Philosophy for Children

First published Thu May 2, 2002; substantive revision Fri May 27, 2022

In the United States, philosophy typically makes its formal entry into the curriculum at the college level. A growing number of high schools offer some introduction to philosophy, often in special literature courses for college bound students. In Europe and many other countries, it is much more common to find philosophy in the high school curriculum. However, philosophy prior to high school seems relatively uncommon around the world. This may suggest that serious philosophical thinking is not for pre-adolescents. At least three reasons might be offered for accepting this view. First, philosophical thinking requires a level of cognitive development that, one may believe, is beyond the reach of most pre-adolescents. Second, especially in the United States, the school curriculum is already crowded; and introducing a subject like philosophy, it may be thought, will distract students from what they need to learn. Third, given that philosophical inquiry raises questions that more often than not resist definitive answers, it may encourage students to become skeptics rather than learners. However, as shall be seen, these reasons can be challenged.

1. Can Children Philosophize?

Jean Piaget’s (1933) well-known theory of cognitive development suggests that prior to age 11 or 12, most children are not capable of philosophical thinking. This is because, it holds, prior to this time, children are not capable of “thinking about thinking,” the sort of meta-level thinking that philosophical thinking requires. This level of cognitive development includes analogical reasoning about relationships, such as: “Bicycle is to handlebars as ship is to rudder, with ‘steering mechanism’ being the similar relationship” (Goswami, p. xxi). However, there is a solid body of psychological research that indicates Piaget’s account seriously underestimates children’s cognitive abilities (Astington, 1993; Gopnik, et al., 1999; Gopnik, 2009).

Philosopher Gareth Matthews went further and argued at length that Piaget failed to see the philosophical thinking manifest in the very children he studied. In Philosophy and the Young Child, Matthews (1980) provides a number of delightful illustrations of very young children’s philosophical puzzlement. For example:

  • TIM (about six years), while busily engaged in licking a pot, asked, “Papa, how can we be sure that everything is not a dream?” (p. 1)
  • JORDAN (five years), going to bed at eight one evening, asked, “If I go to bed at eight and get up at seven in the morning, how do I really know that the little hand of the clock has gone around only once? Do I have to stay up all night to watch it? If I look away even for a short time, maybe the small hand will go around twice.” (p. 3)
  • One day JOHN EDGAR (four years), who had seen airplanes take off, rise, and gradually disappear into the distance, took his first plane ride. When the plane stopped ascending and the seat-belt sign went out, John Edgar turned to his father and said in a rather relieved, but still puzzled, tone of voice, “Things don’t really get smaller up here.” (p. 4)

However, it might be objected, commonly observable as they might be, more than such anecdotes are needed to show that children are capable of serious philosophical thinking. What is needed is evidence that children are capable of sustained philosophical discussion. Matthews (1984) provides illustrations of this, too. For example, meeting with a group of 8–11 year olds, he used the following example to develop a story for discussion:

Ian (six years old) found to his chagrin that the three children of his parents’ friends monopolized the television; they kept him from watching his favorite program. “Mother,” he asked in frustration, “why is it better for three children to be selfish than one?” (Matthews 1984, 92–3)

This generated a lively discussion in which children commented on the inconsiderateness of the three visiting children, the desirability of working out a solution that would satisfy all four children, the importance of respecting people’s rights, and how one might feel if he or she were in Ian’s place. Matthews then posed a possible utilitarian approach: “What about this argument, that if we let the three visitors have their way, three people will be made happy instead of just one?” One reply was that it would not be fair for three people to get what they want at the expense of a fourth. This triggered a discussion of fairness that addressed more specific concerns about the relative ages of the children, whether they are friends, siblings, or strangers—and what types of television programs are involved.

No doubt, part of the explanation of the children’s ability and willingness to carry on an extended discussion of Ian’s circumstance is that they have faced similar challenges. Still, they exhibited a rather sophisticated grasp of the conceptual and moral issues at hand, which is what one might expect from children once they are invited to reflect on their own experiences.

