Tommaso Campanella

First published Wed Aug 31, 2005; substantive revision Tue Apr 6, 2021

Tommaso Campanella (Stilo, 1568–Paris, 1639) was one of the most important philosophers of the late Renaissance. Although his best-known work today is the utopian text La città del Sole (The City of the Sun), his thought was extremely complex and engaged with all fields of learning. The fundamental core of his thinking, which will be examined in this article, was concerned with the philosophy of nature (what would nowadays be called science), magic, political theory and natural religion.

1. Biographical Sketch

Tommaso Campanella was born in Stilo, a town in Calabria, one of the southern regions of Italy, on September 5, 1568. At the age of 14 he entered the Dominican Order. In 1588, while in Cosenza, another Calabrian town, he read the treatise De rerum natura iuxta propriis principiis (On the Nature of Things According to Their Own Principles, 1586) by Bernardino Telesio; and in the following months Campanella wrote his own Philosophia sensibus demonstrata (Philosophy as Demonstrated by the Senses) in defense of this new philosophy of nature. In 1590 he was in Naples, where he made the acquaintance of Giambattista della Porta. He left for Rome in 1592 and then went to Florence and Padua, where he met Galileo. Denounced to the Inquisition, Campanella was arrested at the beginning of 1594 and in October was transferred to the Inquisition’s prison in Rome. Condemned on suspicion of heresy and forced to abjure, at the end of 1597 he was ordered to return to Calabria. In the summer of 1598 he was again in Stilo, where he soon became the inspiration behind a vast conspiracy against the Spanish, who at that time governed the Kingdom of Naples. In August 1599 two of the conspirators revealed the plot to the Spanish viceroy, who sent armed forces into Calabria to repress it. Campanella was imprisoned and in November was moved to Naples, where he was tried for heresy and rebellion. He managed to avoid the death penalty by feigning madness and was instead condemned to a lengthy detention in various Neapolitan fortresses. During the years of his incarceration, he dedicated himself to intense literary activity, composing his most famous works, aimed at producing a new foundation for the entire encyclopedia of knowledge. In 1612 he was visited by Tobias Adami, a German man of letters from Saxony who took it upon himself to publish some of Campanella’s most important writings in Frankfurt from 1617 to 1623. After almost 27 years in prison, Campanella was released from the Castel Nuovo in 1626 and arrived in Rome, where he remained in detention until early 1629. In October 1634 he was compelled to go into exile in France, following renewed Spanish suspicions regarding him. In Paris he was received with favor by King Louis XIII and by Cardinal Richelieu and was able to frequent learned circles. He wrote new political works and arranged for the printing of the first volumes of his Opera omnia, a project that remained incomplete at his death on May 21, 1639.

2. Criticism of Aristotle and Championing of Telesio’s Natural Philosophy

Campanella’s first printed work, Philosophia sensibus demonstrata, was written when the twenty-one year old Dominican friar was living in a monastery in the Calabrian village of Altomonte. It was published in Naples in 1591. The work is divided into eight disputationes (‘disputations’), in which he defends Telesio’s new philosophy of nature against the attack of the Aristotelian Giacomo Antonio Marta. In the preface Campanella traces the course of his intellectual development and presents the “new” aspects of his own thought. It is no accident that these pages begin with the word “truth,” depicted allegorically on the title-page as a sphere floating on water, as winds blowing from all sides threaten to submerge it and a young friar swims out to reach it. Truth can be hidden and persecuted, Campanella maintains, but it cannot be held prisoner by injustice; in the end it emerges from the darkness and is once again resplendent. These introductory pages offer us a lively account of the doubts of the young friar who, recalling the years he spent in Dominican monasteries in Calabria, cannot conceal his disillusionment. The works of ancient and modern philosophers have convinced him that human knowledge had become ever more obscure and confused because it had distanced itself progressively from the direct experience of nature and had turned instead to reading and commenting on books written by human beings. This attitude was particularly evident in the followers of Aristotle who directed their energies toward the words of their master, without attempting to compare them to the natural world. In this way philosophical research had degenerated into sophistical disputes and a series of pointless battles over words. Reflecting on all this, the young Campanella formed a conviction that he would never abandon: an adequate knowledge of things is one that comes from the things themselves, which we must investigate on the basis of sense experience.

This forms the context for his fundamental encounter with the philosophy of Telesio. Reading the first edition of De rerum natura iuxta propria principia, Campanella intuited, right from the beginning, the novelty and cogency of Telesio’s approach. In accordance with Campanella’s own aspirations, Telesio believed in deriving the truth from a direct examination of natural facts, so that the correct connections between words and things, which had gotten lost in the Aristotelian tradition, could now be re-established. Reviving and developing, in an original manner, a time-honored metaphor, Campanella affirmed that the philosophical investigator must read and study the “book of nature.” In a famous sonnet—he was also the author of an extraordinary collection of philosophical poetry—he stated: “The world is the book on which the Eternal Wisdom / wrote its own thoughts” (Poesie, 1998, p. 46). In order to construct an authentic natural philosophy, a continual comparison between the books written by human beings and the infinite book of nature was necessary, so as to correct the errors in the human “copies,” that were inevitably imperfect, partial and consequently in need of revision. In another sonnet, Campanella rendered homage to “Telesio from Cosenza” (“Telesio cosentino”) for having used his arrows to pierce and kill Aristotle, described as the “tyrant of minds”, and for having in this way restored to mankind the libertas philosophandi (freedom to philosophize), which is inseparable from the truth (Poesie, 1998, p. 278).

In his own treatise, Philosophia sensibus demonstrata, Campanella produced a systematic critique of the axioms of Aristotelian philosophy, bringing to light their limitations and incoherence on the physical, cosmological and metaphysical level, by drawing on Telesian principles integrated with notions deriving from other philosophies. Campanella had a secure knowledge of Aristotle’s works and those of his commentators and followers, whether ancient (Themistius, Alexander of Aphrodisias, Philoponus), medieval (Averroes was frequently cited alongside Thomas Aquinas and, above all, the “divine” Albertus Magnus) or contemporary (such as Agostino Nifo). He re-evaluated the Presocratic philosophers, who had been criticized by Aristotle, and was well acquainted with medical writers from Hippocrates and Galen to Pietro d’Abano, Jean Fernel and Vesalius. He had read the works of astronomers and of natural philosophers—Pliny the Elder’s Natural History played a role of primary importance for him. One of the authors most cited by Campanella, in close conjunction with the philosophy of Telesio, was Marsilio Ficino. He quoted in particular passages from Ficino’s commentaries on Plato (especially the Timaeus and Symposium) and on the Enneads of Plotinus.

In his attack on the Aristotelian tradition, Campanella criticized the doctrines of form and of privation; of the four elements as principles of the sublunary world; of matter as privation; of the derivation of celestial heat from the friction of the spheres; and of the distinction between natural and violent motion. The culmination of his efforts to dismantle the Aristotelian system was a radical critique of traditional cosmology, with regard both to the nature of the heavens and to the trajectories and mechanisms of celestial movements. In parallel to the destructive side of Campanella’s argument, the constructive element consisted of defending the doctrines of Telesio’s philosophy. According to Telesio, all being derived from modifications resulting from the actions of the two principles of hot and cold on matter, which he did not regard as an abstract ens rationis (an entity existing in the mind) but rather as an inert corporeal mass, dark and entirely formless but capable of receiving any form. From the subtle and detailed argumentative structure of the eight weighty disputationes emerges a powerful unitary notion: the centrality, nobility and primacy of solar heat, that connects all beings and confers life on them. It is within this context that the assimilation of solar heat to the World Soul acquires a particular significance, a theme that is at the heart of the third disputation, entitled “De coelo et mundo” (“On the heavens and the world”). Campanella here transcribes verbatim a passage from Ficino’s commentary on Plotinus’s Enneads in which he dwells on the World Soul and its “vital and sensual breath” (Philosophia sensibus demonstrata, pp. 322–23). Ficino associates this hot breath, that penetrates and is infused into the entire world, with a well-known line from Virgil’s Aeneid (VI.726: “spiritus intus alit”; “the spirit nourishes from within”) and also with the divine spirit of Genesis 1:2: “the spirit of God moved upon the face of the waters”. The heavens are composed of this breath and divine word, that vivifies and nourishes everything.

