic tone and aphoristic style Buber honed from early on, persisted in his subsequent writings. Between 1896 and 1899 he studied the history of art, German literature, philosophy, and psychology in Vienna, Leipzig (1897/98), Berlin (1898/99), and Zurich (1899). In Vienna he absorbed the oracular poetry of Stefan George, which influenced him greatly, although he never became a disciple of George. In Leipzig and Berlin he developed an interest in the ethnic psychology (Völkerpsychologie) of Wilhelm Wundt, the social philosophy of Georg Simmel, the psychology of Carl Stumpf, and the lebensphilosophische approach to the humanities of Wilhelm Dilthey. In Leipzig he attended meetings of the Society for Ethical Culture (Gesellschaft für ethische Kultur), then dominated by the thought of Lasalle and Tönnies.

From his early reading of philosophical literature Buber retained some of the most basic convictions found in his later writings. In Kant he found two answers to his concern with the nature of time. If time and space are pure forms of perception, then they pertain to things only as they appear to us (as phenomena) and not to things-in-themselves (noumena). If our experience of others, especially of persons, is of objects of our experience, then we necessarily reduce them to the scope of our phenomenal knowledge, in other words, to what Buber later called the I-It relation. Yet Kant also indicated ways of meaningfully speaking of the noumenal, even though not in terms of theoretical reason. Practical reason – as expressed in "maxims of action," categorical imperatives, or principles of duty we choose for their own sake and regardless of outcome – obliges us to consider persons as ends in themselves rather than means to an end. This suggests something like an absolute obligation. Teleological (aesthetic) judgment, as developed in Kant’s Third Critique, suggests the possibility of a rational grounding of representation. Taken together, Kant’s conceptions of ethics and aesthetics resonated with Buber’s notion that the phenomenon is always the gateway to the noumenon, just as the noumenal cannot be encountered other than in, and by way of, concrete phenomena. Thus Buber managed to meld Kantian metaphysical and ethical conceptions into a more immediate relation with things as they appear to us and as we represent them to ourselves. Buber succeeded in translating this theoretical dialectic of immediacy and distance, phenomenal encounter and reflexivity, into a style he cultivated in his writing but also in his manner of personal interactions. Buber sought not only to describe but to live the tension between a Dionysian primacy of life in its particularity, immediacy, and individuality and the Apollonian world of form, measure, and abstraction as inter-dependent forces. Both are constitutive of human experience in that they color our interactions with the other in nature, with other human beings, and with the divine Thou. Buber thus developed his own distinctive voice in the emerging chorus of writers, thinkers, and artists of his time who rallied against the widely-perceived "alienation" associated with modern life.

3. The early Buber: Gestalt as a means of realization

Buber’s early writings include anthologies, such as The Tales of Rabbi Nachman (1906), The Legend of the Baal Shem Tov (1908), and mystical writings from world religions (Ecstatic Confessions, 1909), lectures on Judaism (On Judaism, 1967b), and an expressionist dialogue on “realization” (Daniel, 1913). His essays on the arts include reflections on the Isenheim Altarpiece, the dance of Nijinsky (Pointing the Way, 1957), Jewish art, and the painter Lesser Ury (The First Buber, 1999a). Common to these early productions is the preoccupation with shape (Gestalt), movement, color, language, and gesture as the means of a “realized” or “perfected” particular human existence that represents life beyond the limits of spatio-temporal duration imposed on us in the manner of a Cartesian grid.

The German words Form (form) and Gestalt (here translated as “shape”) are not identical, although, in English, it is easy to confuse one with the other. Buber uses Gestalt as a term of central, constitutive, and animating power, contrasting it with the Platonic term Form, which he associates with a lack of genuine vitality. Commenting upon a work by Michelangelo, Buber speaks of Gestalt as hidden in the raw material, waiting to emerge as the artist wrestles with the dead block. The artistic struggle instantiates and represents the more fundamental opposition between formative (gestaltende) and shapeless (gestaltlose) principles. The tension between these, for Buber, lay at the source of all spiritual renewal, raging within every human individual as the creative, spiritual act that subjugates unformed, physical stuff (1963b: 239). It is the free play of Gestalt that quickens the dead rigidity of form.

The wrestling with form and its overcoming and its reanimation with living energy in Buber’s early work was rooted in a concern with the embodiment of perception and imagination. Whether writing about Hasidic masters, Nijinsky, religiosity, Judaism, mysticism, myth, “the Orient,” or the Isenheim Altar, Buber always returned to the same fundamental dynamics. Everything starts from the most basic facts of human existence: the body and motion. As understood by the early Buber (following a Kantian intuition), the world is one in which the objective spatial order was dissolved, where up and down, left and right, bear no intrinsic meaning. More fundamentally, orientation is always related to the body, which is, however, an objective datum. Ethical life remains inextricably linked, within the world of space, to the human body and to physical sensation as they reach across the divide toward an unmitigated Erlebnis. The “unity,” so important to Buber’s early conception of the self, was not an original one. It was instead the effect of those gestural acts that “dance it out” (Pointing the Way, 1957).

Buber conceived of political community as a type of plastic shape, an object (or subject) of Gestaltung and hence realization. Just as he had enlivened Kant’s distinction between phenomenon and noumenon with his literary imagination, so too he transformed the value-theoretical distinction between Gesellschaft (society) and Gemeinschaft (community), types of social aggregation theorized by Ferdinand Tönnies, into a wellspring for his political speeches and writings. The first arena for his social, psychological, and educational engagement was the Zionist movement. Buber’s social philosophy was stimulated and decisively influenced by his close friend, the anarchist Gustav Landauer, whom he recruited to write the volume on revolution for his series Die Gesellschaft. As a pioneer of social thought and a student of Georg Simmel, Buber participated in the 1909 founding conference of the German sociological association. Buber’s social-psychological approach to the study and description of social phenomena and his interest in the constitutive correlation between the individual and his and her social experience remained important aspects of his philosophy of dialogue. It came to the fore again in his last academic position at Hebrew University in Jerusalem, where he taught social philosophy (prominent students: Amitai Etzioni, Shmuel Eisenstadt).