Stories about children roughly one’s own age can provide opportunities to discuss ideas that are most important to a child. Consider this example from Matthew Lipman’s novel Lisa (1983). Harry and his friend Timmy go to a stamp club to trade stamps. Afterward they stop for ice cream cones, but Timmy discovers he has no money. Harry offers to buy him one, and Timmy says he will buy Harry a cone next time. As they are leaving the store, one of their classmates trips Timmy. Timmy then knocks the tripper’s books off the table. After running away from the scene, Timmy and Harry talk about what has happened:

“I couldn’t let them get away with it,” Timmy remarked when they saw that they weren’t being pursued and could slow down to a walk. “He didn’t have to stick his foot out.” Then he added, “Of course, I didn’t have to do what I did either. But, like I said before, turnabout is fair play.”

“Somehow,” Harry thought, “it isn’t quite the same thing.” But he couldn’t figure out why. “I don’t know,” he said finally to Timmy. “The purpose of your stamp club is to exchange stamps. So when you give someone stamps, you’re supposed to give something back. Just like if someone lends me money, I’m supposed to give it back. But if someone pulls a dirty trick on you, should you do the same thing to him? I’m not so sure.”

“But I had to get even,” Timmy protested. “I couldn’t let him get away with it, tripping me like that for no reason.”

A bit later they met Lisa and Laura. Harry told the girls what had happened and why he was puzzled. “It reminds me,” remarked Lisa, “of last year when we were learning about how some sentences could be turned around and would stay true, while others, when you turned them around, would become false.”

“Yeah,” Harry agreed, “but there we found a rule. What’s the rule here?” Lisa tossed her long hair so that it hung over her right shoulder. “It looks like there are times when it is right to give back what we got and other times when it is wrong. But how do we tell which is which?” (Lisa, pp. 23–4)

This passage is an invitation to explore the moral nuances of reciprocity, or “returning in kind.” What might a group of 10–11 year-olds have to say about this? Here is a sampling from a lengthy discussion of the Lisa passage by a group of fifth graders (Pritchard 1996). With very little prompting from the teacher, the students raised and vigorously pursued questions such as the following:

  • What is likely to happen when we retaliate? Will this simply start a long chain of trying to “get things even” that no one (other than perhaps the initiator) wants?
  • Can retaliating really “get things even”? Can we even make sense of “getting things even”?
  • Is it really right to respond to a wrong by returning in kind? Is this trying to make a right out of two wrongs?
  • What alternatives to trying to “get things even” might there be? What would happen if you just ignore someone who is trying to get a rise out of you?
  • When is self-defense the best strategy?
  • Is there a difference between trying to “get things even” and trying to “teach someone a lesson”?
  • Can something like the Golden Rule help us here? What does the Golden Rule mean? Is it a good rule?

Thoughtful and insightful questions like this are not unusual for children when they are given the opportunity to express them. This discussion was prompted by a children’s novel. However, students’ regular classroom materials, works of art, thought experiments, the daily news, or their own experiences can trigger philosophical discussions of moral concepts and concerns.

Even if one concedes that children are quite capable of engaging in extended discussions of moral concepts related to their own experiences, what about philosophical ideas that are less immediately related to their practical affairs? Here is an illustration that begins with logic and ends up in metaphysics.

The true sentence, “All oaks are trees” becomes false when reversed. So does, “All carrots are vegetables.” Can we say that every true sentence beginning with ‘all’ becomes false when reversed? The children in Harry Stottlemeier’s Discovery initially are tempted to say, yes. But at least as early as the 3rd grade, children easily find exceptions. What about “All tigers are tigers”, many will ask. Others may respond that this is an uninteresting sentence, offering something like “All rabbits are hares,” or “All mothers have children” as alternatives. With relatively little encouragement, they can come up with good definitions of geometric figures and differentiate them from proposed definitions that cannot be reversed. For example, “All squares are rectangles” is true, but it becomes false when reversed. “All squares are rectangles with equal sides,” however, can be reversed.