Campanella set out this philosophy of nature, inspired by Telesio but reworked in an original manner, in successive treatises such as the Epilogo magno (Great Epilogue), that, when translated into Latin, would become the “Physiologia,” the first of the four parts of his Philosophia realis, first published in Frankfurt in 1623; the other three parts were entitled “Ethica,” “Politica” and “Oeconomica”. In the second and definitive edition, published in Paris in 1637, all four parts, and in particular the first, were accompanied by numerous and lengthy quaestiones concerning specific problems, in which the views of ancient and modern philosophers were discussed. Campanella begins the “Physiologia” by stating that when the first Being—most powerful, most wise and best—decided to create the world, defined as its “effigy” and the “image” of its infinite goods, it unfolded an “almost infinite” space in which that effigy was placed. This occurred at the outset of that enduring vicissitude of things that we call time and that is the image of eternity from which it flows. Space is defined as “a primary substance or seat or immobile and incorporeal capacity, able to receive any body.” It is homogeneous: human terms such as “high” and “low”, “behind and in front of”, “right” and “left”, refer to bodies that are placed within it; and if the world did not exist, we would imagine space to be empty. In reality, however, it desires fullness, is endowed with attractive force and abhors remaining empty. Bodies, in turn, enjoy mutual contact and hate the void that separates them (Physiologia, in Opera latina, II, pp. 575–77).

Within space God places matter that in clear contrast to the conception of Aristotle and Averroes, who defined it as privation and as a pure ens rationis, is regarded by Campanella as a physical entity, deprived of form, shape and action, but capable of being extended, divided, united and of assuming any shape, just as wax can receive an impression from any seal. Into this corporeal mass God inserts heat and coldness, the two active principles, that are self-disseminating and incorporeal but can only subsist in bodies. From their conflict, deriving from the fact that each wants to take possession of and occupy the greatest possible quantity of matter, come the two primary bodies and elements of the world: the heavens, that are extremely hot, subtle and mobile, since they are formed of matter transformed by heat; and the earth, composed of matter made immobile, dark and dense by cold. The clash between the heavens and the earth, between heat and coldness—instruments and ‘craftsmen’ that God uses to produce the infinite modes of his creative wisdom in the wondrous effigy that is the world—gives birth to all individual entities. By means of these principles Campanella explains every aspect of the natural world, from celestial and meteorological phenomena to the formation of the waters, from the composition of minerals to that of plants. Animals and human beings he analyzes with particular attention. At the origin of these organisms, that are more complex and have more parts, lies an especially attenuated celestial heat, the spiritus. Consisting of matter made extremely subtle by solar heat, it is a warm breath that, thanks to its tenuousness and motion, is able to separate itself from the portion of matter in which it finds itself enclosed and to act on it. Unable to exhale itself from corporeality in order to return to the heavens from which it has its origin, this plasma constructs, in ways that suit its needs and avoid the external dangers threatening it from within, the organs that guarantee its conservation and life. Proud of his medical knowledge (among his works is one entitled Medicina, made up of eight books and published in Lyons in 1635), here and in other treatises Campanella delighted in highlighting the wondrous structure of the human body and its parts, revealing how the functions and purposes specific and particular to individual organs harmonize in the marvelous order of the totality and confirm the presence of divine craftsmanship in every fiber of natural reality.

3. The Sense of Things and Natural Magic

One aspect of Campanella’s keen interest in natural philosophy was natural magic, described with particular effectiveness in the fourth book of his Del senso delle cose e della magia naturale (On the Sense of Things and On Natural Magic). The original draft of this work goes back to the young friar’s first stay in Naples, from 1590 to 1592. He came into contact there with Giambattista della Porta, one of the most celebrated Renaissance proponents of natural magic. The treatise was rewritten in the following years and was published for the first time in Frankfurt in 1620 in a Latin translation that was reprinted in Paris in 1636 and 1637. The work had a notable European diffusion, provoking discussions and contrasting opinions. In this treatise Campanella set out his vision of the natural world as a living organism, whose individual components partook of life, vitality and sensibility.

The central notion in the treatise is that of sensus (sense), which is directly connected to the principle of self-preservation. Every being displays a tendency toward the conservation of its own life and for this purpose is endowed, in varying proportions, with sense. This consists of the capacity to distinguish that which is positive and conducive to its life, and is consequently to be pursued and sought after, from that which is perceived as negative and destructive, and consequently to be shunned and avoided. Some entities such as celestial bodies and light possess a sense that is much sharper and purer than that of animals. Others such as minerals and metals have a sense that is more obtuse and obscure, due to the heaviness of matter. In animal organisms vital and cognitive functions depend on the spiritus. Hot, mobile and passive, it is identified with the organic soul. Rejecting the distinctions made by Galen between various abstract faculties, Campanella states that the spiritus is singular and has its seat in the brain, from where, flowing through very subtle nerve channels, it accomplishes its multiple functions, both vital and cognitive. By means of the sense organs, it comes into contact with external reality; all passions and cognition derive from the modifications that it undergoes. Every sensation is a form of “contact” on the part of the spiritus, that enters into a relation, via various sense organs, with the exhalations, motions and light coming from external objects. The sensations that the spiritus experiences are the source of all cognition: memory, imagination, reason and the intellect itself, which is nothing but weakened and distilled sense. There is no need to postulate different and specific faculties for such operations, since they are all functions of the same sentient soul, that is capable of preserving the modifications and impressions it receives and of reviving and re-using them when similar situations arise.

When dealing with animals and human beings, Campanella underlies affinities as well as differences. He takes delight in producing evidence of the extraordinary capacities of animals. Furnished with sense organs that in some cases are superior to those of humans, animals are able to achieve wondrous and ingenious things; they adopt forms of collective organization; they know how to make use of medical and military arts; moreover, they are endowed with a form of reasoning, of language, of natural prophecy and even of religion. These analogies should not, however, obscure or cast doubt on the excellence of the human condition. Humans are furnished with a spiritus that is far more refined and pure than that of animals; it is able to move with agility within more spacious brain cells, enabling humans to develop more complex chains of argument. The authentic and radical difference between animals and humans, however, consists in the fact that the latter are endowed, not only with a spiritus, but also with an immaterial mens (mind) of divine origin, that constitutes and is the basis of their specific makeup. Humans do not exhaust all their capacities within the frame of the natural world. They can project themselves by means of thought and desire toward the infinite. They are able to go beyond the limits of natural self-preservation and turn themselves toward higher goods and ends. Above all, humans are free. In contrast to what happens to animals, who are unable to disengage themselves from the demands of the senses, humans can repel the compulsion of the passions in order to make choices that go beyond simple practical advantage and the immediate satisfaction of needs. Humans can resist the siren song, as did Ulysses who tied himself to the stake of reason.

The fourth book of Del senso delle cose is devoted to natural magic. Approaching the theme of magic, Campanella begins by deploring the vile and decadent condition into which this very noble science has fallen. In modern times, the name magician is given to “superstitious friends of demons” who, instead of dedicating themselves to the patient study of nature, prefer to take a “short cut” by asking demons for things that they cannot provide but that they promise and pretend to be able to do. Della Porta’s attempt to restore this doctrine was entirely praiseworthy but remained insufficient, because he restricted himself to speaking about these arguments solely in a descriptive and empirical manner without supplying philosophical explanations of phenomena. In listing the most bizarre occult properties of minerals, plants and animals in the magical tradition, della Porta maintained that it was not possible to offer a rational explanation of the relations of sympathy and antipathy, of affinity and repulsion, that exist between natural entities and limited himself to delighting in the spectacle and entertainment provided by nature. Campanella, however, took it on himself to reinterpret this tradition in light of his doctrine of the sense of things and of the spiritus. As Pliny the Elder had noted (Natural History, XXX.i-ii), magic, an ancient form of wisdom of Persian origin, is constructed from the convergence of three doctrines: religion, that purifies the soul and imprints faith, honor and reverence on the souls of those toward whom the magical operation is directed; medicine, that makes it possible to understand the powers of herbs, stones and metals; and, finally, astrology, a knowledge of which is indispensable for producing well-timed actions by selecting the most favorable disposition of the stars. Magic is a wisdom that is at the same time speculative and practical, that applies its own body of knowledge to works that are useful to humankind. It can be divided into three types: divine, natural, deceitful and diabolical. Essential both for divine and natural magic is a genuine faith, which requires purity of heart and an intrinsic adherence on the part of the soul to the divinity. Such faith, which renders human beings divine, confers on them the capacity to perform operations on things and transform them according to their own desires (Del senso delle cose, pp. 221–22, 226–29). At the opposite pole to divine magic is the type that is playful and deceitful, thanks to which charlatans skillfully produce effects that stupefy ignorant people. These swindlers cause a leg to burst into flames, though in truth the leg is artificial; they place a nail in their eye and another in their mouth, pretending that it has passed from one to the other; they seem to be pierced by fake daggers and swords; and, using the laws of optics, they make it possible to see distant images.

