Category Mistakes

First published Fri Jul 5, 2019

Category mistakes are sentences such as ‘The number two is blue’, ‘The theory of relativity is eating breakfast’, or ‘Green ideas sleep furiously’. Such sentences are striking in that they are highly odd or infelicitous, and moreover infelicitous in a distinctive sort of way. For example, they seem to be infelicitous in a different way to merely trivially false sentences such as ‘\(2 + 2 = 5\)’ or obviously ungrammatical strings such as ‘The ran this’.

The majority of contemporary discussions of the topic are devoted to explaining what makes category mistakes infelicitous, and a wide variety of accounts have been proposed including syntactic, semantic, and pragmatic explanations. Indeed, this is part of what makes category mistakes a particularly important topic: a theory of what makes category mistakes unacceptable can potentially shape our theories of syntax, semantics, or pragmatics and the boundaries between them. As Camp (2016, 611–612) explains: “Category mistakes … are theoretically interesting precisely because they are marginal: as by-products of our linguistic and conceptual systems lacking any obvious function, they reveal the limits of, and interactions among, those systems. Do syntactic or semantic restrictions block ‘is green’ from taking ‘Two’ as a subject? Does the compositional machinery proceed smoothly, but fail to generate a coherent proposition or delimit a coherent possibility? Or is the proposition it produces simply one that our paltry minds cannot grasp, or that fails to arouse our interest? One’s answers to these questions depend on, and constrain, one’s conceptions of syntax, semantics, and pragmatics, of language and thought, and of the relations among them and between them and the world.”

Moreover, the question of how to account for the infelicity of category mistakes has implications for a variety of other philosophical questions. For example, in metaphysics, it is often argued that a statue must be distinct from the lump of clay from which it is made because ‘The statue is Romanesque’ is true, while ‘The lump of clay is Romanesque’ is not—indeed, the latter ascription arguably constitutes a category mistake. Correspondingly, an assessment of this argument depends on one’s account of category mistakes (see §4 below).

After a brief discussion of how to characterize category mistakes (§1) and of the history of the debate (§2), the majority of this entry focuses on the question of how to account for the infelicity of category mistakes (§3). We conclude with some of the implications of the debate on category mistakes for other issues in both philosophy of language and metaphysics (§4).

1. Characterizing Category Mistakes

One might have expected this entry to start with a definition of ‘category mistake’. However, giving an explicit informative definition of category mistakes is no easy task. A typical dictionary definition looks like this: “The error of assigning to something a quality or action which can only properly be assigned to things of another category, for example treating abstract concepts as though they had a physical location” (Stevenson 2010). But such definitions are at best too vague to be useful, and at worst simply incorrect. For example, if ‘properly assigned’ is interpreted as meaning truly assigned, then the definition massively over-generates: the sentence ‘Two is odd’ assigns to something (the number two) a quality (being odd) that can only be truly assigned to things of another category (odd numbers), but the sentence clearly isn’t a category mistake. Alternatively, if ‘properly assigned’ is understood as ‘grammatically assigned’, then we risk classifying obviously ungrammatical strings such as ‘the boys eats’ as category mistakes.

Other definitions suffer from not being sufficiently theoretically neutral, relying on specific controversial accounts of category mistakes. For example, one might try to define category mistakes as sentences that are syntactically well-formed but meaningless. But as we shall see both parts of this proposed definition depend on controversial assumptions about the nature of category mistakes: that they are syntactically well-formed (cf. §3.1) and that they are meaningless (cf. §3.2.1). Moreover, even if we are willing to eschew theoretical neutrality, note that most of the accounts discussed do not offer an obvious way to distinguish category mistakes from other linguistic phenomena. For example, according to the truthvaluelessness view (§3.2.3) category mistakes are contentful but truth-valueless but, at least according to many philosophers, so are some instances of vague sentences such as ‘John is tall’. And according to the presuppositional approach (§3.4), category mistakes suffer from a presupposition failure, but then so do sentences that are not category mistakes such as ‘The king of France is bald’.

Perhaps the question of how to define category mistakes will receive a more satisfactory answer in the future or perhaps (following a general trend in analytic philosophy against conceptual analysis) we should eschew the project of defining category mistakes altogether. At any rate, extant debates on the topic of category mistakes have focused largely on the question of how to account for their infelicity rather than on the question of how to define the concept or distinguish category mistakes from other phenomena. The remainder of this entry will follow suit.

Even without offering an explicit definition, there is a phenomenological way of characterizing category mistakes. As noted at the outset, there seems to be a distinctive kind of infelicity which we can recognize by example: the sort of infelicity present in paradigmatic category mistakes such as ‘The number two is blue’. We can thus characterize category mistakes as sentences that are infelicitous in a similar manner to these paradigmatic examples. While this kind of phenomenological characterization may not seem theoretically informative, on reflection it reveals several interesting features of category mistakes. First, category mistakes can be created using a wide range of syntactic types: for example, adjectives (‘Two is green’); adverbs (‘John sleeps furiously’); or prepositional phrases (‘The theory of relativity is under the table’). Second, the infelicity characteristic of category mistakes seems to occur in a range of complex constructions (for example, ‘The number two isn’t blue’ or ‘Either the number two is blue or it is prime’). Third, whether the sort of infelicity in question is present can depend on context, in various different ways. For example, an utterance if ‘That is green’ seems infelicitous in a context where the demonstrative refers (or appears to refer) to the number two, but entirely innocuous in a context in which it refers to a pen. And an utterance of ‘The priest is pregnant’ can be infelicitous in a context where speakers assume that all priests are male, but entirely innocuous in a context where it is assumed that there are female priests. As we shall see, these features play a role in the ensuing debate.

2. A Brief History of the Topic

Philosophers seem to have been interested in the phenomenon of category mistakes at least since Aristotle, even if the phenomenon was not explicitly labelled. For example, In Metaphysics Zeta 5, Aristotle raises an interesting puzzle concerning the attribute ‘snub’: on the one hand, ‘snub nose’ seems to mean exactly the same thing as ‘concave nose’ which suggests that ‘snub’ simply means the same as ‘concave’. On the other hand, this cannot be the entire story because, unlike ‘concave’, ‘snub’ can only be felicitously attributed to noses: ‘concave bowl’, for example, is entirely felicitous while ‘snub bowl’ is a kind of category mistake.[1]

However, it seems fair to trace the contemporary debate on category mistakes to the first half of the 20th century, and most notably to the work of Gilbert Ryle (who also coined the term ‘category mistake’). Influenced by the work of Edmund Husserl, Ryle argued that category mistakes were the key to delineating ontological categories: the fact that ‘Saturday is in bed’ is a category mistake while ‘Gilbert Ryle is in bed’ is not, shows that Saturday and Ryle belong to different ontological categories.[2] Moreover, Ryle maintained that distinguishing between categories was the central task of philosophy: “The matter is of some importance, for not only is it the case that category-propositions (namely assertions that terms belong to certain categories or types), are always philosopher’s propositions, but, I believe, the converse is also true. So we are in the dark about the nature of philosophical problems and methods if we are in the dark about types and categories.” (Ryle 1938, 189)

To see why category distinctions were so important to Ryle, we need to look at another major influence: Bertrand Russell. Russell argued that a range of paradoxes (including his famous set-theoretic paradox and the Liar paradox) can be solved by restrictions of type. For example, the famous set-theoretic paradox requires considering sets that are (/ are not) members of themselves. However, if ‘is a member of \(s\)’ is a predicate that can only meaningfully be predicated of objects of a certain type which does not include \(s\) itself, then ‘\(s\) is (/ is not) a member of \(s\)’ is simply a meaningless sentence, and the paradox cannot even be properly expressed. This inspired two related ideas, which gained further support from the work of Wittgenstein and the logical positivists: first, due to some kind of type confusion, apparently grammatical sentences might nevertheless be meaningless; second, apparent philosophical puzzles might be resolved by exposing type confusions and declaring the sentences allegedly stating the puzzle meaningless.

Ryle argued that these ideas should be applied much more widely than Russell’s discussion of the paradoxes suggested. The thought was that by recognizing some philosophically puzzling assertions as category mistakes, one would expose them as meaningless, thus dissolving these puzzles altogether. This philosophical methodology saw its culmination in The Concept of Mind, in which Ryle declared that the dualistic position and the mind-body problem that it gives rise to is “one big mistake and a mistake of a special kind. It is, namely, a category mistake”.[3] The exact relation between these philosophical problems and more paradigmatic cases of category mistakes (sentences such as ‘Saturday is in bed’ which Ryle discussed in his earlier work) is not entirely clear, but even putting Ryle’s own application of the concept aside, his work on category mistakes generated a lasting philosophical interest in the phenomenon.