Although the study of logic is traditionally regarded as a part of philosophy, critics might not find the reflections of children on such rules of logic terribly interesting philosophically. (Of course, some might say this about elementary logic in the college classroom, as well.) It is not that different from basic math and grammar, they might object. Whether or not this is a fair assessment, for many children it is but a short step from logic to metaphysics. Here is an example from a 4th grade class that had just been asked whether true sentences beginning with ‘all’ always become false when reversed (Pritchard 1996). After the usual “All tigers are tigers” and “All rabbits are hares” were suggested, a student asked, “How about ‘All answers have questions’ and ‘All questions have answers’?” Fortunately, the teacher paused to explore this with the class, asking“Do all answers have questions?” Of course, replied the students, otherwise we would not say that we have an answer.

The teacher continued, “How about the other sentence? Do you think that all questions have answers?” What followed was a flood of responses:

  • Student #1: “Is there life in the center of the sun?”
  • Student #2: “Even though we can’t go there to find out, the question still has an answer.”
  • Student #3: “How many grains of sand are there on earth?”
  • Student #4: “There’s a definite number even though we don’t know what it is.”
  • Student #3: “The wind will blow them all around, and we’ll count some more than once.”
  • Student #5: “There are too many to count.”
  • Student #6: “How many grains of sand are there on all the planets?”
  • Student #7: “How many trees are there on earth?”
  • Student #4: “That’s easier than grains of sand. We could count the trees.”
  • Student #7: “By the time you finish counting them, some would have fallen down and others would have started to grow.”
  • Student #8: “Did God make time begin?”
  • Student #9: “You mean, if there is a God, did he make time begin?”
  • Student #7: “Does space have limits?”
  • Student #5: “Yeah, what would happen if you got to the end of space and tried to put your hand out? If you couldn’t, what would be holding it back on the outside?”
  • Student #6: “Maybe what would hold your hand back is on the inside. There wouldn’t be any outside.”

Many of the students seemed to be struggling to move from questions that are difficult, if not impossible, to answer because of our practical limitations (e.g., not being certain that a particular grain of sand has not already been counted) to questions that in principle are unanswerable. Finally, with a mischievous grin on his face, one of the students asked, “Will time end?” The problem, he explained, is that if time did end, no one would be able later to confirm that this was so.

Here is another illustration of how quickly a discussion of logic can move to a discussion of deep philosophical issues (Pritchard, 1985). This is a group of 5th graders considering the sentence, “All people are animals.” One of the students offered this as another example of a true sentence that becomes false when reversed. Jeff objected that “All people are animals” is not true. Chip proceeded to develop a taxonomy that relegated people, along with elephants and tigers, under the heading of mammals, mammals under animals, and animals under living things. Jeff continued to object.

Chip: “Jeff, what are people? Just tell me, what are people? You can’t answer that, can you?”

Jeff: “Yes, I can.”

Chip: “What are you?”

Jeff: “A person.”

Chip: “What’s a person?”

Jeff: “A living somebody.”

Chip: “A living somebody could be a whale.”

Jeff: “I said, somebody, not an animal….”

Chip: “You can check every single book out there in the library—well, every one that’s about us….”

Larry: “I want to know why everyone’s getting so huffy about a little subject.”

Rich: “We’re thinking! That’s what we’re here for.”

Amy: “Does anyone have an encyclopedia in here so we can look up either animals, mammals, or persons?”

Jeff: “We’re all humans. So, if this Mars guy saw us, he would say, ‘Hey, look, there’s some human beings.’ He wouldn’t say, ‘Hey, look, there’s some animals down there.’”

Mike: “Martians, if there are any, would say, ‘Hey, look at those weird looking creatures,’ or something like that. They wouldn’t know what we are. They don’t know anything about us.”