Buber’s thought matured under the impact of Landauer’s harsh critique, which persuaded Buber that he had unduly romanticized the war. Buber’s 1916 lead essay for the new journal Der Jude still praised the war as an opportunity for the modern Jew to forge, out of the chaos of rupture, a feeling for community, connection, a new unity, a unified Gestalt, one that could restore the Jewish people to a condition of wholeness. For Buber’s friend Landauer, such thoughts were “very painful…very repugnant, and borderline incomprehensible. Object though you will, I call this way of thinking aestheticism and formalism and I say that you have no right…to try and tuck these tangled events into your philosophical scheme (schönen und weisen Allgemeinheiten): what results is inadequate and outrageous” (Letters of Martin Buber, p. 189; transl. modified). Landauer continued to argue, “Historical matters can only be talked about historically, not in terms of formal patterns (formalem Schematismus) … I gladly grant that behind this is the desire to see greatness; but desire alone is not sufficient to make greatness out of a confused vulgarity” (ibid., 190–1). Landauer’s challenge to the grotesque fusion of Erlebnis, Gemeinschaft, and Gestalt out of world war and mass slaughter precipitated the end of aesthetic religiosity in Buber’s work.

4. Philosophy of Dialogue: I and Thou

Buber’s best-known work is the short philosophical essay I and Thou (1923), the basic tenets of which he was to modify, but never to abandon. In this work, Buber gives expression to the intuition that we need to withstand the temptation to reduce human relations to the simple either/or of Apollonian or Dionysian, rational or romantic ways of relating to others. We are beings that can enter into dialogic relations not just with human others but with other animate beings, such as animals, or a tree, as well as with the Divine Thou. The duality of relations and, at its extreme, their coincidence, may serve as the key to Buber’s mature thought on everything from his approach to biblical faith to his practical politics in matters of Jewish-Arab relations in Palestine. I and Thou was first translated into English in 1937 by Ronald Gregor Smith and later again by Walter Kaufmann. The German original was an instant classic and remains in print today. In the 1950s and 60s, when Buber first traveled and lectured in the USA, the essay became popular in the English-speaking world as well.

Whereas before World War I Buber had promoted an aesthetic of unity and unification, his later writings embrace a rougher and more elemental dualism. Buber always opposed philosophical monism, which he identified with Bergson, and objected to “doctrines of immersion,” which he identified with Buddhism. Complicating the undifferentiated shape of mystical experience (as sought by the medievals, including Eckhart, as an annihilation of self), the profoundly dualistic world-view proffered in I and Thou references Cusa’s coincidentia oppositorum as an expression of human limits. Buber’s text reduces the relation between persons, animate objects, and deity to three expressive signifiers: “I”, “You”, and “It”. They are the elemental variables whose combination and re-combination structure all experience as relational. The individuated elements realize themselves in relations, forming patters that burst into life, grow, vanish, and revive. Human inter-subjectivity affirms the polymorphous I-Thou encounter. Resting upon the claim that no isolated I exists apart from relationship to an other, dialogue or “encounter” transforms each figure into an ultimate and mysterious center of value whose presence eludes the concepts of instrumental language. The heteronomous revelation of a singular presence calls the subject into an open-ended relationship, a living pattern, that defies sense, logic, and proportion; whereas the I-It relationship, in its most degenerate stage, assumes the fixed form of objects that one can measure and manipulate. At the core of this model of existence is the notion of encounter as “revelation.” As understood by Buber, revelation is the revelation of “presence” (Gegenwart). In contrast to “object” (Gegenstand), the presence revealed by revelation as encounter occupies the space “in between” the subject and an other (a tree, a person, a work of art, God). This “in between” space is defined as “mutual” (gegenseitig). Contrasting with the Kantian concept of experience (Erfahrung), Erlebnis (encounter), or revelation of sheer presence, is an ineffable, pure form that carries not an iota of determinate or object-like conceptual or linguistic content. Buber always insisted that the dialogic principle, i.e., the duality of primal words (Urworte) that he called the I-Thou and the I-It, was not an abstract conception but an ontological reality that he pointed to but that could not be properly represented in discursive prose.

The confusion (and/or con-fusion) between philosophy and religion is especially marked in I and Thou. While Buber seems to lack a fully worked-out epistemology and occasionally revels in paradoxes that border on mystical theology, it has been argued that Buber did indeed solve the inherent “difficulty of dialogics that it reflects on, and speaks of, a human reality about which, in his own words, one cannot think and speak in an appropriate manner” (Bloch [1983] p. 62). Debates about the strength and weakness of I and Thou as the foundation of a system hinge, in part, on the assumption that the five-volume project, to which this book was to serve as a prolegomenon (a project Buber abandoned), was indeed a philosophical one. Buber’s lectures at the Freies jüdisches Lehrhaus and his courses at University of Frankfurt, as well as letters to Rosenzweig show that, at the time of its writing, he was preoccupied with a new approach to the phenomenology of religion (cf. Schottroff, Zank). In Buber’s cyclical conception of the history of religions, the revelation of presence mixes into and animates the living and lived forms of historical religion (institutions, texts, rituals, images, and ideas), becoming over time ossified and rigid and object-like, but structurally open to the force of renewal based on new forms of encounter as revelation. The history of religion as described by Buber in the closing words of I and Thou is a contracting, intensifying spiral figure that has redemption as its telos. It would be artificial, however, to separate Buber’s interest in religious phenomena from his interest in a general philosophical anthropology. Rather, Buber seems to have tried to find one in the other, or—put differently—to make religious belief and practice perspicacious in light of a general philosophical anthropology.

