When a diplomat says yes, he means ‘perhaps’;
When he says perhaps, he means ‘no’;
When he says no, he is not a diplomat. —Voltaire (Quoted, in Spanish, in Escandell 1993.)
These lines — also attributed to H. L. Mencken and Carl Jung — may or may not be fair to diplomats, but are surely correct in reminding us that more is involved in what one communicates than what one literally says; more is involved in what one means than the standard, conventional meaning of the words one uses. The words ‘yes,’ ‘perhaps,’ and ‘no’ each has a perfectly identifiable meaning, known by every speaker of English (including not very competent ones). However, as those lines illustrate, it is possible for different speakers in different circumstances to mean different things using those words. How is this possible? What’s the relationship among the meaning of words, what speakers mean when uttering those words, the particular circumstances of their utterance, their intentions, their actions, and what they manage to communicate? These are some of the questions that pragmatics tries to answer; the sort of questions that, roughly speaking, serve to characterize the field of pragmatics.
- 1. Introduction
- 2. Classical Pragmatics
- 2.1 Far-side Pragmatics: Beyond Saying
- 2.2 Near-side Pragmatics
- 3. Contemporary Pragmatic Theory
- 3.1 Two models of Linguistic Communication
- 3.2 Relevance Theory
- 3.3 A Theory of Utterance-Type-Meaning
- 3.4 Border Disputes: Literalists, Minimalists, Contextualists and Others
- 3.5 A Methodological Flaw of Linguistic Pragmatism?
- 4. Some Definitions of Pragmatics
- 5. Glossary
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Pragmatics deals with utterances, by which we will mean specific events, the intentional acts of speakers at times and places, typically involving language. Logic and semantics traditionally deal with properties of types of expressions, and not with properties that differ from token to token, or use to use, or, as we shall say, from utterance to utterance, and vary with the particular properties that differentiate them. Pragmatics is sometimes characterized as dealing with the effects of context. This is equivalent to saying it deals with utterances, if one collectively refers to all the facts that can vary from utterance to utterance as ‘context.’ One must be careful, however, for the term is often used with more limited meanings.
Different theorists have focused on different properties of utterances. To discuss them it will be helpful to make a distinction between ‘near-side pragmatics’ and ‘far-side pragmatics.’ The picture is this. The utterances philosophers usually take as paradigmatic are assertive uses of declarative sentences, where the speaker says something. Near-side pragmatics is concerned with the nature of certain facts that are relevant to determining what is said. Far-side pragmatics is focused on what happens beyond saying: what speech acts are performed in or by saying what is said, or what implicatures (see below for an explanation of these terms) are generated by saying what is said.
Near-side pragmatics includes, but is not limited to resolution of ambiguity and vagueness, the reference of proper names, indexicals and demonstratives, and anaphors, and at least some issues involving presupposition. In all of these cases facts about the utterance, beyond the expressions used and their meanings, are needed.
We can divide these facts into several categories. For indexicals such as ‘I,’ ‘now,’ and ‘here,’ basic facts about the utterance are required: the agent, and when and where it occurred. For other indexicals and demonstratives, speaker intentions are also relevant. While it seems the referent of ‘you’ must be a person addressed by the speaker, which of several possible addressees is referred to seems up to the speaker’s intentions. Within syntactic and semantic constraints, anaphoric relations seem largely a matter of speaker’s intent. Speaker’s intentions and the way the speaker is connected to the wider world by causal/historical ‘chains of reference’ are relevant to the reference of proper names.
Far-side pragmatics deals with what we do with language, beyond what we (literally) say. This is the conception according to which Voltaire’s remarks belong to pragmatics. It’s up to semantics to tell us what someone literally says when they use expressions of a given type; it’s up to pragmatics to explain the information one conveys, and the actions one performs, in or by saying something.
Pragmatics is usually thought to involve a different sort of reasoning than semantics. Semantics consists of conventional rules of meaning for expressions and their modes of combination. Locke supposed that communication was basically a matter of a speaker encoding thoughts into words and the listener decoding words back into thoughts. The same basic picture is found fairly explicitly in Saussure and other influential theorists. This picture seems to fit reasonably well with the picture that emerged from the logicians and philosophers of language in the tradition of logical analysis, of language as a system of phonological, syntactic and semantic rules, of which competent speakers and interpreters have implicit mastery. Paradigmatically, the sincere speaker plans to produce an utterance with the truth-conditions of a belief she wishes to express; she chooses her words so that her utterance has those truth-conditions; the credulous interpreter needs to perceive the utterance, and recognize which phones, morphemes, words and phrases are involved, and then using knowledge of the meanings, deduce the truth-conditions of the utterance and of the belief it expresses.
In contrast, pragmatics involves perception augmented by some species of ‘ampliative’ inference — induction, inference to the best explanation, Bayesian reasoning, or perhaps some special application of general principles special to communication, as conceived by Grice (see below) — but in any case a sort of reasoning that goes beyond the application of rules, and makes inferences beyond what is established by the basic facts about what expressions are used and their meanings.
The facts with which pragmatics deals are of various sorts, including:
- Facts about the objective facts of the utterance, including: who the speaker is, when the utterance occurred, and where;
- Facts about the speaker’s intentions. On the near side, what language the speaker intends to be using, what meaning she intends to be using, whom she intends to refer to with various shared names, whether a pronoun is used demonstratively or anaphorically, and the like. On the far side, what she intends to achieve by saying what she does.
- Facts about beliefs of the speaker and those to whom she speaks, and the conversation they are engaged in; what beliefs do they share; what is the focus of the conversation, what are they talking about, etc.
- Facts about relevant social institutions, such as promising, marriage ceremonies, courtroom procedures, and the like, which affect what a person accomplishes in or by saying what she does.
We will divide our discussion, somewhat arbitrarily, into the ‘Classic Pragmatics’ and ‘Contemporary pragmatics.’ The Classic Period, by our reckoning, stretches from the mid-sixties until the mid-eighties.
Our initial focus will be on the traditions in pragmatics inaugurated by the J. L. Austin and H. P. Grice. Both of these philosophers were interested in the area of pragmatics we call ‘beyond saying.’ In the classic period, these phenomena were studied on the premise — a premise increasingly undermined by developments in pragmatics itself — that a fairly clear distinction could be made between what is said, the output of the realm of semantics, and what is conveyed or accomplished in particular linguistic and social context in or by saying something, the realm of pragmatics. What is said is sort of a boundary; semantics is on the near side, and those parts of pragmatics that were the focus of the classic period are on the far side.
The British philosopher John Langshaw Austin (b. 1911–d. 1960) was intrigued by the way that we can use words to do different things. Whether one asserts or merely suggests, promises or merely indicates an intention, persuades or merely argues, depends not only on the literal meaning of one’s words, but what one intends to do with them, and the institutional and social setting in which the linguistic activity occurs. One thing a speaker might intend to do, and be taken to do, in saying “I’ll be there to pick you up at six,” is to promise to pick her listener up at that time. The ability to promise and to intend to promise arguably depends on the existence of a social practice or set of conventions about what a promise is and what constitutes promising. Austin especially emphasized the importance of social facts and conventions in doing things with words, in particular with respect to the class of speech acts known as illocutionary acts.
Austin began by distinguishing between what he called ‘constatives’ and ‘performatives.’ A constative is simply saying something true or false. A performative is doing something by speaking; paradigmatically, one can get married by saying “I do” (Austin 1961). Constatives are true or false, depending on their correspondence (or not) with the facts; performatives are actions and, as such, are not true or false, but ‘felicitous’ or ‘infelicitous,’ depending on whether or not they successfully perform the action in question. In particular, performative utterances to be felicitous (i) must invoke an existing convention and (i) the convention must be invoked in the right circumstances.
A clear delimitation between performatives and constatives proved to be difficult to establish, however. There are explicit performatives; a verb used in a certain way makes explicit the action being performed: “I bet that there is a dangerous animal there,” “I guarantee that there is a dangerous animal there,” “I warn you that there is a dangerous animal there.” But the same action could be performed implicitly: “There is a dangerous animal there,” where both issues of (in)felicities and issues of truth/falsity are simultaneously present. Instead of pursuing the distinction between performatives and constatives, Austin (1962a) proposed a new three-fold distinction.
According to this trichotomy, a speech act is, first of all, a locutionary act, that is, an act of saying something. Saying something can also be viewed from three different perspectives: (i) as a phonetic act: uttering certain noises; (ii) as a phatic act: uttering words “belonging to and as belonging to, a certain vocabulary, conforming to and as conforming to a certain grammar”; and (iii) as a rhetic act: uttering words “with a certain more-or-less definite sense and reference” (Austin 1962a, 95). Now, to perform a locutionary act is also in general to perform an illocutionary act; in performing a locutionary act, we perform an act with a certain force: ordering, warning, assuring, promising, expressing an intention, and so on. And by doing that, we will normally produce “certain consequential effects upon the feelings, thoughts or actions of the audience, or of the speaker, or of other persons” (ibidem, 101) that Austin calls perlocutionary. At the point of his untimely death, Austin’s work on speech act theory was far from complete. His main work, How to do things with words was published posthumously, based on lecture notes of Austin and his students.
Austin’s student, John R. Searle (1969) developed speech act theory as a theory of the constitutive rules for performing illocutionary acts, i.e., the rules that tell what performing (successfully) an illocutionary act (with certain illocutionary force and certain propositional content) consists in. The rules are classified as (i) propositional content rules, which put conditions on the propositional content of some illocutionary acts; (ii) preparatory rules, which tell what the speaker will imply in the performance of the illocutionary acts; (iii) sincerity rules, that tell what psychological state the speaker expresses to be in; and (iv) essential rules, which tell us what the action consists in essentially.
Let’s return to our case of promising. According to Searle’s analysis, for an utterance by S to H to count as a promise must meet the following conditions:
- The propositional content represents some future action A by S;
- H prefers S’s doing A to her not doing it, and S believes that to be so; and it is not obvious both to S and H that S will do A in the normal course of events;
- S intends to do A; and
- Promising counts as the undertaking of an obligation of S to do A.
If someone, then, wants to make a (felicitous) promise she must meet these conventional conditions. The study of these conventional conditions for illocutionary acts, together with the study of their correct taxonomy constitutes the core of speech act theory.
Based on their essential conditions, and attending to the minimal purpose or intention of the speaker in performing an illocutionary act, Searle (1975a) proposes a taxonomy of illocutionary acts into five mutually exclusive and jointly exhaustive classes:
- Representative or assertive. The speaker becomes committed to the truth of the propositional content; for example, asserting: “It’s raining.”
- Directive. The speaker tries to get the hearer to act in such a way as to fulfill what is represented by the propositional content; for example, commanding: “Close the door!”
- Commissive. The speaker becomes committed to act in the way represented by the propositional content; for example, promising: “I’ll finish the paper by tomorrow.”
- Expressive. The speaker simply expresses the sincerity condition of the illocutionary act: “I’m glad it’s raining!”
- Declarative. The speaker performs an action just representing herself as performing that action: “I name this ship the Queen Elizabeth.”
Speech act theory, then, adopts a social or institutional view of linguistic meaning. This is sometimes opposed to the intentionalist view favored by Grice (1957) and Strawson (1964), but there need be no inconsistency. (For an interesting discussion on the relationship between intentionalist and social, institutional and intersubjective views on meaning and communication by Searle, Bennett, Habermas and Appel, see part I of Lepore & Van Gulick 1991.)
Herbert Paul Grice (b. 1913–d. 1988) emphasized the distinction Voltaire makes, in our opening quotation, between what words mean, what the speaker literally says when using them, and what the speaker means or intends to communicate by using those words, which often goes considerably beyond what is said. I ask you to lunch and you reply, “I have a one o’clock class I’m not prepared for.” You have conveyed to me that you will not be coming to lunch, although you haven’t literally said so. You intend for me to figure out that by indicating a reason for not coming to lunch (the need to prepare your class) you intend to convey that you are not coming to lunch for that reason. The study of such conversational implicatures is the core of Grice’s influential theory.
