Philosophy of Contract Law

First published Tue Nov 23, 2021

The law of contracts, at least in its orthodox expression, concerns voluntary, or chosen, legal obligations. When Brody accepts Susan’s offer to sell him a canoe for a set price, the parties’ choices alter their legal rights and duties. Their success at changing the legal landscape depends on a background system of rules that specify when and how contractual acts have legal effects, rules that give the offer and acceptance of a bargain-exchange a central role in generating obligations. Contract law conceived as a body of rules empowering individuals to shape their own rights and responsibilities presents an object of philosophical study.

The philosophy of contract includes two broad sets of projects. One set, the focus of the first part of this entry, targets the basic structure and normative justification of the law of contracts. The aim is to subsume a salient body of contract law rules under general principles in order to clarify contract law’s conceptual categories, distinguish it from other areas of law, and specify criteria relevant to its normative appraisal. This kind of philosophical work presupposes detailed knowledge of the law in existing legal regimes, and the entry begins by outlining the common law of contracts.

A second set of projects draws on resources from the philosophy of language, philosophy of action, and moral and political philosophy to address debates within contract law. Questions about the nature of meaning and interpretation, intentionality, freedom in contract, and distributive justice drive contemporary legal debates concerning contract formation, interpretation, and enforcement. Philosophical work on these topics has attracted significant commentary which serves as the focus of the second part of this entry.

1. General Theories of the Law of Contracts

This first part examines general theories of contract that take central features of the common law as their explanatory starting point. The range of possible contract law regimes is, of course, vast, and there is a risk of overgeneralization. Still, since many exchange-regimes share basic features, it is not an unreasonable expectation that the principles extracted from a sophisticated and well-functioning body of contract law might aid in our understanding of contract law as such, at least where the law functions to regulate economic life in modern market orders.

There are at least five prominent accounts of the fundamental principles of the common law of contracts. The first, and most famous, holds that contract law enforces the basic moral duty to keep promises. A related though distinct view presents contract law as enforcing a duty not to harm others. A third conceives of the law not as enforcing parties’ non-legal duties, but as promoting efficient investment and exchange. An association with economic theory gives this approach a prominence in legal scholarship that outstrips the philosophical attention it has received. A fourth position emphasizes that contracts establish a distinctive relationship between the parties to them and grounds contractual obligations in the value of acting jointly and cooperatively with others. A fifth position is pluralistic and proposes that contract law has many fundamental goals that need not be jointly satisfiable or even consistent. These competing views can be evaluated along several dimensions, including “fit” with actual doctrine, success in justifying the law, and internal coherence.

1.1 Bare promissory duties

The law of contracts prominently employs the language of promise-making and promissory obligation. The Restatement (Second) of Contracts [henceforth: “R2”] defines a contract as

a promise or a set of promises for the breach of which the law gives a remedy, or the performance of which the law in some way recognizes as a duty. (§1)

Contracting parties are regularly referred to as “promisor” and “promisee”. Where there are multiple parties to a contract, the Restatement provides that “some or all of them may promise jointly as a unit, or some or all of them may each promise severally”. Although the Restatement does not state what a promise is, it defines offer and acceptance, the pair of acts through which contractual obligations characteristically arise, in terms that involve an exchange of promises. An “offer” is

the manifestation of willingness to enter into a bargain, so made as to justify another person in understanding that his assent to that bargain is invited and will conclude it. (R2: §24)

To establish a contract, the offer must be met with an appropriate “acceptance”, typically

a manifestation of assent to the terms [of the offer] made by the offeree in a manner invited or required by the offer. (§50)

Both formulations closely track conventional philosophical accounts of promising, in which a promise arises when a person

communicates … an intention to undertake by the very act of communication an obligation to perform an action and invest the addressee with a right to its performance. (Raz 1977: 210–211)

Several theorists connect such language to the view that contract law enforces promissory morality—that is, moral duties incurred by promising. In Contract as Promise, Charles Fried (1981; 2014: 20) argues that the “central organizing moral and doctrinal principle of contracts is the promise principle”, according to which “a promise is a kind of moral invention… [that] allows persons to create obligation where there was none before”. While the importance of realizing such ends as interpersonal trust and coordination may be part of what explains the value in enforcing promises, on Fried’s view, promissory compliance is “an end in itself”. Likewise, Seana Shiffrin (2007: 721) invokes contract law’s “explicit self-representation” as a law of promissory obligation as a reason for evaluating the law based on the standards of promissory morality.

The promise-conception finds support in the prevailing remedial scheme for breaches of contract. The standard remedy for breach is money damages that approximate the promisee’s valuation of the promised performance. The law calls the remedy “expectation damages” (R2: §344 cmt. A). The expectation remedy does not simply “undo” harms suffered by the promisee through reliance on the promisor. Rather, the promisor must affirmatively vindicate the promisee’s expectation of performance by putting the promisee in as good a position as the promisee would have enjoyed had the promisor performed. To illustrate, if S promises to sell B widgets for $4 that B expects to resell at $10 for a $6 profit and S fails to deliver the widgets, then B’s expectation interest is $6 so long as B hasn’t yet paid for the widgets. If B has already made the $4 payment to S, then the expectation interest is $10. Since the law opts for expectation over “reliance” damages—an alternative measure that returns the parties to their pre-contractual state—it enforces promissory duties indirectly by requiring the promisor to insure the promisee’s value of performance. This feature of contract law distinguishes it from tort law, where the remedial aim is very much that of restoring a status quo ante disturbed by a wrong.