5. Zionism

At the very beginning of his literary career, Buber was recruited by the Budapest-born and Vienna-based journalist Theodor Herzl to edit the main paper of the Zionist party, Die Welt. He soon found a more congenial home in the “democratic faction” of “cultural Zionists” led by Chaim Weizmann, then living in Zurich. Buber’s phases of engagement in the movement’s political institutions alternated with extended phases of disengagement, but he never ceased to write and speak about what he understood to be the distinctive Jewish brand of nationalism. Buber seems to have derived an important lesson from the early struggles between political and cultural Zionism for the leadership and direction of the movement. He realized that his place was not in high diplomacy and political education but in the search for psychologically sound foundations on which to heal the rift between modern realpolitik and a distinctively Jewish theological-political tradition. Very much in keeping with the nineteenth-century Protestant yearning for a Christian foundation of the nation-state, Buber sought a healing source in the integrating powers of religious experience. After a hiatus of more than ten years during which Buber spoke to Jewish youth groups (most famously the Prague Bar Kokhba) but refrained from any practical involvement in Zionist politics, he reentered Zionist debates in 1916 when he began publishing the journal Der Jude, which served as an open forum of exchange on any issues related to cultural and political Zionism. In 1921 Buber attended the Zionist Congress in Carlsbad as a delegate of the socialist Hashomer Hatzair (“the young guard”). In the debates that followed the first anti-Zionist riots in Palestine, Buber joined the Brit Shalom, which argued for peaceful means of resistance. During the Arab revolt of 1936–39, when the British government imposed quotas on immigration to Palestine, Buber argued for demographic parity rather than trying to achieve a Jewish majority. Finally, in the wake of the Biltmore Conference, Buber (as a member of Ihud) argued for a bi-national rather than a Jewish state in Palestine. At any of these stages Buber harbored no illusion about the chances of his political views to sway the majority but he believed that it was important to articulate the moral truth as one saw it. Needless to say, this politics of authenticity made him few friends among the members of the Zionist establishment.

At the theoretical core of the Zionism advanced by Buber was a conception of Jewish identity that was neither entirely determined by religion nor by nationality, but constituted a unique hybrid. From early on, Buber rejected any state-form for the Jewish people in Palestine. This was clear already in a widely-noted 1916 exchange of letters with the liberal philosopher Hermann Cohen. Cohen rejected Zionism as incommensurate with the Jewish mission of living as a religious minority with the task of maintaining the idea of messianism that he saw as a motor of social and political reform within society at large. In contrast, Buber embraced Zionism as the self-expression of a particular Jewish collective that could be realized only in its own land, on its soil, and in its language. The modern state, its means and symbols, however, were not genuinely connected to this vision of a Jewish renaissance. While in the writings of the early war years, Buber had characterized the Jews as an oriental type in perpetual motion, in his later writings the Jews represent no type at all. Neither nation nor creed, they uncannily combine what he called national and spiritual elements. In his letter to Gandhi, Buber insisted on the spatial orientation of Jewish existence and defended the Zionist cause against the critic who saw in it only a form of colonialism. For Buber, space was a necessary but insufficient material condition for the creation of culture based on dialogue. A Gesamtkunstwerk in its own right, the Zionist project was to epitomize the life of dialogue by drawing the two resident nations of Palestine into a perfectible common space free from mutual domination.

6. Political Theology

Buber honed his political theology in response to the conflict between fascism and communism, the two main ideologies dominating mid-twentieth century Europe. His national-utopian thought shared traits with both of these extreme positions and made him, in fact, one of the few Jewish personages “acceptable” as a partner for debate with moderate National Socialists in the early 1930s, a proximity he himself vigorously dismissed as a misperception. His political position remained indissolubly linked to his philosophical-theological commitment to the life of dialogue developed in I and Thou. According to Buber, politics was the work by which a society shapes itself. He rejected any hardened ideological formations of “the collective” and thus objected to the solutions articulated on either political extreme. He understood these to recognize neither an I nor a Thou in social life. Buber particularly opposed the notion that the political sphere rested on the friend/enemy distinction, as theorized by the ultra-conservative jurist Carl Schmitt. Buber’s political ideal, “a-cephalic” and utopian as it was, was derived from his reconstruction of the ancient Israelite polity as reflected in the Book of Judges. Conversely, it has been argued, his reading of Judges was inspired by the anarchism of Landauer. (See Brody (2018))

As presented by Buber in the 1930s, the primary governing trope of Jewish political theology—divine kingship (Königtum Gottes)—represents an answer to Schmitt, whose political theology allowed divine power to be absorbed by the human sovereign. Buber resisted this slippage, privileging instead the anti-monarchical strata of the Hebrew Bible. In his 1932 book on the Kingship of God, the biblical hero Gideon from chapter eight of the Book of Judges stands out as the leader who, beating back the Philistine enemy, declines any claim to hereditary kingship. What Buber reads as a genuine, unconditional “no” to political sovereignty rests on an unconditional “yes” affirming the absolute kingship of God. Against the theory staked out by Schmitt, the assertion that God alone is sovereign means that God’s authority is non-transferable to any human head or political institution. Thus Buber preserves the notion of divine sovereignty over all forms of state apparatus and tyranny. Buber privileged simple, preliminary, primitive, and immediate forms of government, insisting that genuine “theocracy” is not a form of government at all, but rather a striving against the political tide. No “theological work of art,” the messianic ideal of divine kingship found in the Hebrew Bible is presented as a reliable image preserved by the collective memory of tradition. Buber maintained that once upon a time the Israelite deity YHWH was, in fact, the heretog or warrior-king of the people. But he also knew that he was unable to posit this for certain, and so proceeded to admit that the image reflects not a historical actuality that we can know but only a historical possibility.

In Paths in Utopia (1947), Buber was to plot the “image of perfect space” as one composed of lines that allow no fixed definition, the zone between the individual and collective constantly recalibrated according to the free creativity of its members. “The relationship between centralism and decentralization is a problem which…cannot be approached in principle, but…only with great spiritual tact, with the constant and tireless weighing and measuring of the right proportion between them.” A “social pattern,” utopia was based on a constant “drawing and re-drawing of lines of demarcation” (Paths in Utopia, 1996, p. 137). An “experiment that did not fail,” the Jewish village communes in Palestine (i.e. the kvutza, kibbutz, and moshav) owed their success to the pragmatism with which their members approached the historical situation, to their inclination towards increased levels of federation, and to the degree to which they established a relationship to the society at large. Single units combine into a system or “series of units” without the centralization of state authority (ibid., 142–8). “Nowhere…in the history of the Socialist movement were men so deeply involved in the process of differentiation and yet so intent on preserving the principle of integration” (ibid., 145). They discovered “[t]he right proportion, tested anew every day according to changing conditions, between group-freedom and collective order” (ibid., 148). It is not difficult to recognize in this description of the modern Jewish agricultural collective an updated version of the biblical tribal past that Buber idealized in his work on the primitive Israelite polity of the age of the biblical judges.