Beyond these deceits, that are believed to be genuine solely by the masses and that turn out to be “useless fictions”, the nucleus of the book is natural magic. On the one hand, it is connected to the arts and sciences: all wondrous inventions appear at first to be the result of magical operations, until their true causes are discovered. On the other hand, its particular sphere is the knowledge of unusual and arcane events. Natural magic, by means of its body of knowledge, is able to produce specific alterations in the mobile and tenuous spiritus, which is capable of submitting to and receiving any impression. The basic passions are pain and joy, love and hate, hope and fear. The magician is someone who has the ability to act on these passions by employing herbs, phrases, actions and anything else that might be suitable. This person will know how to increase bodily powers, suggesting foods, drinks, climates, sounds, herbal and animal remedies that aid and strengthen vital energies and counseling against anything that has to do with putrefaction and death.

The durability of sense in entities and in the air in latent forms—as if asleep, waiting to be reawakened on specific occasions—explains facts that are only apparently miraculous, such as the bleeding of a corpse in the presence of the murder: the victim, if alerted through the air to the proximity of his killer, is again agitated by anger and fear, discharging blood. Also linked to the durability of affects and sense is the efficacy of the weapon salve, attributed to Paracelsus, by means of which a wound can be healed by putting ointment on the weapon that caused it, as if the spiritus enclosed in the wound acquires confidence by feeling the cure via the air and experiences “almost the joy of revenge”. It is also possible to explain a celebrated example found in every book on magic: a drum made of sheep skin falls to pieces when a drum made of wolf skin is sounded, reawakening its former fear (Del senso delle cose, pp. 253–59).

The profound alterations that animal spirits can undergo explain the true and proper transformations that occur in someone who has been bitten by a rabid dog or in peasants from Puglia attacked by tarantulas. Campanella gives a very precise description of what happens to those bitten by tarantulas, based on eye-witness accounts of the phenomenon: they become weak, dancing and jumping to the sound of various musical instruments, until they collapse in exhaustion. In both cases acrid spirits introduced into the wound produce an alteration of the temperament and the imagination of the unfortunate victims, in whose bodies the animal spirits of the creatures that have attacked them take the upper hand in a manner that is at variance with those already there. By means of dancing and sweating, those bitten by tarantulas endeavor to expel the infected vapors. Usually, however, the symptoms remain as long as the cause that produced them persists; and only the death of the spider that stung them will bring a true remission of their suffering. The connection between general and particular causes is confirmed again by the odd case of the medical school of Tropea in southern Italy, in which a nose was grafted onto a man who had lost his due to a wound. The doctors reconstructed the new nose from flesh taken from the arm of a servant. The new nose took root and lived; but when the servant died, it putrefied, demonstrating that the life that it had received from the new organism in which it was inserted did not annihilate its original and deep-rooted connection to the life of the servant.

4. The Calabrian Conspiracy and Prophecy in The City of the Sun

After having submitted to an inquest in Naples over his advocacy of Telesian philosophy in 1592, Campanella went first to Rome, then to Florence and Padua, where, at the beginning of 1594, he was denounced and arrested for heresy. In October he was transferred to a prison of the Roman Inquisition, in which the “heretical” Florentine Francesco Pucci and the philosopher Giordano Bruno were imprisoned. In a sonnet entitled “Al carcere” (“To Jail”), Campanella could not but reflect on the fact that free spirits who, abandoning the stagnant waters of a traditional culture in order to hurl themselves boldly into the “sea of truth”, found themselves enclosed, as if by a tragic and fatal destiny, in the dismal palace of the Inquisition, that he compares to the cave of Polyphemus, the labyrinth of Crete and the palace of Atlas (Poesie, 1998, p. 254). Accused of supporting atomist and atheist doctrines, he was condemned in 1595 “on grave suspicion of heresy” and forced to make a formal public abjuration. At the end of 1597 the superiors of the Dominican Order commanded him to return to Calabria.

Almost thirty years of age and after ten years of absence, Campanella returned to Stilo on August 15, 1598. The next year he was involved in the most dramatic events of his life. He became convinced by his reading of astrological and prophet texts that announced profound changes, by the appearance of abnormal celestial signs and natural events and, above all, by the miserable and unjust condition of the population and by serious social and political disorders that the end of the century would bring a period of great upheaval. A vast conspiracy, of which he was indisputably the spiritual leader, was organized with the aim of transforming the province into a republic and removing it from the tyrannical rule of the king of Spain. The plot never got underway because on August 10, 1599 it was revealed to the Spanish authorities by two of the conspirators. After frenzied attempts to escape, Campanella was arrested. In November four galleys arrived at the port of Naples carrying dozens of prisoners. Some were dangling, having been hanged from banners; others were dismembered in the port, a pitiless reminder to the crowd who, full of curiosity and horror, had come to see the terrible spectacle.

In defending himself, Campanella firmly denied the accusation of rebellion, maintaining that he had not acted out of personal ambition or malevolence toward the king but rather had been following human and divine prophecies. Astrological tables had predicted an unusual succession of eclipses in the first years of the new century. According to a famous prognostication, De eversione Europae, attributed to Antonius Arquatus, that had foretold events such as the coming of Luther and the Sack of Rome, the Turks, after a period of continual ascent, at the time of their fifteenth sultan would be divided between the two sons of their sovereign—just as the moon, their emblem, halfway through its course begins to divide into two horns—one of whom would become an adherent of Christianity, while the other would be defeated by the king of Spain. Recently, the prophecy of Abbot Ubertino of Otranto had been miraculously recovered and predicted great political changes, the coronation of a new king in France and the beginning of the sixth age of the Church. The year 1600, moreover, appeared to be a crucial moment, a “great turning-point” in time, in that it was composed of a hundred times seven and nine, both of which were fatal numbers according to Pythagoras and Plato.

In the second of two written defences, Campanella sought to justify and legitimate his own initiative by placing it within a prophetic context, so that it would not be regarded as an act of rebellion, which would entail the death penalty. He later developed this work as the Articuli prophetales, but during his trial he decided that presenting it to his judges would be a futile effort. Instead, he resorted to a clever ploy in order to avoid capital punishment. The death penalty could not be inflicted on those deemed insane because, since they were not in a position to repent, the judges would be responsible for the eternal damnation of their souls. Clinging to this judicial cavil, Campanella pretended for many months to be out of his mind. His condition was, in the end, confirmed by means of a horrible form of torture, called the “vigil” because, in addition to the bodily suffering that was inflicted, victims were also subjected to prolonged sleep deprivation. He would refer to this terrible moment in his life as proof of the freedom of the human will, that cannot be bowed even by the most extreme physical pressure. Although disillusioned and embittered by the catastrophic result of his noble Calabrian plan, Campanella questioned himself about the reasons for this failure, reflecting on the role of the prophet who, as bearer of an uncomfortable and unpleasant message for those in power, cannot avoid being persecuted and put to death. Having achieved the supreme good of preserving his life, he wrote his most famous work, The City of the Sun, in the form of a “poetical dialogue” between a Genoese sailor who had accompanied Columbus on his voyage to America and a Knight Hospitaller. It first appeared in Latin translation as the appendix to his Politica, published in Frankfurt in 1623. His aim was to describe an ideal model of society that, in contrast to the violence, disorder and irrationality of the real world, was in harmony with nature, understood as an expression of God’s intrinsic “art” and wisdom. He was, in fact, convinced that present-day society was a labyrinth of injustice and unhappiness precisely because it had deviated from this natural model. The more a city constituted a “body politic,” the happier it would be, with its individual parts integrated so as to form a unitary organism and its various limbs, diversified according to function, entirely coordinated to serve the communal well-being.

Protected and defended by seven circles of walls, constructed of palaces that serve as dwellings for the citizens, the city is located in a place with an ideal climate, conducive to physical health, and on the slope of a hillside because the air there is lighter and purer. One of the most significant aspects of this community is the distribution of work. Once again Campanella engages in an explicit polemic with Aristotle, who had excluded artisans, peasants and those involved in manual labor from the category of full citizenship and from the highest levels of virtue. In the City of the Sun no occupation is vile or base, and all are of equal dignity—in fact, those workers who are required to expend greater effort, such as artisans and builders, receive more praise. Everyone must be acquainted with all lines of work, and then each person practices the one for which he shows the greatest aptitude. They have no servants, and no service is regarded as unworthy. The only thing that they consider to be despicable is idleness, and in this way they come to privilege the dignity of work and to overturn an absurd conception of nobility, linked to inactivity and vice. Thanks to the equal division of labor, it is sufficient for each person to spend only four hours a day working; but it is essential that they all work, because the idleness of one would have repercussions on the profit and the effort of the others. The citizens possess nothing; instead, everything is held in common, from food to houses, from the acquisition of knowledge to the exercise of activities, from honors to amusements, from women to children. There are “officials” in charge of the distribution of each thing, who keep an eye out and make sure that this happens justly, but no one can appropriate anything for himself. According to them, possession of a house or a family reinforces “self-love”, with all the dire consequences this generates. They live “like philosophers in common” because they are aware of the negative impact, not only on the social but also on the moral level, of an unequal distribution of goods.