The role that fault plays in breach reinforces contract’s connection to promise and its difference from tort. Whereas tort liability is typically fault-based—most torts require intent or negligence—contractual liability is strict and can arise without any fault in a promisor. A person might take all reasonable care to avoid making promises she cannot keep and might make every cost-justified effort to keep whatever contractual promises she has made. Yet (with only a few exceptions under narrow doctrines, such as impossibility or frustration of purpose) when the promisor makes and breaks a contractual promise, she remains liable even if performance becomes unexpectedly burdensome or she is unable to perform because of the actions of a third party. Standard accounts of contract therefore emphasize that the duty to vindicate the promisee’s expectations is legally robust and not easily excused; though for an opposing view on the significance of fault in contract, see Hillman (2014).

The contract-as-promise view confronts challenges along three dimensions:

  1. whether promissory morality is a legitimate ground for state coercion;
  2. whether the moral assumptions underwriting the view are plausible; and
  3. whether a promise-based theory can account for certain prominent and well-established doctrines of contract law.

First, it is unclear why a liberal state would be justified in promoting promissory virtue for its own sake, which seems a far more controversial end for the state to adopt than various others that might justify enforcing promises (such as preventing harm to promisees or efficient coordination; see below). Raz (1982: 937) argues that “enforcing voluntary obligations is not itself a proper goal for contract law” because “[t]o enforce voluntary obligations [for their own sake]” would be “to enforce morality through the legal imposition of duties on individuals”. Raz adds, “[i]n this respect, [enforcing promissory morality] does not differ from the legal proscription of pornography”. This challenge is aligned with neutralist conceptions of liberalism. A state that aims at relative neutrality on contested moral claims and restraint in the exercise of power must connect the enforcement of contracts to ends that are widely embraced as worthwhile.

Second, the moral assumptions about promising that the view imports appear questionable. Proponents of the promise-conception endorse what Raz (2014) calls the “bare reasons” of promising. The view entails that an act of promising generates a moral reason to keep one’s promise that is independent of (a) the moral desirability of the promised acts, (b) whether or not the promisee relied on the promise and might be harmed or disappointed by its breach, and (c) the value in having a mechanism that allows us to bind ourselves. Of course, this “bare” reason to keep one’s promise might be overridden by competing considerations. Additionally, a promise may not generate reasons unless certain conditions are satisfied, including conditions related to the promisor’s freedom from coercion (for the legal analogue of this moral requirement, see R2: §175), their capacity to promise (cf. §§14, 15, 16), and the promise’s content falling within certain moral bounds (compare with the illegality doctrine: §178). Still, provided key enabling conditions are met, the promise-conception proposes that even bare promises—promises whose breach will not undermine anyone’s trust or cause any reliance-based harms—generate moral obligations. But it is puzzling why such obligations should arise. The puzzle is clearest if obligations are grounded in people’s interests. It is difficult to say what interest might support the duty to keep a bare promise, since the ordinary interests that might be in play—associated with reliance and expectations—have been excluded by construction. Thoughts like these led David Hume to worry that promissory obligations purport to “arise[] from our mere will and pleasure” and to compare such obligations to the mystery of transubstantiation, insofar as both involve intentions that purport to “change[] entirely the nature of an external object, and even of a human creature” (A Treatise of Human Nature, Bk. III, Pt. 2, Ch. v).

The contract-as-promise view must defend bare promissory reasons against such skepticism. A proposal owing to Owens (2006) treats the breach of a promissory duty as a “bare wronging”, one that needn’t set back any “non-normative interest” of the promisee—for example, their general interest in wellbeing—but does set back the promisee’s “normative interest” in having a measure of authority over the promisor. This view may be subject to a circularity challenge. The claim that promisees have normative interests appears to presuppose the fact that needs to be explained—namely, that promises have the relevant authority-conferring effects. For a broader discussion of these and related issues, see the general entry on promises, bearing in mind that not just any moral theory of promising can be slotted into the contract-as-promise view. The view is not—and cannot—be neutral on the nature of promissory obligation, given the character of the views it opposes.

Finally, a central challenge for the promise conception is the divergence of well-established legal rules from the rules of promissory morality. Shiffrin (2007) offers examples of divergence to criticize the law. For instance, contract law only enforces promises that are supported by adequate “consideration”. The consideration doctrine, in its modern form, requires a promise to be part of a bargain. The Restatement states that

[a] performance or return promise is bargained for if it is sought by the promisor in exchange for his promise and is given by the promisee in exchange for that promise. (R2: §71)

Contracts, in other words, arise out of an exchange of promises where each party’s promise triggers the other’s, in what Oliver Wendell Holmes (1881 [1991: 293–294]) calls “reciprocal conventional inducement”. In exceptional circumstances, a gratuitous promise may be enforced in the absence of consideration. Certain promises (especially concerning contract modifications) made among merchants are enforceable without consideration, as are promises to make charitable subscriptions (R2 §90(2); Uniform Commercial Code [“UCC”] § 2-209). More generally, the doctrine of promissory estoppel enforces promises that are detrimentally relied on when considerations of justice demand it (R2 §90). But promissory estoppel is in practice narrowly construed and rarely invoked by courts (for a leading case applying the rule in the context of pre-contractual bargaining, see Hoffman v. Red Owl Stores, Inc. [1965], and for a survey of the law that shows Hoffman’s exceptional status, see Schwartz and Scott [2007]).

The consideration doctrine presents a challenge for the contract-as-promise theory because the rules of promissory morality do not limit obligations in any analogous way. Other limits on contract law’s willingness to enforce promises—for instance, doctrines relating to fraud and duress— might track analogous limits in the morality of promising. But there is no obvious reason to suppose that a gratuitous promise—to collect a friend from the airport, to give a child a coveted treat, or to keep a friend’s secret—cannot generate moral obligations. The challenge is bolstered by the fact that the consideration requirement remains entrenched in the common law of contracts despite repeated academic criticism. Even civil law, which includes no formal analog to consideration, nevertheless favors legal enforcement of exchange promises in a number of ways.