Grice’s so-called theory of conversation starts with a sharp distinction between what someone says and what someone ‘implicates’ by uttering a sentence. What someone says is determined by the conventional meaning of the sentence uttered and contextual processes of disambiguation and reference fixing; what she implicates is associated with the existence of some rational principles and maxims governing conversation (setting aside ‘conventional implicatures’ which we discuss below). What is said has been widely identified with the literal content of the utterance; what is implicated, the implicature, with the non-literal, what it is (intentionally) communicated, but not said, by the speaker. Consider his initial example:
A and B are talking about a mutual friend, C, who is now working in a bank. A asks B how C is getting on in his job, and B replies: Oh quite well, I think; he likes his colleagues, and he hasn’t been to prison yet. (Grice 1967a/1989, 24.)
What did B say by uttering “he hasn’t been to prison yet”? Roughly, all he literally said of C was that he hasn’t been to prison up to the time of utterance. This is what the conventional sentence meaning plus contextual processes of disambiguation, precisification of vague expressions and reference fixing provide.
But, normally, B would have implicated more than this: that C is the sort of person likely to yield to the temptation provided by his occupation. According to Grice, the ‘calculation’ of conversational implicatures is grounded on common knowledge of what the speaker has said (or better, the fact that she has said it), the linguistic and extra linguistic context of the utterance, general background information, and the consideration of what Grice dubs the ‘Cooperative Principle (CP)’:
Make your conversational contribution such as is required, at the stage at which it occurs, by the accepted purpose or direction of the talk exchange in which you are engaged. (Grice 1967a/1989, 26.)
According to Grice, the CP is implemented, in the plans of speakers and understanding of hearers, by following ‘maxims:’
- Make your contribution as informative as is required (for the current purposes of the exchange).
- Do not make your contribution more informative than is required.
- (Supermaxim): Try to make your contribution one that is true.
- Do not say what you believe to be false.
- Do not say that for which you lack adequate evidence.
- Be relevant.
- (Supermaxim): Be perspicuous.
- Avoid obscurity of expression.
- Avoid ambiguity.
- Be brief (avoid unnecessary prolixity).
- Be orderly.
- Frame whatever you say in the form most suitable for any reply that would be regarded as appropriate; or, facilitate in your form of expression the appropriate reply (added by Grice 1981/1989, 273).
Grice sees the principles governing conversation as derived from general principles governing human rational cooperative action. There has been much discussion about the CP and the maxims. Are all of them necessary? Do we need more? Are they normative or descriptive? What’s their exact role in the theory of implicatures: Are they principles that speakers and hearers are assumed to observe in rational communication, or simply the theorist’s tools for rational reconstruction? Does the CP require from speaker and hearer further cooperation towards a common goal beyond that of understanding and being understood? What is clear is that Grice attributes to these principles an essential role for the definition and the interpretation of conversational implicatures.
The paradigmatic kind of reasoning on the part of the hearer for the determination of implicatures, according to Grice, follows this pattern:
He has said that p; there is no reason to suppose that he is not observing the maxims, or at least the CP; he could not be doing this unless he thought that q; he knows (and knows that I know that he knows) that I can see that the supposition that he thinks that q is required; he has done nothing to stop me thinking that q; he intends me to think, or is at least willing to allow me to think, that q; and so he has implicated that q. (Grice 1967a/1989, 31.)
Applied to the earlier example, about the banker, A would reason in the following way:
B has said that C has not been to prison yet (p); he is apparently flouting the maxim of relation (“Be relevant.”), but I have no reason to suppose that he is opting out CP; his violation of the maxim would only be apparent if he is thinking that C is potentially dishonest (q); B knows (and knows that I know that he knows) that I can figure out he is thinking that q; …; so he has implicated that q.
Conversational implicatures have the following characteristics:
- They are cancelable:
… a putative conversational implicature that p is explicitly cancelable if, to the form of words the utterance of which putatively implicates that p, it is admissible to add but not p, or I do not mean to imply that p, and it is contextually cancelable if one can find situations in which the utterance of the form of words would simply not carry the implicature. (Grice 1967b/1989, 44.)
- They are non-detachable:
… it will not be possible to find another way of saying the same thing, which simply lacks the implicature in question, except where some special feature of the substituted version is itself relevant to the determination of an implicature (in virtue of one of the maxims of Manner). (Grice 1967a, 1989, 39.)
- They are calculable:
The presence of a conversational implicature must be capable of being worked out; for even if it can in fact be intuitively grasped, unless the intuition is replaceable by an argument, the implicature (if present at all) will not count as a conversational implicature. (Grice 1967a/1989, 31.)
Grice considers this last property to be crucial for distinguishing between conversational and conventional implicatures. Conventional implicatures are generated by the meaning of certain particles like ‘but’ or ‘therefore.’ Consider the difference between (1) and (2):
- He is an Englishman, therefore he is brave.
- He is an Englishman, and he is brave.
According to Grice, a speaker has said the same with (1) as with (2). The difference is that with (1) she implicates (3).
3. His being brave follows from his being English.
This is a conventional implicature. It is the conventional meaning of ‘therefore,’ and not maxims of cooperation, that carry us beyond what is said.
Grice’s concept of conventional implicatures (which has antecedents in Frege; see Bach 1999b) is the most controversial part of his theory of conversation for many followers, for several reasons. According to some, its application to particular examples runs against common intuitions. By using the word ‘therefore’ is the speaker not saying that there is some causal connection between being brave and being English? Isn’t she saying and not merely implying that one’s being brave follows from one’s being English? Moreover, the category of conventional implicatures blurs the distinction between what is said, usually conceived as determined by the semantic conventions of language, and what is implicated, usually thought of as a matter of the speaker’s intentions in saying what she does. Conventional sentence meaning contributes crucially to what is said, which is considered essentially different from implicatures; but now we have the result that some elements of conventional meaning do not contribute to what is said but to implicatures (albeit conventional). Finally, it places the study of the conventional meaning of some expressions within the realm of pragmatics (study of implicatures), rather than semantics, usually conceived as the home of conventional meaning.
Among conversational implicatures, Grice distinguished between ‘particularized’ and ‘generalized.’ The former are the implicatures that are generated by saying something in virtue of some particular features of the context, “cases in which there is no room for the idea that an implicature of this sort is normally carried by saying that p.” (Grice 1967a/1989, 37) The above example of conversational implicature is, then, a case of particularized conversational implicature. A generalized conversational implicature (henceforth GCI) occurs where “the use of a certain forms of words in an utterance would normally (in the absence of special circumstances) carry such-and-such an implicature or type of implicature.” (Ibid.). Grice’s first example is a sentence of the form “X is meeting a woman this evening.” Anyone who utters this sentence, in absence of special circumstances, would be taken to implicate that the woman in question was someone other than X’s “wife, mother, sister, or perhaps even close platonic friend” (Ibid.) Being an implicature, it could be cancelled, either implicitly, in appropriate circumstances, or explicitly, adding some clause that implies its denial.
Particularized conversational implicatures have a wide range of applications that Grice himself illustrates: the informative use of tautologies, irony, metaphor, hyperbole, meiosis and, in principle, any kind of non-literal use that relies in special circumstances of the utterance can be explained in terms of them. But GCIs apply to philosophically more important issues, in particular, to what, according to the introduction to “Logic and Conversation”, was Grice’s most important motivation: the issue of the difference of meaning between logical constants of formal languages and their counterparts in natural languages, or the alleged meanings of verbs like ‘to look like,’ ‘to believe’ or ‘to know.’ GCIs are also at the heart of Grice’s Modified Occam’s Razor (“Senses are not to be multiplied beyond necessity,” Grice 1967b/1989, 47), which has served as a criterion for distinguishing semantic issues from pragmatic uses and for preferring, in general, an explanation in terms of implicatures rather than a semantic one that postulates ambiguity.
Grice is probably best known in the philosophy of language for his theory of implicatures. It is surely his most influential body of work for those parts of linguistics, psychology, cognitive science and computer science that share philosophy’s interest in language. His theory of meaning, however, is indispensable for understanding his overall philosophical vision and his ‘big picture’ of language and communication. We will not explain this project, which consists in part of ultimately reducing all semantic notions to psychological ones. But we will say a bit about its central concept of ‘M-intentions,’ in order to develop an important aspect of his pragmatic theory, the concept of a communicative intention.
Grice conceived that semantic notions like word and sentence meaning were ultimately based on speaker’s meaning, and this on speaker’s intention, what he called M-intentions. What he conceived as a study of the ontology of semantic notions has been received, however, as a characterization of communicative intentions, the mental causes of communicative acts, and those that the hearer has to understand for the communicative act to be successful.
So conceived, communicative intentions have these characteristic properties:
- They are always oriented towards some other agent — the addressee.
- They are overt, that is, they are intended to be recognized by the addressee.
- Their satisfaction consists precisely in being recognized by the addressee.
These properties are already pointed out in the first version of Grice’s M-intentions:
“A meant something by x” is (roughly) equivalent to “A intended the utterance of x to produce some effect in an audience by means of the recognition of this intention.” (Grice 1957/1989, 220.)
Grice later reformulated this definition, giving rise to a hot debate about the precise characterization of communicative intentions, mainly about two points:
- Communicative intentions are intentions to produce some response
on the part of the addressee, but what kind of response, exactly,
should this be? Suppose I tell you, “It’s raining.”
This act may have many results: perhaps you will hear the words,
understand their meaning, come to believe that it is raining, search
for your umbrella, fail to find it and grow angry, and finally become
so angry you chew the rug. I may have planned all of this, but more
typically I will have had in mind that you be prepared for the
weather. But my communicative intention seems to be directed at a
crucial subgoal. If I get you to believe it is raining, your own
rationality will take over and you will get prepared. What I seem to
aim at is changing your beliefs. It was this sort of response that
Grice took to be typical in his early work on meaning. But it is
really more in line with the spirit of his proposal that the crucial
subgoal be to get the audience to believe that the speaker believes
that it is raining. That’s really the change that language can
bring about; having gotten the audience that far, the speaker needs to
hope that the audience trusts her weather-knowledge, will take the
steps to themselves believing in rain, and then prepare adequately for
But even this rather modest subgoal may be too much to require for the success of the communicative action qua communicative action. Suppose I say that it is raining, and you hear me and understand the meaning of my words. But you don’t think I am being sincere; you don’t believe that I believe what I said. But still, I have said it. My overall plan to help insure that you don’t get wet and catch cold may fail, but I do seem to have succeeded in saying what I set out to say. It seems that the only new mental state needed is the audience’s recognition of the speaker’s communicative intention; his understanding of the speaker’s utterance. This is what has been called ‘illocutionary uptake’:
In the case of illocutionary acts we succeed in doing what we are trying to do by getting our audience to recognize what we are trying to do. But the ‘effect’ on the hearer is not a belief or a response, it consists simply in the hearer understanding the utterance of the speaker. (Searle 1969, 47.)
So the most common answer has been to follow Searle on this point and exclude perlocutionary results, beyond uptake of this sort, from the content of communicative intentions.
- Communicative intentions must be wholly overt:
The understanding of the force of an utterance in all cases involves recognizing what may be called broadly an audience-directed intention and recognizing it as wholly overt, as intended to be recognized. (Strawson 1964, 459.)
The exact formulation of this requirement has been a subject of intense debate, some arguing for a reflexive (self-referential) definition, others for a potentially infinite but practically finite number of clauses in the definition, with conceptual, logical or psychological arguments. What seems to be a matter of consensus is that every covert or even neutral (with respect to its intended recognition by the addressee) aspect of the speaker’s intention must be left out of the definition of communicative intentions.