7. Distance and Relation: Late Philosophical Anthropology

Responding to the unfolding political chaos in Europe and to the struggle between Jews and Arabs in Palestine, Buber’s philosophical oeuvre assumed a more occasionalist and essayistic form in the late 1930s and 1940s. In addition to the works cited above and works on religion, the Bible, and prophetic faith, his last major philosophical publication was The Eclipse of God (1951). What unites all of the late works as a group is the common emphasis on philosophical anthropology, the place of the individual person in the world vis-à-vis other human beings in human community. Whether reflecting on “man,” “the Jew,” or “the single one,” always critical to Buber’s late thought is the tension between distance and relation, and the role of mediated images in dialogical, open-ended, non-fixed relation to the social and natural world. In this, Buber addressed, but never directly, the tension between “fact” and “value,” explored with more rigor in later nineteenth- and early twentieth-century German philosophy and in post-war Anglo-American analytic philosophy.

One of the signature pieces from this period is the essay on Kierkegaard, “The Question to the Single One” (1936). Buber turns to Kierkegaard in order to force the question of solipsism. For Buber, the Danish philosopher stands for a modern alienation from the world. The question Buber asks is whether it is even possible to conceive of the human being as a “single one.” According to Buber, Kierkegaard’s love of God excludes the love of his neighbor, the fellow creature with whom we constitute “the world” in human terms. With his eye on the creation of Genesis, Buber describes man as a subject hovering over and embracing the creaturely world. In this model, there is no renunciation of objects and political life. At the same time, relation does not mean the giving oneself over to the crowd. The embrace of creaturely existence remains vexing. Buber characterizes the human being in terms of “potentiality” within factual and finite limits, not in terms of the “radicality” he sees in Kierkegaard. That is to say, instead of positing a radical dichotomy between community and the single one, Buber argues that they are compatible with, and necessary for, one another.

This critique of the single one in relation to a larger social world belongs to the world-picture established by Buber in the essay “What is Man?” (1938). At stake for Buber was a knowledge of the human person as a whole, i.e., a complete understanding of human subjectivity. The methodological key to the essay is a philosophical anthropology. Buber assumed that only by entering into the act of self-reflection can the philosophical anthropologist become aware of human wholeness based on a structural distinction between epochs of human habitation and epochs of human homelessness. In the former, philosophical anthropology is cosmological, i.e. fundamentally related to the world and to human environments. In the latter, human subjectivity is conceived of as self-standing and independent. The conceptual tension is between being at home in a universe of things in contrast to what is presented as the collapse of a rounded and unified world vis-à-vis self-divided forms of consciousness. In order to preserve the imbrication of singular selfhood and the bonding of human personhood, Buber rejected the false choice between individualism and collectivism. As Buber always understood it, human wholeness lies in the meeting of the one with the other in a living fourfold relation to things, individual persons, the mystery of Being, and self. Every living relation is essential and contributes to human wholeness because human wholeness (“man’s unique essence”) is known or posited only in living out a set of relations.

If relationship constitutes the fundamental datum of human wholeness, it remains also true that relation was not understood by Buber independent of its conceptual antipode, namely “distance.” As developed in the essay “Distance and Relation” (1951), relation cannot take shape apart from or without the prior setting of things, persons, and spiritual beings at a distance. For Buber, this setting of things, persons, and beings at a distance is the only way to secure the form of otherness without which there can be no relation. For without the form of otherness there can be no confirmation of self insofar as the confirmation of the I is always mediated by the other who confirms me, both at a distance and in relation, or rather in the distance that is relation and the relation that is difference.

While Buber most famously understood the I-Thou relationship as one based on immediacy, he always steeped his thought in the power of mediating images and other plastic forms as the material stuff of inter-subjective relationship. In the essay "Man and his Image-Work," Buber set out to understand something about the formation of images in relation to the world, the world encompassed by art, faith, love, and philosophy. Buber postulated three levels of world formation. The first two levels are the familiar Kantian concepts of a noumenal “x” world and a phenomenal sense-world of form, comprising the world as shaped by and in images and concepts. Buber’s conception of the third level, what he calls the world of perfect form, derives from the mystical tradition. This paradoxical level of world formation is expressed in terms of perfected form-relations. In art, faith, and philosophy, the human image-work emerges out of relational encounters between persons and an independent "world" that exists on its own, but is not imaginable.

The concern about “images” in relation to distance and dialogue surfaced again in Buber’s last major work, The Eclipse of God (1952). The so-called “eclipse of God” was Buber’s symbol for the spiritual crisis in postwar Western civilization. It designated a philosophical collapse as much as a moral one. Like Sartre and Heidegger, Buber directed his attention to concrete existence. But unlike his fellow “existentialists,” Buber was moved by the interaction between humans, individually and collectively, and an absolute reality that exceeds the human imagination. Against Sartre, Heidegger, and also Carl Jung, Buber rejected the picture of self-enclosed human subjects and self-enclosed human life-worlds beyond which there are no external, independent realities. Towards the end of his career as a writer and thinker, Buber sought to maintain the distinction and relation between the human subject and an external other in order to sustain an ontological source of ethical value in opposition to the false absolutes of a modern world that had fused the absolute with the political and historical products of the human spirit.

8. Criticism

Philosophical criticism of Buber tends to focus on three areas: [1] epistemological questions regarding the status of the I-Thou form of relationship and the status of the object-world delimited by the I-It form of relationship, [2] hermeneutical questions regarding Buber’s reading of Hasidic source material, and [3] doubts regarding the author’s rhetoric and style that touch upon the philosophy of language. All three lines of criticism have at their core the problem of the conflict between realism and idealism, world-affirmation and world-denial.