A second doctrinal challenge to the theory resides in the law’s acceptance—and apparent encouragement—of “efficient breach”. As noted above, the standard remedy for breach of contract, expectation damages, vindicates contractual rights through substitutionary relief: it provides disappointed promisees with a money award equal to their value of performance. The remedy of “specific performance”—a court injunction ordering the promisor to do as she promised—would more directly enforce the duty to perform. Yet specific performance is not the primary or usual judicial remedy. Moreover, the expectation remedy—in fact and perhaps also by design—encourages contractual promisors to breach when the costs of performance (including the opportunity costs of diverting performance to higher-valuing third parties) exceed the value of the promisee’s performance. If S promises to sell a widget for $10 to B, who values the widget at $15, and C offers to buy the same widget from S for $16, then the expectation remedy gives S an incentive to sell to C, pay B $5 in expectation damages, and pocket the additional dollar. The breach is efficient insofar as the widget ends up in the hands of the party that values it most, and this efficiency is cited (both in legal theory and by courts) as a reason for denying specific performance (N. Ind. Pub. Serv. Co. v. Carbon County Coal (1986)). By contrast, morality gives promisors no equivalent flexibility. This has dismayed some theorists who are attracted to contract as promise (Friedmann 1989). Others deny that there is any fundamental conflict, reinterpreting the expectation remedy in terms of an implied promise in the alternative, which allows promisors the choice of performing by trading a good for its price or by transferring money equal to the promisee’s value of trade (Markovits & Schwartz 2011). Sophisticated parties have good reason to make contractual promises in this way, as doing so maximizes their gains from trade. But unsophisticated parties may think contracts require simple performance and view the legal option of substituting damages for performance as immoral.

Shiffrin and others take departures from promissory morality to be reasons for law reform. However, given that theoretical work in this area proceeds on the assumption that the normativity of contract law is worth engaging with on its own terms, there is reason for desiring a theory that is not too revisionary. While the contract-as-promise theory is explanatorily powerful and morally appealing, its adequacy in the final analysis turns on whether it can plausibly explain away the tensions it perceives in contract law, a question that remains very much unsettled.

1.2 The duty not to harm & the promisee’s reliance interest

Broken promises typically impose tangible burdens on the promisee in the form of costs (including opportunity costs) incurred in reliance on a promise or in the form of disappointed expectations. If these costs can be classified as harms, then promissory representations implicate the duty not to harm. In other words,

[i]f there is a general principle that one ought not cause harm to others, that might be enough to justify some sort of rule against [agreement-breaking]. (Craswell 1989: 499)

On the harm-based view, contract law is analogous to tort law—an instance of a broader class of regulations enforcing harm-based obligations. More specifically, contract elaborates liability for misrepresentation—including not just fraud but also negligent misrepresentation—especially insofar as analogous doctrines in the law of torts appear artificially cabined.

The leading contemporary proponent of the harm-based theory is T.M. Scanlon, who argues that contract law imports the moral principles governing harm-avoidance into law (Scanlon 1998: 295–327; 2001: 93–94). Scanlon’s view begins with pre-promissory moral principles that no one could “reasonably reject”, which forbid certain ways of manipulating others and, moreover, require persons to exercise care in leading others to form expectations. Scanlon explains the wrongfulness of lying and imposing misimpressions based on these principles. He then defends a more specific principle of promissory fidelity:

Principle of Fidelity: If (1) A voluntarily and intentionally leads B to expect that A will do X (unless B consents to A’s not doing so); (2) A knows that B wants to be assured of this; (3) A acts with the aim of providing this assurance, and has good reason to believe that he or she has done so; (4) B knows that A has the intentions and beliefs just described; (5) A intends for B to know this, and knows that B does know it; (6) B knows that A has this knowledge and intent, then, in the absence of special justification, A must do X unless B consents to X’s not being done. (Scanlon 1998: 304)

The principle of fidelity articulates a first-order duty to keep one’s promises, grounded not in the simple fact of promising, as on the bare reasons view, but in the fact that promises give assurances that lead to reasonable reliance and a risk of harm. The principle calls for doing as one has promised and not just making up a disappointed promisee’s losses, but it does not prescribe any specific legal enforcement scheme. Consequently, an important challenge for the view is explaining contract law’s standard remedy for breach, which obliges the promisor to vindicate the promisee’s expectation and not merely reimburse her for costs incurred through reliance.

Scanlon suggests that no one could reasonably reject a legal remedy that protects the promisee’s expectations given the substantial benefits to promisees and the low costs to promisors (Scanlon 2001: 105–111). But the costs to promisors of a principle requiring compensation for expectations may not be all that low. Scanlon imagines that promisors can easily avoid the special remedial obligations by qualifying their intentional representations with: “of course, I’m not promising”. But such a disclaimer, in the context of a regime that enforces promises, undermines the credibility of the communicated intention. A person who wishes to credibly signal her intent to perform while hoping to avoid liability for her promisee’s expectations appears disempowered by Scanlon’s regime.