Chip: “There’s living life, okay? Then you branch off from there. You have animals, plants, and whatever the other stuff is—you know, molecules and things like that. Now you go to the animals and you branch off—mammals, amphibians, reptiles, and whatever there is. Then you branch off and you have all these special humans. Is that right so far, Jeff?”

Jeff: “Just go on.”

Chip: “Well, I just want to know if you agree so far.”

Jeff: “Just go on. Go on. I’m not going to change my mind. That’s all…. I’m not an animal. I’m a person, and I’m going to stay that way.”

Amy: “People are a type of animal, like a bird is. That’s different than like an elephant is. A bird’s different than an elephant. And we’re different than a bird.”

The discussion continued for several more minutes. As the group dispersed, one student remarked to another, “If we want to, we could argue for hours!” “For days,” replied the second. Meeting weekly after school in the local public library, this group of children returned the next week with an encyclopedia to try to settle the matter. After several minutes of discussion, the teacher asked the students if they thought everything in the encyclopedia is true.

Emily: “Some things we’re not sure of; and the encyclopedia could put down every word about how the solar system was formed, and it would probably say there was big dust that spun around like a top. But we’re not sure about that. And, so, that could be wrong.”

The teacher asked whether, in such cases, the encyclopedia would say, “We’re not sure.”

Mike: “It’ll say ‘hypothesis’—which is a guess.”

Kurt: “It’ll say we’re not sure yet.”

So, the discussion retained its philosophical vitality. This particular group continued to meet weekly for the entire school year, discussing a wide range of philosophical topics, including: the relationship between the mind and the brain, differences (and similarities) between dreams and reality, knowledge of other minds, self-knowledge, and relationships between evidence and knowledge.

2. Philosophy in a Crowded Curriculum

Those favoring adding philosophy to K-12 school programs face the challenges of an already crowded curriculum and growing pressure to provide quantifiable evidence of student mastery of the standard subjects of history, literature, math, and science. Where is time to be found for the give-and-take of philosophical discussions? Adding philosophy to the mix, doubters object, only makes matters worse. Not only is it yet another subject, it is one that many teachers may find unsettling. They may fear that philosophy’s continual questioning will actually interfere with students’ mastery of the subjects already in the curriculum. Given the unsettling nature of much philosophical inquiry, they may feel vulnerable as teachers because they are not confident of their own answers to the questions posed.

Adding to this problem is increasing pressure on teachers to demonstrate that their students are performing at satisfactory levels in already established subjects. Standardized tests are commonly used as the measure of student achievement. Marked by definitive, unambiguous questions and answers, these tests do not place a premium on philosophical reflection. Since student performance is typically linked to school funding, this is not something teachers can take lightly, however skeptical some of them might be about the educational value of preparing their students to perform well on standardized tests.

In response, advocates of bringing philosophy into the schools such as Matthew Lipman and his colleague Ann Margaret Sharp have countered that the introduction of philosophy can enhance the entire educational experience of students. They urge that the aim is more than simply the introduction of one more subject in the schools. Philosophy, they insist, invites students to reflect on relationships among different areas of inquiry and to make sense of their educational experiences as a whole. This can add to the meaningfulness of students’ education as a whole. In addition, philosophy can make important contributions to another area of concern that cuts across the curriculum, critical thinking.

In the mid-1960s, Matthew Lipman became dismayed at the low quality of argumentation employed by presumably well-educated citizens discussing the Vietnam war and society’s ills in general. Convinced that the teaching of logic should begin long before college, he tried to figure out a way to do this that would stimulate the interest of 10–11 year olds. Leaving his secure position of teaching philosophy at Columbia University for an open ended one at Montclair State College, he undertook work on his first children’s novel, Harry Stottlemeier’s Discovery. Lipman’s concerns about the level of critical thinking in society in general, and the schools in particular, were not his alone. By the 1970s the hue and cry for teaching critical thinking in the schools was, if not clear, at least loud; and it has continued largely unabated to the present.