A short but comprehensive way of concluding would be to say that the fulfillment of communicative intentions consists precisely in being recognized by the addressee. (For this debate, see Searle 1969; Schiffer 1972; Harman 1974; Blackburn 1984; Sperber and Wilson 1986; Recanati 1986; Bach 1987 and Neale 1992.)
After the founding work made in parallel by Austin-Searle, on the one side, and by Grice, on the other, Kent Bach and Robert Harnish (Linguistic Communication and Speech Acts (1979)) made an important attempt to integrate the founders’ insights in a unified theory.
On the whole, if choosing the appropriate label for their theory between either ‘neo-Gricean’ or ‘neo-Austinian/Searlean,’ the first seem the most appropriate: their theory might be taken to lean toward the Gricean conception of inferential understanding of the speaker’s communicative intentions rather than to the Austin-Searle view of speech acts as performed according to some conventional or ‘constitutive’ rules. To obtain a unified theory they developed their own conceptual framework, based on the ideas of Grice, Austin and Searle but including many important innovations of their own. Here it is a brief description of some of them:
Like Austin, but unlike Searle, Bach and Harnish argue for the concept of locutionary acts: acts of using sentences with “a more or less definite ‘sense’ and a more or less definite ‘reference,’” in Austin’s words. They are more explicit than Austin, and argue that determining what someone has (locutionarily) said by uttering a sentence amounts to determining
- the operative meaning of the sentence uttered
- the referents for the referring expressions
- the properties and relations being ascribed
- the times specified
With this information the hearer identifies what a speaker has said, at the locutionary level. From a contemporary perspective, the most remarkable point here is, in our opinion, that they see the determination of the locutionary act by the hearer, not as a matter of merely decoding the conventional meaning of the sentence uttered, but as a matter of inference that has to be based on linguistic meaning plus contextual information concerning the speaker’s intentions. Grice did not claim that what a speaker said was determinable without consideration of the speaker’s intentions; quite the contrary. But he was not particularly explicit about the way it was done, and the received view, anyway, has been that inference was exclusive to the ‘calculation’ of implicatures.
The distinction between locutionary and illocutionary acts of saying also offers Bach and Harnish a useful conceptual tool for treating potentially problematic cases of discordance between utterance content and speaker’s intentions, such as slips of the tongue, false referential beliefs, and irony.
To go from the locutionary to the illocutionary content, if there is any, the hearer has to infer the communicative intention of the speaker, and to do that, the hearer needs more information. Among other things, the hearer will have to make use of the Communicative Presumption (CP) that they state as follows:
The mutual belief in the linguistic community CL to the effect that whenever a member S says something in L to another member H, he is doing so with some recognizable illocutionary intent. (Bach and Harnish 1979, 61.)
The taxonomy of illocutionary acts
Bach and Harnish accept most of Searle’s (1975a) critiques of Austin’s taxonomy as well as his criteria for grouping illocutionary acts in terms of basic illocutionary intentions and expression of mental attitudes; but they make some amendments. To begin with, they discard Searle’s class of declarative illocutionary acts (basically covering Austin’s explicit performatives), because they take them to be basically assertives or constatives (see Searle 1989, Bach and Harnish 1992 for a further discussion of this issue). Then, the communicative illocutionary acts are (Bach and Harnish 1979, ch. 3):
- constatives, that express a speaker’s belief and her desire that the hearer forms a similar one.
- directives, that express some attitude about a possible future action by the hearer and the intention that her utterance be taken as reason for the hearer’s action.
- commissives, that express the speaker’s intention to do something and the belief that her utterance obliges her to do it.
- acknowledgments, that express feelings toward the hearer (or the intention that the utterance will meet some social expectations regarding the expression of feelings).
Bach and Harnish make a distinction between communicative illocutionary acts, the category to which these four types belong, and the category of conventional illocutionary acts, which they take to be fundamentally different. Communicative acts are acts performed with certain communicative intentions whose recognition by the hearer is necessary for the acts to be successful. In conventional acts, on the other hand, no communicative intention need be involved. Success is a matter of convention, not intention. Conventional acts determine and produce facts of institutional nature, if performed according to conventions that do not require any communicative intention on the part of the speaker and, a fortiori, neither its recognition on the part of any hearer. Among conventional acts, Bach and Harnish (1979, ch. 6) distinguish between two classes:
- effectives, that when produced by the appropriate person in appropriate circumstances produce a change, a new fact in an institutional context; an example might the President of the United States statement that he vetoes a piece of legislation.
- verdictives, do not produce facts, but determine facts, natural or institutional, with an official, binding effect in the institutional context; an example is a jury’s verdict of guilt; it does not create the fact of guilt, but settles the issue of guilt in a binding way.
The Speech Act Schema (SAS) gives the form of the required reasoning by the hearer to fully understand the speaker’s utterance: from the meaning of the sentence used all the way to the perlocutionary act performed. This requires, besides linguistic information, a system of communicative and conversational presumptions, together with contextual mutual beliefs.
Bach and Harnish think that inference is involved, from the beginning, in the determination of the locutionary act. The next step is to infer the literal illocutionary intentions and from here, in the simplest case, go for the (intended) perlocutionary ones, if any. Roughly, an illocutionary act is literal when its propositional content coincides with the content of the locutionary act, and the force of the former is within the constraints imposed by the latter.
But it may happen that the literal illocutionary act cannot be taken as a reasonable thing to have been done by the speaker in some specific circumstances (say, the literal claim is false and obviously so), and the hearer has to search for another non-literal act. Someone speaks non-literally when she does not mean what she says but something else instead.
It can also be the case that the speaker is doing more than merely performing a literal act. She means what she says but she means more. The hearer will have to infer the indirect act being performed. It must be noticed that indirect acts can also be based on non-literal acts. Then the SAS extends to account for the intentional perlocutionary effects of the speech act.
Bach and Harnish’s SAS offers a detailed study of the structure of utterance interpretation as an inferential process. Taken as an attempt of unification of the two main roots of pragmatics, it can be considered as the closing of the ‘Classic Pragmatics’ period and the transition from ‘philosophical’ pragmatics to linguistic and psychological pragmatics. They can be still located within far-side pragmatics but their clear idea of the role of pragmatic ‘intrusion’ in the determination of what is said is announcing the arrival of near-side pragmatics.
In logic and in many of the investigations of logical empiricists in the first two-thirds of the twentieth century, artificial languages were the focus of attention. First the predicate calculus, and then various extensions of it incorporating modal and temporal operators seemed the appropriate linguistic vehicles for clear-thinking philosophers. Issues about the use of natural languages were often thought to be beyond the scope of the proof-theoretic and model-theoretic tools developed by logicians. As Stalnaker put it in 1970,
The problems of pragmatics have been treated informally by philosophers in the ordinary language tradition, and by some linguists, but logicians and philosophers of a formalistic frame of mind have generally ignored pragmatic problems … . (Stalnaker 1970/1999, 31.)
(For an important exception, see Reichenbach’s Elements of Symbolic Logic (1947).)
The idea that techniques of formal semantics should be adapted to natural languages was forcefully defended by Donald Davidson, on general philosophical principles, and Richard Montague, who applied the techniques of possible worlds semantics to fragments of English in a body of work that was influential in both philosophy and linguistics.
These attempts make clear that, on the near side of what is said, semantics and pragmatics are quite enmeshed. The interpretation of indexicals and demonstratives seems squarely in the realm of pragmatics, since it is particular facts about particular utterances, such as the speaker, time, and location, that determine the interpretation of ‘I,’ ‘you,’ ‘now’ and the like. But the relevance of these varying factors is determined by a non-varying rule of meaning, as Bar-Hillel (1954) had already observed.
In his essay “Pragmatics” (1968), Richard Montague generalized the concept of a possible world to deal with a number of phenomena, including indexicals. An index combines a possible world with other factors relevant to the truth value of a sentence. To study tensed sentences, for example, one incorporates times into indices. A sentence like “Elwood went to the store,” is true in a world, at a time. A sentence like “I went to the store,” would be true in a world, at a time, for a speaker: roughly, if the speaker went to the store prior to the time in the world.
If we ignore time, we can think of the meaning of “I am sitting” as a function from pairs of speakers and worlds to truth-values. Suppose Moe is sitting in the actual world w and standing in alternative world w′, while Curley is standing in w and sitting in w′. “I am sitting” is true at <Moe, w> and <Curley, w′>.
A somewhat different approach to indexicality, implemented in different ways by David Kaplan and Robert Stalnaker, has been much more influential, however. Here is how Stalnaker put the key idea:
The scheme I am proposing looks roughly like this: The syntactical and semantical rules for a language determine an interpreted sentence or clause: this, together with some features of the context of use of the sentence or clause determines a proposition; this in turn, together with a possible world, determines a truth-value. An interpreted sentence, then, corresponds to a function from contexts into propositions, and a proposition is a function from possible worlds into truth-values. (Stalnaker 1970/1999, 36.)
Both of these philosophers develop a ‘two-tiered’ approach to the content of utterances of sentences containing indexicals. “I am sitting” expresses the proposition that Moe is sitting in a context with Moe as speaker, a different proposition, that Curley is sitting, in a context with Curley as speaker. Thus we have two functions involved. The character (Kaplan) or propositional concept (Stalnaker) is a function from contexts to propositions. And, at least within possible worlds semantics, propositions are conceived as functions from worlds to truth-values.
This ‘two-tiered’ approach brings out what Moe’s utterance of “I am sitting,” has and doesn’t have in common with Curley’s utterance of “You are sitting,” directed at Moe. They both have the same truth-value, of course, but more importantly they express the same proposition, in spite of having different meanings (characters, propositional concepts).
There are, however, important differences in the way Kaplan and Stalnaker implement this idea, which reflect the very different ways in which they think about context.
The most influential treatment of indexicals and demonstratives has probably been David Kaplan’s monograph Demonstratives (1989), versions of which were circulated in the seventies. Kaplan’s basic concepts are context, character, and content. Character is what is provided by sentences with indexicals, like “I am sitting,” or “You are sitting,” a function from contextual features to contents.
For Kaplan, a context is a quadruple of an agent, location, time and world; intuitively, these are the speaker of an utterance, the time and location of the utterance, and the possible world in which it occurs; the beliefs of the speaker as to who she is, where she is, and when it is, and what the real world is like are irrelevant to determining content, although not of course to explaining why the speaker says what she does. (The possible world is the contextual feature Kaplan uses to deal with “actually”). A proper context is one in which the agent is at the location at the time in the world, which is of course the characteristic relation among the speaker, time, location and world of an utterance.
Kaplan did not officially take his theory to be a theory of utterances. He thought of his account, or at least of the formal theory he supplies, as a theory of occurrences, or sentences-in-context, which are abstract objects consisting of pairs of contexts and expression types. Utterances, Kaplan argues, are an unsuitable subject matter for logical investigation. Utterances take time, for one thing, so it would not be possible to insist that all of the premises of an argument share the same context, but this stipulation is needed for logic. For another, since any utterance of “I am not speaking” would be false, we might have to conclude that “I am speaking” is a logical truth, an unwelcome result.
Kaplan does not call what he is doing “pragmatics” but the semantics of indexicals and demonstratives.
Kaplan’s theory was part of a movement in the philosophy of language that developed the sixties and seventies, which we will call ‘referentialism.’ For our purposes, the salient aspects of referentialism are (i) in some forms, heavy reliance was made of the concept of ‘what is said,’ — often equated with ‘the proposition expressed’ — by a particular utterance of a suitably declarative sentence; (ii) referentialists argued persuasively that ‘what is said’ or ‘the proposition expressed’ depends on reference of names, indexicals and demonstratives, rather than any descriptive ‘backing’ or identifying conditions speakers or hearers might associate with them. More controversially, Donnellan (1966) argued that in the case of ‘referential’ uses of definite descriptions, the reference of the description, rather than the descriptive condition, is a constituent of the proposition expressed.