Even if a principle that enforces promissory expectations cannot reasonably be rejected, this still does not fully explain why the law favors expectations. Some alternative remedy might equally fall within the bounds of moral principles no one could reasonably reject. For instance, the law could compensate based on reliance damages, returning parties to their pre-contractual state in the event of breach. Of course, the practical difference between vindicating expectations and reliance-based losses is not always substantial. Lon Fuller and William Perdue (1936) discuss cases where the two remedial schemes converge, as when markets are thick. Where a promisee’s reliance on her promisor includes forsaking an identically attractive offer, then the promisee’s reliance interest arguably equals her valuation of performance—that is, her contractual expectation. Moreover, a number of legal rules cabin the expectation remedy by imposing requirements of foreseeability (see, e.g., Hadley v. Baxendale (1854)) and mitigating one’s losses (R2: §350); and the law sometimes opts for reliance damages where expectation is hard to measure (see, e.g., Sullivan v. O’Connor (1972)). Still, reliance and expectation are not always congruent, and the law’s clear preference for the latter requires an explanation.

A deeper problem is that Scanlon’s defense of a regime that enforces contractual expectations does not fully vindicate the law, since it presupposes moral constraints that have no legal analogue. Scanlon (2001: 105) suggests that enforcing a promisee’s expectation is appropriate only if the compensatory burden is not “excessive” and only if the promisor had “adequate opportunity” to avoid it based on an “adequate understanding” of their situation at the time of promising. But the law does not qualify the promisor’s duty in these ways. A promisor might have every intention to comply with a promise and yet later find that, due to events she reasonably did not foresee, the cost of her performance has risen dramatically or the value to her of the other side’s promise has fallen. It is hardly obvious that promise-breaking in such cases violates the duty not to harm (could the promisee reasonably expect the promisor to keep her promise in this scenario?) or that it would be fair to make the promise-breaker liable for the promisee’s full expectation (did the promisor have a reasonable opportunity ex ante to avoid the burden?). While the law excuses breach if the unexpected costs of performance are extraordinary (under the doctrines of “impossibility” and “impracticability”, see R2: §261) or if the decrease in the value of the bargain is similarly substantial (see “frustration of purpose”, R2: §269), these excuses are only available in exceptional circumstances (a leading case on impracticability, Alcoa v. Essex (1980), involved unexpected costs greater than $50 million). Historically, the common law’s pacta sunt servanda (“agreements must be kept”) principle used to be enforced quite unforgivingly (see Paradine v. Jane (1647)); and while courts now recognize a broader category of excuses for non-performance, the law’s remedial demands are not so clearly consistent with Scanlon’s moral framework.

Finally, the harm-based view conceives of promissory duties as arising only when the promisee reasonably relied or formed reasonable expectations. This invites the question of what might ground the reasonableness of reliance or expectations. The answer cannot be that the promisor is obligated by her promise and it is reasonable for the promisee to expect the promisor to honor her obligations. As an account of promissory obligation, this argument travels a (very short) circle. The theoretical problem, moreover, is directly captured in law, given the contrast between contract and the misrepresentation torts. These torts include, among their elements, that defendants must have failed to exercise reasonable care in making false statements and, additionally, require plaintiffs to have justifiably relied on defendants’ false statements (Restatement (Second) of Torts §552). Moreover, tort law expressly adds that a party asserting liability for misrepresentations must have relied specifically on the representations’ being true, rather than just “upon the expectation that the maker [of the false statement] will be held liable in damages for its falsity” (§548). Contract takes the opposite approach. As Learned Hand observed in discussing warranties:

[A warranty is] an assurance by one party to a contract of the existence of a fact upon which the other party may rely. It is intended precisely to relieve the promisee of any duty to ascertain the fact for himself; it amounts to a promise to indemnify the promisee for any loss if the fact warranted proves untrue, for obviously the promisor cannot control what is already in the past. (Metropolitan Coal Co. v. Howard 1946)

In other words, a kind of bootstrapping—where the law generates expectations of enforcement that it regards as a reason for enforcement—is of the essence in contract.

A more detailed look at doctrine compounds the explanatory challenge. For example, the law does not allow contracting parties to escape liability by providing advance warning of breach (on “anticipatory repudiation”, see Hochster v. De La Tour (1853)). Contractual obligations are imposed notwithstanding a promisor’s attempt to negate their promissory intent and the promisee’s reasonable reliance immediately after an apparent act of promising (see Lucy v. Zehmer (1954)). More generally, the harm-based view struggles to explain why the law imposes liability even if the promisee incurs no reliance costs or when the promisor is known to be unreliable. In CBS Inc. v. Ziff-Davis Publishing Co. (1990), the seller of a business warranted certain claims regarding the business’ profitability. The buyer, after independent investigation, confessed that he didn’t think the warranted representations were true. The court ruled that the buyer’s lack of belief in and reliance on the truth of the warranted information did not relieve the seller of its obligations under the warranty. Such rulings are prima facie puzzling on the harm-based view.

1.3 Enabling mutually beneficial exchange

There is room to question whether the law (especially in a liberal state) should be in the business of enforcing moral duties associated with promising. The economic approach to contract law de-emphasizes contract’s promissory roots and instead locates the law’s justification in general welfare: the rules of contract law enable socially productive reliance on promises and mutually beneficial exchange. This approach is more prominent among academic lawyers than among philosophers, and is widely regarded, at least in the United States, as the leading interdisciplinary approach to contract law.