One of the most spectacular and imaginative aspects of The City of the Sun, which immediately struck its readers, are the painted walls of the city. Apart from enclosing and protecting the city, the walls are also the curtains of an extraordinary theater and the pages of an illustrated encyclopedia of knowledge. The walls of the palaces are painted with images of the all the arts and sciences. Starting with the wall that holds up the columns of the temple and gradually descending in large circles, following the order of the planets from Mercury to Saturn, we encounter illustrations of the heavens and the stars, of mathematical figures, of every country on earth and of all the marvels and secrets of the mineral, vegetable and animal worlds, until we arrive at mankind: on the internal wall of the sixth circle the mechanical arts and their inventors are represented. Campanella was greatly interested in all ingenious discoveries, and in The City of the Sun he provides many examples of curious inventions, such as vessels able to navigate without wind and without sails, and stirrups that make it possible to guide a horse using only one’s feet, leaving one’s hands free. On the external wall legislators are depicted; and it is here, in “a place of great honor”—but along with Moses, Osiris, Jove, Mercury and Muhammad—that the Genoese sailor recognizes Christ and the twelve apostles. Knowledge is not enclosed in books kept in separate places such as libraries but is openly on show to everyone’s eyes. Visualizing in this manner promotes a quicker, easier and more efficient form of learning, in that it is connected to the art of memory, which underlines the evocative and emotive power of images. From a tender age children run around in this theater of knowledge, appropriately guided and following correct itineraries, so that they learn joyously, as if playing a game, without effort or pain.

In addition to the community of goods and the painted walls, another characteristic feature of the City of the Sun, one that is more difficult and disconcerting and that Campanella himself describes as “hard and arduous”, is the community of wives. This is the solution adopted by the citizens to the problem of generation. Echoing the teaching of the Pythagorean Ocellus Lucanus, Campanella says that they are amazed that humans are preoccupied by the breeding of horses and dogs while neglecting their own. The act of generation entails a large responsibility of the part of the parents; and if it is exercised in an incorrect manner, it can give rise to a long chain of suffering. Moreover, there is a close connection between a person’s natural “complexion” or character, which is inborn and not afterwards modifiable, and moral virtue, which needs a suitable terrain in order to take root and prosper. Generation should therefore respect precise norms and not be entrusted to chance nor to individual sentiments. The citizens distinguish between love and sex. Affection between men and women, based on friendship and respect more than sexual attraction, is expressed in acts that are far removed from sexuality, such as exchanges of gifts, conversation and dancing. Sexual generation, on the other hand, must obey strict rules regarding the physical and moral qualities of the parents and the choice of a propitious time for conception, determined by an astrologer. Such a union is not the expression of a personal, emotional or passionate relationship, but rather is connected to the social responsibility of generation and to love for the collective community.

The religious beliefs of the citizenry, even though they include fundamental principles of Christianity such as the immortality of the soul and divine providence, form a natural religion that establishes a sort of osmosis between the city and the stars. The temple is open and not surrounded by walls. In one of his poems Campanella promises: “I shall make the heavens a temple and the stars an altar” (Poesie, 1998, p. 327). On the vault of the temple’s dome the stars are depicted together with their influence on earthly affairs. The altar, on which are placed a celestial and a terrestrial globe, is in the form of the sun. Prayers are directed toward the heavens. The task of the twenty-four priests, who live in cells located in the highest part of the temple, is to observe the stars and, using astronomical instruments, to take account of all their movements. It is their job to indicate the times most favorable for generation and for agricultural labors, acting in this way as intermediaries between God and human beings.

5. The Universal Monarchy

The City of the Sun is Campanella’s best-known work today, but it is not the only expression of his political thought, which was multifaceted and which evolved over the course of his life, from his youthful days until his final years of exile in Paris. An important textual consideration is that while Campanella started writing his utopia in Italian soon after being sentenced to life imprisonment, at more or less the same time he was working on a series of political aphorisms, also in Italian. He eventually translated both texts into Latin, placing the Civitas Solis as an appendix to the aphorisms, which now took the form of a treatise covering both theoretical and practical aspects of politics and government. The Politica and its appendix, together with four political quaestiones in which he also theorized about the utopian genre, constitute the third part of his Philosophia realis (Frankfurt, 1623; Paris, 1637). The shared trajectory of his general treatise on politics and his utopia provides a clear indication of how different aspects and expressions of his political thought were intertwined.

While the Politica was Campanella’s most analytic treatise on the subject, he also articulated his political ideas in many other writings. Apart from numerous works linked to particular moments in the complex itinerary of his life and his thought, his political writings form part of a more general philosophical framework, which often makes it difficult to consider them on their own, since they are located in a zone that borders on theology, ethics and natural philosophy. It is not surprising, therefore, that it is precisely in this area, so full of contradictions and ambiguities, that the debate among his interpreters is most lively and most enflamed by polemics. It is difficult to reconcile the prophet of the Calabrian conspiracy, who, reading celestial and natural signs, proclaimed the advent of an epoch of profound renewal, with the defender of the unconditional primacy of the papacy; or the thinker who believed in the “idea” of a philosophical republic in which everything would be governed according to nature with the supporter of a universal monarchy under the king of Spain; or, finally, the harsh critic of Machiavelli, whom he accused of having cut the bonds between politics, ethics and religion, with the subtle politician who in his writings frequently supported some of the most unscrupulous Machiavellian maxims. Campanella’s reading of Machiavelli left such an impression on his works that even his early readers did not hesitate to define him as a “harsh critic and at the same time a disguised master of Machiavelli’s precepts” (Hermann Conring’s introduction to the Latin translation of Machiavelli’s Prince, in his Opera, 5 vols, Braunschweig 1730, II, p. 979) and to affirm that he had relaunched on the scene, suitably camouflaged and consequently in a more insidious manner, the same principles that Machiavelli had had the courage to express without disguise (Conring, De civili prudentia, in his Opera, III, p. 41).

There is no doubt that Campanella’s reflections on Machiavelli, and on “politicians” in general, constituted one of the most forceful aspects of his thought. His deliberations focused, above all, on two closely connected points. On the one hand, he underlined the philosophical limits of Machiavelli’s theories—limits that made his political constructions inherently fragile. On the other hand, he developed and inserted into a Catholic and Counter-Reformation context an element that was already present in Machiavelli, especially in his Discourses on the First Decade of Livy: the view of religion as one of the most powerful bonds in the human community.

Both these elements are found in a central text of Campanella’s political thought, the Monarchia di Spagna (Monarchy of Spain). Right from the outset, he expresses the doctrine of the three causes that are at the origin of political associations—God, prudence and expediency—in order to highlight the inadequacy of a vision of history, characteristic of politicians, that is limited solely to human causes. The first cause, that rules and governs the others and that is always present, even if in hidden ways, in all historical events is, of course, God. This means that a skillful and shrewd politician must endeavor to integrate empirical causes into more general ones. To this end, it is indispensable to have recourse to the “highest sciences” of prophecy and of astrology, that enable one to insert particular events into a universal background.

Appealing to biblical texts, Campanella maintains that the Spanish sovereign can aspire to the monarchy of the world if he takes inspiration from the model of Cyrus, invested by God, as Isaiah (45.1) confirms, with the mission of liberating the Church from infidels and of bringing together all peoples under a single faith. For the Catholic king the only practical way of achieving his own universal plans is through a firm accord with the Church and with the pope, following the example of Constantine and Charlemagne. Campanella further stresses that religion is the most powerful bond of political unity. Machiavelli, too, had emphasized the strength of this bond, when analyzing the events of the Roman Republic, but then had condemned the Christian religion as a cause of weakness, strife and divisions. Campanella has no doubt that religion, whether true or false, is the primary and most powerful unifying force in the political body, in that it rules over souls and brings them together, and that all other ties between human beings depend on it.