Some of the ensuing debates continued the project of attempting to demarcate ontological categories using category mistakes[4], while others focused more directly on the semantic status of category mistakes. In the 1940s and 50s the orthodox view seems to have accepted Ryle’s claim that category mistakes are meaningless[5], so much so that in his 1954 paper ‘Entities’ Arthur Prior complained that anyone who takes category mistakes to be false rather than meaningless “must nowadays count themselves among the heretics” (Prior 1954, 160). Even in that period, this orthodoxy had its dissenters (Prior 1954; Ewing 1937; and Quine 1960). For example, in Word and Object, Quine criticized the view that took category mistakes to be meaningless as “just a spontaneous revulsion against silly sentences” (Quine 1960, 229). These objectors were primarily focused on refuting the claim that category mistakes are meaningless and the alleged applications of this claim to metaphysical debates, rather than in offering any positive account of why category mistakes are nevertheless infelicitous.

The 1960s saw a more direct interest in category mistakes as an independently interesting linguistic phenomenon. In 1966 Drange published an entire monograph devoted to the topic (Drange 1966), and a lively exchange in the Australasian Journal of Philosophy focused on the question of whether category mistakes are truth-valued, with Lambert and Haack supporting the view (labelled ‘no type’ or ‘falsidal’) that category mistakes are truth-valued and Brady, Goddard, and Routley arguing that they are not.[6] The period between the late 1960s and the early 1980s saw a series of papers attempting to account for category mistakes using a range of tools from formal logic, culminating with the publication of the second monograph devoted to category mistakes: Lappin (1981).[7] However, by the mid-1980s the topic of category mistakes seemed to have fallen out of fashion: for over twenty years it was by and large neglected in the philosophical literature, at least as a self-standing issue.

Almost entirely divorced from the philosophical debate, category mistakes were also extensively discussed in the linguistics literature (though almost never under that label –terms used in the linguistic literature for various aspects of the phenomenon include ‘selectional violations’, ‘selectional restrictions’, ‘semantic anomaly’ ‘sortal presuppositions’). Here the driving figure of the debate was Noam Chomsky. In his 1957 monograph Syntactic Structures, Chomsky maintained that the now-famous category mistake ‘Colorless green ideas sleep furiously’ is grammatical but meaningless, using this claim to support his contention that syntax is an autonomous field from semantics. The claim was further developed in Fodor & Katz’s influential paper ‘The structure of semantic theory’ (Fodor & Katz 1963), where they claimed that the ability to recognize which sentences are ‘semantically anomalous’ (their term for category mistakes) was a crucial component of linguistic competence. Moreover, they developed a semantic framework which predicted that category mistakes are (grammatical but) meaningless. However, in his 1965 book Aspects of the Theory of Syntax Chomsky revised his view of category mistakes, now arguing that they are ungrammatical, and offering a syntactic theory which rendered them syntactically ill-formed (cf. §3.1). The theory followed many of the technical details of Fodor and Katz’s theory, but this time treating features they took to be semantic as syntactic.

In the late 1960s category mistakes played a central role in the chasm between the followers of Chomsky (whose view was labelled ‘Interpretative Semantics’), and proponents of a new movement in linguistics labelled ‘Generative Semantics’, whose key proponents were Lakoff, McCawley, Ross, and Postal. Interpretative semanticists claimed that sentences were assigned a syntactic structure by an autonomous syntactic module, a structure which could then be provided as input for semantic interpretation. By contrast, generative semanticists eschewed the sharp distinction between syntax and semantics, maintaining that the structure of a sentence was determined by a combination of so-called syntactic, semantic, and pragmatic considerations. In particular, they labelled infelicitous sentences such as category mistakes as simply ‘ill-formed’, resisting the attempt to pin down the precise source of the ill-formedness.[8]

As in philosophy, by the 1980s dedicated discussions of the phenomenon of category mistakes seemed to have died out, although the concept is still routinely mentioned in passing, especially in introductory text-books. The standard view seems to be that category mistakes are ‘semantically anomalous’ or ‘semantically ill-formed’. It is not entirely clear what these labels amount to, but most likely they indicate the view, which seems to be accepted by the majority of linguists these days, that category mistakes are grammatical but meaningless.

However, since the early 2000s, the topic of category mistakes has been experiencing a small revival in both philosophy and linguistics (with the division between those two fields no longer being sharp).[9]

3. Accounts of the Infelicity of Category Mistakes

3.1 The Syntactic Approach

One way to account for the infelicity of category mistakes is to maintain that they are syntactically ill-formed. The most substantial defense of this approach appeared in Chomsky’s 1965 monograph Aspects of the Theory of Syntax.[10] Chomsky’s account proceeds roughly as follows. In addition to assignments of general grammatical categories such as ‘noun’ and ‘verb’, lexical items also receive what Chomsky calls ‘selectional features’. For example, even though ‘boy’ and ‘sincerity’ are both nouns, the former receives the selectional features ‘+animate’, and ‘-abstract’, while the latter receives the features ‘-animate’, and ‘+abstract’. Verbs and adjectives are also marked with selectional features, representing, for each argument place, the kinds of argument they accept. For example, the verb ‘admire’ expects a ‘+animate’ for its subject argument, thus predicting that ‘The boy admires sincerity’ is grammatical, while the category mistake ‘Sincerity admires the boy’ is not.

Chomsky’s key argument in favor of the syntactic approach is that the use of selectional features as part of syntax is independently motivated (Chomsky 1965, §4.1). Thus consider the following strings:

  • (1) The boy who is next to the table is unusual.
  • (2) * The book who is next to the table is unusual.
  • (3) The book which is next to the table is unusual.
  • (4) * The boy which is next to the table is unusual.

According to Chomsky, while (1) and (3) are grammatical, (2) and (4) are not. But in order to account for this difference, it looks like we need to incorporate something like the selectional features ‘+/-animate’ into syntax. And, the argument goes, once such features have already been incorporated into syntax, a natural account of the infelicity of category mistakes follows.

However, even if Chomsky’s who/which argument succeeds in showing that syntax should be sensitive to the animate/inanimate distinction, it is not clear that this is sufficient to account for category mistakes in general.[11] For example, Hebrew has a special verb to denote picking grapes (rather than other sorts of fruit), and a special verb to denote putting on socks (rather than other kinds of clothing). The following are both category mistakes in Hebrew:

  • (5) * Ani botzer et ha-tamrim.
  • I am grape-picking the dates.
  • (6) * Ani gorev et ha-kfafot.
  • I am sock-putting-on the gloves.

The problem is that in order to extend Chomsky’s syntactic approach to account for such category mistakes, one would need very specific selectional features such as ‘+/-grape’ and ‘+/-sock’. Of course, this is not a decisive argument against the syntactic approach—perhaps syntax really should be enriched with such a wide array of sectional features. However, it does undermine the claim that the syntactic approach can be executed using independently motivated syntactic machinery, as clearly no (other) syntactic phenomenon requires sensitivity to whether an argument denotes a grape.

There are also some more direct objections to the syntactic approach. One issue concerns the fact that one can felicitously embed category mistakes in other environments. Thus consider the following examples:

  • (7) * John said that rides boy the on.
  • (8) John said that the number two is green.
  • (9) * John dreamt that rides boy the on.
  • (10) John dreamt that the number two is green.

While embedding the ungrammatical string ‘rides boy the on’ in the context of propositional attitude reports results in ungrammatical sentences ((7) and (9)), embedding the category mistake ‘the number two is green’ in the same environment arguably results in felicitous, grammatical sentences ((8) and (10)).[12]

Another potential problem for the syntactic approach has to do with the context sensitivity of category mistakes. Consider the following examples:

  • (11) The thing I am thinking about is green.
  • (12) That is green.
  • (13) The number two has the property I’ve just mentioned.

Whether or not these sentences exhibit the kind of infelicity associated with category mistakes depends on context: (11) and (12) are perfectly felicitous in a context where it is clear that the thing I am thinking about/referring to is a pen, but not so in a context where it is the number two. Similarly, (13) is felicitous in a context where it is clear that the property I’ve just mentioned the property of being prime, but not so if it was the property of being green. This is a problem for the syntactic approach, because whether a sentence is syntactically well-formed or not is a context-invariant property: it cannot vary according to context in this manner.

3.2 Semantic Approaches

A second way of accounting for the infelicity of category mistakes is to maintain that they are syntactically well-formed but semantically defective. This general approach encompasses several different views. To see why, note that there are various kinds of semantic values that are assigned to a single sentence token. First, a sentence is assigned a general meaning. Without going into too much theory, we can think of the meaning of a sentence as the result of combining the definitions of each of the words it contains, and also as what the sentence shares with its translations into other languages. Thus the meaning of the English sentence ‘I am tall’ is a property it shares with the French sentence ‘Je suis grande’. Second, when a sentence is uttered in a particular context, it expresses a particular content. For example, in a context where Sophie utters the sentence ‘I am tall’ it expresses the proposition that Sophie is tall, and in a context where Jim utters this sentence it expresses the proposition that Jim is tall. Third, particular tokens of the sentence receive a truth-value—for example, when Sophie utters ‘I am tall’, her (token) sentence is true if she is indeed tall, and false otherwise.