The economic analysis of contract begins, in effect, with Hume’s observation that

experience has taught us, that human affairs wou’d be conducted much more for mutual advantage, were there certain symbols or signs instituted, by which we might give each other security of our conduct in any particular incident. (A Treatise of Human Nature, bk. 3, pt. II, sec. v [Of the Obligation of Promises], emphasis removed)

When parties exchange promises as part of a bargain, they usually stand to gain from mutual performance, but in the absence of a commitment mechanism, each has an incentive to defect; and, since the parties can foresee the defections, they might fail to invest in and or enter into mutually beneficial bargains. The law prevents self-interest from getting in the way of mutual advantage by enabling

individuals to bind themselves to a future course of conduct, to make it easier for others to arrange their lives in reliance on [a] promise. (Craswell 1989: 496; see generally Goetz & Scott 1980; cf. Atiyah 1979)

This power-conferring conception of contract law is generally understood as having normative import: contracts should be enforced just insofar as doing so (by increasing confidence in the promises that they contain) establishes optimal incentives for reliance and maximizes the joint surplus produced through contractual coordination (see, e.g., Schwartz & Scott 2003: 541). A striking upshot is that nothing in the intrinsic character of contract law favors promise-based or chosen obligation; instead, everything depends on contingent facts about which legal forms coordinate mutual reliance in the most “efficient” or welfare maximizing way.

Most lawyer-economists adopt an overtly revisionary stance towards particular legal rules. Some argue that the law should be more solicitous of promissory reliance in the absence of consideration—especially reliance on pre-contractual representations—than orthodox contract doctrine allows (see, e.g., Bebchuk & Ben-Shahar 2001: 427; Ben-Shahar 2004; Craswell 1996; Johnston 1999; Katz 1996). In addition, and independently, the economic approach rejects orthodox contract law’s categorical preference for expectation-based remedies. Such remedies may or may not support optimal reliance; but in either case, the promise-based idea of securing the promisee’s expectations “will not have played any role in the analysis leading up to [the] conclusion” about which remedy is optimal (Craswell 2000: 107).

Although no longer seen as a primarily descriptive theory, the economic approach appears to rationalize established doctrines that competing views struggle to explain. The approach seems tailormade to explain the law’s encouragement of “efficient breach” (discussed earlier, in §1.1). Though even here there are puzzles. It remains unclear why contract law is unwilling to promote efficiency through orders of specific performance (Ayres & Klass 2017). After all, it is likely costly to deal with an unwilling counterparty forced to perform, so promisees will usually seek specific performance only when expectation damages are genuinely undercompensatory or hard to calculate (Schwartz 1979). At the very least, an efficient contract law should allow parties, ex ante, to contract for the specific performance remedy or even for supra-compensatory “penalties” that assure performance by requiring damages upon breach that exceed the promisee’s expectation interest (see discussion in Edlin 1996; Edlin & Schwartz 2003; Shavell 1980). But, in fact, the law does not condone such agreements, even between sophisticated parties (R2: §356; see, e.g., Lake River v. Carborundum (1985)). A possible explanation is that penalty clauses enable inefficient collusion by established firms to keep new entrants out of markets.

The view that contract law, in its positive expression, promotes efficient investment and exchange is hard to maintain in the face of doctrinal challenges (see, e.g., Posner 2003). “This is Not a Legally Enforceable Agreement” clauses used by parties to disclaim their intent for an agreement to be legally enforceable are not always enforced. Similarly, efforts by parties to opt out of legal duties in the pre-contractual bargaining phase, including duties related to disclosure of information, are often deemed legally ineffective (V.S.H. v. Texaco (1985)). In all such cases, the law’s reluctance to cater to parties’ preferences is not straightforwardly explainable in power-conferring or general welfarist terms. For an exploration of the degree to which the law’s mandatory constraints can be explained from the standpoint of efficiency, see Zamir and Ayres (2020).

Another explanatory puzzle is broader and focuses not on specific doctrines but rather on contract law’s generic structure. The economic approach is free to focus on efficiency and to disregard both distributive fairness and freedom only insofar as it ignores the inequities and vulnerabilities that figure in the lives of natural persons. The most sophisticated economists recognize this and limit the domain of their arguments to contracts among firms owned by diversified shareholders (see, e.g., Schwartz & Scott 2003). This focus on firms suits the efficiency standard: firms are artificial entities, so that concerns about freedom and autonomy are irrelevant to regulating their behavior. Moreover, the diversified holdings of the natural persons who own the firms cause legal rules to have no distributive effects across owners since the owners hold shares in firms that are benefited as well as those that are burdened by every legal rule. The firms that the economic approach focuses on are, therefore, mere instrumentalities of shareholders who, insofar as they own (or could own) diversified portfolios, are all more or less identically situated with respect to every transaction that contract law might regulate. This suggests that the economic approach abandons a basic presupposition from which the study of contract law as the law of agreements ordinarily begins. Contracts, intuitively understood, involve coordination among multiple parties with distinct interests. But there is a sense in which the transactions modelled by economic theory ultimately involve only one such party: the diversified shareholder who stands behind the firms on both sides of every contract. This is of course an idealized model, and actual firms will often have differentiated owners. Nevertheless, the model casts doubt on whether transactions among firms should be understood, in the end, to be agreements at all.

Finally, the economic view’s normative assumptions have been subject to criticism. Dworkin (1975: 1061) argues that judges should decide bilateral disputes based on the parties’ established rights and considerations of interpersonal fairness, while leaving the crafting of rules based on general welfare to “[t]he political system of representative democracy”. The economic approach seems to ignore these limits to judicial authority. A different normative critique (discussed more broadly within the entry on the philosophy of economics) targets the definition of welfare that animates work in this area. Economists tend to equate the parties’ welfare with preference satisfaction, while inferring the strength of preferences based on a willingness to pay. This approach biases measurements of efficiency in favor of the rich given that the willingness to pay is sensitive to background endowments (Liscow 2018). In the context of contractual exchange, an approach that aims to maximize preference satisfaction is at least more or less constrained by the Pareto criterion (an outcome counts as a Pareto improvement only if it is preferred by at least one person and not dispreferred by anyone), because both parties to every contract must agree before it becomes enforceable. But even here, the preference-satisfaction/welfare equivalence remains vulnerable to critique for being based on an impoverished account of the social good (Radin 1987; Murphy 2014; Mullen 2016).