The two other primary causes of political associations are prudence and expediency. Here another key element in Campanella’s thought comes into play: the return to nature. Political associations, like all other natural entities, are living organisms. The main task of political action will therefore be to promote the most effective union among its members. The virtue specific to this activity is prudence, which has the job of reinforcing natural bonds and coming up with unifying techniques designed to strengthen the ties of individuals with the whole, of integrating unlike with like and of attenuating the most violent conflicts, so that the result is the correct functioning and prosperity of the entire organism. When he speaks of prudence, Campanella insists on distinguishing it from Machiavellian cunning and from “reason of state,” drawing on various clever and subtle contrasts and distinctions. While prudence is an instrument of organic unity, cunning and reason of state are nothing but techniques designed to affirm individualistic egoism and, for this reason, are doomed to failure, as is amply demonstrated by the tragic end of Machiavellian heroes, whose successes are revealed to be merely apparent or ephemeral, or by the sad life of tyrants, constantly plagued by suspicions and fears. The wise politician is one who, having as his aim the solidarity and well-being of the whole community, is in a position to promote three different types of bond. First of all, there is the bond of souls, achieved by the impetus given to the humanities and sciences and to religion. Secondly, there is the bond of bodies, in relation to which Campanella insists on the expediency of increasing marriages by all available means, encouraging unions between individuals of different physical constitution and temperament and between the Spanish and other nations, in order both to spread Spanishness to other nations and to temper the vices of the Spanish people, who often arouse hatred for their humility when serving and for their pride when commanding. The third bond is that of goods of fortune; here it is a case of encouraging the economic prosperity of people by means of developing commerce and especially navigation, the vital lymphatic system that makes it possible to unite distant lands and to connect the separate limbs of the empire.

The stance adopted by Campanella in relation to universal monarchy is directly linked to the prophetic ideal of re-uniting humanity in a “single fold under one shepherd.” The central text for this topic is Monarchia del Messia (Monarchy of the Messiah). The original unity of king and priest, which derives from the divine unity, permits human beings, after the multiplicity of sects introduced by the devil and fomented by ambition and ignorance, to return to a single priestly law, under which the entire human race can come together, transcending divisions and conflicts. According to Campanella, Adam and Hermes Trismegistus were simultaneously kings, priests and wise men. Uniting kingship and priesthood in the same person is extremely advantageous and auspicious, for the people will more willingly obey those whom they believe have their authority from God; and their laws will be more respected and observed, whether in public or in the inner sanctum of the human heart. The epoch in which a king-priest will reign is described by Campanella as a golden age, in which there will be an end to the evils that afflict humanity: wars will no longer have any reason to exist; famine and scarcity will cease because the barrenness of certain countries will be corrected and supplemented by the abundance of foodstuffs produced in other countries; plagues will disappear because it will be possible to transfer people to salubrious lands free from contagion; finally, there will be a wondrous flourishing of all forms of knowledge thanks to exchanges of information and to communication, bringing great benefits to humanity (Monarchia del Messia, pp. 62–63). The division and the separation of human beings are always the devil’s work; envious of the good that comes from unity, he induces people to forget that they are all children of the same God and of the same father, Adam, and therefore siblings.

6. Natural Religion: Atheism Conquered

One of Campanella’s most important works is Atheismus triumphatus (Atheism Conquered), written between 1606 and 1607. He himself regarded it as a watershed in his thinking, signaling his detachment from the more openly rationalist positions of his youth and his move toward a more sincere adherence to Christian principles. In letters written from prison, he describes the work as a “volume against politicians and Machiavellians” (Lettere, p. 26). Central to the work is his polemic against both reason of state and Machiavelli’s conception of religion as a political invention, a useful “fiction” devised by priests and princes to gain and maintain power. This polemic is coupled with the need to undertake a far-reaching rational examination, passing in review and evaluating all religious beliefs and philosophical doctrines in order to demonstrate that religion, in contrast to what politicians think, is a “natural virtue” inborn in human beings. A further motive of this research is to ascertain the relationship between natural religion and Christianity, which leads to the conclusion that there is no conflict between Christian law and natural law but instead a profound and fundamental agreement, since Christ did not nullify and abolish natural law but rather added to it moral precepts and rites that completed and perfected it.

On June 1, 1607 the treatise was dedicated to Kaspar Schoppe, a German scholar who had come to Naples in the spring of that year to make contact with the imprisoned Campanella, who informs us that Schoppe suggested the title by which the work is known—he himself had called it Recognoscimento della vera religione universale (Identification of the True Universal Religion). Written in Italian, the treatise was translated into Latin in the following years by Campanella himself; it was printed in Rome in 1631, then in Paris in 1636. The original Italian version has recently come to light, discovered in an autograph manuscript held in the Vatican Library. In the prefatory letter, addressed to Schoppe, Campanella weaves a moving account of the dramatic events his life into a powerful contrast between darkness and light: on the one hand, there is a dark age dominated by reason of state; on the other, there is a determination to kindle a light in order to distinguish truth from error, philosophers from sophists, princes from tyrants, religion from superstition. The first chapter acts as an introduction, setting out the different ways of dealing with religion. From the outset, two figures take center stage and come face to face as the heroes and villains of the story: philosophers and politicians. The latter deny God and his providence, maintaining that all religions are political in origin. Such doctrines, based on self-love, are extremely difficult to eradicate and constitute the plague of every age, since their supporters refuse to engage in any dialogue, closed within the arrogant certainty of possessing the truth. Diametrically opposed to them are the philosophers, who believe that there is only one true and certain truth, that is natural and common to all. Uncertain when it comes to supernatural dogmas, they live in a virtuous manner in conformity with nature. Without doing harm to anyone, they endeavor to accomplish works that are honest and beneficial to the human race. Since they have no desire for honors or wealth, “they live content with little and enjoy contemplation, and they have more esteem for themselves than for a king or a pope or a monarch.”

The second chapter, one of the most famous and widely discussed in the treatise, ushers us into the heart of the matter. It contains a dense series of arguments against religion in general and Christianity in particular. These objections are presented in such a crude light and in a succession so beleaguered by questions that they provoked perplexity and anxiety, in both Catholic and Protestant camps, even before the book was published. After the objections have been listed, the replies to them are given in the central and concluding chapters. The remaining chapters of the first part are devoted to demonstrating that religion is natural and inherent in every aspect of nature, which is the expression of divine craftsmanship. From the axiom of the existence of God as Reason and Wisdom diffused in every aspect of reality derive corollaries concerning the “vestiges” of the Trinity that shine forth in every natural entity; the rationality of the Incarnation; the influence of providence on the world, which is the theater and effigy of the divinity, not a dark labyrinth of suffering; the non-existence of death and the relativity of evil, which is connected to non-being, itself necessary in order to distinguish between things; the deep solidarity of human beings with nature but at the same time their inherent divinity and eminence that enables them to elevate themselves to a higher world. Next comes the vexed problem of the immortality of the soul, a certainty arrived at by paths that are different from those of the Aristotelian tradition and that insist on the distinctiveness of humans as the sole beings able to transcend their own natural limits and gain awareness of their relationship to the infinite. In the ninth chapter Campanella reaffirms, against any skeptical position, that the existence of many false religions is not a sufficient reason for concluding that all religions are fundamentally false, just as the lack of skill on the part of many doctors does not demonstrate the falsity of medicine. If it is true that there are differences between the various religions, with their distinctive rites and supernatural beliefs, it is also true that “human beings have a natural inclination toward justice and toward living within a religion” and that religion is part “of the law of nature”. A confirmation that religion is natural is provided by the fact that it is the indispensable foundation and connective tissue of every political organization, which would not be able to survive and would dissolve without religion. The central chapters then attempt to prove that positive laws are nothing but special cases of the same primary law of nature, since if they are reasonable and just, they participate in the Divine Word, source of all rationality and all virtue. If there is only one natural law and it depends on the unique eternal law, all humans, if they live according to reason, are implicitly and explicitly Christians. Christianity is not one sect among many, but rather, as the explication of the Word, coincides with natural religion, completed and perfected by supernatural beliefs, dogmas and ceremonies that are not alien to rationality and to nature. Christianity, whether on account of its simplicity and the universality of its moral message or because its ceremonial apparatus completes and perfects nature, turns out to be the religion that is most in conformity with nature and, consequently, opens up the possibility of a confluence of all beliefs in one universal religion common to all peoples.

