Lady Anne Conway

First published Thu Feb 13, 2003; substantive revision Fri Feb 21, 2020

Lady Anne Conway (nee Anne Finch) was one of a tiny minority of seventeenth-century women who was able to pursue an interest in philosophy. She was associated with the Cambridge Platonists, particularly Henry More (1614–1687). Her only surviving treatise, Principles of the Most Ancient and Modern Philosophy, was published posthumously and anonymously in 1690. This propounds a vitalist ontology of spirit, derived from the attributes of God, which she sets out in opposition to More, Descartes, Hobbes and Spinoza. Her philosophy was received favorably by Leibniz.

1. Life

Lady Anne Conway (née Finch) (1631–1679) was the posthumous daughter of Sir Heneage Finch and his second wife Elizabeth Cradock, widow of Sir John Bennet. She was born in London in 1631, and raised in the house now known as Kensington Palace, which then belonged to the Finch family. The youngest child in a large family, she was especially close to her half-brother, John Finch. Nothing is known of her education, though she was clearly well-read by the time she made the acquaintance of one of the Cambridge Platonists (see entry), Henry More (1614–1687). Of Anne Conway’s remarkable philosophical education, much more is known. Thanks to her brother, who was his pupil at Christ’s College, University of Cambridge, More agreed to give her instruction in philosophy. Since, as a woman, she was debarred from attending the university, he instructed her by letter. The few letters that survive from this early correspondence indicate that Cartesianism formed the basis of the course of instruction she followed. Thereafter, Anne Conway and More remained friends for the rest of her life. By this means she had a permanent link to intellectual life beyond the confines of her domestic situation.

In 1651 Anne Conway married Edward, third Viscount Conway, who was heir to estates in Warwickshire and County Antrim in Ireland. Their one child, Heneage, died in infancy. The Conway family possessed one of the finest private libraries of the period, and her husband appears to have encouraged his wife’s intellectual interests. However, from her teens she suffered from periodic bouts of illness, which became more acute and more frequent as she got older. It was as a result of a search for relief from this that she came into contact with the Flemish physician and philosopher, Francis Mercury van Helmont, son of the iatrochemist, Jan Baptiste van Helmont. During the last decade of her life, the younger Van Helmont lived in her household. It was through Van Helmont that Anne Conway was introduced to kabbalistic thought and to Quakerism. These encounters resulted in radical new departures for her: on the one hand, her study of the Jewish kabbalah contributed to her decisive break with the Cartesianism of her philosophical upbringing; on the other hand, her encounter with Van Helmont’s Quaker friends led to her conversion to Quakerism, shortly before she died in 1679.

2. Conway’s Philosophy in Outline

Anne Conway is known to be the author of a single treatise of philosophy. This was written at the end of her life and published anonymously in Amsterdam in 1690 in a Latin translation with the title, Principia philosophiae antiquissimae et recentissimae. It was translated back into English and printed in London in 1692 as The Principles of the Most Ancient and Modern Philosophy. The other source for her philosophical activities is her correspondence with Henry More.

Anne Conway’s treatise is a work of Platonist metaphysics in which she derives her system of philosophy from the existence and attributes of God. The framework of Conway’s system is a tripartite ontological hierarchy of “species”, the highest of which is God, the source of all being. Christ, or “middle nature”, links God and the third species, called “Creature”. God as the most perfect being is infinitely good, wise, and just. A principle of likeness links God and creation. Since God is good and just, his creation too is good and just. Created substance, like God, consists of spirit, but, unlike God, is constituted of infinite multiples of spirit particles, which, as unities in multiplicity, may be described as monadic (though not in a Leibnizian sense). All created substance is living, capable of motion and perception. Anne Conway denies the existence of material body as such, arguing that inert corporeal substance would contradict the nature of God, who is life itself. Incorporeal created substance is, however, differentiated from the divine, principally on account of its mutability and multiplicity even so, the infinite number and constant mutability of created things constitutes an obverse reflection of the unity, infinity, eternity and unchangeableness of God. The continuum between God and creatures is made possible through “middle nature”, an intermediary being, through which God communicates life, action, goodness and justice. “Middle nature”, partakes of the nature of both God and creation, and is therefore both a bridge and a buffer between God and created things. Thus, although she conceives of created substance as a continuum, and understands mutability as capacity for increased perfection, she sought to avoid the charge of pantheism. The spiritual perfectionism of Anne Conway’s system has a dual aspect: metaphysical and moral. On the one hand all things are capable of becoming more spirit-like, that is, more refined qua spiritual substance. At the same time, all things are capable of increased goodness. She explains evil as a falling away from the perfection of God, and understands suffering as part of a longer term process of spiritual recovery. She denies the eternity of hell, since for God to punish finite wrong-doing with infinite and eternal hell punishment would be manifestly unjust and therefore a contradiction of the divine nature. Instead she explains pain and suffering as purgative, with the ultimate aim of restoring creatures to moral and metaphysical perfection. Anne Conway’s system is thus not just an ontology and but a theodicy.