What is meant by ‘critical thinking’? Characterizations range in complexity from Robert Ennis’s admirably brief, “reasonable reflective thinking that is focused on deciding what to believe or do” (Ennis 1987) to a complex statement by a group of 46 panelists convened by the American Philosophical Association’s Committee on Pre-College Philosophy to employ the Delphi Method of striving for consensus:

We understand critical thinking to be purposeful, self-regulatory judgment which results in interpretation, analysis, evaluation, and inference, as well as explanation of the evidential, conceptual, methodological, criteriological, or contextual considerations upon which that judgment is based…. The ideal critical thinking is habitually inquisitive, well-informed, trustful of reason, open-minded, flexible, fair-minded in evaluation, honest in facing personal biases, prudent in making judgments, willing to reconsider, clear about issues, orderly in complex matters, diligent in seeking relevant information, reasonable in the selection of criteria, focused in inquiry, and persistent in seeking results which are as precise as the subject and the circumstances of inquiry permit. (Facione, 1989)

Lipman was a member of this panel, and it is clear that his novels and teacher’s manuals all strive to meet these objectives. His briefer depiction of critical thinking is that it involves judgments based on criteria, or reasons. Criteria, he says, can be appraised in terms of “megacriteria” such as reliability, relevance, strength, coherence, and consistency (Lipman 1991, p. 119). Critical thinking, he adds, is characterized as “thinking that (1) facilitates judgment because it (2) relies on criteria, (3) is self-correcting, and (4) is sensitive to context.” (Lipman 1991, p. 116)

Picking up on the idea that critical thinking is sensitive to context, some critics challenge the notion that critical thinking can be usefully taught independently of specific disciplinary areas (McPeck, 1985). While conceding that there are some generic features of critical thinking that cut across disciplines, they maintain that even these features acquire their meanings only in specific contexts that vary across disciplines (such as history, sociology, biology, chemistry). However, unless the different disciplines ask questions about their own basic assumptions and their relationships to one another, critical thinking within those disciplines will overlook important questions that need attention. Philosophy does ask such questions about the different disciplines, including itself.

Lipman’s hope was that philosophy would acquire a central place in the K-12 curriculum, thus enabling students to develop their critical thinking skills through philosophical questioning. At the same time, he claimed, philosophy can help students make better sense of their educational experiences. By seeking to develop comprehensive perspectives, philosophy attempts to understand connections. A curriculum that divides students’ education into discrete, self-contained disciplines without encouraging philosophical questions about the nature of those disciplines and their relationships to one another invites a fragmented view of education. Lipman’s proposed alternative is described in the next section, which describes the K-12 program developed by the Institute for the Advancement of Philosophy for Children (IAPC) that he and Ann Margaret Sharp founded.

Short of the ambitious program Lipman and his IAPC colleagues had in mind for the schools, there are more modest, but worthwhile, ways of bringing philosophical inquiry into the already existing disciplinary structure in the schools. Teachers can invite their students to reflect on philosophical aspects of their subjects of study. At the same time they study history, students can take some time to ask questions about the extent to which historical accounts can be objective—and questions about what ‘objectivity’ might mean, and why it is or is not important to seek it. Similar questions can be asked about the natural and social sciences, including questions about the extent to which science is, or ought to be, “value-free”. In fact, if room for such questions is not encouraged, one might well ask to what extent critical thinking itself is encouraged.

Finally, especially since the passing of Lipman and Sharp in 2010 and 2011, many of those originally inspired by their work have initiated efforts to introduce groups of children to philosophy outside the formal educational setting of the schools.