The question naturally raises, then, how does the referentialist conception of what is said fit with Grice’s theory of conversation, which, as we have seen, pertains to the reasons the speaker has for saying what she does.
It can be argued that Kaplan’s concept of content fits in with Grice’s theory of conversation. For the purposes of formal semantics and logic, the context (in Kaplan’s sense) can be taken as given. Kaplan treats both the sentence and the context as abstract objects, and all of the rules of interpretation are suitably deductive. Pragmatics begins when we apply Kaplan’s theory to utterances. Semantics and near-side pragmatics resolve reference, and so what proposition is expressed, that is, what is said, by an utterance involving the use of a sentence in a context. Then Grice’s theory of conversation, and the Austin-Searle theory of speech acts, takes over to tell us what else the speaker has implicated by saying what she did, and what else she has accomplished in or by saying what she did.
This picture is not without problems, however. Referentialism seems to bring in its wake various version of Frege’s problem of identity, and these are relevant to pragmatics.
Consider the statements “Hesperus is visible in the eastern sky” and “Phosphorus is visible in the eastern sky.” On referentialist principles, the two statements express the same proposition, the one that is true in all worlds in which Venus (the planet that ‘Hesperus’ and ‘Phosphorus’ are two names for) is visible in the eastern sky. But they seem to convey different information. And, most dramatically, “Hesperus is Hesperus” seems trivial, while “Hesperus is Phosphorus” or “Phosphorus is Venus” seem to convey valuable information. And yet, on referentialist principles, all three identity statements express the same proposition.
Paradigmatically, according to Grice’s theory, the input to the hearer’s reasoning about implicatures is what is said. Referentialism would seem to imply that different ways of saying the same thing should be conversationally equivalent. But this does not seem correct. If Elwood says, “I can’t reach the salt,” this has the implicature that he would appreciate someone passing it to him. But what if he says, “Elwood can’t reach the salt”? The implicatures are not so clear. Elwood seems to have flouted the maxim of quantity, in both its submaxims, giving us information we don’t need (the name of the person who can’t reach the salt), and denying us information we do need, namely that the speaker is the person whose relation to the saltshaker is at issue. Grice’s maxims of manner allow the theory of conversation to deal with information that depends on how something is said, rather than only what is said; it seems these maxims may have to be exploited beyond what Grice envisaged to explain how co-referential names and indexicals can give rise to non-equivalent implicatures, if we adopt the referentialist account of what is said.
In his seminal article “Pragmatics” (1970) Stalnaker proposed a conception of semantics and pragmatics that would allow the tools and traditions of formal semantics to be extended to pragmatics. The pragmatic phenomena he mainly had in mind are what we are calling “near-side pragmatics,” involving the way in which, in the setting of natural language, contextual factors interact with conventional meaning to determine what is said, or the proposition expressed. Stalnaker uses his pragmatic theory to deal with issues that might be thought to require a semantic explanation, such as the informativeness of identity statements (“Hesperus is Phosphorus”) and the import of negative existentials (“Homer did not exist”); in doing so he saw himself as continuing in a Gricean tradition:
… I think the general Gricean strategy of trying to reduce the burden on semantics by explaining as much of the phenomena as possible in terms of truisms about conversation as a rational activity remains as fruitful and promising as it was when he first proposed it. (Stalnaker 1999, 113.)
Formal semantics, as Stalnaker sees it, can be conceived as the study of propositions within a possible worlds framework. Artificial languages are designed to fit the meanings they are to express, so the connection between language and proposition should not be a tricky issue. But with natural languages,
it is a semantical problem to specify the rules for matching up sentences of a natural language with the propositions that they express. In most cases…the rules will not match sentences directly with propositions, but will match sentences with propositions relative to features of the context in which the sentence is used. These contextual features are a part of the subject matter of pragmatics… (Stalnaker 1970/1999, 34.)
Presupposition, Common Ground and Context
Like Kaplan, Stalnaker has a two-tiered picture: sentence meanings provide a function from contexts to propositions; propositions themselves are functions from worlds to truth-values. Stalnaker, however, has a quite different picture of context, which he bases on the concept of presupposition. Intuitions about what is said are accompanied by intuitions about what is not said, but merely presupposed. If Elwood says,
- The Queen of England has several palaces
he does not say that there is a Queen of England, but he presupposes that there is. And consider
- Peter knows the sea is salty
- It was James Madison that led America to defeat in the war of 1812
- Bush regrets invading Iraq
- Trump resumed cheating on his wife
In saying (2), Elwood would not say, but merely presuppose, that the sea is salty. In saying (3) he would presuppose, but not say, that someone led America to defeat in the War of 1812. In saying (4) Elwood would presuppose that Bush invaded Iraq, and in (5) he would presuppose that Trump had cheated on his wife, and then stopped doing so for a period of time (possibly rather short).
Presupposition has been treated as a semantic phenomenon and as a pragmatic phenomenon. Arguably, each of (1)-(5) and its corresponding negation would have the same presupposition. This has led to the semantic conception of presupposition as a non-trivial entailment that is shared by a statement and its negation. Semantical approaches to presupposition encounter some tricky problems, the most important of which is “the projection problem.” If presupposition is semantic, then it seems the presuppositions of complex sentences should be a function of the presuppositions of the simple sentences that make them up, but it is at least not obvious that this is so. Consider, for example,
- The king has a son
- The king’s son is bald
- If the king has a son, the king’s son is bald
(6) presupposes that there is a king, (7) that there is a king and that the king has a son. (8) contains both (6) and (7). It seems to inherit the presupposition of (6) but not of (7); that is, (8) presupposes that there is a king, but not that he has a son. A correct theory of just how presuppositions are inherited from simple to complex sentences would solve the projection problem, and doing so seems to be required for a semantic account of presupposition. A number of interesting theories have been put forward; it is not our purpose to claim that they are or are not successful. (See Kartunnen 1973, 1974; Kartunnen and Peters 1979; Gazdar 1979; Soames 1989; Burton-Roberts 1989a-b, 1999; Heim 1992; Horn 19995; Asher and Lascarides 1998; Carston 1998, 1999a; Kamp 2001; Beaver 2002; Schlenker 2010.)
Stalnaker recognizes semantic presupposition in the case of simple sentences (1)-(5). And he thinks that semantic presuppositions are also pragmatically presupposed; that is, if P is a semantic presupposition of what the speaker says, then the speaker will in fact take P for granted and take her audience to do so too; she will treat P as part of the common ground:
There is no conflict between the semantic and pragmatic concepts of presupposition; they are explications of related but different ideas. In general, any semantic presupposition of a proposition expressed in a given context will be a pragmatic presupposition of the people in the context, but the converse clearly does not hold.
To presuppose a proposition in the pragmatic sense is to take its truth for granted, and to assume that others involved in the context do the same…
The set of all the presuppositions made by a person in a given context determines a class of possible worlds, the ones consistent with all the presuppositions. This class sets the boundaries of the linguistic situation. (Stalnaker 1970/1999, 38.)
Stalnaker emphasizes that when we make assertions (the paradigmatic use of language, conceived as a tool for exchanging information), there is a natural division into what the speaker presupposes and what the speaker says. If Elwood says, “The Queen of England has charming grandchildren,” he presupposes that there is a unique queen of England, and says that her grandchildren are charming. In the ordinary case, the presupposition would be shared by the conversational participants, but not everyone would already know, or believe, what Elwood says about her. The presuppositions that are shared are the common ground, which is an important part of the context of an utterance. Elwood’s assertion is an attempt to add to the common ground that additional content that the queen’s grandchildren are charming. Of course, someone may deny that this is so, in which case it wouldn’t become part of the common ground. Nevertheless, we can conceptualize the meaning of a sentence, or a central part of the meaning of a sentence, in terms of the change a use of it attempts to make to the common ground.
Unlike Kaplan, Stalnaker has a homogeneous theory of contexts and contents. Both context and content can be conceived of as propositions, or equivalently as sets of worlds. A context is a set of worlds, that capture the common ground in a conversation, the presuppositions that all of the participants share. The point of an assertion is to change the common ground. An utterance token is associated with a propositional concept, which characterizes the context-change potential of an assertion.
A propositional concept is a function from possible worlds into propositions, or, equivalently, a function from an ordered pair of possible worlds into a truth-value. (Stalnaker 1978/199, 81.)
The truth-value of a statement like “That man is sitting” will depend on two issues: (i) who is being referred to as ‘that man’; (ii) who is sitting. The propositional concept corresponding to this statement will yield the truth for any pair of worlds w, w′ such that there is an x that is referred to as ‘that man’ in w, and x is sitting in w′.
Suppose, for example, we are talking about Albert. The common ground will include such things as that ‘Albert’ names a certain person that attended Stanford last year, that this person was from Bonn, and that he intended to return and teach in Germany. The common ground leaves open whether he is, as we speak, in Germany or not. I say, “Albert isn’t in Germany, but in Switzerland, this month.” If no one objects, the common ground will change; the worlds in which Albert is anywhere but in Switzerland will be eliminated. The propositional concept of an utterance can be seen as the effect it will have on the various contexts in which it might occur. Which worlds my assertion adds or deletes from the common ground will depend on who we are talking about (the reference of ‘Albert’) and which month it is when I speak, for example. The proposition expressed by a statement, what is asserted, will be a proposition that captures the change proposed for the context in which it occurs.
Suppose now that you and I are talking, and not far in the distance are Elwood and Ambrose. Elwood is clearly standing; it’s not so clear whether Ambrose is standing or sitting. I point to Ambrose and say, “that man is sitting.” Given that I am pointing to Ambrose, my statement will be true only if he is sitting, and so perhaps you change your beliefs accordingly; what was not part of the common ground, that Ambrose was sitting, now becomes part of the common ground.
Another possibility is that you think you see Ambrose at least as clearly than I do, and it is not at all clear that I am right. So you reject my proposal to modify the common ground, and say, “Ambrose may not be sitting.”
But there is a third possibility, too. Suppose you took me as pointing to Elwood. But if I am pointing to Elwood, I am saying something patently false, for it is clear that he is standing. To make sense of my remark, the simplest thing to do is change your view of whom I am pointing at: Ambrose rather than Elwood. Now the change is not in who you think is sitting or not, but whom you think I am pointing to. Given the propositional concept of the utterance “that man is sitting”, it works, in the paradigmatic case, to convey information about who is sitting, and it also has the capacity, in a different situation, to convey information about to whom I am pointing.
The concept of a propositional concept allows Stalnaker to accommodate the facts that, as we saw above, seemed to pose a problem for referentialists.
Most current pragmatic theorists are neo-Griceans in that they adopt at least some version of his main three contributions:
- a fundamental distinction of what a speaker says and what she implicates;
- a set of rules or principles, derived from general principles of rationality, cooperation and/or cognition, that guide, constrain or govern human linguistic communication (there are differences among neo-Griceans on the exact nature of these principles and of pragmatic reasoning generally, as we shall see); and
- a notion of communicative intention (called M(eaning)-intention by Grice) whose fulfillment consists in being recognized by the addressee.
Given these similarities, there are many differences. One important dimension involves disciplines and methodology. Following Carston (2005) there are at least three different general tendencies: those who see pragmatics, much in Grice’s vein, as a philosophical project; those who concentrate on its interaction with grammar; and those who see it as an empirical psychological theory of utterance interpretation.
A second dimension has to do with the relative importance given to two models of communication. One is the coding-decoding model of Locke and Saussure, as developed in the twentieth century logic and philosophy in compositional theories of meaning and truth. The other model, which we owe mostly to Grice, also has Lockean roots, in that communication of belief from speaker to hearer lies at its center. But the mechanism of discovery is not decoding according to conventional rules, but intention-recognition and discovery based on ampliative inference. The two models are not inconsistent, and all theorists accept elements of each. The issue is their relative centrality and importance in the phenomenon of human communication with language.