The nature of the world picture in Buber’s magnum opus has always been among the most contested aspects of Buber’s philosophy in the critical literature. I and Thou is considered to have inaugurated “a Copernican revolution in theology (…) against the scientific-realistic attitude” (Bloch [1983], p. 42), but it has also been criticized for its reduction of fundamental human relations to just two—the I-Thou and the I-It. Writing to Buber after the publication of I and Thou, Rosenzweig would not be the last critic to complain, “In your setting up the I-IT, you give the I-Thou a cripple for an opponent.” He continued to rebuke, “You make of creation a chaos, just good enough to provide construction material (Baumaterial) for the new building” (Franz Rosenzweig, Briefe und Tagebücher, pp. 824–5). In Jewish philosophical circles, it has been long argued that Buber was unable to ward off the relativism, subjectivism, and antinomianism that are said to permeate non-realist epistemologies and ontologies. Building on Rosenzweig’s complaint against Buber’s epistemology, Steven Katz called for a “realism” that affirms the rich world of stable objects extended in time and space. It is still widely assumed by his critics in Jewish philosophy that in his critique of Jewish law and the I-It form of relationship Buber rejected the world of object-forms in toto.

In addition to hermeneutical arguments regarding historicism, anti-historicism, literary style and poetic license, arguments about the picture of Hasidism that emerged out of Buber’s research and writing are also based upon the philosophical world picture as it took shape in Buber’s philosophical universe. Against Buber’s corpus of Hasidica, the doyen of Kabbalah scholarship, Gershom Scholem, was one of the first to throw down the gauntlet. Scholem argued that Buber’s focus on the genre of folk-tales obscured the theoretical works within the corpus Hasidic literature, where the phenomenon of (gnostic) world denial was more pronounced than in the popular tales. Buber’s later collections of Hasidic tales in particular reflect a this-worldly ethos at odds with important tenets of Hasidic mysticism. Whereas Buber’s early, neo-romantic Hasidica assumed a more distant and even antagonistic relation to the world of time and space, critics, such as Scholem, Katz, and Schatz-Uffenheimer, focused their critique almost exclusively on the later body of work, in which a this-wordly cosmology was more sharply articulated, in line with Buber’s own renewed interest, starting in the mid to late 1920s, with quotidian forms of existence.

The analytic philosopher Steven T. Katz, author of an important essay about the particularism of mystical language, articulated a range of criticisms directed against Buber’s writings (Katz, 1985). More recently, Katz revisited and mitigated some of these earlier criticisms that included the charge of antinomianism, the lack of an account for the enduring character of the I-Thou relation, and the misrepresentation of Hasidic thought (Katz in Zank, 2006). What remains most objectionable in Buber is the tendency toward an aestheticization of reality and the problem of Buber’s often slippery poetic rhetoric. Walter Kaufmann, who produced a second English translation of I and Thou, articulated his displeasure with Buber most strongly. While he did not regard the lack of deep impact of Buber’s contributions to biblical studies, Hasidism, and Zionist politics as an indication of failure, Kaufmann considered I and Thou a shameful performance in both style and content. In style the book invoked “the oracular tone of false prophets” and it was “more affected than honest.” Writing in a state of “irresistible enthusiasm,” Buber lacked the critical distance needed to critique and revise his own formulations. His conception of the I-It was a “Manichean insult” while his conception of the I-Thou was “rashly romantic and ecstatic,” and Buber “mistook deep emotional stirrings for revelation.” (Kaufmann [1983] pp. 28–33). The preponderance in Buber’s writings of rhetorical figures, such as “experience,” “realization,” “revelation,” “presence” and “encounter,” and his predilection for utopian political programs such as anarchism, socialism, and a bi-national solution to the intractable national conflict between Jews and Arabs in Palestine, are in line with a vagueness in his philosophical writing that often renders Buber’s thought suggestive, but elusive. Similar criticisms apply to Buber’s claim that language has the power to reveal divine presence or uncover Being.

Buber’s early Jugendstil rhetoric was a far cry from the neue Sachlichkeit of the nineteen twenties (Braiterman, 2007). While similarly inclined literary authors like Hermann Hesse praised Buber’s German renditions of Hasidic lore and his Bible translation later gained popular praise among German theologians, others, among them Franz Kafka, Theodor W. Adorno, and Siegfried Kracauer, spoke of Buber’s style disparagingly.

On a more biographical note, the philosopher of the “I and Thou” allowed very few people to call him by his first name; the theorist of education suffered no disturbance of his rigorous schedule by children playing in his own home; the utopian politician alienated most representatives of the Zionist establishment; and the innovative academic lecturer barely found a permanent position in the university he had helped to create—the Hebrew University of Jerusalem. Some of the most dedicated students of this inspiring orator and writer found themselves irritated by the conflict between their master’s ideas and their own attempts at putting them into practice. In the final analysis it seems as if Buber always remained the well-groomed, affected, prodigiously gifted, pampered Viennese boy, displaced in a land of horses and chemists, whose best company were the works of his own imagination and whose self-staging overtures to the outside world were always tainted by his enthusiasm for words and for the heightened tone of his own prodigious voice.

9. Honors and Legacy

Largely ignored by academic philosophers, Buber was already widely recognized and reviewed across the larger field of German letters before World War I. He rose to renewed prominence in Germany after World War II, where his Bible translation, collections of Hasidic stories, and writings on the philosophy of dialogue have remained in print ever since. Among the honors Buber received after 1945 were the Goethe Prize of the City of Hamburg (1951), the Friedenspreis des Deutschen Buchhandels (Frankfurt am Main, 1953), and the Erasmus Prize (Amsterdam, 1963). Significant students who considered their own work a continuation of Buber’s were Nahum Glatzer (Buber’s only doctoral student during his years at the university in Frankfurt, 1924–1933, later an influential teacher of Judaic Studies at Brandeis University), Akiba Ernst Simon (historian and theorist of education in Israel who first met Buber at the Freies jüdisches Lehrhaus in Frankfurt, and who returned from Palestine to work with Buber for the Mittelstelle für jüdische Erwachsenenbildung), and important Israeli scholars, such as Shmuel Eisenstadt, Amitai Etzioni, and Jochanan Bloch, who knew Buber in his later years when he taught seminars on social philosophy and education at the Hebrew University of Jerusalem. As for the United States, Buber’s American translator and biographer Maurice Friedman, a prolific author in his own right, almost single-handedly introduced Buber to post-war American religious scholars and the larger reading public. In addition to Friedman, Walter Kaufmann, the author of one of the first English-language studies of Nietzsche as well as books on religion and existentialism, helped to popularize Buber in the United States, despite the above-cited critique of Buber’s I and Thou. It was Kaufmann who first included Buber in the canon of religious existentialism in the 1950s and 1960s. In Jewish philosophy, Buber’s name has since been eclipsed by those of Franz Rosenzweig and Emmanuel Levinas.