3. The Institute for the Advancement of Philosophy for Children (IAPC)

The educational movement known as Philosophy for Children got its start in the early 1970s with the publication of Matthew Lipman’s philosophical novel for children, Harry Stottlemeier’s Discovery. In 1970 Harry made its entry into the Montclair Public Schools in New Jersey. By the mid-70s the Institute for the Advancement of Philosophy for Children (IAPC) was formally in place at Montclair State College (now Montclair State University). The media quickly picked up on reports of significant improvements in the reading and critical thinking skills of middle school children who were involved in IAPC programs. Subsequently, IAPC produced materials consisting of Lipman’s children’s novels and, under the leadership of IAPC colleague Ann Margaret Sharp, accompanying teacher workbooks for the entire K-12 curriculum. Thousands of children in New Jersey, across the United States, and even around the world have subsequently been introduced to IAPC educational programs.

An unassuming 96 page novel for middle-school children, Lipman’s first novel, Harry Stottlemeier’s Discovery, features Harry and his 5th grade classmates. Adults occasionally enter in, but the primary philosophical work is done by the children. Harry and his friends discover several basic concepts and rules of Aristotelean logic; and they puzzle over questions about the nature of thought, mind, causality, reality, knowledge and belief, right and wrong, and fairness and unfairness.

“What is Harry Stottlemeier’s discovery?” Harry’s readers might ask. This question is not directly answered. However, one candidate stands out among the many things that Harry discovers in the course of exploring questions about logic, knowledge, reality, and the mind. Harry and his classmates are asked to write a paper on the topic, “The Most Interesting Thing in the World.” Entitled Thinking, Harry’s essay begins:

To me, the most interesting thing in the whole world is thinking. I know that lots of other things are also very important and wonderful, like electricity, and magnetism and gravitation. But although we understand them, they can’t understand us. So thinking must be something very special.

After writing several more paragraphs, Harry puts his paper aside. Later he thinks, “In school, we think about math, and we think about spelling, and we think about grammar. But who every heard of thinking about thinking?” So, he adds one more sentence to his paper: “If we think about electricity, we can understand it better, but when we think about thinking, we seem to understand ourselves better.”

Without using the word ‘philosophy,’ either here or anywhere else in Harry, Lipman shows Harry engaged in serious philosophical thought, “thinking about thinking.” This, we might say, reveals Harry’s discovery of the joys of philosophical thinking. But there is more. Harry also notices that, as interesting and important as thinking about thinking is, it seems to have no special place in school. Finally, although his paper begins in the first person, it quickly moves to ‘we’ and focuses on what might be accomplished with others in the classroom.

One of the more attractive features of the IAPC approach to Philosophy for Children for many teachers has been that it promotes the idea of the classroom as a “community of inquiry” in which students openly and respectfully exchange ideas. Each student is regarded as having the potential to make valuable contributions to the topics under consideration. Students are encouraged to develop good listening skills, responsiveness to what others say, willingness to try to support one’s own ideas with good reasons, and openness to the possibility that one should modify one’s beliefs in light of new considerations. In short, the classroom is designed to reinforce the student’s potential for reasonableness. This involves more than being able to engage in skillful reasoning. As Laurance J. Splitter and Ann Margaret Sharp put it (Splitter and Sharp, p. 6):

Reasonableness is primarily a social disposition: the reasonable person respects others and is prepared to take into account their views and their feelings, to the extent of changing her own mind about issues of significance, and consciously allowing her own perspective to be changed by others. She is, in other words, willing to be reasoned with.

Teachers who look favorably on the idea that the classroom should be a “community of inquiry” nevertheless may resist the idea that philosophy should be the centerpiece for discussion. Other subjects, they might contend, lend themselves well to forming the sort of collaborative learning environment that can fairly be called a “community of inquiry.” Philosophy for Children advocates, however, need only insist that the sort of inquiry they are supporting be philosophical, rather than being simply shared. Unfortunately, Ann Margaret Sharp passed away in 2011. The distinctiveness of the sort of inquiry she and Lipman advocated is explored in some detail in a recent collection of essays by and about her that is dedicated to her memory, In Community of Inquiry with Ann Margaret Sharp: Philosophy, Childhood and Education (Gregory and Laverty, 2017). [This is the first book in Routledge’s Philosophy for Children Founders series of volumes to be edited by Maughn Rollins Gregory and Megan Jane Laverty. The second volume is Gareth Matthews, The Child’s Philosopher, 2022, with several other books in this series forthcoming.]