According to the coding model, communication consists in a sender and a receiver sharing a common code or language and a channel, so that the former encodes the message and sends it for the latter to decode it. Communication is, following this picture, quite an easy matter. It just amounts to knowledge of language and a safe channel — i.e., without too much ‘noise.’ If sender and receiver share the knowledge of the code and the message makes its way through the channel the success of communication is guaranteed.
One of Grice’s major contributions to the theory of communication was provision of an alternative to the Locke-Saussure model of communication as a coding and decoding of thoughts. One can think of the alternative either as a supplement or a replacement for the coding model.
Intentions and their recognition are at the heart of Grice’s alternative. Even if the interpreter’s reasoning is guided by the conversational principle or maxims, as Grice suggested, intention-recognition is not basically a matter of following conventional rules, but ampliative reasoning about what is going on in other minds.
But how do the two models fit together? Is language mainly and centrally a matter of deduction, of coding and decoding according to the conventions of meaning, with a little intention-recognition around the near and far edges to take care of ambiguity and implicature? Or is communication mainly a matter of acting in ways that get one’s intentions recognized, with the conventions of language being just a helpful resource for accomplishing this?
In the classical period, near-side pragmatics tended to be ignored, and the Gricean model applied only to issues beyond saying; all of this is consistent with the first picture. Many neo-Griceans still adopt much of the first picture, and see the core of language as an autonomous realm studied by semantics, in which the meanings of parts compositionally determine the meanings of wholes, the fundamental concept of meaning being the truth-conditions of sentences. Grice’s work is often used to bolster this picture; Gricean considerations serve as a sort of shock-absorber, where apparent data that are difficult to handle on the autonomous-semantics picture are treated as merely apparent, resulting from mistaking implicatures for ‘semantic content.’ Recanati calls such theorists ‘minimalists;’ (see 3.4 below) while no one denies that contextual facts and pragmatic reasoning are needed at the near side of what is said, according to these theorists, there is minimal intrusion of such considerations on autonomous semantics.
According to relevance theory this is a mistake. Sperber and Wilson (1986) see things the second way. Following Grice’s model, understanding what someone means by an utterance is a matter of inferring the speaker’s communicative intention: the hearer uses all kinds of information available to get at what the speaker intended to convey. The semantic information obtained by decoding the sentence uttered is but one example of such information. But much more information has to be used to infer what the speaker meant — that includes both what she said and what she implicated — by her utterance. So central is intention-recognition to understanding language that the code model, with autonomous semantics at its core, should largely be abandoned in favor of the inferential model. One kind of pragmatic reasoning pervades language use, near-side and far-side, and the areas in which the code model is applicable are basically marginal.
The need for supplementary information is too pervasive and too important to be a matter of something specifically linguistic, as might be suggested by Grice’s conversational principle and maxims. Sperber and Wilson see the fundamental mechanism of such inferences as going well beyond language, and beyond humans. In terms of Carston’s distinctions, relevance theory departs from Grice’s philosophical project, and aims at an empirical psychological theory of human cognition and communication. They see the phenomenon they call ‘relevance’ as a psychological phenomenon basic to the lives not only of humans but of all animals with a cognitive repertoire sophisticated enough to have choices about which environmental cues to attend to. Evolution shapes the phenomenon of relevance; an animal’s attention is drawn to environmental cues that provide the most crucial information. Sounds of an approaching cat grabs a bird’s attention away from a worm; parents are alert to the sounds of their baby’s crying. The phenomenon is extended through learning; the squeal of brakes grabs a driver’s attention away from a pretty sunset. And the cues can be conventional; the dinner bell grabs the attention of the hungry child. The phenomenon of relevance in language is another manifestation of this very general phenomenon. ‘Relevance’ in relevance theory, then, should not be taken to be just our ordinary conception of relevance; nor should it be equated with the ‘relevance’ of Grice’s maxim, although it is connected to that and intended to provide a deepened understanding of what underlies the maxim.
Relevance theory emphasizes that the rules of language leave all sorts of issues open. Some words have too many meanings: ambiguity. Others have too little meaning: ‘he,’ or ‘that.’ Decoding alone won’t determine which meaning the speaker is using, or which object she intends to refer to with a pronoun. So even before we get to what is said, communication involves intentions on the part of the speaker that go beyond what she “codes-up” into language, and inferences on the part of the hearer that go beyond decoding. And of course when we consider what is conveyed beyond saying, the coding model is even less adequate. In all of these ways in which knowledge of convention falls short, relevance fills the gap.
A second difference rooted in the psychological conception of pragmatics is reliance on the representational theory of mind. The tenets of relevance theory are couched in talk of processing representations, rather than, and sometimes in addition to, the ordinary terminology of philosophical psychology.
Thus, instead of Grice’s cooperative principle and conversational maxims, relevance theory postulates principles of relevance, which stem from the applicability of the general phenomenon of relevance to linguistic situations in the context of a representational theory of mind. There are two fundamental principles.
Pragmatic relevance is a property of utterances as a particular case of inputs to cognitive processes:
An input is relevant to an individual when it connects with available contextual assumptions to yield POSITIVE COGNITIVE EFFECTS: for example, true contextual implications, or warranted strengthenings or revisions of existing assumptions. (Sperber & Wilson 2005, 7)
The relevance of an input for an individual is a matter of degree. In general, the greater those positive cognitive effects with the smaller mental effort to get them, the greater the relevance of the input for the individual. Sperber and Wilson conjecture that the cognitive architecture of human beings tends to the maximization of relevance. This is what their first principle of relevance states:
First (cognitive) principle of relevance: Human cognition is geared towards the maximization of relevance (that is, to the achievement of as many contextual (cognitive) effects as possible for as little processing effort as possible).
This is the general cognitive principle that serves as background for communication in general and linguistic communication in particular. Applied to linguistic communication, this involves the following: For a communicative act to be successful, the speaker needs the addressee’s attention; since everyone is geared towards the maximization of relevance, the speaker should try to make her utterance relevant enough to be worth the addressee’s attention. This leads us to the
Second (communicative) principle of relevance: Every act of ostensive communication (e.g. an utterance) communicates a presumption of its own optimal relevance.
By ‘ostensive’ relevance theorists make reference to the ‘overt’ or ‘public’ nature of the speaker’s communicative intentions in acts of communication. Communication will be successful (i.e., understanding will occur) when the addressee recognizes those intentions. This process is mostly inferential and it has costs. So, the addressee would not start the inferential process without a presumption that it will report her some benefits, that is, without a presumption that the input is not only relevant, but as relevant as it can, ceteris paribus. Then, when someone utters something with a communicative purpose, she does it, according to relevance theory, with the presumption of optimal relevance, which states that
- The utterance is relevant enough to be worth processing.
- It is the most relevant one compatible with the communicator’s abilities and preferences.
Although the principles of relevance account for near-side and far-side inferences, relevance theory acknowledges a fundamental distinction. On the near side, ambiguities, references, and issues of vagueness will be resolved so as to make the ‘explicature’ — the relevance theoretic replacement for ‘what is said,’ or ‘the proposition expressed’ — maximally relevant. A somewhat more complex sort of reasoning then derives implicatures. But these processes are not sequential. The ‘choice’ of explicature will be affected by the need to come to an understanding of everything that is communicated, explicature and implicature, as maximally relevant.
The addressee’s understanding process starts then when she perceives an ostensive stimulus and stops when her expectations of relevance are satisfied, that is, when she has the most relevant hypothesis (the one with the most positive cognitive effects at the least processing costs) about the speaker’s communicative intention. After decoding the sentence uttered and getting at the proposition expressed, the hearer will built a ‘context’ of ‘implicated premises’ or assumptions for getting the cognitive positive effects that make the utterance relevant. Remember that those effects can be the reinforcement or revision of those assumptions but also conclusions obtained deducing then from the proposition expressed plus the context of premises. This context building will also be highly constrained by relevance, looking for as many positive effects as possible with the fewer inferential steps as possible. In addition, the hearer has to look for the contents or assumptions the speaker ostensively intends her to consider.
Consider the following exchange between A and B:
- Have you seen The Da Vinci Code?
- I don’t like action movies.
It is reasonable to think that in B’s response has the following implicatures, as implicated premise and conclusion, respectively:
- Premise: That The Da Vinci Code is an action movie.
- Conclusion: That B has not seen it and, maybe, does not intend to see it.
A retrieves the premise that together with the content of B’s response allows her to deduce a conclusion that is reasonable to think B intends her to make, given that it seems the most relevant (the one with more cognitive positive effects — as implicatures in this case — with low processing costs).
This is how relevance theory re-interprets the Gricean notion of particularized conversational implicatures: they are treated as implicated premises and conclusions, communicated beyond what the speaker says. On the other hand, relevance theorists abandon the category of generalized conversational implicatures. The phenomena Grice took to be as generalized conversational implicatures belong on the near side according to relevance theorists. They are not part of what is implicated by the speaker in making her utterance, but part of the explicature.
According to this view, pragmatics in general and the principle of relevance in particular have a lot to say about what happens on the near side of the explicature. It is probably fair to say that relevance theorists are mainly responsible for contemporary pragmatics focusing not only on what is conveyed beyond saying but also on saying itself, and for the fact that, as we shall see below, contemporary philosophical pragmatic theory tends to focus on the extent to which pragmatics ‘intrudes’ upon the traditional turf of semantics.
Together with Horn’s (1984, 1989, 2004), Levinson’s work (2000) is a good representative of grammar-oriented pragmatics. Levinson is only marginally a neo-Gricean. He is not committed to Grice’s fundamental two-fold division between what is said, on the one hand, and implicatures, on the other — he proposes a third level of default or preferred interpretation. He does not provide a theory of utterance comprehension based primarily on recognition of communicative intentions, for default interpretations are not concerned with that. However, he does assume conversational principles and maxims, formulating a series of heuristics, inspired by Grice’s maxims, for a theory of Generalized Conversational Implicatures (GCIs) that, as important as they were in Grice’s program, have been neglected by many post-Gricean authors. Levinson’s GCI theory is not a philosophical theory of human communication, nor a psychological theory of utterance understanding, but a partial theory of utterance-type meaning with its focus on linguistics. As he puts it:
In the composite theory of meaning, the theory of GCIs plays just a small role in a general theory of communication… It is just to linguistic theory that GCIs have an unparalleled import. (Levinson 2000, pp. 21–22.)
The two-layered view of utterance content consisting, according to Levinson, of a level of encoded meaning (sentence-meaning) and a level of inferential meaning (speaker’s or utterance-(token)-meaning), must be supplemented by a third intermediate layer of utterance-type-meaning which is not based “on direct computations on speaker-intentions but rather on general expectations about how language is normally used” (p. 22).
These expectations are formulated by Levinson as a series of heuristics, that have a clear connection with Grice’s maxims of quantity and manner:
First (Q) Heuristic: What isn’t said, isn’t (i.e., what you do not say is not the case)
This is related to Grice’s first maxim of quantity (“Make your contribution as informative as required”) and is held responsible for the inference of so-called scalar implicatures, among others. So from an utterance of “Some students came to the party” it is inferable by default that not all the students came. It is not part of the meaning of ‘some,’ yet, in general — by default from the utterance-type — it is what one would infer in absence of evidence to the contrary. In this case, the heuristic has to be restricted to a set of alternates in a ‘scale,’ so that the use of one implicates the non-applicability of the other.
Second (I) Heuristic: What is expressed simply is stereotypically exemplified
This is related to Grice’s second maxim of quantity (“Do not make your contribution more informative than necessary”), and is taken to be involved in cases of interpretation of conditionals as bi-conditionals, the enrichment of conjunctions with the expression of temporal and causal relations among the conjuncts, ‘bridging’ inferences, collective reading of plural noun phrases, and so on.