Works Cited

  • Braiterman, Zachary, 2007, The Shape of Revelation: Aesthetics and Modern Jewish Thought, Stanford: Stanford University Press.
  • Brody, Samuel H., 2018, Martin Buber’s Theopolitics, Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
  • Friedman, Maurice, 1981, Martin Buber’s Life and Work: The Early Years, 1878–1923, New York: Dutton.
  • Bloch, Jochanan/Gordon, Hayyim (ed.), 1983, Martin Buber. Bilanz seines Denkens, Freiburg i. B.
  • Kaufmann, Walter, 1983, “Bubers Fehlschläge und sein Triumph” in Bloch [1983], pp. 22ff.
  • Wurm, Carsten, 1994, 150 Jahre Rütten & Loening … Mehr als eine Vertragsgeschichte, Berlin: Rütten & Loening.
  • Zank, Michael, 2006, “Buber and Religionswissenschaft: The Case of His Studies on Biblical Faith” in New Perspectives on Martin Buber, Tübingen: Mohr Siebeck, pp. 61–82.


  • Catanne, Moshe, 1961, A Bibliography of Martin Buber’s Works (1895–1957), Jerusalem: Bialik Institute.
  • Cohn, Margot, 1980, Martin Buber. A Bibliography of His Writings, 1897–1978. Compiled by Margot Cohn and Raphael Buber. Jerusalem: Magnes Press. This is the most authoritative bibliography compiled by Buber’s long-time secretary and his son.
  • Friedman, Maurice, 1963, “Bibliographie” in Paul Arthur Schilpp and Maurice Friedman (ed.), Martin Buber, Stuttgart: Kohlhammer1.
  • Kohn, Hans, 1930, Martin Buber, Hellerau: J. Hegner. This biography includes a bibliography of Buber’s writings from 1897 to 1928. The second edition (1961) contains bibliographic updates by Robert Weltsch.
  • Moonan, Willard, 1981, Martin Buber and His Critics. An Annotated Bibliography of Writings in English Through 1978, New York & London: Garland. With a list of the abstracts, indices, and bibliographies consulted by the author, indices of translators and authors writing on Buber, and subject indices of writings by and about Buber.

Selected Early Works By Martin Buber

  • 1906–1912, Die Gesellschaft. Sammlung sozial-psychologischer Monographien [Society. A Collection of Social-Psychological Monographs], Frankfurt am Main: Rütten & Loening. 40 volumes. The first volume (Werner Sombart, Das Proletariat) includes Buber’s introduction to the series.
  • 1906b, Die Geschichten des Rabbi Nachman [The Tales of Rabbi Nachman], Frankfurt am Main: Rütten & Loening. Dedicated to “the memory of my grandfather, Salomon Buber, the last master of the old haskalah.” (“Meinem Großvater Salomon Buber dem letzten Meister der alten Haskala bringe ich dies Werk der Chassidut dar in Ehrfurcht und Liebe.”)
  • 1908, Die Legende des Baal Schem [The Legend of the Baal Shem], Frankfurt: Rütten & Loening (second edition: 1916). On the founder of the Hasidic movement in early eighteenth-century Podolia/Volynia,
  • 1911a, Chinesische Geister- und Liebesgeschichten [Chinese Ghost and Love Stories], Frankfurt: Rütten & Loening.
  • 1911b, Drei Reden über das Judentum [Three Speeches on Judaism], Frankfurt: Rütten & Loening, 1911 (second, “complete” edition, 1923). Dedicated to “my wife.”
  • 1913, Daniel: Gespräche von der Verwirklichung [Daniel, Dialogues on Realization], Leipzig: Insel-Verlag.
  • 1916–24, Der Jude. Eine Monatsschrift [The Jew. A Monthly], Wien/Berlin: R. Löwith and Berlin: Jüdischer Verlag. Founded by Buber, who edited it during these years and wrote many contributions.
  • 1918, Mein Weg zum Chassidismus. Erinnerungen [My Path to Hasidism. Recollections], Frankfurt: Rütten & Loening. Dedicated to “my beloved father.”
  • 1919, Der heilige Weg. Ein Wort an die Juden und an die Völker [The Holy Path. A Word to the Jews and to the Gentiles], Frankfurt: Rütten & Loening. Dedicated to “my friend Gustav Landauer at his grave.”
  • 1922, Der grosse Maggid und seine Nachfolge [The Great Maggid and his Succession], Frankfurt: Rütten & Loening.
  • 1923, Ich und Du [I and Thou], Leipzig: Insel Verlag.
  • 1924, Das verborgene Licht [The Hidden Light], Frankfurt: Rütten & Loening.
  • 1925ff, Die Schrift. Zu verdeutschen unternommen von Martin Buber gemeinsam mit Franz Rosenzweig. Buber and Rosenzweig’s translation of the Hebrew Scriptures was published by Lambert Schneider first in his own publishing house in Berlin, between 1933 and 1939 under the heading of Schocken Verlag, Berlin, and again, after 1945, through the newly founded Lambert Schneider Verlag, Heidelberg.
  • 1926–29, Die Kreatur [Creation], Berlin: Lambert Schneider. A quarterly edited by Buber with the Protestant psychologist Victor von Weizsäcker and the dissident Catholic theologian Joseph Wittig.