1.4 The normativity of the contract relation

Tort law concerns obligations among strangers. But contract law concerns obligations among parties who have a special relationship to each other, including the relationship constructed by the contract itself. Raz (1977: 228) writing about promises, has suggested that bare reasons for keeping promises “can only be justified if the creation of [the] special relationships between people [that even bare promises involve] is held to be valuable.” However, Raz declines “to argue that the special relationships the desirability of which would validate [bare promissory obligations] are indeed desirable.”

Some contract theorists embrace Raz’s formal observation and seek to ground contract law in one or another substantive conception of the value of the special relationships that exist among contracting parties.

One version of this approach emphasizes that contracts generally (some theorists claim always) arise inside already existing commercial and even social relationships. The “theory of relational contracting” seeks the basis for enforcing contractual promises in the norms that govern the background relationships. Legal sociologists working in this vein have emphasized that contracting, especially in commercial contexts, relies on the parties’ antecedent commitments to integrity or “common honesty and decency” (Macaulay 1963). Others emphasize social norms involving reciprocity and respect, especially within close-knit contracting communities (Bernstein 1992). Still others approach contract law through a theory of exchange relations according to which every contract is “necessarily partially” embedded in a thick context of extra-legal relations, from which it draws its legal authority and force (Macneil 1980).

Another set of theories emphasizes the formal structure of the legal relation of contract itself, even apart from any commercial or social relationships within which it arises (Markovits 2004; Bensen 2019). The doctrines governing offer and acceptance require contractual promisors to form (and to communicate) intentions that refer to their promisees. The parties to contracts, that is, intend to pursue ends that do not merely coincide but rather, to borrow a formulation from David Hume, “have a reference to” each other (A Treatise of Human Nature, L.A. III, 2, ii.). Moreover, each promisor intends not simply to do things but to be bound to do things, entrenching her deference to the promisee, intending to perform unless released. Her obligation endures at his option, so that she gives him power over her normative situation. Contracts, that is, establish the transaction as a normative unit.

A contractual promisor’s intentions, moreover, run not just to her own interest in the joint contractual project, or even to her promisee’s interest in this project (as she understands it), but rather to his perspective on the project, as this is the perspective from which he will decide whether to insist on her performance or to release her. In this way, the promisor recognizes her promisee as an authority over her, with respect to the promised contractual performance. She treats as a final end not just the joint activities described by her contracts but also his person—his will (which may insist on or relieve the duty to perform). Borrowing from Kant, one might even say that a contract constitutes “an act of the united choice of two persons” (The Metaphysics of Morals 6:271) so that offers and acceptances are “represented not as following upon one another but … as proceeding from a single common will” (6:273). Every contract, on this view, establishes a shared perspective over the contemplated performance.

Contractual obligations, according to such theories, are grounded in the value of a shared perspective. On one version, this value lies in the recognition immanent in the perspective, as promisors and promisees each treat the other as an independent person, imbued with the special normative status that asserting contractual authority involves. This approach treats the duty of good faith in performance, which the common law makes mandatory in every contract (UCC: §1-304; R2: §205), as contract law’s core doctrine, because it requires parties to show fidelity to the shared perspective of the contract relation when they administer their contracts (Markovits 2014). On another version, the value of the contract relation lies in the transfer of rights, completed at the moment of contract formation. This approach treats the consideration doctrine, which other theories regard as poorly justified and marginal to contract law, as contract’s central, organizing principle. Consideration ensures that every contract is indeed constituted as a transaction involving an exchange of rights (Benson 2019).

Accounts of contract that emphasize the normativity of the contract relation face a shared challenge, although it expresses itself differently for different versions of the view. The challenge is to explain why the motives parties adopt in the shadow of legal enforcement do not undermine the value of the special relationship, whose desirability grounds contractual obligation on the relational model. Theorists who embed the contract relation inside pre-existing social and moral relationships must explain why the self-interested motives associated with contractual compliance—“greed and fear” as G. A. Cohen (2009: 40–44) puts it—do not “crowd out” the desirable attitudes and motives out of which the enveloping pre-legal relationships are built. This concern has been much discussed—both the empirical reality of crowding out (see, e.g., Deci, Koestner, & Ryan 1999; Gneezy and Rustichini 2000) and its normative significance for valued social relationships (Atiq 2014). Theorists who understand contract as a free-standing relation can avoid this challenge and might even embrace the crowding out of socially thicker motives as a feature of the contract relation rather than a bug (Markovits 2011). But the general problem remains in place of explaining how an arm’s-length relation among self-interested parties might establish a morally desirable form of solidarity. This challenge becomes especially pressing in light of the fact that most contracts have organizations as a party (Leib 2015). Organizations lack the properties of natural persons out of which the relational theories build their accounts of the normativity of the contract relation. Whereas contracts among organizations are the natural domain for economic theories (see §1.3), they are difficult for relational theories to compass.

1.5 Pluralism

The criteria for measuring a contract theory’s success remain vaguely defined, which is to be expected in an interpretive enterprise. We want our theory to fit and to explain contract law doctrines that are themselves sometimes contested. In addition, we want the law to be understood as worthy of our moral approval, with all the complexities and controversies that this involves. The competing theories of contract strike different balances between considerations of fit and justification and are based on competing views about what the law is and what it should be. Moreover, the differences among the theories—especially with respect to justification—involve fundamental disagreements about value, which makes compromise elusive. Whether any balance can be sensibly struck between, say, the value of promissory integrity and that of maximizing the joint surplus from contractual exchange remains unclear.