Corresponding to these three kinds of semantic values are three different semantic accounts of category mistakes: according to the first (‘the meaninglessness view’), category mistakes are syntactically well-formed but meaningless; according to the second (‘the contentlessness view’) they are meaningful but lack content; according to the third (‘the truthvaluelessness view’), they are meaningful and have a content, but lack a truth-value (or at least lack one of the two standard truth-values, true and false).

3.2.1 The Meaninglessness View

The meaninglessness view has been the most popular account of category mistakes throughout the history of the debate, and still receives considerable support from both linguists and philosophers. For example, Beall and van Fraassen (2003, 125) say that “there are different ways in which a (declarative) sentence might properly be called ‘meaningless’. Perhaps the best example involves so-called category mistakes” and Sauerland and von Stechow (2001, 15413) describe sentences such as Chomsky’s famous ‘Colorless green ideas sleep furiously’ as ones which “are syntactically well formed but do not make any sense”.[13]

The meaninglessness view is highly intuitive: category mistakes are extremely infelicitous and often generate the feeling that they simply do not make any sense. Another advantage of the meaninglessness view is that it arguably has the best chance of providing a clean answer to the question of how to characterize category mistakes (cf. §1). This is so because if category mistakes are grammatical but meaningless, then plausibly, they also constitute the only kind of sentence that have these two features. By contrast, the same does not seem to be true of any of the other accounts discussed: for example, even if category mistakes are syntactically ill-formed (§3.1) or suffer from presupposition failures (§3.4) they are clearly not the only kind of strings to have these features. The meaninglessness view might also be motivated by a commitment to a particular favored theory of meaning. For example, a proponent of conceptual role semantics might maintain that category mistakes play no conceptual role, and thus are predicted by the theory to be meaningless.[14]

However, the meaninglessness view also faces several serious challenges. First, note that some of the observations raised against the syntactic approach (§3.1) also pose a problem for the meaninglessness view. For example, consider the context sensitivity of category mistakes. Since in some contexts ‘The thing I am thinking about is green’ is entirely innocuous the sentence is clearly meaningful. But as with being syntactically well-formed, being meaningful is a context invariant property of a sentence so the sentence must be meaningful even in those contexts where the thing I am thinking of is the number two.

Similarly, the fact that category mistakes embed felicitously in propositional attitude reports presents at least a challenge to the meaninglessness view: since ‘John said that the number two is green’, or ‘Jane dreamt that her toothbrush is pregnant’ are themselves felicitous reports, these reports are not (even by the lights of the meaninglessness view) meaningless. This leaves the question of whether it is possible that the report as a whole is meaningful, even though the embedded category mistake is not. Note that in the case of the syntactic approach, we were able to test how such embeddings behave using clear examples of syntactically ill-formed strings, ones which are not themselves category mistakes (e.g. ‘John said that rides boy the on’). In this case, however, matters are much trickier as we do not have any clear examples of grammatical but meaningless sentences that are not category mistakes which we can use to test the behavior of such embeddings. Nevertheless, more theoretical arguments concerning the semantics of attitude reports might bear on the question. For example, if we accept that the meaning of a sentence is composed out of the meaning of its constituents and that the relevant ‘that’-clause is a constituent of the attitude report,[15] it follows that the attitude report as a whole cannot be meaningful if its constituent category mistake is meaningless.

Considerations of compositionality (the principle that the meaning of a sentence is composed of the meaning of its parts), can also be brought to bear more directly on the question of whether category mistakes are meaningful. One might be tempted to think that the mere fact that a category mistake such as ‘Two is green’ is composed out of meaningful words arranged in a grammatical way is sufficient to trivially entail, given compositionality, that the sentence is meaningful. This temptation ought to be resisted, though: for all we have said, the principle of compositionality merely shows that when a sentence has a meaning then that meaning is composed out of the meaning of its parts. This is not the same as saying that any (grammatical) combination of meaningful parts always successfully results in a sentence meaning.[16] It is thus open to defenders of the meaninglessness view to accept that meaning is compositional, but deny that category mistakes are meaningful.

Nevertheless, considerations of compositionality might still pose a significant challenge to the meaninglessness view. This is so because defenders of the meaninglessness view need to provide a compositional semantic theory that accounts for the meaning of those sentences that they do deem to be meaningful. The problem is that once such a theory provides a systematic recipe for how to assign meanings to benign sentences, there is a risk that an assignment of meanings to categorically mistaken combinations will automatically fall out. To illustrate the point, suppose that the semantic theory assigns objects to the names ‘Two’ and ‘Desky’ (the number two and a particular desk respectively), and the ordinary functions from objects to truth-values to the predicates ‘is green’ and ‘is prime’. Suppose further that the recursive specification of the theory say that the meaning of any sentence of the form ‘\(a\) is \(P\)’ is the claim that \(f(o)=\)true, where \(f\) is the function denoted by ‘\(P\)’ and \(o\) is the object denoted by ‘\(a\)’. Note that even if this theory was only designed to account for the meaning of standard combinations such as ‘Desky is green’ and ‘Two is prime’, it also inadvertently assigns a meaning to the category mistakes ‘Two is green’ and ‘Desky is prime’. Of course, one can try to amend the semantic theory so that it avoids this consequence, but the question is whether a semantic theory can be constructed that succeeds in assigning meanings to precisely all and only non-categorically mistaken sentences.

A completely different set of challenges to the meaninglessness view stems from the fact that while category mistakes are rarely used in literal discourse, they are highly prevalent in figurative speech. Consider for example a metaphorical use of ‘The poem is pregnant’ (by a critic, wanting to describe the richness of the poem); a metonymic use of ‘The ham sandwich left without paying’ (uttered by a waiter in reference the customer who ordered the ham sandwich); or uses of category mistakes in fiction (a story containing the sentence ‘The tree forgave the boy’ or even ‘The number two was happy’). Indeed, the very fact that the sentences in question are category mistakes often serves as in indication that the sentence is used figuratively rather than literally.[17]

The very fact that category mistakes have such figurative uses is not in itself a problem for the meaninglessness view: prima facie, there is no contradiction between the claims that, when taken literally, category mistakes are meaningless while when used figuratively, they can be meaningful. However, figurative uses of speech clearly have some connection to their literal meanings, with different theories offering different accounts of this connection. The question then becomes, for each such account of figurative uses, whether it requires the relevant sentence to also be literally meaningful.

Consider the case of metaphor. According to one central view of metaphor, the metaphorical meaning of a sentence is communicated via the mechanism of conversational implicature: when one utters a metaphor, the proposition literally expressed by the metaphor blatantly violates one of Grice’s maxims of conversation (typically the maxims of quality or relevance) thus giving rise to an implicated content which constitutes the metaphorical meaning. There is more to say about the details of the view, but the crucial point for our purposes is that on the Gricean account of metaphor, metaphorical meanings are generated indirectly, using the literal content of the sentence. But then in order for a sentence to receive a metaphorical interpretation, it must also have a literal meaning, and in particular successful metaphors that are category mistakes are also literally meaningful, pace the meaninglessness view.

A better hope for the meaninglessness view are accounts of metaphor on which the metaphorical meaning does not depend on the literal meaning of the entire metaphorical sentence, but merely on the meaning of some sub-sentential phrases. For example according to Joseph Stern’s account (Stern 2000), when a sentence is used metaphorically, some of its sub-sentential phrases are embedded under a special operator called ‘Mthat’, which delivers as an output a new (contextually determined) metaphorical meaning for that phrase. Thus on Stern’s view, when used metaphorically the sentence ‘The poem is pregnant’ has the deeper structure ‘The poem is Mthat(pregnant)’, where ‘Mthat(pregnant)’ can be interpreted in context as, for example, the property of containing many ideas. When we consider such syntactically simple metaphors, Stern’s view seems entirely consistent with the meaninglessness view: at no stage in this interpretation are we required to assign a (literal) meaning to the entire categorically mistaken sentence. However, things become more difficult once we consider metaphors with a more complex structure. Thus consider the following conversation, discussing Jane’s research:

  • Jill: So, I heard that Jane ended up giving up her idea for the thesis?
  • Sally: Oh, she didn't just give it up. She dropkicked the idea noisily off the nearest cliff!