It may be thought that philosophy is, at best, a suitable subject for relatively few students at the pre-college level. Since philosophy traditionally has been taught only at the college level in the United States, it might be thought that it can be suitable for only a small segment of students at pre-college levels—the two percent of students who are classified as “gifted and talented.” However, Philosophy for Children programs have shown themselves to be remarkably successful in drawing virtually all students in the classroom together in inquiry. Teachers are often surprised, and pleased, to see many of their most reticent, “underachieving” students actively join in the discussion of philosophical ideas.

Nevertheless, because they lack background in the formal study of philosophy, many teachers are reluctant to encourage the philosophical thinking of their students. Their fears, however, are exaggerated. Familiarity with some of the standard philosophical literature might be desirable, but it is not necessary for bringing Philosophy for Children into the classroom. What is required is the ability to facilitate philosophical discussion. For this, it is much more important that teachers have some philosophical curiosity themselves than a familiarity with academic philosophical literature. Like their students, teachers unfamiliar with the discipline of philosophy may nevertheless have an aptitude for philosophical thinking—or at least a knack for recognizing when others are engaged in philosophical thought.

Facilitating a Philosophy for Children discussion does not mean dominating it; it is important for teachers to allow their students to develop their own ideas. Teachers are not expected to provide, or even have, answers to all the questions. They can share puzzlement with their students, be open to unexpected but suggestive responses to the questions they and their students pose, and take pleasure in observing the exchanges students have with each other. This means shedding the traditional role of teacher as lecturer and answer-giver. Especially for teachers who are uncertain about what this entails, workshops like those offered by IAPC provide a good introduction to the pedagogy of Philosophy for Children. However, there is a growing number of organizations around the world (some of which are mentioned below) also providing assistance for teachers.

4. Philosophizing With Others?

Philosophy for Children encourages children to think for themselves at the same time that it encourages them to think with others. However, philosophy is often viewed as more a matter of solitary reflection, perhaps involving exchanges between a few other solitary thinkers—something to which the “masses” are neither privy nor attracted. Perhaps many would claim that this is philosophy at its best. Even if this were so (a controversial view), it would not undermine arguments for including philosophy in the K-12 curricula. However esoteric physics and mathematics at their best may be, the schools nevertheless recognize the importance of making these subjects available in some form to all students. Similarly, Philosophy for Children advocates can counter that there should be a place for all students—whether labelled “gifted and talented,” “underachieving,” or “ordinary”—pursuing philosophical questions together.

For this to work, it must be possible for children in the classroom to engage in sustained philosophical discussion with others. As already noted, Gareth Matthew’s writings provide ample evidence that children are capable of having interesting, if not profound, philosophical thoughts. Less obvious, however, is children’s ability to sustain and develop this with others. Anecdotes of young children spontaneously sharing a philosophical thought with an observant adult are not sufficient. Matthews’ Dialogues With Children provides good evidence that children can go well beyond this. Other examples of substantial philosophical conversations of children found in Lone (2012, 2021), McCall (2009), Pritchard (1996, 2022), Shapiro (2012), and Wartenberg (2009, 2013), among many others, should leave little doubt that children have this ability.

5. Philosophy For Children Today

In light of the rapidly expanding international interest in philosophy for children, the International Council for Philosophical Inquiry with Children (ICPIC) was established in 1985. ICPIC continues to sponsor an international conference every other year, with hosts including Australia, Austria, Brazil, England, Mexico, Spain (twice), and Taiwan.