The “pluralist” finds in this stalemate reasons to question whether contract law is animated by one evaluative goal or master principle, rather than a plurality of independent and perhaps even incommensurable evaluative aims. Pluralism is more often presupposed in the literature than directly defended, and what defense there is usually takes the form of a critique of monistic views (see, e.g., Hillman 1998). The critique is qualified, however, since the monistic views are portrayed as offering genuine even if incomplete insights into contract law, contributing to the taxonomic project of mapping the values that undergird it (Hillman 1998; Klass 2008; Kreitner 2012). For pluralism to be more than a negative thesis, pluralists have considerable work to do in explaining contract law’s plural commitments, ideally offering more than a grab-bag list of values to be promoted (Lucy 2007).

An important question facing the pluralist is whether there are reasons for contract law’s pluralism. The answer might seem obvious, as if it were lawyerly commonsense. The law of contracts has developed over the course of several centuries, with many diverse juridical personalities disagreeing on how best to resolve contract disputes. Some of the law’s guiding principles have survived both this competitive process and changing normative fashions in the broader culture; others have been modified. The expectancy remedy and pacta sunt servanda principles may be relics of a bygone age’s commitment to bare promissory duty. But efficient breach and related doctrines have evolved to prevent promissory virtue from getting in the way of social welfare, especially in economies marked by a high-frequency spot contracts among parties with no relationship outside of the contracts at issue. These tensions within contract law are, as one commentator puts it, “historical and political accidents” (Alces 2008).

But there are also other explanatory possibilities. Contract law’s distinctive pluralism may reflect an indeterminacy in the realm of non-legal value. The promotion of promissory and collaborative virtue, or general welfare, or careful promising to avoid monetary harm, may be understood as falling largely within the realm of the (institutional) supererogatory rather than the realm of duty or basic justice. And if there is genuine indeterminacy regarding how these incompossible goods are to be integrated by a regime that aspires to do what is best (rather than exclusively what is obligatory), then the character of contract law’s pluralism might be explained in terms of judges “settling” a genuinely indeterminate moral question regarding the optimal institutional choice (Atiq 2018: 78, 88–97). Contract law is thus seen not as the incoherent end result of judges disagreeing on questions of morality and the social good, but as a distinctly juridical solution to a genuine evaluative dilemma: quasi-legislative stipulation by judges of the precise mix of goods to be institutionally promoted. Law’s usefulness in this regard, providing closure on problems of value pluralism, has been explored more generally in legal and political philosophy (see, e.g., Radbruch 1932; Finnis 1980; Williams 1985; Waldron 1996, Berlin 2002).

Even in this case, the central challenge facing the various strains of pluralism remains in place: that of explaining how law integrates its several and often competing normative commitments. To what extent are decisions informed by some “covering value”, in Ruth Chang’s (2004) terminology, or synthesizing principles? A recent proposal suggests an organizing principle based on a typology of contracts and contracting parties (Leib 2005). Wealth maximization may be appropriate in the enforcement of contracts between firms, for example, whereas promissory virtue becomes a more significant object of concern in contractual disputes between natural persons (see also C. Riley 2000). Along similar lines, Dagan and Heller (2017) suggest that distinct contract-types implicate distinct values, and that the organizing principle that determines which normative structure applies is the choice principle—the parties’ freedom to choose the rules that govern their exchange relations. Such proposals sit uncomfortably with existing law, which does not explicitly distinguish the application of its basic doctrines in this way, even if it should.

2. Philosophical Themes in the Law of Contracts

The second part of this entry explores questions in the philosophy of language (on meaning and interpretation), philosophy of action (the metaphysics of intention), and moral and political philosophy (freedom and distributive justice) as they arise in contract law. §2.1 discusses work that brings tools from the philosophy of language to bear on questions of contract interpretation. §2.2 examines the concept of freedom in contract through the lens of established doctrine and philosophical work on autonomy. §2.3 explores how the pairing of orthodox contract theory with modern doctrine generates a puzzle about the nature of contractual intent. Finally, §2.4 considers questions of distributive justice raised by private exchange.

2.1 Language, meaning, and interpretation

The law of contracts includes rules that map the parties’ speech acts onto legal effects. What the rules are that relate speech to legal obligation and what they ought to be are questions for legal and moral theory. But the conventional answers may be clarified using resources from the philosophy of language (Farnsworth 1967; Rosen 2011).

We begin with rules specifying the legally relevant feature of the parties’ speech. What a person intends to mean by their words can come apart from the actual meaning (the semantic content) of the words. In general, contract law is said to privilege “objective” over intended (or, as lawyers sometimes say: “subjective”) meaning as the basis for the parties’ legal obligations, at least where the intended meaning is not evident from context:

A contract has, strictly speaking, nothing to do with the personal, or individual, intent of the parties. … If … it were proved by twenty bishops that either party, when he used the words, intended something else than the usual meaning which the law imposes upon them, he would still be held, unless there were some mutual mistake or something else of the sort. (Hotchkiss v. National City Bank 1911)

This preference for objective meaning, moreover, reaches the interpretation of the speech acts through which contracts are entered into, such as offers and acceptances (R2: §24). Proponents of the so-called “objective theory of contracts” regularly invoke the “usual”, “objective”, “reasonable”, or “plain” meaning as distinguished from the meaning that the parties “attached” to their words (R2: §201). Since talk of meaning is often ambiguous, we must be cautious in interpreting such locutions. The gloss that’s sometimes given in law is that objective meaning concerns what a reasonable person in the position of the addressee would have inferred was meant based on the available evidence.