Sally’s second sentence ‘She dropkicked the idea noisily off the cliff’ is a metaphor, so on Stern’s view, some syntactic phrase within that sentence should be read as falling within the scope of an ‘Mthat’ operator. Magidor (2017, 70) argues that Mthat must apply here to the entire verb phase (‘dropkicked the idea nosily off the nearest cliff’). But note that Stern requires Mthat to apply to meaningful phrases,[18] so the entire verb phrase needs to be meaningful. Interestingly, however, once one has conceded that the verb phrase is literally meaningful, there is no reason not to take the entire sentence to be meaningful as well: the introduction of the subject term is entirely innocuous, and if there were any problem arising from category mistakes being meaningless it should have already arisen at the stage where one talks of an idea being dropkicked off a cliff.[19]

Another more general problem for reconciling the meaninglessness view with an account of metaphor is raised by Camp (2004, 225). Camp points out that not all metaphors are category mistakes, and indeed some are obviously literally meaningful and even true. (Consider for example a metaphorical use of ‘Anchorage is a cold city’.) This posits a dilemma for the meaninglessness view. Either even in such cases, the metaphorical meaning is accounted for without making use of the literal meaning of the sentence in which case the account deprives itself of some helpful resources in interpreting the metaphor. Or else, the account of metaphor becomes bifurcated—offering one account for metaphors that are also category mistakes and another one for those that are not.

3.2.2 The Contentlessness View

According to the contentlessness view, category mistakes are meaningful but fail to express a proposition. An attractive feature of the contentlessness view is that it addresses one of the most pressing objections against the previous two accounts: namely, accommodating the context sensitivity of category mistakes. Unlike grammaticality and meaningfulness, what content (if any) is assigned to a sentence is not a context-invariant property. So one can coherently maintain that ‘This is green’ is perfectly acceptable in contexts where the demonstrative refers to a pen, while lacking content in contexts where the demonstrative refers to the number two.

The contentlessness view can be developed in two rather different ways. The first way to develop the view is particularly attractive to those who accept some kind of radical contextualism about natural language: the view that every (or nearly every) expression of natural language is context sensitive. Suppose one accepted, for example, that the content of the predicate ‘is green’ is extremely sensitive to context (dimensions of sensitivity might include which set of shades are being picked by the predicate or which parts of the object need to exhibit the color in order to satisfy it). One might then maintain that in the case of category mistakes such as ‘Two is green’, the sentence is so artificial that there simply isn’t enough material in the context to determine which property ‘is green’ denotes, and hence some words in the sentence (and ipso facto the sentence as a whole) cannot be assigned a content.[20] A second, very different way to develop the view assumes that in category mistakes such as ‘Two is green’, each word succeeds in picking out a content but these contents fail to compose together to form a unified proposition.

A way to put pressure on the contentlessness view on either of its versions is by constructing examples of apparent category mistakes (or category mistake-like utterances) that are designed specifically to ensure there should be a content in place. With respect to the first, contextualist proposal we can consider the following sequence, uttered in a particular context:

  • (14) This pen is green. So is the number two.

The first sentence in the sequence uses ‘is green’ in a perfectly ordinary context so it is assigned a content in the usual manner (a particular color property). This property is then anaphorically referred to in the second sentence. This ensures that the second sentence in the sequence doesn’t suffer from the kind of content failure due to insufficient contextual information, despite attempting to attribute a color to the number two.

Of course (14) does not pose any problems for the second version of the contentlessness view, which locates the problem with category mistakes in the composition of contents (presumably, according this version, the number wouldn’t be able to compose with the color property referred to anaphorically). However, consider an utterance of the following sentence, in a context where the thing I am thinking about is a table (and where the description is interpreted as non-rigid):

  • (15) The thing I am thinking about is green.

As uttered in this context the sentence is entirely innocuous, and hence clearly expresses a proposition (call this proposition ‘\(p\)’). The problem, however, arises when we evaluate \(p\) relative to a possible world \(w\) in which the thing I am thinking about is the number two. (Crucially, note that we are evaluating the very same proposition \(p\), not the proposition that would have been expressed by (15) had it been uttered in \(w\)). Relative to \(w\), \(p\) is a proposition which effectively ascribes to the number two the property of being green. The example does not quite provide us with an example of a contentful category mistake (arguably, since (15) is actually uttered in the innocuous context, it is not itself a category mistake), but it does suggest that some propositions succeed in ascribing colour properties to numbers, and hence this kind of predication shouldn’t in general be an obstacle to generating contents.

In addition to these worries, note that while the contentlessness view is well-equipped to address some of the objections against the meaninglessness view (such as the context sensitivity objection), it nevertheless shares some of the problems that the meaninglessness view faces. For example, successful embeddings under propositional attitude reports present a challenge for the contentlessness view if one maintains that the report as a whole is contentful, and that the content of the embedded category mistake is a constituent of the content expressed by the report as a whole. And many views of the semantics of figurative language conflict with the contentlessness view as well: for example, the Gricean view of metaphor discussed above requires that category mistakes are not only meaningful but also contentful.

3.2.3 The Truthvaluelessness View

The third semantic account of category mistakes is one according to which category mistakes are meaningful, contentful, but lack a truth-value (‘the truthvaluelessness view’). This gets around many of the issues raised against previous semantic accounts. For example, in the case of (14) or (15) defenders of the truthvaluelessness view need not deny that there is a proposition \(p\) which predicates greenness to the number two. They can simply maintain that in such cases the proposition is truth-valueless. The truthvaluelessness view also seems to be better equipped to deal with the embedding problem (there doesn’t seem any obvious issue with a contentful or even true report that embeds a truth-valueless sentence) or the problems to do with figurative language (even if the figurative meaning depends on a literal meaning or content, it does not seem to depend on any literal truth-values).

Shaw (2015) proposes another interesting argument in favor of the truthvaluelessness view.[21] Shaw maintains that there is a special mechanism for restricting the domain of quantifiers so as to avoid categorically mistaken statements in their scope. Suppose for example that Bob’s yard contains several planted trees and also a pile of wooden planks lying on the ground. Now consider the contrast between the following two sentences:

  • (16) Bob uprooted everything in his yard and burned it.
  • (17) Bob burned everything in his yard.

In (16), we seem to be quantifying only over the trees in the yard, while in (17) we are quantifying over (at least) both the trees and the planks. Shaw argues that this observation cannot be accounted for by typical mechanisms of contextual domain restriction, or by pragmatic considerations such as providing a charitable interpretation. Instead, he proposes, this kind of restriction can be explained by the following two hypotheses: first, language users attempt to interpret statements so as to maximize truth-evaluability (namely, as having some truth value or other); second, category mistakes are truth-valueless. The thought is that if the quantifier in (16) is allowed to range over some of the planks, then the open sentence ‘Bob uprooted \(x\)’ will be a truth-valueless category mistake relative to assignments where the variable is assigned a plank and this will entail the universally quantified sentence as a whole is truth-valueless. In order to avoid this consequence and maximize the truth-evaluability of the statement, interpreters restrict the quantifier so as to range only over the trees.

Shaw’s argument, however, is not decisive. One issue is that the restriction data is not entirely systematic, in the sense that other examples with exactly the same structure seem to elicit different intuitions. For example, consider a context involving a long column of letters and numbers randomly mixed together. Suppose John multiplied all the numbers in the column by three. The following seems at best false, possibly infelicitous:

  • (18) John multiplied everything written on the page by three.

Note that Shaw’s analysis predicts that the quantifier in (18) would be restricted to only the numbers on the page, and thus that the utterance should be felicitous and true. Second, even assuming that Shaw is right that we do systematically restrict domains of quantification so to avoid categorically mistaken predications, it is not clear that the claim that category mistakes are truth-valueless is essential for this mechanism of domain restriction. Consider any theory that systematically tracks the status of category mistakes as infelicitous (e.g., a presuppositional view, as discussed in §3.4). On the face of it, one could equally well explain Shaw’s data using the alternative hypothesis that the categorically mistaken status of sentences projects into quantified statements in precisely the way that Shaw predicts, and that speakers have a strategy of maximizing the felicity (rather than truth-evaluability) of their utterances.

The truthvaluelessness view also faces some unique challenges. One such challenge arises from its commitment to the claim that there are sentences which express a proposition but are nevertheless truth-valueless. Two widely accepted principles governing the notions of truth and falsity are Tarski’s truth-schemas, which can be stated thus:

  • (T) The proposition that \(p\) is true if and only if \(p\).
  • (F) The proposition that \(p\) is false if and only if not \(p\).

But as Williamson (1994, 187–198) argues, these principles are inconsistent with the claim that there is a truth-valueless proposition: For suppose that the proposition that \(p\) is neither true nor false. From (T), since it is not true that \(p\), then not \(p\). From (F), since it is not false that \(p\), then not not \(p\). We have now arrived at a direct contradiction: not-\(p\) and not-not-\(p\).

Note that this is an objection that neither of the previous two semantic accounts of category mistakes face: the Tarskian truth schema do not apply to cases where ‘\(p\)’ does not express a proposition at all (either because it is meaningless or because it is meaningful but contentless).