Third (M) Heuristic: What is said in an abnormal way, isn’t normal (i.e., marked message indicates marked situation)
This heuristic is related to Grice’s maxim of manner and, specially, to the first submaxim (“Avoid obscurity of expression”) and the fourth (“Avoid prolixity”). If according to the second heuristic an unmarked utterance gives rise to a stereotypical interpretation, now we have that this interpretation is overruled if a marked utterance is produced. One of the clearest examples is double negation versus simple positive assertion. Compare “It’s possible the plane will be late” with “It’s not impossible that the plane will be late.”
When conflict among these three heuristics arise, Levinson argues that these are resolved in the following way: Q defeats M, and M defeats I.
Contemporary philosophical approaches to pragmatics are often classified by their view of the two models discussed in Section 3.1. ‘Literalists’ think that semantics is basically autonomous, with little ‘pragmatic intrusion’; ‘contextualists’ adopt the basic outlines of the Relevance Theory view of the importance of pragmatics at every level, while perhaps demurring on many of the details and the psychological orientation.
Take, for example, an utterance of “It is raining” by John now on the CSLI patio in a telephone conversation with Kepa, who is in Donostia. John is talking about the weather in Stanford. Arguably, what John says is that it is raining in Stanford. This is what he intends for Kepa to understand, and it is the content of the belief, formed by looking at the weather around him, that motivates his utterance. Stanford, then, seems to be a constituent, part of the subject matter, of John’s remark. But how did it get there? It seems that it is a matter of pragmatics; it is a fact about John’s intentions that makes his remark to be about Stanford, and that suffices. This is an example of what Perry (1986) calls an ‘unarticulated constituent,’ and an instance of a more general phenomenon we will call ‘unarticulated content.’
The same basic choice, about what to do with apparently unarticulated content that seems to be part of what is said, presents itself in connection with a number of other phenomena: ‘enriched’ uses of logical operators and numerals (“Mary got married and [then] had [exactly] three children”), quantifier domain restriction (“Nobody [in the class] was paying attention”), comparative adjectives (“John is short [for a football player]”), and a long list of phenomena reconsidered now as possibly being part of what is said, the explicature or the content of the utterance, rather than part of what is implicated.
Most contemporary theorists would acknowledge that in such cases one might describe ‘what is said’ in terms of the unarticulated content: John said that it was raining at Stanford; the speaker said that Mary got married and then had children, and so forth. And there is general agreement that intuitions about ‘what is said’ cannot by themselves carry much theoretical weight, and there is considerable disagreement about theoretical interpretation of unarticulated content.
Literalists argue that the important divide, traditionally marked by ‘what is said,’ should be maintained, although marked by new terminology. Cappelen and Lepore’s (2005) term is ‘semantic content.’ On the near side of semantic content will be only the factors acknowledged by Grice: conventional meaning of words and modes of composition; resolution of ambiguity (including, perhaps, issues of standards of precision and vagueness), and resolution of reference of indexicals, demonstratives and names. On the far side are Gricean implicatures.
Among literalists, we may distinguish between minimalists and ‘hidden indexical’ theorists. Literalists, do not accept any pragmatically determined element in utterance content that is not triggered by grammar, i.e., by a particular context-sensitive element in the sentence used. Minimalists try to keep context-sensitive expressions to a minimum and hidden-indexicalists pose a context-sensitive expression whenever is needed. The latter admit the ‘unarticulated’ content into the proposition literally expressed by the utterance, but hold that it is not ‘really’ unarticulated, since below the surface grammar, at some deeper level, say logical form, the sentence provide an indexical to be resolved pragmatically (Stanley 2000; Stanley and Szabo 2000).
Cappelen and Lepore are both literalists and minimalists. They use the term ‘semantic content’ for propositions determined solely by conventions of meaning, precisification, disambiguation and reference fixing. They allow that semantic content, so conceived, is often not what ordinary speakers would identify as ‘what is said’; but they take what is said to be a pragmatic concept, and so do not see this as an objection to their scheme. The semantic content of John’s utterance above, for example, is something like the proposition “Rain is occurring,” a relatively trivial proposition, that will be true if it is raining anywhere on earth (or perhaps, anywhere in the universe). (See Cappelen and Lepore (2007) and Perry (2007).) The triviality of John’s remark, literally interpreted, sets Kepa on the search of some relevant proposition he may have meant to convey, and this proposition, that it is raining in Palo Alto, is what satisfies our intuitive concept of ‘what is said.’ But that shows only that ‘what is said’ is basically a pragmatic concept, that shouldn’t be used to delineate true semantic content. We need to change the sign from ‘what is said’ to ‘semantic content,’ rather than move the boundary to fit the sign. On the near side of semantic content we find only conventional meaning, disambiguation, and resolution of reference and vagueness. On the far side we find implicatures, that contribute not only what is suggested, conveyed, and the like, but even what is said, as ordinarily conceived.
Those over on the Contextualist side, in contrast, see the level corresponding to Grice’s ‘what is said’ as determined not only by semantics, disambiguation and reference-fixing, but also by a number of other pragmatic processes that ‘intrude’ on the near side and enrich semantic content. Contextualists include relevance theorists and such philosophers as Recanati (2004), Travis (1997), Korta and Perry (2006a, 2006b, 2007a, 2007b, 2008, 2011, 2013) and Neale (2004). Contemporary contextualists do not insist on the term ‘what is said,’ but provide other criteria for the boundary between the proposition more or less directly expressed and implicatures. Recanati argues that this level — which he sometimes calls ‘what is saidmax’ in contrast of the ‘what is saidmin’ of minimalists — should consist of a proposition that is consciously available to the speaker and the proposition he intends to express, and that any planned implications should also be consciously accessible. Cappelen and Lepore’s proposition would not usually pass this test. In our example, John would not be consciously aware of having expressed a proposition that would be true if it was raining on Venus, nor would he at any remotely conscious level have planned for Kepa to reason from the triviality and irrelevance of the proposition that rain occurs to the one he meant to convey, that it rains at Stanford.
In Korta and Perry’s ‘Critical Pragmatics’ (2008, 2011, 2013), the concept of ‘what is said’ is replaced with two concepts. The ‘reflexive’ or ‘utterance-bound content’ and the ‘referential’ or ‘locutionary content’ of an utterance. The ‘utterance-bound content’ is its truth-conditions, as determined by the conventional meanings of the words used and modes of composition, and thus corresponds to the ‘semantically determined content.’ This content will not be the proposition expressed, but rather a set of conditions on the utterance and the proposition it expresses, with quantification over all relevant factors not determined by meaning — including factors that resolve ambiguity and reference. At this level, then, Critical Pragmatics is radically minimal. For example, an utterance u of “Elwood touched that woman” will be true (roughly) if and only if there is an x and y such that the speaker of u refers to x with ‘Elwood,’ refers to y with ‘that woman,’ and uses ‘touches’ with for some action A permitted by the conventions of English, and at some time prior to the time of u, x A’ed y. The condition on the utterance given to the right of the ‘if and only if’ comprise the reflexive content of the utterance. On the other hand, the referential content of u will be the proposition that, say, Elwood put his hands on Eloise, if the actual facts about u provide Elwood, Eloise as the referents and putting one’s hands on as the relevant sense of ‘touches.’ Critical Pragmatics emphasizes the speaker’s plan, a hierarchy of intentions, as the main source of the facts that supplement conventional meaning to get us from reflexive to incremental meaning.
The second concept employed to do the traditional work of ‘what is said’ is ‘locutionary content.’ The intended locutionary content is basically the referential content the speaker intends to express, given her conception of the context — that is, roughly, the speaker, time, place and whom and what she points at. The locutionary content is fixed by the actual contextual facts, so a speaker’s intended locutionary content may not be the locutionary content of the utterance she produces.
An intermediate position — called ‘syncretic’ by Recanati (2004) — has been subtly defended by Kent Bach (1994, 1999a, 2001). Bach is on the literalist, minimalist side of the spectrum with respect to semantic content (for which he continues to use the term ‘what is said.’) But he agrees with contextualists that unarticulated contents are not implicatures, and are not triggered by the meaning of the sentence uttered. He introduces an intermediate category between what is said, in his minimalist sense, and implicatures, which he calls ‘implicitures’ —with ‘ci’ pronounced as in ‘implicit’ — to include these elements.
Recently, the philosopher Michael Devitt (2013) raised an interesting issue about an alleged methodological flaw of many, if not most, approaches to pragmatics. The flaw consists in conflating the metaphysics of meaning — the study of what constitutes the meaning of an utterance — and the epistemology of meaning — the study of how the hearer interprets the meaning of an utterance. In his words:
Consider the ‘meaning-properties’ of an utterance in as broad a sense as you like, cover all its ‘semantic’ and ‘pragmatic’ properties, in whatever preferred sense. So the properties we are concerned with include conventional properties, ‘what is said’, ‘what is implicated’, and so on. [footnote omitted] Now, what constitutes one of those properties is one thing, how the hearer discovers the property, another. The property is constituted by what the speaker does, by the conventions she participates in, the objects she has in mind, or messages she intentionally conveys. [footnote omitted] That is where we look for the ‘metaphysics of meaning’. And what needs emphasizing is that none of these meaning-properties is constituted in any way at all by what the hearer does in trying to interpret what is said or meant (Devitt, 2013: 288).
Devitt attributes the confusion between the metaphysics and the epistemology of meaning to most contextualist proposals (or what he calls linguistic pragmatism), such as Bezuidenhout (2002), Capone (2012), Carston (2004), Crimmins and Perry (1989), Elugardo and Stainton (2004), Green (1989), Korta and Perry (2008), Levinson (2000), Parikh (2010), Recanati (2004), Sperber and Wilson (1986/1995), Saul (2002), Stanley and Szabo (2000) and Taylor (2001). The exceptions, on the other hand, would be Bach (1999a, 2005), Neale (2004, 2016) and Fodor and Lepore (2004) (for a recent discussion, see the exchange between Korta and Perry (2019a, 2019b) and Devitt (2019) in the Journal of Pragmatics.)
Relevance theory, for example, certainly takes pragmatics to be the study of the comprehension processes of the utterance on the part of the hearer (Sperber and Wilson (1986/1995), Carston (2002), Wilson and Sperber (2012)). And, as Devitt claims, the study of those processes should not be confounded with the study of what constitutes the pragmatic properties of an utterance. In this case, however, the relevance-theoretic hearer-oriented perspective seems a matter of deliberate choice rather than a confusion.
Following Neale (forthcoming), besides the distinction between the metaphysics and the epistemology of meaning, we should also consider formatics: the study of how the speaker forms the plan that eventually causes the production of her utterance. It is reasonable to be clear about these three approaches, because though different, they are closely interconnected. The speaker’s beliefs about the hearer’s capability of understanding in the circumstances of the utterance may affect, and typically do affect, her formation of communicative intentions, which, in turn, constrain what she says and implicates. Some approaches combine the three perspectives, and being explicit about their difference may be often welcome.
Contemporary pragmatics is a large, active, interdisciplinary field. The work we have considered here merges into important work in logic, computer science and other areas we have not been able to discuss. Philosophers, the founders of the discipline, continue to play an important role in this field. Philosophically oriented pragmatists (to give an old term a new meaning) usually consider pragmatic issues with an eye towards large issues in the philosophy of language and beyond. But in the course of this, they provide detailed analyses and consider a wide variety of cases that continue to provide ideas and inspiration for pragmatists from other disciplines. There is formal and computational pragmatics; theoretical and applied; clinical, experimental pragmatics and even neuropragmatics; there is also intercultural. Interlinguistic and intersociocultural pragmatics; historical pragmatics and history of pragmatics. And this list, as the whole entry, is not exhaustive.
Many of the definitions reproduced below contrast pragmatics with semantics.
Morris 1938. Semantics deals with the relation of
signs to (…) objects which they may or do denote. Pragmatics
concerns the relation of signs to their interpreters.
By ‘pragmatics’ is designated the science of the relation of signs to their interpreters. (…) Since most, if not all, signs have as their interpreters living organisms, it is a sufficiently accurate characterization of pragmatics to say that it deals with the biotic aspects of semiosis, that is, with all the psychological, biological, and sociological phenomena which occur in the functioning of signs.