3. Substance

Strictly speaking, Conway’s metaphysics is an ontology of three kinds of being, which she calls “species”. Each of these is a single substance distinguished by a particular set of properties which determine its essence, and set its ontological boundaries. Conway holds that there can only be three species, and one species cannot transform into another. The species are nevertheless inter-connected through their shared properties (principally the “communicable” attributes of God), and differentiated by others (principally mutability which is a property of the second and third species). The second species (Christ or Middle nature) is differentiated from both God and other created things because it also retains God’s immutability. As a causal intermediary between God and Created Nature, Middle nature is analogous to Cudworth’s Plastic Nature and More’s Spirit of Nature, but a divinized version.

The question of substance dualism within one of the three species only arises in relation to the third species or created being. This species is itself a unity in multiplicity, since it is a single substance comprising innumerable spirit particles, which Conway also calls species (a term indicative of their being parts that constitute the whole). The third species as a whole is thus a unity of multiplicities (“the whole creation is just but one substance or entity”, exhibiting “a general unity of creatures with one another”; Principles VII.4). Each of these spirit particles consists of infinite spirit particles, every one of which contains infinite numbers of others. These entities may be considered monadic in the sense that each is a unity. But, like created nature as a whole, they are unities in multiplicity, there being “a special and peculiar unity among the parts of one [individual] species in particular” (Principles, VII.4). It is from aggregates of these that creatures are formed. The mutability of all created beings means that there is considerable—nay infinite—variety within created nature.

Conway’s case for substance monism rests on fundamental principles of her metaphysics: it is grounded first in her vitalist conception of all being. On the principle of similitude whereby all things bear some resemblance to God, everything in existence must be in some sense alive—from God down through angels, to human beings, animals, plants and mere dust. There are of course other attributes of created things not shared by God (mutability, shape or “figure” and solidity or density). Also, creatures, unlike God, are multiple and subject to time. Since all substance created by God must be living, it follows there can be no non-living substance. Furthermore, matter being nothing but inert extension (“dead” is Conway’s adjective) is devoid of likeness to God, so cannot exist. It follows that body and soul (or spirit) are not distinct substances, but different gradations or modes of the same substance. Secondly, all created things are subject to change, and change is only possible between things that are alike. This holds both for divine causality and change within created nature. The main limit to change is ontological: creatures may change radically, but not to the extent that they might lose any of their essential properties, or acquire others, for that would entail change of substance. It follows, therefore, that within the ontological parameters of the third species, all changes are changes of degree or mode, not substance.

For Conway body is, therefore, not a substance distinct from spirit, but both are modes of the same created substance differentiated only by relative density. Conway uses the metaphor of light and dark to express the difference between them, light being associated with spirit (soul) and darkness with body. In the scale of being, the higher creatures are more active, spiritual and bright, while the lower creatures are on the scale, the less active and more corporeal and darker they become, though they never become completely dark.