Of course, a natural response for defenders of the truthvaluelessness view is to reject the Tarskian truth-schema.[22] Indeed, arguably, the semantic paradoxes such as the Liar already motivate the rejection of the schema for reasons entirely independent of category mistakes. Against this, defenders of the schema have suggested that the semantic paradoxes might be addressed in a way that does not require a commitment to truth-valueless propositions. One potential assessment of the dialectical situation is this: perhaps accounting for the infelicity of category mistakes is not on its own sufficient to ground a rejection of the truth schema, which is often thought to be fundamental to our concepts of truth and falsity. However, if the schema ought to be rejected on independent grounds, then applying the apparatus of truth-valueless propositions to the case of category mistakes looks attractive. If we accept this assessment, then the issue of whether one should accept the truthvaluelessness view turns on the much wider issue of our response to the semantic paradoxes.

As noted at the outset of this subsection, one of the key advantages of the truthvaluelessness view over the previous two semantic views is that it does not automatically deem any sentence in which a category mistake is embedded to be infelicitous. How does, then, the truthvaluelessness view treat embeddings of category mistake in more complex sentences, and in particular those involving logical connectives such as disjunction, conjunction, or conditionals?

A range of logics have been developed for determining the truth-values of complex sentences in the presence of truth-value gaps. One option is to use Weak Kleene logic (WK), on which a complex sentence which has a truth-valueless constituent will always be truth-valueless as well. But assuming the truthvaluelessness view takes a sentence to be infelicitous if and only if it is truth-valueless (at least where the lack of truth-value is due to the occurrence of some category mistake), this approach will over-predict infelicity. Consider for example the following:

  • (19) If numbers have colors, then the number two is green.

While the sentence is perhaps surprising, it seems significantly more felicitous than typical category mistakes, but on the WK treatment it will be deemed truth-valueless and hence predicted to be infelicitous. Other problems occur when we consider how WK treats quantified sentences. Consider for example the following:

  • (20) Something is green.

Suppose the domain contains several concrete objects (including some green ones), as well as some abstract objects. Intuitively, (20) is felicitous and true (after all, there are some green objects in the domain). However, according to the WK treatment of category mistakes the sentence ought to be truth-valueless. This is so because the existential quantifier scopes over the open formula ‘\(x\) is green’ which is truth-valueless relative to some assignments (e.g. ones where \(x\) is assigned a number).[23]

Both of these problems are avoided by using Strong Kleene logic (SK) instead. According SK, a sentence with a truth-valueless constituent isn’t automatically deemed truth-valueless. Specifically, a sentence of the form ‘If \(A\) then \(B\)’ (with the conditional interpreted as material) is true if \(A\) is false and \(B\) is truth-valueless, and an existentially quantified sentence is true if it has one true instance (even if some other instances are truth-valueless), and thus neither (19) nor (20) would be deemed truth-valueless. However, the SK treatment of category mistakes possibly errs in the other direction, namely by under-predicting infelicity. Consider for example the following:

  • (21) ? Either the number two is green or the number five is prime.
  • (22) ? The number two is green and Lisbon is the capital of France.

On a SK treatment of category mistakes, the fact that (21) has one true disjunct (the second) is sufficient to render it true, and the fact that (22) has one false conjunct (the second) is sufficient to render it false. Both sentences are thus predicted by the account to be felicitous. The judgements might not be as clear in these cases, but insofar as one judges these sentences to be infelicitous that is a challenge for the SK approach.

One additional worry that has been raised against both the WK and the SK treatment of category mistakes (Thomason 1972, 231) is that not all classical tautologies are deemed true on these logics. For example, both logics render the following truth-valueless:

  • (23) Either the number two is green or the number two isn’t green.

While this is only to be expected on views which maintain that ‘the number two is green’ is meaningless or at least contentless, it is arguably a less palatable consequence for the truthvaluelessness view. An alternative view which avoids this consequence is an account of category mistakes using supervaluationist logic. The view is developed in detail in Thomason (1972), but in broad terms it proceeds as follows: a valuation is an assignment of the values true/false to each atomic sentence, where unproblematic instances receive truth values as usual and category mistakes are assigned an arbitrary truth value. Complex sentences receive a truth value relative to each valuation in the standard recursive manner, and finally a sentence is considered true if it is true relative to every valuation; false if it is false relative to every valuation; and truth-valueless if it is true relative to some valuations and false relative to others. This ensures that (23) is deemed true because it is true relative to every valuation (one can prove that the same holds for all other classical tautologies). Moreover, it also deems existential quantifications such as (20) true and hence correctly predicts that they are felicitous. However, as with the SK approach, the supervaluationist treatment of category mistakes renders both (21) and (22) to be truth-valued, and hence (incorrectly?) predicts that they are felicitous.

In §3.4 we will see yet another version of the truthvaluelessness view, which offers a different way of addressing the embedding of category mistakes in complex sentences.

3.3 Pragmatic Approach

A third approach to accounting for the infelicity of category mistakes is to maintain that they are syntactically well-formed, meaningful, and truth-valued but pragmatically inappropriate.

The most natural way to develop a pragmatic account of category mistakes is to appeal to Grice’s maxims of conversation. According to Grice’s maxim of quality, one ought not to assert what one believes to be false. Since atomic category mistakes are arguably trivially false[24], it seems obvious to participants in the conversation that the speaker is uttering something that they do not believe, violating the maxim. Thus unless the speaker is interpreted as attempting to communicate something other than the literal content of the sentence (e.g. a metaphorical meaning), the utterance would be infelicitous.

One problem for this approach is that while trivially false sentences such as \(2 + 2 = 5\) are conversationally inappropriate at some level, they don’t seem to suffer from the kind of severe infelicity that we see with category mistakes. (Indeed, an indication of this difference is that, unlike the case of category mistakes, there is no temptation to classify ‘\(2 + 2 = 5\)’ as meaningless or even truth-valueless.) Another difficulty for the account as we sketched it is that not all category mistakes are trivially false. Consider the following:

  • (24) The number two isn’t green.

This sentence seems just as infelicitous as its non-negated counterpart, and yet it is not trivially false (if anything, it seems trivially true). This is not yet a serious problem for the Gricean account of category mistakes. The account can be easily extended to address this example as well: according to Grice’s maxim of quantity, one should make their contribution as informative as required. But trivially true sentences (such as, it is claimed, (24)) are clearly not informative, thus violating the maxim of quantity. There are trickier cases, however, ones of category mistakes that are neither trivially true nor trivially false. Consider for example the following:

  • (25) Either the temperature in London is green, or the temperature in London is zero degrees.

This sentence is arguably also infelicitous in the way which is typical of category mistakes, but (assuming category mistakes are truth-valued, as per the pragmatic approach) whether (25) is true or false depends entirely on the truth value of the second disjunct—which is itself neither trivially true nor trivially false.

In the next section (§3.4) we will see a different pragmatic (or at least semi-pragmatic) approach.

3.4 The Presuppositional Approach

The fourth account of the infelicity of category mistakes is one that places this in the context of a broader phenomenon—that of presupposition failures. This account comes in several different versions, some more semantic and some more pragmatic in nature. While each version can be seen as an instance of one of the accounts discussed above, it is instructive to discuss these various presuppositional accounts in tandem.[25]

A widely recognized phenomenon in the study of language is that of presupposition. Consider the following sentences:

  • (26) The king of France is bald.
  • (27) George stopped smoking.
  • (28) It is Jill who murdered Jack.

It is standardly accepted that these sentences generate, respectively, the presuppositions that France has a king; that George used to smoke; and that someone murdered Jack. What precisely this amounts to is a matter of controversy in the theory of presupposition, but as a first pass we can say that when these sentences are uttered in conversation, the presupposed material is not the main point of the speaker’s assertion and that participants in the conversation are expected to already have accepted it. Moreover, when such sentences are uttered in contexts where speakers do not already accept the presupposition, the utterance suffers from presupposition failure, and is consequently infelicitous. For example, in current context, an utterance of (26) seems infelicitous because we all know France does not have a king, and an utterance of (28) is infelicitous in a context where it was not already commonly believed that Jack was murdered.[26]

A particularly notable feature of presuppositions is that they project into embedded contexts in predictable patterns. For example, it is standardly accepted that if \(s\) presupposes \(p\) then not-\(s\) also presupposes \(p\). Thus (29) also generates the presupposition that France has a king, and is therefore equally infelicitous in current context:

  • (29) The king of France isn’t bald.

More interestingly, it is standardly accepted that if \(s\) presupposes \(p\) (which itself is presupposition free) then both ‘\(p\) and \(s\)’ and ‘If \(p\) then \(s\)’ are presupposition-free. This prediction accounts for why, even in contexts where participants in the conversations do not accept in advance that Jack was murdered, the following no longer suffer from presupposition failure:

  • (30) Jack was murdered, and it was Jill that murdered him.
  • (31) If Jack was murdered, then it was Jill that murdered him.