Carnap 1942. If in an investigation explicit reference is made to the speaker, or, to put it in more general terms, to the user of a language, then we assign it to the field of pragmatics. (…) If we abstract from the user of the language and analyze only the expressions and their designata, we are in the field of semantics. And if, finally, we abstract from the designata also and analyze only the relations between expressions, we are in (logical) syntax.
Bar-Hillel 1954. I believe, therefore, that the investigation of indexical languages and the erection of indexical language-systems are urgent tasks for contemporary logicians. May I add, for the sake of classificatory clarity, that the former task belongs to descriptive pragmatics and the latter to pure pragmatics (in one of the many senses of the expression)?
Stalnaker 1970. Syntax studies sentences, semantics studies propositions. Pragmatics is the study of linguistic acts and the contexts in which they are performed. There are two major types of problems to be solved within pragmatics: first, to define interesting types of speech acts and speech products; second, to characterize the features of the speech context which help determine which proposition is expressed by a given sentence. … It is a semantic problem to specify the rules for matching up sentences of a natural language with the propositions that they express. In most cases, however, the rules will not match sentences directly with propositions, but will match sentences with propositions relative to features of the context in which the sentence is used. Those contextual features are part of the subject matter of pragmatics.
Katz 1977. [I] draw the theoretical line between semantic interpretation and pragmatic interpretation by taking the semantic component to properly represent only those aspects of the meaning of the sentence that an ideal speaker-hearer of the language would know in an anonymous letter situation,(…) [where there is] no clue whatever about the motive, circumstances of transmission, or any other factor relevant to understanding the sentence on the basis of its context of utterance.
Gazdar 1979. PRAGMATICS = MEANING — TRUTH CONDITIONS. What we need in addition is some function that tells us about the meaning of utterances. (…) The domain of this pragmatic function is the set of utterances, which are pairs of sentences and contexts, so that for each utterance, our function will return as a value a new context: the context as changed by the sentence uttered. (…) And we can treat the meaning of the utterance as the difference between the original context and the context arrived at by utterance of the sentence. [This applies to only] a restricted subset of pragmatic aspects of meaning.
Kempson 1988. Semantics provides a complete account of sentence meaning for the language, [by] recursively specifying the truth conditions of the sentence of the language. … Pragmatics provides an account of how sentences are used in utterances to convey information in context.
Kaplan 1989. The fact that a word or phrase has a certain meaning clearly belongs to semantics. On the other hand, a claim about the basis for ascribing a certain meaning to a word or phrase does not belong to semantics… Perhaps, because it relates to how the language is used, it should be categorized as part of (…) pragmatics (…), or perhaps, because it is a fact about semantics, as part of (…) Metasemantics.
Davis 1991. Pragmatics will have as its domain speakers’ communicative intentions, the uses of language that require such intentions, and the strategies that hearers employ to determine what these intentions and acts are, so that they can understand what the speaker intends to communicate.
The Oxford Companion to Philosophy (Fotion 1995). Pragmatics is the study of language which focuses attention on the users and the context of language use rather than on reference, truth, or grammar.
The Cambridge Dictionary of Philosophy (Lycan 1995). Pragmatics studies the use of language in context, and the context-dependence of various aspects of linguistic interpretation. (…) [Its branches include the theory of how] one and the same sentence can express different meanings or propositions from context to context, owing to ambiguity or indexicality or both, (…) speech act theory, and the theory of conversational implicature.
The Blackwell Companion to Philosophy (Davies 1995). The distinction between semantics and pragmatics is, roughly, the distinction between the significance conventionally or literally attached to words, and thence to whole sentences, and the further significance that can be worked out, by more general principles, using contextual information.
Carston 1999. The decoding process is performed by an autonomous linguistic system, the parser or language perception module. Having identified a particular acoustic stimulus as linguistic, the system executes a series of deterministic grammatical computations or mappings, resulting in an output representation, which is the semantic representation, or logical form, of the sentence or phrase employed in the utterance. (…) The second type of cognitive process, the pragmatic inferential process (constrained and guided by the communicative principle of relevance) integrates the linguistic contribution with other readily accessible information in order to reach a confirmed interpretive hypothesis concerning the speaker’s informative intention.
Bach 2004. Semantic information is information encoded in what is uttered — these are stable linguistic features of the sentence — together with any extralinguistic information that provides (semantic) values to context-sensitive expressions in what is uttered. Pragmatic information is (extralinguistic) information that arises from an actual act of utterance, and is relevant to the hearer’s determination of what the speaker is communicating. Whereas semantic information is encoded in what is uttered, pragmatic information is generated by, or at least made relevant by, the act of uttering it.
In general, an expression is ambiguous if it has more than one meaning. When a word (e.g., ‘bank’) has multiple meanings, we have lexical ambiguity. A sentence can be ambiguous even if none of its words is ambiguous. Sometimes the ambiguity is considered syntactic because the alternative meanings correspond to alternative syntactic configurations (e.g., ‘Mary saw John with a telescope’). If there is only one syntactic configuration, the ambiguity is structural (e.g., ‘Every man admires a woman’). It is not always clear what kind ambiguity is at stake, or even if there is any ambiguity at all (Grice’s theory of implicatures and his Ockham’s modified razor had a great impact on this issue). In any case, ambiguity — the existence of several meanings for an expression — should be distinguished from nambiguity (the existence of many different bearers of a proper name), from vagueness (meanings with unclear boundaries of application), and underdetermination (failure to fully specify a meaning). It is usually assumed that resolving ambiguity is a pragmatic process, involving determining which meaning the speaker intends to be exploiting, although ambiguity itself is a semantic condition.
‘Propositional attitude’ is Bertrand Russell’s term for designating mental states with propositional content, conceived as relations between an agent and a proposition. Propositional attitude verbs include ‘believes,’ ‘wants,’ ‘desires,’ ‘intends’ or ‘knows’ and many others — basically, the core of our vocabulary for describing minds and language.
Sentences like ‘Kepler thought that the Earth was spherical’ embed other sentences — ‘the earth was spherical’ — in oblique (or opaque or intensional (with an ‘s’)) contexts. Oblique contexts are not truth-functional. Substituting other true sentences for ‘the earth was spherical’ will not necessarily preserve truth. Moreover, even substituting co-designative terms for ‘the earth’ may not preserve truth. Kepler did not, one supposes, think that Frege’s favorite planet was spherical (assuming the earth was Frege’s favorite planet).
According to Frege, in such contexts the usual sense of the sentence, the ‘Gedanke’ or proposition expressed, becomes the reference. Since Frege’s “Über Sinn und Bedeutung” (1892) and Russell’s “On Denoting” (1905) the study of reports of these attitudes has been one of the central topics of the philosophy of language, semantics and pragmatics.
Since Kaplan’s work on indexicals and demonstratives, (Kaplan 1989) it is commonplace to distinguish between the character of an expression and the content of an utterance of an expression. For example, the character of the word ‘I’ in English doesn’t change from context to context, although the content does. Knowing the character of a sentence like ‘I am a philosopher’ doesn’t imply knowing the content of a particular utterance of that sentence; for the latter, you need to know the ‘semantic’ context of the utterance. Character is a property of linguistic expressions (types); content is a property of utterances —sentences-in-context; tokenings of them.
‘Context’ is an all-pervasive term in pragmatics. For some authors ‘context’ is the defining concept of pragmatics. But many, perhaps too many, different concepts are included under this term.
In Linguistics, ‘context’ commonly means the previous and subsequent linguistic material in a given text. In Kaplan’s scheme, the context is objective, it comprises the actual basic facts about an utterance: the speaker, time, place, and possible world in which it occurs. In Stalnaker’s scheme, context is basically subjective: a matter of common ground: that is, shared beliefs that serve as common presuppositions for the interpretation of assertions. Often the term is used for anything in the indefinitely large surrounding of an utterance, from the intentions of the speaker to the previous topics of conversation to the objects discernible in the environment.
Here are a number of distinctions that have been made with respect to the concept(s) of context that the reader may find helpful. The list is not intended to be exhaustive, mutually exclusive, or to represent a single coherent view of pragmatic phenomena.
Linguistic context versus extralinguistic context
Considering the context of an utterance, one of the most intuitive distinctions is between the context as consisting of its previous and subsequent utterances — the linguistic contexts — and any other extra-linguistic circumstance surrounding the utterance. In the case of ellipsis and anaphoric (and cataphoric) pronouns the designation is determined, or at least constrained, by the linguistic context of the utterance, while the designation of deictic demonstratives is fixed by contextual extralinguistic facts.
Narrow versus broad
Narrow context is usually understood as the list of parameters for basic indexicals, parameters that correspond to basic facts about the utterance. Speaker, place and time are on almost everyone’s list, as required for the interpretation of ‘I,’ ‘here,’ ‘now’ and tense. Kaplan adds the possible world, for the interpretation of ‘actual.’ Arguably, every utterance occurs in a world, at a time, in a place, and with a speaker.
In contrast, wide or broad context is understood as all other kinds of
information, in particular, information relative to the
speaker’s communicative intention, used for the interpretation
of ‘pragmatic aspects’ of the utterance. In Bach’s
Wide context concerns any contextual information relevant to determining the speaker’s intention and to the successful and felicitous performance of the speech act… Narrow context concerns information specifically relevant to determining the semantic values of [indexicals]… (Bach 1999a)
Bach goes on to say,
Narrow context is semantic, wide context pragmatic.
But on this there would be some disagreement, as many would hold that information about the speaker’s intentions, and perhaps also about causal and informational chains, ongoing topics of conversations, and much else, are needed for semantics.
Epistemic versus doxastic
It is sometimes assumed, particularly by writers with a psychological orientation, that, together with speaker’s intentions, it is speaker’s beliefs what determine the content of expressions in her utterance, with the issue of the truth (or falsity) of her beliefs having no relevance. So, belief rather than knowledge is the relevant concept to characterize context. According to this view, there would not be a significant difference between ‘intending to say’ and ‘saying,’ which goes about some truths of intentions in general: one usual way of failing to perform an action comes from the falsity of some agent’s belief. This is related to another possible distinction between objective and subjective contexts.
Objective versus subjective
There are a number of cases, however, in which the speaker’s beliefs, even if shared by everyone in the conversation, do not seem to determine content. Suppose, for example, that Elwood’s hero worship of John Searle has reached such a point that he now takes himself to be John Searle. He introduces himself to the new class of Stanford graduate students by saying, “I’m John Searle, from across the Bay.” It seems that even if he and everyone in the conversation believes he is Searle, what he has said is the falsehood that Elwood is John Searle. Or, suppose a group of golfers is standing on the small portion of the Stanford golf course that juts into San Mateo County, but none of them realize it. “The county seat of this county is San Jose,” one of them says, for some reason or other. He believes he has informed them of the truth that the county seat of Santa Clara County is San Jose, and in fact the other members of the foursome learn this fact from what he says. Nevertheless, many would argue, what he said was false, and only fortuitous ignorance led his partners to learn a truth from the falsehood he uttered.
Pre-semantic context provides information for identifying the utterance: which words in which language with which syntactic structure, and with which meanings are being used.
Semantic context comprises those contextual features that determine or partly determine the content of context-sensitive expressions. This is the case of pronouns, whose linguistic meanings do more or less strictly constrain but do not determine their designata. Their meanings direct us to the context (linguistic context, in cases of anaphoric co-designation; extra-linguistic context in cases of indexicals and deictic uses of demonstratives) to look for the designation of the pronoun. But there are more context-sensitive expressions than indexical, deictic and anaphoric pronouns. Sentence mood, for instance, is an indicator of illocutionary point, but it does not determine the precise illocutionary force of an utterance without the help of contextual factors. The contribution to utterance-content of some particles like ‘but’ (that, according to Grice, produce ‘conventional implicatures) are another case in point.