4. Creatures

All creatures, humans, animals, plants and minerals, consist of composites of spirit and body (in Conway’s sense), each of which contains infinite numbers of other creatures, compounded, in their turn of infinite creatures. All creatures interact and inter-communicate by means of the emanation of spirits (even the most dense bodies, produce and emit other, finer, or more subtle spirits). Creatures are, furthermore subject to change. These changes can be radical—body can become spirit and vice versa, while creatures can metamorphose into other creatures, up or down the scale of nature. Creaturely change takes the form of reconfigurations or as it were re-balancing of the constituent corporeal and spiritual elements that make-up a particular creature. This reflects the relative goodness of the creature, such that the more good, and therefore more godlike a creature becomes, the more spiritual its make-up. This is manifest in terms of its increase or loss of capacity for action—the more spiritual a creature, the more volatile and more able to act (“active and operative”) and vice versa.

The mutable state of creatures raises the question of how far a creature can change and still be the same individual thing? Conway’s answer is that outwardly every creature may change radically, though not to such an extent that it exceeds the ontological boundaries of the third species/created nature (e.g., by acquiring the attributes of a higher species, God or Christ, or losing the attribute of life). Creaturely change occurs across successive life-times, rather than in the course of a single life span. The identity of a creature is not co-terminous with its natural life span, but persists throughout its existence in time. Thus a horse (to use the example she gives) may transform into a human being through incremental changes across in successive life spans. But its identity as a living being persists through these changes. Conway explains explains the continuous identity of an individual creature from one state to another and across time, partly through her conception of the composition of living creatures, which are structured as organized orderly composites, the unity of which is sustained by a dominant spirit:

the unity of the spirits composing this spirit is…so great that nothing can dissolve it…thus it happens that the soul of every human being will remain a whole soul for eternity. (Principles, VII.4; see Thomas 2017, Hutton 2004).

This “captain spirit”, determines the moral constitution of the creature, and its continuous identity across time, throughout the metamorphoses which the creature undergoes. Another limit on creaturely change is that an individual creature cannot transform into another individual (Peter cannot become Paul, or Judas). The reason for this rests with divine justice: it would be unjust for Peter to be rewarded for Paul’s righteousness, or for Peter to be punished for the sins of Judas.

4. Perfectibility

A key feature of Conway’s system is perfectibility. All created beings have the potential to increase in perfection. Perfectibility is grounded in divine goodness, and made possible by the mutability of created things. Holding to the Platonic conception of goodness as godlikeness, Conway argues that since all creatures have some resemblance to God, all creatures are endowed with a capacity for good, and an impulse to strive for greater good (“continual motion or operation, which most certainly strives for their further good”; Principles VI.6). Everything is thus perfectible, with the potential to increase in goodness, even beyond its original state in its first creation, ad infinitum. But nothing can become infinitely good, because then it would become God.

However, the mutability of the creatures’ condition means that they may change for the worse. There is no inevitability about this, since moral corruption in creatures results from either a deliberate act of will or indifference of will (a failure to pursue the good) (Lascano 2018). The moral degeneration of the creature is mitigated by the fact that no creature can become so corrupt as to lose its God-given goodness entirely. (A creature utterly lacking in goodness would be so unlike God that it could not exist). The residual goodness of the creature holds out the possibility of recovery from its degenerate state. To understand how this comes about, let us recall, first, that the change in creatures is physical as well as moral, such that as a creature degenerates, it becomes more corporeal (“hardened”). Furthermore, just as a creature can never become utterly evil, so it can never be reduced to mere corporeality, because that would be a lifeless condition, so unlike to God as not to exist.

The second factor in the regenerative process is punishment for sin: here pain has a crucial role. Conway holds that the disequilibrium between corporeality and spirit, whereby it becomes more corporeal, is a painful condition. The pain so experienced is punishment for the sin which brought about it to this condition (in that respect sin is its own punishment). But Conway holds, further, that the purpose of punishment is not merely retributive; pain has a purgative effect on the degenerate creature, leading to its release from its overly corporeal, inactive condition, and enabling it to reset itself on a trajectory of recovery of its original godlikeness. In this process its constitutional composition becomes increasingly refined (spirit-like) in tandem with its increase in goodness. The trajectories of degeneration, on the one hand, and amelioration echo Plato’s account of immortality of the soul in the Phaedo 80d–84b. In Conway’s version, pain and suffering are beneficial because they have a restorative function, thereby playing a crucial role in sustaining the over-all dynamic towards perfectibility in her metaphysical system. In this way Conway vindicates the justice of God. Conway’s system is thus a theodicy, which explains pain and suffering as a transient conditions, contributory to the amelioration and recovery of creatures. The consequences in terms of religious belief are that Conway denies the eternity of hell punishment and upholds the doctrine the universal salvation or apocotastasis.