The presuppositional account of category mistakes maintains that category mistakes are infelicitous because they suffer from presupposition failure. Suppose, for example, that the predicate ‘is green’ triggers the presupposition that its subject has a color. This means that ‘The number two is green’ generates the presupposition that the number two has a color, a presupposition which is assumed to be false in nearly all contexts. A key way to test this presuppositional hypothesis is to check it against the various projection properties for presupposition, and indeed this test seems to lend support to the hypothesis:

  • (32) * The number two isn’t green.
  • (33) Numbers have colors, and the the number two is green.
  • (34) If numbers have colors then the number two is green.

Note that (32) is just as odd as the original category mistake. By contrast, while (33) and (34) may be unusual or false assertions, they do not seem infelicitous in a similar manner. These projection properties point to a key advantage of presuppositional accounts: they seem to predict a range of data on how category mistakes behave when embedded in complex environments. Unlike the WK account (§3.2.3), the presuppositional approach does not assume that every complex sentence with a category mistake as a constituent is infelicitous (for example, it predicts that (34) is not infelicitous despite the embedded category mistake). On the other hand, unlike the SK and the supervaluationist accounts (§3.2.3), it predicts that sentences such as the following are infelicitous. (This is so because according to the standard projection rules for presupposition, a conjunction inherits all the presuppositions of its first conjunct.):

  • (35) * The number two is green and Lisbon is the capital of France.

So far, we have sketched the presuppositional account in very general terms. However, there are a variety of different ways to develop the account. A first key question is how presupposition failure affects the truth-value of a sentence. Category mistakes aside, the literature on presupposition is split between views which maintain that sentences suffering from presupposition failure are truth-valueless, and those that maintain that while presupposition failure leads to infelicity, such sentences are nevertheless truth-valued. The former approach maintains that ‘The king of France is bald’ is truth-valueless, while the latter deems it to be infelicitous but false.

As applied to category mistakes, the former approach yields either a version of the contentlessness view or of the truthvaluelessness view—depending on whether one takes presuppositional failure to lead to a failure to express content or merely a failure to have a truth-value. (From now on we will assume that this presuppositional account is understood as a version of the truthvaluelessness view.) An important advantage of this version of the truth-valueless approach over the ones discussed previously is that it seems to correctly account for the behavior of category mistakes embedded in complex sentences. However, note that the view still predicts that contentful sentences can lack truth-value, and more specifically that contentful instances of logical tautologies (e.g. ‘It’s not the case that two is green and two isn’t green’) can fail to be true.

When we apply the latter approach - the claim that presupposition failures do not lead to truth-value gaps—to the case of category mistakes, we get a version of the pragmatic approach.[27] How does this account compare to the Gricean pragmatic account discussed above? As with other versions of the presuppositional view, this account seems to fare better than the Gricean account in terms of predicting the behavior of category mistakes embedded in complex sentences. On the other hand, a significant disadvantage of the presuppositional account over the Gricean one is that, depending how the account is developed, it might require far more linguistic stipulations.[28]

A second question which separates different versions of the presuppositional account is what kind of presuppositions are involved in the case of category mistakes. A natural hypothesis (endorsed by Asher (2011)) is that these are type presuppositions. For example, we might suggest that ‘is green’ triggers the presupposition that its subject is a concrete object; that ‘is prime’ triggers the presupposition that its subject is a number; and that ‘is pregnant’ triggers the presupposition that its subject is a female. This has the advantage of supporting the intuition (borne in their name) that category mistakes have something to do with a misclassification of kinds or categories. However, Magidor (2013, 139–146) argues that the presuppositions involved are more specific that this: for example, that the subject has a color in the case of ‘is green’, or that it is either prime or composite in the case of ‘prime’. Her argument relies on discourses such as these:

  • (36) Mathematician: you know, not only numbers, but also polynomials are prime or composite. This polynomial, for example, is prime.
  • (37) Doctor: you know, we’ve developed a method that allows males to be pregnant too. This male, for example, is pregnant.

These discourses seem entirely felicitous even though the final sentence in each discourse violates the proposed type presupposition. In response a proponent of the type-presuppositional hypothesis might suggest reverting to a different type-based hypothesis. For example, in response to (36) they might suggest that the presupposition generated is that the subject-term is a mathematical object. However, this new proposal might be too liberal and because it fails to account for why ‘2.145 is prime’ is a category mistake and it might also be too restrictive because it fails to account for other versions of the argument, where an expert suggests that a non-mathematical object can be prime as well.[29] So the question remains whether we can find a suitable kind to play the relevant role here.

A final question which separates different versions of the presuppositional account is the issue of what determines whether the presupposition is satisfied or not on a particular occasion. According to Asher (2011), the lexicon encodes the type that each lexical item belongs to, and this in turn determines whether the relevant presupposition—a type presupposition on his view—is satisfied. This lexical approach, however, faces similar problems to those which we have seen with the meaninglessness view. The lexicon cannot predict that the following subject terms are of the wrong type in those contexts where the definite description or the demonstrative pick out the number two:

  • (38) The thing I am thinking about is green.
  • (39) That is green.

One feature of the lexical approach which is worth highlighting is that it sets apart the case of category mistakes from other instances of presupposition failures: clearly, it is not the lexicon that tells us whether John used to smoke, and hence whether ‘John stopped smoking’ suffers from presupposition failure. This can be seen either as a disadvantage of the approach (because it does not assimilate category mistakes smoothly into the more general theory of presupposition) or as an advantage (because it might help explain what is distinctive about the infelicity associated with category mistakes).

An alternative approach, one that is applicable to presuppositions more generally, is to maintain that it is worldly facts which determine whether the presupposition is satisfied or not. Thus for example, ‘John stopped smoking’ suffers from presuppositional failure if and only if John in fact used to smoke and similarly ‘The thing Jill is thinking about is green’ suffers from presupposition failure if Jill is thinking about the number two, but not if she is thinking about a table. According to a third proposal, one in the spirit of Stalnaker (1973), what matters aren’t the actual facts, but rather which propositions are taken for granted by the participants in conversation. To see how this differs from the ‘worldly’ approach, note that on this Stalnakerian approach to presupposition, ‘John stopped smoking’ would suffer from presupposition failure in a context where participants take it for granted that John never did smoke, even if they are wrong and John in fact used to smoke.

In so far as our primary aim is to account for the infelicity of category mistakes, this might point to an advantage of using the Stalnakerian approach to presupposition over the worldly one. Consider for example, an utterance of:

  • (40) The thing Jill is thinking about is green.

This utterance would be infelicitous in a context where participants take for granted that Jill is thinking about the number two (even if in fact she is thinking about a table), and felicitous in a context where it is taken for granted that Jill is thinking about a table (even if in fact she is thinking about a the number two), so the Stalnakerian view predicts that presupposition failure patterns exactly with the infelicity characteristic of category mistakes. Moreover, the Stalnakerian approach seems to be particularly well-suited for explaining why the infelicity of category mistakes varies across a range of contextual settings. Consider, for example, the following:

  • (41) The priest is pregnant.

In contexts where it is taken for granted that priests are male, (41) arguably functions as a category mistake. However, in other contexts—ones where speakers are aware of churches that ordain female priests—the sentence can be entirely felicitous. And indeed, the Stalnakerian approach predicts that whether the sentence suffers from the relevant presupposition failure depends precisely on what is taken for granted in conversation.

It is worth noting, however, that a presuppositional account of category mistakes which relies on the ‘worldly’ conception can also account for these infelicity patterns, albeit in a more indirect way. The account can maintain that infelicity depends not on actual presupposition failure, but on being believed (perhaps falsely) to suffer from presupposition failure.

We have seen that there are various choice points for how to develop a presuppositional account of category mistakes. It might be thought to be an advantage of the presuppositional account of category mistakes (on any of its versions) that it utilizes an independently motivated linguistic theory. However, a significant disadvantage of utilizing such a theory is that it makes it harder for the presuppositional approach to account for what is distinctive about the infelicity of category mistakes, i.e., what distinguishes their infelicity from other cases of presupposition failure and explains why category mistakes form a distinctive and unified phenomenon (cf. §1).[30]

4. Implications for Other Debates

In addition to the intrinsic interest in the phenomenon of category mistakes, which account of category mistakes is adopted also has a range of implications for other debates. In this section we will survey a few of these (this survey is not intended to be exhaustive).