Third, there is (or may be) what Perry (2001) calls post-semantic context. This comprises facts that provide unarticulated content. For example, the fact that a conversation is about Palo Alto may determine, perhaps together with speaker intentions, that the statement “It is raining,” has the content that it is raining in Palo Alto. Arguably, such contextual contributions are not triggered by the meaning-rules of the words used, but more global considerations. The fact that we usually are talking about rain in a particular place has to do with the nature of rain and the way humans are concerned with it and conceptualize the phenomena, rather than the syntax of ‘rain.’
(Far-side) Pragmatic Context
This comprises those contextual factors needed to get at (calculate, infer) what is communicated or done in and by saying what one says. This importantly concerns the speaker’s intentions regarding indirect speech acts, implicatures, and non-literal contents. It may also include institutional facts and indeed, all sorts of other things relevant to the effects of the utterance.
Communicative intention is what characterizes, an action as communicative. Following Grice’s definition of M(eaning)-intention, it is widely agreed that communicative intentions have three particular properties: (i) it is perlocutionary, that is, it is an intention that seeks a mental effect (certain belief(s) or intention(s)) on the part of the addressee; (ii) it is overt, that is, the speaker wants the addressee to recognize her communicative intention; and (iii) the satisfaction of a communicative intention consists precisely in its recognition by the addressee. Communicative intentions need not be carried out by linguistic means (see Clark 2003). In human linguistic communication planning and inference processes have a role at least as important as coding and decoding processes. The speaker plans her speech act according to her communicative intention; the addressee uses, among other sources, the information decoded to infer (recognize) the speaker’s communicative intention.
Implicature (conventional, conversational, particularized,
Grice distinguished what the speaker says from what she implicates by an utterance. The category of implicature refers to what the speaker suggests, implies or communicates beyond what she says. Among implicatures he made a further distinction between conventional, generated by the conventional meaning of certain words, and non-conventional ones. Within non-conventional implicatures, he distinguished between conversational, affected, among other factors, by conversational principles and maxims, and non-conversational. And finally, among conversational implicatures between particularized, depending on particular features of contexts, and generalized ones. Grice pointed out that conversational implicatures have the following properties: (i) they are calculable, that is, inferable from, among other things, the cooperative principle and the conversational maxims; (ii) they are cancelable either explicitly (adding something like “but I did not meant that”) or contextually, by changing the context; and (iii) except those implicatures based on the maxims of manner, they are non-detachable, i.e., there is no way of saying the same thing that would not carry the implicature. The last two features, cancelability and non-detachability are known as the ‘tests’ for the presence of an alleged implicature.
In the traditional Gricean picture, ‘explicit meaning’ corresponds to the sentence’s conventional meaning; or to the meaning obtained by the combination of conventional meaning and those contextual aspects required by the conventional meaning; in other words, to the result of sentence conventional meaning+disambiguation+reference fixing, i.e., what is said. The remaining of utterance meaning, in particular presuppositions and implicatures, would be regarded as implicit meaning within the Gricean picture. Grice’s categories of conventional implicature and generalized conventional implicatures, however, pose problems to the distinction between the explicit and the implicit. After Grice, the limits between them are not very clear yet, despite relevance theorists’s notion of ‘explicature’ or Bach’s ‘impliciture.’
To determine the reference of an indexical expression (that is, to determine what a speaker is referring to by the utterance of an indexical expression), the interpreter must resort to context. This is the most prominent property of indexical expressions: without varying their meaning, they can change their content from context to context. Paradigmatic indexical expressions are personal pronouns (‘I,’ ‘you,’ ‘she’…), demonstratives (‘this,’ ‘that’), time and place adverbs (‘here,’ ‘there,’ ‘now,’ ‘yesterday,’ ‘tomorrow’…). But indexicality is a more general phenomenon: verb tense and aspect point to context for determining the relevant temporal point or interval. The semantic information of some indexical expression leaves little room for doubts about what to look for in context: ‘I’ refers to the speaker, ‘here’ refers to the place the speaker is in, ‘tomorrow’ to the day starting at midnight of the day of utterance. These are called ‘pure’ or ‘automatic’ indexicals, in contrast to ‘discretionary’ indexicals, whose semantic information does not determine the referent, and it is necessary to appeal to speaker’s intentions to do so (Perry 2001). Indexical expressions have been called ‘deictic,’ ‘egocentric particulars’ and ‘token-reflexive expressions.’
It is a kind of mental state, like belief and desire, for example. From the point of view of the mental cause theory of action, intentions cause actions.
Being caused by an intention distinguishes movements (or absences of movement) which are actions from mere events, and so, among bodily movements, intentional actions from mere reflexes. The object of intention can be represented as a proposition representing the movements (she moved her arm on purpose), or as various results expected or hoped for as a result of the movement (she checkmated her opponent, and made him cry, on purpose).
The word ‘intention’ is relatively unambiguous outside of philosophy. But philosophers use the word ‘intention’ and especially the adjective ‘intentional’ to refer to a feature of a class of mental states that includes but is not limited to intentions ordinarily understood. This is the property of being about or directed at objects, including not only real concrete objects, but also abstract and fictional objects, properties, and states of affairs. Thus believing that it is raining, hoping to get a computer for Christmas, talking about Sherlock Holmes, figuring out the square root of six hundred and twenty five, are all intentional states and activities, as is intending to bake a cake. It is often assumed that minds, mental states, have intrinsic intentionality, and that utterances and sentences have only intentionality in a derived sense: they have it from the intentionality of the mental state they express.
Intentionality (with a ‘t’) should not be confused with intensionality (with an ‘s’). The latter is another technical expression of logic and philosophy; intensions are opposed to extensions. Russell’s example is that the intension of ‘featherless biped that is not a plucked chicken’ is quite different than the intension of ‘human being,’ although their extensions are (perhaps) the same. Extensions include classes, sets, and functions considered as sets of ordered pairs and truth-values. Intensions are meaning, rules, properties, functions as ordinarily conceived, and propositions. In possible-worlds semantics intensions are often identified with sets of possible worlds or functions that take possible worlds as arguments. A property, for example, might be identified with a function from worlds to set of objects (those that have the property in the world), and a proposition with a set of worlds (those in which it is true). Whether such an identification is meant as a reduction or explanation of intensions as extensions, or simply as a way of modeling intensions as extensions, varies from theorist to theorist.
Some take this to be a distinction about word meaning. According to this view, beyond their conventional or literal meaning, words can have figurative or non-literal meanings: metaphoric, ironic, metonymic meanings. After the rise of pragmatic studies, the distinction is considered mostly to be one at the speaker’s meaning level. When the speaker’s meaning is closed to the conventional meaning of the sentence uttered the speaker is said to be speaking literally. When it departs from conventional meaning is considered non-literal. Of course, the distinction is not clear cut: how much must the speaker’s meaning depart from conventional meaning to be considered as non-literal? Some authors prefer to talk about a continuum rather than a two-sided distinction.
Locutionary, illocutionary, perlocutionary
In terms of Austin’s speech act theory these are three main levels to be distinguished in a speech act. Every speech act is an act of saying something. This is the locutionary level. Within it Austin distinguished three more: the phonetic act (the act of producing some sounds), the phatic act (the act of uttering some words pertaining to the vocabulary of a certain language organized according to the rules of its grammar), and the rhetic act (the act of using those words with a certain sense and reference). But in saying something one does something. This is the illocutionary level. And, finally, by saying something one gets some (intended or unintended) effects in the audience. This is the perlocutionary level. Searle casts doubt on the distinction between locutionary and illocutionary acts, not seeing the necessity of the former category. As it has developed, speech act theory has been almost entirely devoted to study of the illocutionary level.
Austin contrasted between statements, traditionally considered as the only utterances with any philosophical importance, with performative utterances that would not be considered as being true or false, and rather than merely saying something are better considered as acts of doing something. He further distinguished between explicit and implicit performative utterances. The first are those whose main verb, called ‘performative verb,’ makes explicit the particular act that the speaker is performing in producing the utterance. These verbs usually present a canonical form: (in English) the first person singular in the present active, or the second person of the passive. Not all implicit performative utterances can be made explicit through a performative utterance. Following Austin’s discussion, all utterances end up being performative, so that the contrast between them and statements seems to make no sense any more. The concept of performative utterance was supplanted in the development of speech act theory by the concept of speech act.
It is traditionally defined as the (grammatical) complex expression capable of expressing a complete thought or proposition. This definition is questioned by the assumption that thoughts or propositions are expressed by utterances (or speakers). According to the contextualist thesis, no sentence expresses a complete (truth-evaluable) proposition; i.e., there are no ‘eternal’ sentences. From the viewpoint of pragmatics, sentences can be conceived as utterance-types, resulted from abstracting all elements except the linguistic expressions used. The issue of what counts as a complete (grammatical) sentence opposed to a sub-sentential complex expression pertains to syntax, rather than to semantics or pragmatics.
Speech acts are communicative acts performed through the oral or written use of language. Within speech acts, Austin distinguished among locutionary, illocutionary and perlocutionary levels, but speech act theory has been devoted almost exclusively to the illocutionary level, so that ‘speech act’ and ‘illocutionary act’ are in practice synonymous terms. An elementary speech act consists of a propositional content and an illocutionary force. Illocutionary force concerns the act the speaker intends to do in performing the speech act. All illocutionary forces, in Searle’s version of speech act theory, can be grouped into five classes, according to their basic intention or illocutionary point: assertives, commissives, directives, declaratives and expressives. The illocutionary force and the propositional content of a speech act determine its conditions of success and satisfaction.
‘Alabama’: how many letters does this word have? If we count letter tokens, the answer is 7. If we count letter types, the answer could be 4 (‘a,’ ‘l,’ ‘b,’ ‘m’) or 5 (if we distinguish between capital and small letters). If you say “You are wrong” to me, and I say “You are wrong” to you, we have produced different tokens of the same type. Usually tokens are conceived as marks on paper, or sounds that travel through space.
Tokens can be typed in various ways. We might consider “Life is fun” and “Life is fun” as two tokens of the same type, if fonts are not relevant, or different if they are. In semantics and pragmatics, the default way of typing tokens is by the syntax and semantics of the phrases produced according to the language used.
At the time the distinction was made by Peirce (1931–58, sec. 4.537), it was pretty straightforward, with just spoken and written tokens to worry about. If I mail you a letter, you see the same token I produced. If I speak to you, you hear the same token I produced.
Things are more complicated now. Suppose I send you an email. It seems I produce one token on my screen and another of the same type appears on your screen, with the same content, at least in ordinary cases. Similarly if I send you a recording. The extension of type/token distinction to modern technology is not a settled issue, however.
So conceived, token are objects, and written tokens, at least, can be re-used. A department might have a reusable note, “I am at lunch,” that various faculty can put on their doors at different times. The same token is used; the type is the same, but the content changes from door to door and time to time.
Utterances are usually taken to be intentional acts, and not the tokens produced. But some thinkers take utterances to simply be tokens. More commonly those who want to emphasize the importance of tokens refer to utterances conceived as acts, as a tokening; a number of writers use this terminology.
Conceived as acts, utterances have properties that are crucial to pragmatics. An utterance is most often taken to be a linguistic action performed by a certain speaker in a certain place at a certain moment. It has, then, the ontological status of actions: each utterance is a unique historical event; it is a token, not a type; an utterance made by one speaker cannot be made by another one; an utterance made here and now cannot be made there later. In Linguistics, ‘utterance’ is often used for the action of pronouncing orally a sentence, but philosophers tend to also include writing, signing, and other modes of language use, and for the action of using a sub-sentential expression. It is the view of many but not all pragmatists that the primary bearers of truth-conditional contents are utterances, not sentences; or, even better, that truth-conditional contents or propositions are expressed by the speakers who utter sentences, not by the sentences themselves. Utterances of declarative sentences are called ‘statements.’
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