5. Conclusion

Anne Conway presents her system as an answer to the dominant philosophies of her time. Several chapters of her treatise are devoted to a refutation of the dualism of Henry More and Descartes. (She does, however, express her admiration for Descartes’ physics). She also takes issue with Hobbes and Spinoza, whom she charges with material pantheism, which confounds God and created substance. Anne Conway’s concept of substance probably owes much to Platonism and Kabbalism (which, in the version she encountered was heavily Platonised). Her thinking also shows the impact of the teachings of the heterodox Christian theologian, Origen, who was much admired by her teacher, Henry More. In many respects, her system anticipates the philosophy of Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz, who recognized affinities with his own philosophy. (Leibniz in fact owned a copy of her treatise—probably a gift to him by their mutual friend, Van Helmont). However, although she was unusual as a female philosopher of the seventeenth century, by virtue of the fact that her philosophy achieved publication, the anonymity of Conway’s work has ensured that she has suffered the same neglect that has been the lot of most pre-modern female philosophers.


Primary Sources

  • Conway, Anne, Principia philosophiae antiquissimae et recentissimae de Deo, Christo et Creatura id est de materia et spiritu in genere. Amsterdam, 1690.
  • Conway, Anne, The Principles of the Most Ancient and Modern Philosophy. London, 1692. [Principles 1692 available online]
  • Conway, Anne, The Principles of the Most Ancient and Modern Philosophy, Allison P. Coudert and Taylor Corse (trans/eds), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511597978
  • The Conway Letters: The Correspondence of Anne, Viscountess Conway, Henry More, and Their Friends 1642–1684, Marjorie Hope Nicolson and Sarah Hutton (eds.), Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1992. doi:10.1093/actrade/
  • Plato, The Collected Dialogues of Plato, edited by Edith Hamilton and Huntington Cairns, Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1978 (first published 1961).