Over the course of the almost thirty years that intervened between the composition of Atheismus triumphatus and the publication of the definitive Paris edition of 1636, the treatise had to overcome many obstacles, following a tortuous itinerary, due to the suspicions of the ecclesiastical authorities, who accused the work of Pelagianism and thus of excessively exalting the natural capacities of humans and diminishing divine grace by restricting it to far too narrow confines. The work was not published despite the initiative of Schoppe; nor was it among those that appeared in Frankfurt between 1617 and 1623 due to the efforts of Tobias Adami. With the failure of these attempts, Campanella thought of publishing it in Italy; but the treatise still had to face numerous difficulties and to be censored more than once before it came out in the Rome edition of 1631, which was soon afterwards impounded. After repeated entreaties to put the book back into circulation, Campanella took the decision to reprint it in Paris; and Atheismus triumphatus was published, along with other writings, at the beginning of 1636 in a volume dedicated to Louis XIII.

7. The Years of Imprisonment in Naples and the Sojourns in Rome and Paris

During the twenty-seven years he spent imprisoned in Neapolitan castles (1599–1626), Campanella dedicated himself to the huge task of providing a new foundation for the entire encyclopedia of knowledge, writing, in addition to the works already mentioned, texts dealing with medicine, astrology, practical religion (in Quod reminiscentur he addressed eloquent appeals to members of all the religions of the world, aimed at persuading them to abandon irrational beliefs and to come together in Christian rationality), the Metaphysica, later printed in Paris, and a theological treatise in thirty books, whose publication, begun in the middle of the nineteenth century, is still in progress. One of the most interesting of his works is the Apologia per Galileo (Defense of Galileo). Written in 1616, when difficulties relating to natural theology first began to amass around Copernican and Galilean doctrines, and printed in Frankfurt in 1622, the Apologia represents an act of great courage and intellectual honesty on Campanella’s part, since he took up this delicate issue while he was still in prison and, furthermore, was not even defending his own doctrines. His own image of the book of nature, conceived as a living and organic entity, was far from Galileo’s picture of a book written in mathematical characters. Rather than a defense of heliocentrism, about which Campanella harbored grave reservations on account of its incompatibility with Telesian physics, the Apologia is a defense of the intellectual and academic freedom (libertas philosophandi) of Galileo and, more generally, of all Christian natural philosophers, whose first right and duty is to give preference to reading the book of nature over studying the books written by human beings. With great clarity, Campanella identifies the nub of the problem as the unjustified dogmatic value conferred on Aristotelian philosophy which, like all human doctrines, does not possess absolute and definitive certainty. All philosophies, in fact, must be modified, corrected or abandoned in light of our reading of the book of nature. In this brief work he draws on his immense theological knowledge to rethink in a profound and lucid manner the relationship between philosophy, science and theology. In a virtuoso demonstration of his hermeneutic abilities—on account of which the treatise in many places difficult going for the reader, who is in danger of getting lost in the thick tangle of citations—Campanella attempts to show how the longstanding union of theology and Aristotelian philosophy, regarded by theologians as necessary and unalterable, is in reality precarious, dated and in need of revision. Such a revision would pose no risk to theology; on the contrary, theology will be harmed by an obstinate and blind adherence to a system of physics that is no longer in agreement with new data and that rejects new discoveries. Abandoning Aristotelian philosophy not only would not bring about the collapse of theology, it would permit the recovery of a correct conception of science, one that must consist, as it did for Galileo, in a continual reading of the infinite book of nature, which is the expression of the infinite truth and of Christian rationality. On this basis Campanella invited Christianity to accept the rational and natural values of science with confidence and without unjustified fears, if it intended to set itself up as the authentic expression of Christ as the Word of God.

Freed from prison in Naples in 1626, Campanella moved to Rome, where he lived until 1634. The most notorious episode of his Roman sojourn was connected to Pope Urban VIII’s desire to take advantage of his astrological expertise in order to counter the ever more insistent predictions of his imminent death, based on the inauspicious disposition of the stars. Called to the papal palace, Campanella put into effect the natural magic practices described in his short treatise De siderali fato vitando (How To Avoid the Fate Dictated by the Stars). Reprising themes borrowed from Marsilio Ficino, who had taught how to attract the favor of the stars, Campanella proposed to teach how to avoid the evils threatened by the stars through taking suitable precautions. The most famous and controversial pages of this work, since they deal with practices used on the pope, are those in which Campanella suggests remedies against the possible harm caused by eclipses and comets. When an eclipse appears to threaten a specific person, he counsels using every precaution to prevent the seeds carried in the polluted air from finding a favorable terrain and producing their noxious effects. He then explains how to demarcate a separate space that will be impenetrable to malign influences. With the doors and windows sealed, the air should be purified by sprinkling perfumes and scents and by burning aromatic woods such as laurel, myrtle, rosemary and cypress. In the room, decorated with foliage and fabric of white silk, one should set alight two lamps, five torches and other lights in order to represent the planets of the zodiac. It will also be useful to seek out the company of friends who are not subject to the negative effects of the eclipse, to play music connected with Jupiter and Venus, and to have recourse to all those “enticements,” connected with plants, stones, colors and odors, capable of attracting beneficent influences and countering malign ones. If the darkness of the eclipse seems to suspend and interrupt the life that flows from the heavens, it will be necessary to secure protection by constructing a sort of artificial sky. De fato was published in Lyons in 1629 as the seventh and final book of Campanella’s Astrologia. This risked compromising the pope himself by involving him in accusations of superstitious practices. Campanella was quick to write an Apologeticus in which he attempted to demonstrate that the practices recommended in De fato were not superstitious but rather entirely natural. In a further effort to avert any scandal, in the early months of 1632 Urban VIII hurriedly promulgated an extremely severe bull, Inscrutabilis, directed against astrologers. The pope also had Don Orazio Morandi, abbot of the monastery of Santa Prassede, in which astrological practices were entangled with shady political intrigues, imprisoned and put to death (see the introduction to Campanella, Opuscoli astrologici, pp. 41–42).

Following new threats from the Spanish, in 1634 Campanella was forced to go into exile in Paris. There he devoted his energies to the publication of his works, bringing out a new edition of the Philosophia realis in four parts, accompanied by quaestiones; reprints of De sensu rerum and of Atheismus triumphatus; Philosophia rationalis in five parts (Dialectica, Grammatica, Rhetorica, Poetica and Historiographia); and, above all, the Metaphysica, which he described with legitimate pride in the dedicatory letter as the “philosophers’ bible.” This is a vast and complex work, in which the most important themes of his thought come together and in which he sets out the doctrine of the “primalities” (primalitates), the constituent principles of the Supreme Being and of all other created beings. God, the first infinite cause, has his essence in the principles of Power, Wisdom and Love in an infinite manner. Every finite being is composed of these same primalities but in ways and proportions that are limited and differentiated. Nothingness does not exist either in God or outside of him; but he makes use of it to construct the finiteness and the distinctiveness of entities. After the explanation of the doctrine of the primalities comes that of the three great influences: Necessity, Fate and Harmony, the vehicles by which the divine Idea, in all its infinite degrees, is conveyed to the world and to matter. In the light of these doctrines, Campanella re-examines fundamental issues such as the relationship between necessity and contingency and between human freedom, fate and providence, as well as problems concerning evil and sin.

During his years in Paris Campanella’s interest in politics and in prophecy, subjects close to his heart, resurfaced. In the two year period from 1635 to 1636 there was a remarkable blossoming of political writings, different in style and persuasive power, but sharing in common certain similar themes. Making a comparative analysis of the two great European powers, Spain and France, he shows that Spain is on the downward slope of an inexorable decline, while its adversary is in the ascendant phase of “mounting success” and, as the new superpower, is exhorted to assume the role of re-unifying the Christian flock and asserting itself as the champion of liberty against the tyranny of Spanish-Habsburg rule. There are two points in particular that most dramatically reveal the fatal decline of Spain: it has not known either how to spread Spanishness to other nations or to how to manage economy affairs effectively. While the ancient Romans were masters of gradually accumulating populations and making them participants in the empire, the Spanish, on account of their immense pride, spurn any integration whatever with other peoples. Because of their unwillingness to adopt the shrewd political tactic of mixed marriages that Campanella had suggested in the Monarchia di Spagna, an alarming demographic contraction has occurred due to the loss of soldiers in war and the infertility of women, so that the Spanish population, formerly numbering eight million, has now been reduced to half that figure. Because of the scarcity of the populace, they have have induced—and this is a very serious consequence—to destroy and depopulate the countries that they conquer in the New World. Chosen by divine providence to evangelize the entire world, the Spanish have betrayed their mission, transforming themselves into executioners and instruments of divine wrath. An even greater condemnation of Spanish politics is its disastrous economic policy. In the Monarchia di Spagna Campanella had already said that the gold of the New World had ruined the Old Word, generating greed for riches and therefore weakening the ties and solidarity between humans. In his later works he repeated the view that affluence had exacerbated social inequalities, together with the vices that derive from them.