4.1 Implications for the Philosophy of Language

Debates about category mistakes have substantial implications for some foundational questions in philosophy of language and linguistics. Consider the question of how to formulate the principle of compositionality. It is widely accepted that meaning is in some sense compositional, but there are many non-equivalent ways to elaborate what precisely this amounts to. One hypothesis which originates in the work of Richard Montague but has been substantially developed by Pauline Jacobson (and others), is the idea of direct compositionality[31]: “the hypothesis that the syntax and the semantics work ‘in tandem’. The syntax builds expressions and the semantics works to assign meanings to the representations as they are built in the syntax” (Jacobson 2012, 109). As Jacobson argues, the hypothesis of direct compositionality is attractive for a number of reasons: it is theoretically parsimonious, unifying the compositional theories of syntax and semantics, and it explains why semantic composition seem to proceed in a local fashion: the meaning of each sub-sentential expression is computed using only the meanings of its syntactic constituents rather than using material in other parts of the sentence. But as Jacobson remarks, “Direct Compositionality entails that there are no syntactic expressions of any sort, which do not have a meaning” (Jacobson 2012, 110). Note that this entails that the direct compositionality hypothesis is inconsistent with the meaninglessness view of category mistakes and thus the question of how to account for the infelicity of category mistakes interacts with the question of which formulation of the principle of compositionality ought to be adopted.

Other accounts of category mistakes have implications for different foundational issues. For example, we have seen that the truthvaluelessness view is committed to the existence of truth-valueless propositions, which in turn conflicts with the Tarskian truth-schema. For another example, consider the presuppositional account of category mistakes (on any of its versions). If the presuppositional account is correct, then the set of presupposition triggers is much wider than has previously been assumed: presupposition triggers are not restricted to a small number of special words like ‘know’ or ‘the’, but rather encompass at least most adverbs and adjectives in natural language. This in turn has a variety of implications for the triggering problem: the question of why particular lexical items trigger their respective presuppositions, and the issue of whether this question can be answered based on general pragmatic principles, or rather by maintaining that presupposition triggers are simply a conventionally encoded aspect of language.[32]

One’s account of category mistakes also has implications for more specific questions in the philosophy of language. We have seen (§3.2.1) that the meaninglessness view of category mistakes is arguably incompatible with a range of accounts for the semantics of metaphor. This means that one should either reject the meaninglessness view, or else offer a theory of metaphor that is compatible with the view. Another area where the debate on category mistakes is important is the semantics of fictional discourse. Consider a sentence such as ‘A famous detective lives in 221b Baker Street’. There is a sense in which the sentence seems true (contrast it with ‘The famous detective was called ‘Watson’’ which seems false). However, the sentence isn’t true on its most straightforward literal reading. One popular view on how a true reading of such sentences can be generated (see, e.g., Lewis 1978), is to assume that the fictional sentence is within the scope of an (unpronounced) operator, so the sentence is taken to express a claim of the form: ‘According to the Sherlock Homes stories, a famous detective lives in 221b Baker Street’, a claim which is straightforwardly true. Recall, however that fictions can often contain categorically mistaken sentences; for example, “Once there was a tree and she loved a little boy” (Silverstein 1964). But if the fictional sentence \(s\) is either meaningless or even contentless, then arguably, even after embedding it in the propositional operator ‘according to the story’, we will get a contentless ascription (cf. Friend 2007, 143). The upshot is that the operator view of fictional discourse is incompatible with both the meaninglessness view and the contentlessness view of category mistakes.

Even if one accepts that category mistakes are contentful, uses of category mistakes in fiction have significant implications for the philosophy of language. For example, Nolan (2015) argues that fictions involving personified abstract entities (e.g., fiction in which Death is a character) entail that fictions routinely feature substantive impossible contents. This observation is important because it presents a challenge for accounts of contents which take them to be as coarse grained as possible worlds, as on such accounts there is only one impossible proposition.[33]

4.2 Implications for Metaphysics

We have seen (§2) that the interest in category mistakes in the 1930s was fueled by the thought that category mistakes reveal some deep facts about ontological categories. While the project of using category mistakes to define ontological categories is no longer being actively pursued, category mistakes still play an important role in other debates in metaphysics.

Consider the debate about the relationship between a material thing and its matter. A lump of clay is molded into a statue. According to monists, the lump is identical to the statue. According to pluralists, they are two distinct objects which occupy the same space. A key argument in favor of pluralism proceeds as follows:

  • (42) The statue is Romanesque.
  • (43) The lump is not Romanesque.


  • (44) The statue is not identical to the lump.

An interesting feature of this argument is that (43) is, at least arguably, a category mistake. This fact can be exploited by both pluralist and monists in a variety of ways.

First, assume that category mistakes are truth-valueless (either because they are meaningless, or because they are meaningful but truth-valueless). This poses a problem for the pluralist’s argument because if (43) is a truth-valueless category mistake, the argument is unsound (one of its premises isn’t true).[34] The pluralist might respond by arguing that the negation in (43) isn’t ordinary descriptive negation but rather an instance of meta-linguistic negation, that is the kind of negation that is present in utterances like this:

  • (45) I am not happy, I am elated!

While this might account for why (43) is a felicitous utterance it is not clear that it helps the pluralist: if the negation in (43) isn’t standard, then the premise isn’t sufficient to show that the statue and lump genuinely have conflicting properties, and are thus distinct. Almotahari (2014) pushes this line even further, arguing that the sequence ‘The lump is not Romanesque, but the statue is’ indeed involves meta-linguistic negation, but also that a necessary condition on the occurrence of meta-linguistic negation in such contexts is precisely that, if read with ordinary negation, the first clause (‘I am not happy’/‘The lump is not Romanesque’) is semantically incompatible with the second clause (‘I am elated’/’The statue is Romanesque’). This conclusion, claims Almotahari, is detrimental for the pluralist: in order to involve meta-linguistic negation the two clauses must be (when taken literally) incompatible, but they can only be incompatible if the statue is identical to the lump, which is precisely the monist’s contention. Interestingly, the claim that category mistakes are truth-valueless offers the pluralist a rejoinder to Almotahari’s argument: if we assume that two statements are semantically incompatible just in case they cannot be simultaneously true, then the two clauses might be incompatible not because the statue is identical to the lump, but simply because one of the two claims is a truth-valueless category mistake and hence in itself never true.[35]

The claim that (43) is a category mistake can play a role in this debate even if one assumes that category mistakes are truth-valued but pragmatically infelicitous. Consider a monist who accepts that the lump and the statue are identical and reads the negation in (43) as ordinary descriptive negation. This would render the pluralist’s argument to be simply unsound: if the statue is Romanesque and lump is identical to it, then the lump is Romanesque as well and (43) is false. However, there is still a burden on the monist to explain why (43) seems to many to be true. This is where an account of category mistakes might come into play. Speakers often confuse pragmatic infelicity with falsity. So if ‘The lump of clay is Romanesque’ is pragmatically infelicitous (because it is a category mistake), speakers might mistakenly take it to be false (rather than true and infelicitous) and hence assume its negation is true.[36]

Finally, irrespective of the semantic status of category mistakes, the pluralist can present a somewhat different challenge to monism: if, as the monist claims, the statue is identical to the lump, how can the monist account for the fact that ‘The lump is Romanesque’ is a category mistake, while ‘The statue is Romanesque’ is not? Whether the monist can respond to this challenge depends on the precise details of one’s account of category mistakes, and to what extent substituting co-referential terms preserves the relevant kind of infelicity.

Next, consider a different debate at the intersection of philosophy of language and metaphysics, one concerning the phenomenon of copredication. Imagine a context where three copies of War and Peace are on the shelf. Each of the following seems to have a true reading:

  • (46) (Exactly) three books are on the shelf.
  • (47) (Exactly) one book is on the shelf.

A natural way to account for these diverging readings is to posit two respective readings of ‘book’: one on which it is used to pick out physical books (of which we have three), and one on which it is used to pick out “informational” books (of which we have one). However, on further reflection this still leaves a puzzle concerning (47): if ‘book’ in this sentence picks out an informational book (arguably a kind of abstract entity), how can this kind of object have the physical property of being on the shelf? These kind of apparently ‘mixed’ reading are referred to in the literature as instances of copredication.

Some solutions to this puzzle involve constructing non-standard semantic and syntactic structures for copredicational sentences (e.g., Asher 2011; Gotham 2017), but Liebesman and Magidor (2017) argue that sentences such as (47) should be taken at face-value: the sentence is about informational books, but on their view, informational books can have physical properties such as being on shelves.

A central challenge for this view is that it requires us to distinguish between (47) and clearly infelicitous category mistakes such as:

  • (48) * One prime number is on the shelf.

To sharpen the problem, consider any theory of category mistakes which accounts for the infelicity of (48) by maintaining that locational properties such as ‘on the shelf’ are restricted so as to only apply to physical objects (whether the nature of the restriction is syntactic, semantic, or pragmatic). This predicts that if (47) has the structure Liebesman and Magidor attribute to it (namely, a straightforward predication of the locational property to an informational book), the sentence should have resulted in an infelicitous category mistake. Liebesman and Magidor (2017, 148–9) respond to this worry by arguing that the restriction placed by ‘on the shelf’ is not a type restriction such as ‘is a physical object’, but rather a more specific restriction, such as ‘has a location’ (we have seen this idea in §3.4 in the context of the presuppositional approach, though it could in principle be adopted by proponents of any of the semantic accounts as well). This more specific restriction allows them to account for how (48) can be a category mistake even if (47) is not: while neither a number nor an informational book are physical objects, the latter but not the former satisfies (so they claim) the property of having a location. Whether or not this account of copredication is accepted, we see once again how which theory of category mistakes is adopted has substantial implications for debates in metaphysics.