Secondary Sources

  • Borcherding, Julia, 2019, “Nothing is Simply One Thing: Conway on Multiplicity in Causation and Cognition”, in Causation and Cognition in Early Modern Philosophy, Dominik Perler and Sebastian Bender (eds), (Routledge Studies in Seventeenth-Century Philosophy), London: Routledge, 123–144.
  • –––, forthcoming, “Loving the Body, Loving the Soul. Anne Conway’s Critique of Cartesian and Morean Dualism”, Oxford Studies in Early Modern Philosophy, 9.
  • Boyle, Deborah, 2006, “Spontaneous and Sexual Generation in Conway’s Principles”, in The Problem of Animal Generation in Early Modern Philosophy, Justin E. H. Smith (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 175–193. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511498572.009
  • Broad, Jacqueline, 2003, Women Philosophers of the Seventeenth Century, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511487125
  • Brown, Stuart, 1990, “Leibniz and More’s Cabbalistic Circle”, in Hutton 1990: 77–95. doi:10.1007/978-94-009-2267-9_5
  • Coudert, Allison, 1998, The Impact of the Kabbalah in the Seventeenth Century. The Life and Thought of Francis Mercury van Helmont, 1614–1698, Leiden: Brill.
  • Detlefsen, Karen, 2018, “Cavendish and Conway on the Individual Human Mind”, in Philosophy of Mind in the Early Modern and Modern Ages, Rebecca Copenhaver (ed.), New York: Routledge, 134–56.
  • Duran, Jane, 2006, Eight Women Philosophers. Theory, Politics and Feminism, Champaign, IL: University of Illinois Press.
  • Gabbey, Alan, 1977, “Anne Conway et Henry More: Lettres sur Descartes”, Archives de Philosophie, 40(3): 379–404.
  • Gordon-Roth, Jessica, 2018, “What Kind of Monist Is Anne Finch Conway?”, Journal of the American Philosophical Association, 4(3): 280–297. doi:10.1017/apa.2018.24
  • Grey, John, 2017, “Conway’s Ontological Objection to Cartesian Dualism”, Philosophers’ Imprint 17.13: 1–9.
  • Hutton, Sarah (ed.), 1990, Henry More (1614–1687) Tercentenary Studies, Dordrecht: Springer Netherlands. doi:10.1007/978-94-009-2267-9
  • –––, 1995, “Anne Conway critique d’Henry More: l’esprit et la matière”, Archives de Philosophie, 58(3): 371–384.
  • –––, 2004, Anne Conway: A Woman Philosopher, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511487217
  • –––, 2011, “Sir John Finch and Religious Toleration: An Unpublished Letter to Anne Conway”, in La Centralita del Dubbio. Un Progetto di Antonio Rotondo, Luisa Simonutti and Camilla Hernanin (eds.), 2 vols., Florence: Olschki, pp. 287–304.
  • –––, 2018, “Goodness in Anne Conway’s Metaphysics”, in Early Modern Women on Metaphysics, Emily Thomas (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 229–246. doi:10.1017/9781316827192.013
  • –––, 2019, “‘As we observe by continued experience’. Experience and the Senses in the Philosophy of Anne Conway”, Bruniana e Campanelliana, supplement on Filosofe e scienzate nel eta moderna, Sandra Plastina and Emilio Tommaso (eds), 51–64.
  • Lascano, Marcy P., 2013, “Anne Conway: Bodies in the Spiritual World”, Philosophy Compass, 8(4): 327–336. doi:10.1111/phc3.12025
  • –––, 2018, “Anne Conway on Liberty”, in Women and Liberty, 1600–1800: Philosophical Essays, Jacqueline Broad and Karen Detlefsen (eds), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 163–77.
  • Mercer, Christia, 2012a, “ Knowledge and Suffering in Early Modern Philosophy: G.W. Leibniz and Anne Conway”, in Emotional Minds. The Passions and the Limits of Enquiry in Early Modern Philosophy, Sabrina Ebbersmeyer (ed.), Göttingen: de Gruyter, 179–206. [Mercer 2012 available online]
  • –––, 2012b, “Platonism in Early Modern Natural Philosophy: The Case of Leibniz and Anne Conway”, in Neoplatonism and the Philosophy of Nature, James Wilberding and Christoph Horn (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 103–126. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199693719.003.0006
  • Merchant, Carolyn, 1979, “The Vitalism of Anne Conway: Its Impact on Leibniz’s Concept of the Monad”, Journal of the History of Philosophy, 17(3): 255–269. doi:10.1353/hph.2008.0331
  • O’Neill, Eileen, 1998, “History of Philosophy: Disappearing Ink: Early Modern Women Philosophers and Their Fate in History”, in Philosophy in a Feminist Voice: Critiques and Reconstructions, Janet A. Kourany (ed.), Princeton: Princeton University Press, 17–62. doi:10.1515/9781400822324.17
  • Platas Benitez, Viridiana, forthcoming, “Percepcion sensible e imaginacion en la filosofia di Anne Conway”, Annales del seminario de Historia de Filosofia, Universidad Complutense de Madrid.
  • Popkin, Richard H., 1990, “The Spiritualistic Cosmologies of Henry More and Anne Conway”, in Hutton 1990: 97–114. doi:10.1007/978-94-009-2267-9_6
  • Pugliese, Nastassja, 2019, “Monism and Individuation in Anne Conway as a Critique of Spinoza”, British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 27(4): 771–785. doi:10.1080/09608788.2018.1563764
  • Thomas, Emily, 2017, “Time, Space, and Process in Anne Conway”, British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 25(5): 990–1010. doi:10.1080/09608788.2017.1302408
  • –––, 2018a, “Anne Conway on the Identity of Creatures over Time”, in Thomas 2018b: 131–149. doi:10.1017/9781316827192.008
  • ––– (ed.), 2018b, Early Modern Women on Metaphysics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/9781316827192
  • –––, forthcoming, “Anne Conway as a Priority Monist: A Reply to Gordon-Roth”, Journal of the American Philosophical Association. [Thomas forthcoming available online]

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