Even after the passing of IAPC pioneers Matthew Lipman (2010) and Ann Margaret Sharp (2011), now led by Maughn Gregory and others, IAPC retains a strong presence in ICPIC. However, many ICPIC members now have established their own institutional structures and have developed centers, associations, and programs. In North America, there is the North American Association of Community of Inquiry (NAACI), which gathers every other year (years when ICPIC is not meeting). With initial support from the American Philosophical Association’s Pre-College Philosophy Committee, PLATO (Philosophy Learning and Teaching Organization) was formed. Now a non-profit organization supported by the Squire Family Foundation, PLATO sponsors annual meetings, and in 2022 the University of Washington Center for Philosophy for Children and PLATO were joined. PLATO also sponsors two periodicals: Questions and the online Precollege Philosophy and Public Practice. Australia and New Zealand are organized under the Federation of Australasian Philosophy in Schools Associations (FAPSA), which meets annually and publishes Journal for Philosophy in Schools as its official journal (Burgh and Thornton, 2016). In 1992 the Society for the Advancement of Philosophical Enquiry and Reflection in Education (SAPERE) was established in Oxford, England. In 2007 England’s Philosophy Foundation was established (Worley, 2011). Since 2005, the journal Philosophy and Childhood has been sponsored by ICPIC and the graduate program in education at the State University of Rio De Janeiro (UERJ). These organizations, along with many other centers and experienced practitioners around the world, continue to support training programs for teachers that enable them to introduce thousands of children to philosophy, both inside and outside regular classrooms.

Although there is continued use of IAPC materials, recent years have been marked by a proliferation of alternative teaching resources and ways of engaging children in philosophical discussions. For years Gareth Matthews contributed reviews of children’s stories to Thinking, then IAPC’s official journal (even though IAPC’s own teaching materials made no use of other children’s literature). This inspired Tom Wartenberg (2009, 2013) to develop his highly successful pre-college philosophy program at Mt. Holyoke College (MA), a prize winning program that is built around classic children’s stories. His website offers a wealth of materials on children’s literature that are designed to provide guidance for those wishing to pursue philosophy with children. Karen Murris was an early objector to Lipman’s resistance to using illustrated materials (Morris, 1992). She and Johana Haynes offer a detailed account of the philosophical importance of picture books (Murris and Haynes, 2012 and Murris, 2016). Peter Worley, head of England’s Philosophy Foundation has written several stimulating books for teachers and students that make no use of IAPC materials. Australia’s Phil Cam has assembled a variety of stories suitable for philosophical use with children. In short, there is a rapidly growing list of resources that show great promise for engaging children in philosophical discussions. (See, for example, DeHaan et al. 1995; Fisher 1998; Keen 1997; Lewis and Chandley 2012; Lone 2012 & 2021; McCall 2009; Murris 1992, 2016; Sprod 2001, and White 2000). Questions: Philosophy for Young People, a periodical sponsored by the American Philosophical Association’s Pre-College Philosophy Committee, features young people’s writings on special philosophical topics. The first issue (Spring 2001) focused on children’s rights.

Fortunately, the internet makes it possible to keep up reasonably well with the latest developments around the world and communicate quickly with other educators interested in Philosophy for Children. Unfortunately, many of these websites seem to be short-lived. However, see the Internet Resources section below for a list of websites that are reliable and which provide links to other useful sites.


Books and Articles

  • Astington, Janet Wilde, 1993, The Child’s Discovery of the Mind Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Burgh, Gilbert and Simone Thornton, 2016, “Philosophy Goes to School in Australia: A History 1982–2016,” Journal of Philosophy in Schools, 3(1): 59–83.
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  • Analytic Teaching and Philosophical Praxis, Viterbo University, La Crosse, WI.
  • Journal for Philosophy in Schools, The Federation of Australian Philosophy for Children Associations (FAPSA).
  • Childhood & Philosophy, Official Journal of the International Council of the Philosophical Inquiry with Children (ICPIC).
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  • Precollege Philosophy and Public Practice (online periodical sponsored by PLATO).

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