At the request of Cardinal Richelieu, Campanella wrote and dedicated to him a short treatise on chiromancy, entitled Chiroroscopia; and on the occasion of the long-awaited birth of the Dauphin, the future Sun King, Louis XIV, he composed a lengthy Latin Eclogue, in which he returned to the prophetic themes that had always been dear to him. In these verses he once again predicted the advent of an epoch of unity and peace: impiety, deception, lying and disputes would be abolished; work, distributed among everyone, would be turned from painful labor into a game; lambs would no longer fear wolves; and sovereigns would rule for the benefit of their people. Aware of dire presages connected to the coming of a solar eclipse, he sought to avert the impending dangers; but he died at dawn on May 21, 1639.


Primary Literature: Campanella’s Works

There is no complete edition of Campanella’s works, and for many of them it is still necessary to consult early printed editions. The starting-point for a description of his writings remains Luigi Firpo, Bibliografia degli scritti di Tommaso Campanella (Turin: V. Bona, 1940), though it requires numerous additions and corrections. For Campanella editions published since 1990 see the journal Bruniana & Campanelliana (1995–).

The section ‘Testi’ in the online Archivio Tommaso Campanella offers access to digital facsimiles and/or transcriptions of most of Campanella’s works, with full bibliographical references for original and modern editions.

The most important editions of his writings are:

  • Aforismi politici, ed. L. Firpo (Turin: Istituto Giuridico dell’Università, 1941).
  • Apologia pro Galileo/A Defense of Galileo, ed. R. J. Blackwell (Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1994); Apologia pro Galileo/Apologie pour Galilée, ed. M.-P. Lerner (Paris: Les Belles Lettres, 2001); ed. M.-P. Lerner, Ital. transl. by G. Ernst (Pisa: Edizioni della Normale, 2006).
  • Articuli prophetales, ed. G. Ernst (Florence: La Nuova Italia, 1977).
  • Astrologicorum libri VII (Frankfurt: G. Tampachius, 1630; also in Opera latina, II, pp. 1081–1346).
  • L’ateismo trionfato, ed. G. Ernst, 2 vols (Pisa: Edizioni della Normale, 2004).
  • Atheismus triumphatus (Rome: apud haeredem B. Zannetti, 1631; repr. Pisa-Rome: Fabrizio Serra, 2013; Paris: T. Dubray, 1636).
  • La città del Sole, ed. L. Firpo; new ed. G. Ernst and L. Salvetti Firpo (Rome and Bari: Laterza, 1997); The City of the Sun, transl. by D.J. Donno (Berkeley and Los Angeles: University of California Press, 1981).
  • Compendium physiologiae – Compendio di filosofia della natura, Lat. text G. Ernst, Ital. transl. and notes P. Ponzio (Milan: Rusconi, 1999).
  • Del senso delle cose e della magia, ed. A. Bruers (Bari: Laterza, 1925); new ed. G. Ernst (Rome and Bari: Laterza, 2007).
  • Economica. Questioni economiche, ed. G. Ernst (Pisa-Rome: Fabrizio Serra, 2016).
  • Epilogo magno, ed. C. Ottaviano (Rome: Reale Accademia d’Italia, 1939).
  • Ethica. Quaestiones super Ethicam, ed. G. Ernst, in collaboration with O. Catanorchi (Pisa: Edizioni della Normale, 2011); Ital. transl.: Etica, transl. by G. Ernst (Pisa: Edizioni della Normale, 2015).
  • Lettere, ed. V. Spampanato (Bari: Laterza, 1927); new ed. G. Ernst (Florence: Olschki, 2010).
  • Liber apologeticus contra impugnantes Institutum Scholarum Piarum / Libro apologetico contro gli avversari dell’Istituto delle Scuole Pie, ed. M. Erto (Pisa-Rome: Fabrizio Serra, 2015).
  • Medicinalium libri VII (Lyon: I. Pillehotte, 1635).
  • Metaphysica (Paris: D. Langlois, 1638); facsimile ed. L. Firpo (Turin: Bottega d’Erasmo, 1961).
  • Monarchie d’Espagne et Monarchie de France, ed. G. Ernst, French transl. S. Waldbaum and N. Fabry (Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 1997).
  • La monarchia del Messia, ed. V. Frajese (Rome: Edizioni di Storia e Letteratura, 1995).
  • Monarchia Messiae, ed. P. Ponzio, French translation, V. Bourdette (Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 2002).
  • Opera latina Francofurti impressa annis 1617–1630, facsimile ed. L. Firpo (Turin: Bottega d’Erasmo, 1975); two volumes containing: I, Prodromus philosophiae instaurandae (ed. 1617), De sensu rerum et magia (ed. 1620), Apologia pro Galileo (ed. 1622); II, Philosophia realis epilogistica (ed. 1623), Astrologicorum l. VII (ed. 1630).
  • Opere letterarie, ed. L. Bolzoni (Turin: Utet, 1977).
  • Opuscoli astrologici. Come evitare il fato astrale; Apologetico; Disputa sulle Bolle, ed. G. Ernst (Milan: Rizzoli, 2003).
  • Philosophia rationalis (Paris: I. Dubray, 1638).
  • Philosophia realis (Paris: D. Houssaye, 1637).
  • Philosophia sensibus demonstrata, ed. L. De Franco (Naples: Vivarium, 1992).
  • Le poesie, ed. F. Giancotti (Turin: Einaudi, 1998; new ed. Milan: Bompiani, 2013; English translation by Sherry Roush in two parts: Selected Philosophical Poems, Chicago and London: University of Chicago Press, 2011; Pisa and Rome: Fabrizio Serra, 2011).
  • Prodromus philosophiae instaurandae, ed. with Ital. transl. by M. Perugini (Sarzana: Agorà & Co., 2016)
  • Quod reminiscentur et convertentur ad Dominum universi fines terrae, ed. R. Amerio, Books I–II (Padua: Cedam, 1939); Book III: Per la conversione degli Ebrei (Florence: Olschki,1955); Book IV: Legazioni ai Maomettani (Florence: Olschki, 1960).
  • De sensu rerum et magia (Frankfurt: G. Tampach, 1620; Paris: L. Boullenger, 1636; Paris: J. Dubray, 1637).
  • Syntagma de libris propriis et recta ratione studendi, ed. V. Spampanato (Milan and Florence: Bestetti e Tumminelli, 1927); Sintagma dei miei libri e sul corretto metodo di apprendere/ De libris propriis et recta ratione studendi syntagma, ed. G. Ernst (Pisa and Rome: Fabrizio Serra Editore, 2007).
  • Theologicorum libri, ed. R. Amerio and M. Muccillo (Rome: Centro di Studi Umanistici, 1949– ).
  • Tommaso Campanella, ed. G. Ernst, introd. N. Badaloni (Rome: Il Poligrafico e Zecca dello Stato, 1999) [an anthology of 16 texts].
  • Tre questioni politiche contro Aristotele, ed. G. Ernst, Bruniana & Campanelliana, XIX, 2013, pp. 591–698; Ital. transl., pp. 601–658; Latin text, pp. 659–697.
  • Tutte le opere. I. Scritti letterari, ed. L. Firpo (Milan: Mondadori, 1954) [the only volume published; it contains Le poesie, the Philosophia rationalis (except for the Dialectica) with an Italian translation].

Secondary Literature

Bibliographical information on studies of Campanella can be found in the following articles by Luigi Firpo: “Campanella nel Settecento,” Rinascimento, IV (1953): 105–54; “Campanella nel secolo XIX,” Calabria nobilissima, VI-X (1952-1956); “Cinquant’anni di studi sul Campanella: 1901–1950,”Rinascimento, VI (1955): 209–348; “Un decennio di studi sul Campanella: 1951–1960,” Studi secenteschi, III (1960): 125–64. An extensive bibliography is now also available in Ricci, 2018.