  • Abrusán, M., 2011a, “Triggering verbal presuppositions”, Proceedings of SALT, 20: 684–701.
  • –––, 2011b,, “Predicting the presuppositions of soft triggers”, Linguistics and Philosophy, 34: 491–535.
  • –––, 2016, “Coercion and pragmatic presuppositions”, Inquiry, 59: 529–541.
  • Almotahari, M., 2014, “The identity of a material thing and its matter”, Philosophical Quarterly, 64: 387–406.
  • Asher, N., 2011, Lexical Meaning in Context, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Barker, C., and Jacobson, P., eds., 2007, Direct Compositionality, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Beall, J.C., and van Fraassen, B.C., 2003, Possibilities and paradox, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Beaver, D.I., 1997, “Presupposition”, in Johan van Benthem and Alice ter Meulen (eds.), Handbook of Logic and Language, Amsterdam: Elsevier: 939–1008.
  • Bergmann, M., 1977, “Logic and sortal incorrectness”, Review of Metaphysics, 31: 61–79.
  • Brady, R., and Routley, R., 1973, “Don’t care are made to care”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 51: 211–25.
  • Camp, E., 2004, “The generality constraint and categorical restrictions”, Philosophical Quarterly, 54: 210–31.
  • –––, 2016, “Category Mistakes, by Ofra Magidor”, Mind, 125: 611–615.
  • Chomsky, N., 1957, Syntactic Structures, The Hague: Mouton.
  • –––, 1965, Aspects of the Theory of Syntax, Cambridge, MA: MIT press.
  • Cooper, R., 1983, Quantification and Syntactic Theory, Dordrecht: Reidel.
  • Davidson, D., 2001, “On saying that”, in Davidson, D., Inquiries into Truth and Interpretation, Oxford: Clarendon Press: 93–108.
  • Drange, T., 1966, Type Crossings, The Hague: Mouton.
  • Elbourne, P., 2016, “Multi sentential category mistakes”, Inquiry, 59: 542–558.
  • Ewing, A.C., 1937, “Meaningfulness”, Mind, 46: 347–64.
  • Fine, K., 2003, “The non-identity of a material thing and its matter”, Mind, 112: 195–234.
  • Field, H., 2003, “No fact of the matter”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 81: 457–80.
  • Fodor, J., and Katz, J., 1963, “The structure of a semantic theory”, Language, 39: 170–210.
  • Friend, Stacie, 2007, “Fictional Characters”, Philosophy Compass, 2(2): 141–156.
  • Goddard, L., 1966, “Predicates, relations, and categories”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 44: 139–71.
  • –––, 1968, “Towards a logic of significance”, Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic, 9: 219–41.
  • Gotham, M., 2017, “Composing criteria of individuation in copredication”, Journal of Semantics, 34(2): 333–371.
  • Haack, R.J., 1971, “No need for nonsense”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 49: 71–7.
  • –––, 1975, “Still No need for nonsense”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 53:161–4.
  • Harris, R.A., 1993, The Linguistics Wars, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Heim, I., and Kratzer, A., 1998, Semantics in Generative Grammar, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Jacobson, P., 2012, “Direct compositionality”, in Wolfram Hinzen, Edouard Machery, and Markus Werning (eds.), The Oxford Handbook of Compositionality, Oxford: Oxford University Press: 109–128.
  • Katz, J.J., 1964, “Semi-sentences”, in Jerry Fodor and Jerrold Katz (eds.), The Structure of Linguistic Theory, New Jersey: Prentice Hall: 400–416.
  • –––, 1970, “Interpretative semantics vs. Generative semantics”, Foundations of Language, 6: 220–59.
  • Kinoshita, E., Mineshima, K., and Bekki, D., 2017, “An analysis of selectional restrictions with dependent type semantics”, in S. Kuranashi et. al (eds.), New Frontiers in Artificial Intelligence: JSAI-isAI 2016, Springer: 19-32.
  • Lambert, K., 1968, “On the no type theory of significance”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 46: 79–86.
  • Lappin, S., 1981, Sorts, Ontology, and Metaphor, Berlin & New York: de Gruyter.
  • Lewis, D., 1978, “Truth in fiction”, American Philosophical Quarterly, 15: 37–46.
  • Libert, A.R., 2016, “Adpositions and Presuppositions”, SpringerPlus, 5: 858.
  • Liebesman, D., and Magidor, O., 2017, “Copredication and property inheritance”, Philosophical Issues, 27: 131–166.
  • Ludlow, P., 2011, The Philosophy of Generative Linguistics, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Magidor, O., 2009, “Category mistakes are meaningful”, Linguistics and Philosophy, 32: 553–581.
  • –––, 2011, “Arguments by Leibniz’s Law in metaphysics”, Philosophy Compass, 6: 180–195.
  • –––, 2013, Category Mistakes, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2016, “Response to Abrusán, Shaw, and Elbourne”, Inquiry, 59: 559–586.
  • –––, 2017, “Category mistakes and figurative language”, Philosophical Studies, 174: 65–78.
  • Martin, J., 1975, “A many valued semantics for category mistakes”, Synthese, 31: 63–83.
  • McCawley, J., 1971, “Interpretative semantics meets Frankenstein”, Foundations of Language, 7: 285–96.
  • Nolan, D., 2015, “Personification and impossible fiction”, The British Journal of Aesthetics, 55: 57–69.
  • Pap, A., 1960, “Types and meaninglessness”, Mind, 69: 41–54.
  • Prandi, M., 2016, “Selectional restrictions as ultimate presuppositions of natural ontology”, Topoi, 35: 73–81.
  • Prior, A.N., 1954, “Entities”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 32: 159–68.
  • Quine, W.V.O., 1960, Word and Object, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Ricœur, P., 1978, The Rule of Metaphor: the Creation of Meaning in Language, London: Routledge.
  • Routley, R., 1966, “On significance theory”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 44: 172–209.
  • –––, 1969, “The need for nonsense”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 47: 367–384.
  • Ryle, G., 1938, “Categories”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 38: 189–206.
  • –––, 1949, The Concept of Mind, London: Hutchinson University Library.
  • Sauerland, U. & von Stechow , A., 2001, “The syntax-semantics interface”, in Neil Smelser & Paul Baltes (eds.), International Encyclopaedia of the Social & Behavioural Sciences, Oxford: Pergamon: 15412–15418.
  • Shaw, J., 2015, “Anomaly and quantification”, Noûs, 49: 147–176.
  • –––, 2016, “Magidor on anomaly and truth-value gaps”, Inquiry, 59: 513–528.
  • Silverstein, S., 1964, The Giving Tree, Harper & Collins.
  • Smart, J.J., 1953, “A note on categories”, British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 4: 227–8.
  • Sommers, F., 1963, “Types and ontology”, Philosophical Review, 72: 327–63.
  • Stern, J., 2000, Metaphor in context, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • –––, 2006, “Metaphor, Literal, Literalism”, Mind & Language, 21: 243–279.
  • Stalnaker, R., 1973, “Presuppositions”, Journal of Philosophical Logic, 2: 447–457.
  • Stevenson, A. (ed.), 2010, Oxford Dictionary of English, third edition, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Strawson, P., 1952, Introduction to Logical Theory, London: Methuen.
  • –––, 1970, “Categories”, in Oscar Wood and George Pitcher (eds.), Ryle: A Collection of Critical Essays, New York: Doubleday: 181–212.
  • Thomason, R., 1972, “A semantic theory of sortal incorrectness”, Journal of Philosophical Logic, 1: 209–258.
  • Thomasson, A., 2002, “Phenomenology and the development of analytic philosophy”, The Souther Journal of Philosophy, 40: 189–206.
  • Turbayne, C., 1962, The Myth of Metaphor, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • von Fintel, K., 2008, “What is presupposition accommodation, again”, Philosophical Perspectives, 22: 137–170.
  • Westerhoff, J., 2002, “Defining ontological category”, Proceedings of the Aristotelean Society, 102: 337–343.
  • Williamson, T., 1994, Vagueness, London: Routledge.
  • –––, 2000, Knowledge and its Limits, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Ziff, P., 1964, “On understanding ‘understanding utterances’”, in Jerry Fodor and Jerrold Katz (eds.), The Structure of Linguistic Theory, New Jersey: Prentice Hall: 390–399.

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

Copyright © 2019 by
Ofra Magidor <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free