Collections and Editions of Writings and Letters

  • 1953–62, Die Schrift. Verdeutscht von Martin Buber gemeinsam mit Franz Rosenzweig, improved and complete edition in four volumes, Cologne: J. Hegner.
  • 1953a, Hinweise. Gesammelte Essays, Zurich: Manesse.
  • 1962, Werke. Erster Band: Schriften zur Philosophie [Works, Volume One: Philosophical Writings], Munich and Heidelberg: Lambert Schneider.
  • 1963a, Werke. Dritter Band: Schriften zum Chassidismus [Works, Volume Three: Writings on Hasidism], Munich and Heidelberg: Lambert Schneider.
  • 1963b, Der Jude und sein Judentum. Gesammelte Aufsätze und Reden, Cologne: J. Hegner.
  • 1964, Werke. Zweiter Band: Schriften zur Bibel [Works, Volume Two: Writings on the Bible], Munich and Heidelberg: Lambert Schneider.
  • 1965, Nachlese. Heidelberg: Lambert Schneider. English translation: 1967a.
  • 1972–75, Briefwechsel aus sieben Jahrzehnten, edited by Grete Schaeder, Volume I: 1897–1918 (1972), Volume II: 1918–1938 (1973), Volume III: 1938–1965 (1975), Heidelberg: Lambert Schneider.
  • 1996, The Letters of Martin Buber: A Life of Dialogue, edited by Nahum Glatzer and Paul Mendes-Flohr, Syracuse: Syracuse University Press.
  • 2001ff, Werkausgabe, edited by Paul Mendes-Flohr, Peter Schafer, Martina Urban, Bernd Witte and others. Gutersloh: Gutersloher Verlagshaus.

Buber in English

  • 1937, I and Thou, transl. by Ronald Gregor Smith, Edinburgh: T. and T. Clark. 2nd Edition New York: Scribners, 1958. 1st Scribner Classics ed. New York, NY: Scribner, 2000, c1986
  • 1952, Eclipse of God, New York: Harper and Bros. 2nd Edition Westport, Conn.: Greenwood Press, 1977.
  • 1957, Pointing the Way, transl. Maurice Friedman, New York: Harper, 1957, 2nd Edition New York: Schocken, 1974.
  • 1960, The Origin and Meaning of Hasidism, transl. M. Friedman, New York: Horizon Press.
  • 1964, Daniel: Dialogues on Realization, New York, Holt, Rinehart and Winston.
  • 1965, The Knowledge of Man, transl. Ronald Gregor Smith and Maurice Friedman, New York: Harper & Row. 2nd Edition New York, 1966.
  • 1966, The Way of Response: Martin Buber; Selections from his Writings, edited by N. N. Glatzer. New York: Schocken Books.
  • 1967a, A Believing Humanism: My Testament, translation of Nachlese (Heidelberg 1965) by M. Friedman, New York: Simon and Schuster.
  • 1967b, On Judaism, edited by Nahum Glatzer and transl. by Eva Jospe and others, New York: Schocken Books.
  • 1968, On the Bible: Eighteen Studies, edited by Nahum Glatzer, New York: Schocken Books.
  • 1970a, I and Thou, a new translation with a prologue “I and you” and notes by Walter Kaufmann, New York: Scribner’s Sons.
  • 1970b, Mamre: Essays in Religion, translated by Greta Hort, Westport, Conn.: Greenwood Press.
  • 1970c, Martin Buber and the Theater, Including Martin Buber’s “Mystery Play” Elijah, edited and translated with three introductory essays by Maurice Friedman, New York, Funk &Wagnalls.
  • 1972, Encounter: Autobiographical Fragments. La Salle, Ill.: Open Court.
  • 1973a, On Zion: the History of an Idea, with a new foreword by Nahum N. Glatzer, Translated from the German by Stanley Godman, New York: Schocken Books.
  • 1973b, Meetings, edited with an introduction and bibliography by Maurice Friedman, La Salle, Ill.: Open Court Pub. Co. 3rd ed. London, New York: Routledge, 2002.
  • 1983, A Land of Two Peoples: Martin Buber on Jews and Arabs, edited with commentary by Paul R. Mendes-Flohr, New York: Oxford University Press. 2nd Edition Gloucester, Mass.: Peter Smith, 1994
  • 1985, Ecstatic Confessions, edited by Paul Mendes-Flohr, translated by Esther Cameron, San Francisco: Harper & Row.
  • 1991a, Chinese Tales: Zhuangzi, Sayings and Parables and Chinese Ghost and Love stories, translated by Alex Page, with an introduction by Irene Eber, Atlantic Highlands, N.J.: Humanities Press International.
  • 1991b, Tales of the Hasidim, foreword by Chaim Potok, New York: Schocken Books, distributed by Pantheon.
  • 1992, On Intersubjectivity and Cultural Creativity, edited and with an introduction by S.N. Eisenstadt, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • 1994, Scripture and Translation, Martin Buber and Franz Rosenzweig, translated by Lawrence Rosenwald with Everett Fox. Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
  • 1996, Paths in Utopia, translated by R.F. Hull. Syracuse: Syracuse University Press.
  • 1999a, The First Buber: Youthful Zionist Writings of Martin Buber, edited and translated from the German by Gilya G. Schmidt, Syracuse, N.Y.: Syracuse University Press.
  • 1999b, Martin Buber on Psychology and Psychotherapy: Essays, Letters, and Dialogue, edited by Judith Buber Agassi, with a foreword by Paul Roazin, New York: Syracuse University Press.
  • 1999c, Gog and Magog: A Novel, translated from the German by Ludwig Lewisohn, Syracuse, NY: Syracuse University Press.
  • 2002a, The Legend of the Baal-Shem, translated by Maurice Friedman, London: Routledge.
  • 2002b, Between Man and Man, translated by Ronald Gregor-Smith, with an introduction by Maurice Friedman, London, New York: Routledge.
  • 2002c, The Way of Man: According to the Teaching of Hasidim, London: Routledge.
  • 2002d, The Martin Buber Reader: Essential Writings, edited by Asher D. Biemann, New York: Palgrave Macmillan.
  • 2002e, Ten Rungs: Collected Hasidic Sayings, translated by Olga Marx, London: Routledge.
  • 2003, Two Types of Faith, translated by Norman P. Goldhawk with an afterword by David Flusser, Syracuse, N.Y.: Syracuse University Press.