  • Amabile, Luigi, 1882, Fra Tommaso Campanella, la sua congiura, i suoi processi e la sua pazzia, 3 vols, Naples: Morano.
  • –––, 1887, Fra Tommaso Campanella ne’ castelli di Napoli, in Roma ed in Parigi, 2 vols, Naples: Morano.
  • Amerio, Romano 1972, Il sistema teologico di Tommaso Campanella, Milan-Naples: Ricciardi.
  • Badaloni, Nicola, 1965, Tommaso Campanella, Milan: Feltrinelli.
  • Blanchet, Léon, 1920, Campanella, Paris: Alcan.
  • Blum, Paul Richard, 2010, “Tommaso Campanella: God Makes Sense in the World,” in Philosophy of Religion in the Renaissance, Farnham: Ashgate, pp. 137–162.
  • Bock, Gisela, 1974, Thomas Campanella. Politisches Interesse und Philosophische Spekulation, Tübingen: M. Niemeyer.
  • Bonansea, Bernardino, 1969, Tommaso Campanella. Renaissance Pioneer of Modern Thought, Washington, D.C.: The Catholic University of America Press.
  • Canone, Eugenio and Germana Ernst (eds), 2006, 2010, 2017, Enciclopedia Bruniana e Campanelliana, 3 volumes, Pisa-Rome: Fabrizio Serra.
  • Cerbo, Anna (ed.), 2020, Studi campanelliani (per Germana Ernst), Rome: Aracne.
  • Corsano, Antonio, 1961, Tommaso Campanella, Bari: Laterza; 2001, new edition by D. M. Fazio, Galatina: Congedo.
  • Cro, Stelio, 1979, Tommaso Campanella e i prodromi della civiltà moderna, Hamilton: The Symposium Press.
  • De Lucca, Jean-Paul, 2009, “Prophetic Representation and Political Allegorisation: The Hospitaller in Campanella’s The City of the Sun,” Bruniana & Campanelliana, 15 (2): 387–405.
  • –––, 2012, “The Art of History Writing as the Foundation of the Sciences: Campanella’s Historiographia,” Bruniana & Campanelliana, 18 (2): 55–70.
  • –––, 2015a, “Corpo, spirito e anima-mente: l’antropologia della libertà in Campanella,” in E. Canone (ed.), Anima-corpo alla luce dell’etica: antichi e moderni, Firenze: Leo S. Olschki, pp. 247–263.
  • –––, 2015b, “Grotius and Campanella: A Footnote to Luigi Firpo,” Bruniana & Campanelliana, 21 (1): 25–34.
  • –––, 2017a, “‘Un fiume piccolissimo di quel mare immenso’: Universalism, Navigation and the Rethinking of the Mediterranean in Campanella,” Mediterranea: International Journal on the Transfer of Knowledge, 2: 17–33.
  • –––, 2017b, “‘Ad altiora nati sumus’: Practical Theology and Cultural Diplomacy in Campanella’s Legatio to China,” Bruniana & Campanelliana, 23 (2): 597–608.
  • –––, 2021, “Law and Religion in Bruno’s Spaccio de la Bestia trionfante and Campanella’s L’Ateismo trionfato,” in M. Traversino di Cristo (ed.), Giordano Bruno. Law, Philosophy and Theology in the Early Modern Era, Paris: Classiques Garnier, pp. 241–273.
  • De Mattei, Rodolfo, 1934, Studi campanelliani, Florence: Sansoni.
  • Di Napoli, Giovanni, 1947, Tommaso Campanella, filosofo della restaurazione cattolica, Padua: Cedam.
  • Ducros, Franc, 1969, Tommaso Campanella poète, Paris: Presses Universitaires de France.
  • Delumeau, Jean, 2008, Le mystère Campanella, Paris: Fayard.
  • Ernst, Germana, 1991, Religione, ragione e natura: ricerche su Tommaso Campanella e il tardo Rinascimento, Milan: Franco Angeli.
  • –––, 2002a, Il carcere il politico il profeta. Saggi su Tommaso Campanella, Pisa-Rome: Istituti Editoriali e Poligrafici Internazionali.
  • –––, 2002b, Tommaso Campanella: il libro e il corpo della natura, Bari-Rome: Laterza; Tommaso Campanella: Le livre et le corps de la nature (2007), French transl. by R. Lenoir, Paris: Les Belles Lettres; Tommaso Campanella: The Book and the Body of Nature (2010); Engl. transl. by D. Marshall, Dordrecht: Springer.
  • –––, 2015, “‘Maculae Galilei me perplexum habent’: Campanella, Sunspots and the Temptations of Pythagoreanism,” in M. McLaughlin, I.D. Rowland and E. Tarantino (eds.), Authority, Innovation and Early Modern Epistemology. Essays in Honour of Hilary Gatti, Cambridge: Legenda, pp. 170–185.
  • –––, 2016a, “‘Humilitas est magnes virtutum’. L’autoritratto del filosofo nell’ Ethica di Campanella,” Rivista di storia della filosofia, 71 (Supplement 4): 111–123.
  • –––, 2016b, “A Story in the History of Scholarship: The rediscovery of Tommaso Campanella,” in C. Muratori and G. Paganini (eds.), Early Modern Philosophers and the Renaissance Legacy, Dordrecht: Springer, pp. 277–292.
  • –––, 2018, “Life in Prison: Cardano, Tasso and Campanella,” in A. Ossa-Richardson and M. Meserve, Et Amicorum. Essays on Renaissance Humanism and Philosophy in Honour of Jill Kraye, Leiden-Boston: Brill, pp. 338-354.
  • ––– (ed.), 2001, Tommaso Campanella e la congiura di Calabria, Stilo: Comune di Stilo.
  • Ernst, Germana, and Caterina Fiorani (eds), 2008, Laboratorio Campanella. Biografia. Contesti. Iniziative in corso, Rome: L’Erma di Bretschneider.
  • Firpo, Luigi, 1947, Ricerche campanelliane, Florence: Sansoni.
  • –––, 1998, I processi di Tommaso Campanella, E. Canone (ed.), Rome: Salerno.
  • Fournel, Jean-Louis, 2012, La cité du soleil et les territoires des hommes. Le savoir du monde chez Campanella, Paris: Albin Michel.
  • Frajese, Vittorio, 2002, Profezia e machiavellismo: il giovane Campanella, Rome: Carocci.
  • Gatti, Paola, 2010, Il gran libro del mondo nella filosofia di Tommaso Campanella, Rome: Gregorian and Biblical Press.
  • Giglioni, Guido, 2007, “Healing and Belief in Tommaso Campanella’s Philosophy,” Intellectual History Review, 17 (3): 225–238.
  • –––, 2010, “The Anatomical Foundations of Tommaso Campanella’s Theory of Magic,” Revista Portugeusa de Filosofia, 66 (1): 9–24.
  • Hagengruber, Ruth, 1994, Tommaso Campanella: Eine Philosophie der Ähnlichkeit, Sankt Augustin: Academia Verlag.
  • Headley, John M., 1997, Tommaso Campanella and the Transformation of the World, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Lerner, Michel-Pierre, 1995, Tommaso Campanella en France au XVII siècle, Naples: Bibliopolis.
  • Martinez Perucha, David, 2014, La traducción del orden natural al ámbito humano. El pensamiento politico de Tommaso Campanella, Frankfurt: Peter Lang.
  • Miglietta, Deborah, 2019, Anatomie d’un Homme-Dieu: Éléments de la christologie et de la physiologie de Tommaso Campanella, Paris: Champion.
  • Mönnich, Michael, 1990, Tommaso Campanella: Sein Beitrag zur Medizin und Pharmacie in der Renaissance, Stuttgart: Wissenschaftliche Verlagsgesellschaft.
  • Palumbo, Margherita, 2004, La Città del Sole. Bibliografia delle edizioni (1623–2002), Pisa-Rome: Istituti Editoriali e Poligrafici Internazionali.
  • Panichi, Alessio, 2015, Il volto fragile del potere. Religione e politica nel pensiero di Tommaso Campanella, Pisa: ETS.
  • Ponzio, Paolo, 2001, Tommaso Campanella. Filosofia della natura e teoria della scienza, Bari: Levante.
  • Ricci, Saverio, 2018, Campanella. Apocalisse e governo universale, Rome: Salerno.
  • Sgarro, Tommaso, 2018, Un inquieto domenicano. Temi e figure della Seconda Scolastica nella filosofia di Tommaso Campanella, foreword by J.P. De Lucca, Bari: Edizione di Pagina.
  • Walker, Daniel Pickering, 1958, Spiritual and Demonic Magic from Ficino to Campanella, London: Warburg Institute.

Other Internet Resources

  • Archivio Tommaso Campanella, hosted by the Istituto per il Lessico Intellettuale Europeo e Storia delle Idee (ILIESI), CNR – Italian National Research Council. General editor: Eugenio Canone).


The author and principal editor would like to express their indebtedness to the subject editor, Jill Kraye, for translating Germana Ernst’s original version of this entry into English.

Copyright © 2021 by
Germana Ernst
Jean-Paul De Lucca <>

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