Selected Edited Volumes on Martin Buber

  • Bloch, Jochanan/Gordon, Hayyim (ed.), 1983, Martin Buber. Bilanz seines Denkens, Freiburg i. B.: Herder.
  • Licharz, Werner/Schmidt, Heinz (ed.), 1989, Martin Buber (1878–1965). Internationales Symposium zum 20. Todestag. Two volumes (Series: Arnoldshainer Texte), Arnoldshain: Haag and Herchen.
  • Schilpp, Paul Arthur/Friedman, Maurice (ed.), 1963, Martin Buber, (Series: Philosophen des 20. Jahrhunderts), Stuttgart, Kohlhammer. English edition: 1967, The Philosophy of Martin Buber. (Series: Library of Living Philosophers, vol. XII). Lasalle/Ill.: Open Court. Among the contributors to this volume are, aside from Buber himself, Max Brod, Emmanuel Lévinas, Emil Brunner, Emil Fackenheim, Marvin Fox, Nahum Glatzer, Mordecai Kaplan, Walter Kaufmann, Gabriel Marcel, Nathan Rotenstreich, Rivka Schatz-Uffenheimer, Ernst Simon, Jacob Taubes, C.F. von Weizsäcker, and Robert Weltsch.
  • Zank, Michael (ed.), 2006, New Perspectives on Martin Buber, Tübingen: Mohr Siebeck. With essays by Joseph Agassi, Leora Batnitzky, Ilaria Bertone, Asher Biemann, Zachary Braiterman, Micha Brumlik, Judith Buber Agassi, Steven T. Katz, Paul Mendes-Flohr, Gesine Palmer, Andrea Poma, Yossef Schwartz, Jules Simon, Martina Urban, and Michael Zank

Secondary Literature

  • Avnon, Dan, 1998, Martin Buber. The Hidden Dialogue, Lanham, Boulder, New York, Oxford: Rowman & Littlefield.
  • Babolin, A., 1965, Essere e Alteritá in Martin Buber, Padova: Gregoriana.
  • Balthasar, Hans Urs von, 1958, Einsame Zwiesprache. Martin Buber und das Christentum, Cologne: J. Hegner.
  • Berkovits, Eliezer, 1962, A Jewish Critique of the Philosophy of Martin Buber, New York: Yeshiva University.
  • Bloch, J., 1977, Die Aporie des Du, Heidelberg: Lambert Schneider.
  • Brody, Samuel H., 2018, Martin Buber’s Theopolitics, Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
  • Blumenfeld, Walter, 1951, La antropologia filosofica de Martin Buber y la filosofia antropologica; un essayo, Lima: Tipografia Santa Rosa.
  • Braiterman, Zachary, 2007, The Shape of Revelation: Aesthetics and Modern Jewish Thought, Stanford: Stanford University Press.
  • Casper, Bernhard, 1967, Das dialogische Denken: Franz Rosenzweig, Ferdinand Ebner, Martin Buber, Freiburg i. B., Basel, Wien: Herder.
  • Dujovne, L., 1966, Martin Buber; sus ideas religiosas, filosoficas y sociales, Buenos Aires: Bibliografica Omeba.
  • Friedman, Maurice, 1955, Martin Buber. The Life of Dialogue, Chicago: University of Chicago.
  • Friedman, Maurice, 1981, Martin Buber’s Life and Work. The early years. 1878–1923., New York: Dutton.
  • Horwitz, Rivka, 1978, Buber’s Way to I and Thou. An Historical Analysis, Heidelberg: Lambert Schneider.
  • Kavka, Martin, 2012, “Verification (Bewahrung) in Martin Buber” Journal of Jewish Thought and Philosophy 20 (1):71–98.
  • Katz, Steven, 1985, Post-Holocaust Dialogues, New York: New York University Press.
  • Kohn, Hans, 1930, Martin Buber, Hellerau: J. Hegner. Second edition: Cologne: Melzer, 1961. First biography of Buber, published on the occasion of his fiftieth birthday.
  • Koren, Israel, 2002, “Between Buber’s Daniel and His I and Thou: A New Examination” in Modern Judaism 22 (2002): 169–198.
  • Lang, Bernhard, 1964, Martin Buber und das dialogische Leben, Bern: H. Lang.
  • Mendes-Flohr, Paul, 1989, From Mysticism to Dialogue. Martin Buber’s Transformation of German Social Thought, Detroit: Wayne State University Press.
  • Mendes-Flohr, Paul, 2019, Martin Buber: A Life of Faith and Dissent, New Haven/Ct and London: Yale University Press.
  • Poma, Andrea, 1974, La filosofia dialogica di Martin Buber, Torino: Rosenberg and Sellier.
  • Schaeder, Grete, 1966, Martin Buber, Hebräischer Humanismus, Göttingen: Vandenhoek and Ruprecht. English: 1973, The Hebrew Humanism of Martin Buber, transl. by Noah J. Jacobs, Detroit: Wayne State University.
  • Simon, Ernst, 1959, Aufbau im Untergang, Tübingen: Mohr. English: 1956, “Jewish adult education in Nazi Germany as spiritual resistence” in Yearbook of the Leo Baeck Institute, London: Secker & Warburg, Nr. 1, pp. 68–105. On the Mittelstelle für jüdische Erwachsenenbildung, a centralized institution, run by Buber from 1933–38, in charge of reeducating Jewish teachers who had been forced out of the general school system under the Nazis.
  • Smith, M. K., 2000 [2009], “Martin Buber on education,” in The Encyclopaedia of Informal Education, [available online, retrieved: Dec 3, 2014].
  • Theunissen, Michael, 1964, “Bubers negative Ontologie des Zwischen” in Philosophisches Jarhbuch, Freiburg and Munich: Alber, pp. 319–330.
  • Theunissen, Michael, 1965, Der Andere. Studien zur Sozialontologie der Gegenwart, Berlin: De Gruyter. English: 1984, The Other: Studies in the Social ontology of Husserl, Heidegger, Sartre, and Buber, transl. by Christopher Macann, Cambridge: The MIT Press, 1984.
  • Wood, R., 1969, Martin Buber’s Ontology; An Analysis of “I and Thou”, Evanston, Illinois: Northwestern University Press.
  • Urban, Martina, 2008, Aesthetics of Renewal: Martin Buber’s Early Representation of Hasidism as Kulturkritik, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.

Other Internet Resources

  • Information on the Martin Buber Werkausgabe Published on behalf of Philosophische Fakultät der Heinrich Heine Universität Düsseldorf and Israel Academy of Sciences and Humanities, edited by Paul Mendes-Flohr and Bernd Witte.
  • Martin Buber Homepage, The English language website of the German Martin Buber Society.
  • Buber Timeline, A brief biographic sketch maintained by the online project of the Museum for German History in Berlin.

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Zachary Braiterman

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