A related set of legal rules specify the core contractual text to be interpreted and what evidence determines its meaning. The “parol evidence rule” (“PER”) establishes a preference for writings over prior or contemporaneous oral agreements (UCC: §2-202). The rule, in its traditional statement, entails that where a writing exists, oral agreements (inferable from testimony) that are “extrinsic” to the “four corners of the document” do not become part of the contract. Some versions of the PER forbid the use of extrinsic evidence to “introduce an ambiguity” into a writing whose terms are otherwise clear and unambiguous. In addition, once the contours of a contractual text are set, principles of contract interpretation favor (to varying degrees in different jurisdictions) giving words meanings that are familiar to judges rather than meanings that are idiosyncratic to the parties. The interaction between the PER and the principles of interpretation entails a complication that runs through the legal practice of extracting meaning—namely that contracts themselves (especially written contracts) often seek to set their own boundaries and regulate their own interpretation, and the law both permits and resists such efforts.

“Textualism” in contract law can be defined as the view that (a) contractual obligations stem from the objective meaning of the parties’ speech acts, (b) writings trump oral communication, and (c) a text’s meaning must be inferred from a restricted evidence-base. “Contextualists,” by contrast, favor considering prior and contemporaneous oral agreements, which might help interpret, add to, or even vary the terms of a writing. There are good reasons in favor of either textualist or contextualist approaches to fixing meaning, relating to the costs of drafting in the shadow of various interpretive regimes, the costs of litigating meaning, and the temptations that parties face to make opportunistic claims about what their contracts require. But textualists and contextualists sometimes—and much less plausibly—cast their positions as required by basic and very general features of language.

Textualists—for example, Alex Kozinski, formerly a judge of the United States Court of Appeals (Ninth Circuit)—worry that contextualism:

chips away at the foundation of our legal system. By giving credence to the idea that words are inadequate to express concepts, [contextualism] undermines the basic principle that language provides a meaningful constraint on public and private conduct. (Trident Center v. Connecticut General Life Ins. Co. 1988)

Contextualists, for their part, sometimes seem to reject widely shared assumptions about language. Kozinski’s opinion criticized a leading contextualist opinion by Roger Traynor, writing as Chief Justice of the Supreme Court of California. Traynor held that courts should consider all extrinsic, contextual evidence to determine whether written terms are ambiguous, while defending the holding based on doubts about the “inherent meaning of words”:

If words had absolute and constant references, it might be possible to discover the contractual intention in the words themselves and in the manner in which they were arranged. Words, however, do not have absolute and constant references. A word is a symbol of thought but has no arbitrary fixed meaning like a symbol of algebra or chemistry. (Pacific Gas & Electric Co. v. G.W. Thomas Drayage & Rigging Co. 1968)

Traynor followed an influential tradition in legal scholarship skeptical not just of the parol evidence rule, but of the very possibility that the impersonal semantic content of the parties’ speech acts might come apart from the contextually salient intended meaning (see, e.g., Wigmore 1923: 378).

From a philosophical perspective, these general arguments paint too quickly and with too broad a brush. On the one hand, practical considerations that support looking to broader context when interpreting writings plainly do not undermine anything so general as the idea that words can convey shared meaning. On the other hand, it would equally be surprising if embracing contextualism meant having to deny the platitude that speakers of language can be mistaken in ways that allow public (or even legal) meaning to come apart in contextually manifest ways from intended meaning. Contextualist skepticism about impersonal semantic content is surely separable from the practical question of whether restricting the evidence base for discerning meaning best serves the various goals of contract law, including fairness to the parties and minimizing burdens on courts (Rosen 2011).

Gideon Rosen suggests an alternative conceptual framework for the debate between textualists and contextualists, one that deemphasizes the parties’ semantic intentions. Following Grice (1957), we can distinguish the parties’ semantic intentions in relation to their speech acts (intentions to mean this or that by one’s words) from their pragmatic and distinctly legal intentions (the intent to cause legal effects via one’s speech acts, like the creation of a judicially enforceable promise). The parties’ legal intentions—which seem to matter, ultimately—can come apart from their semantic intentions. In re Soper’s Estate (1935) offers an illustration. In that case, the deceased designated his “wife” as the beneficiary of his estate. However, Soper was legally married to person 1, faked his own death, and then “married” person 2. We can set aside what “wife” objectively means in this context. We can also stipulate that Soper’s legal intention was to leave his estate to person 2. Suppose Soper’s semantic intention was to refer to 2 under the description my wife in the legal sense on the erroneous assumption that his prior marriage to 1 was not a legal impediment. Clearly, the semantic intention to refer to 2 as his legally recognized wife would have been irrelevant to what Soper was trying to accomplish legally by writing his will. We can, of course, construct alternative scenarios where the semantic intention is relevant to Soper’s legal intent. Indeed, contract law’s interest in semantic intentions is explained by the fact that, in general, what we intend to mean by our words bears on what we are trying to accomplish legally. But In re Soper’s Estate illustrates that the connection is contingent—the alignment that usually exists between the legal effects that we intend to produce and the descriptions under which we intend to produce them is far from guaranteed.

Accordingly, the debate between textualists and contextualists might be fruitfully recast in terms of: (a) whether the parties’ speech acts should be mined for impersonal semantic content or the parties’ legal intentions, and (b) whether the court should rely on a narrow or broad evidence base to infer the legally relevant facts about speech (Rosen 2011, 163). Rosen’s framework is not intended to apply to situations where the parties have conflicting legal intentions or cases where the contract is silent on the parties’ responsibilities. Separate legal rules and considerations—those concerning misunderstanding (R2: §201) and gap-filling (R2: §204)—bear on such cases.

In re Soper’s Estate illustrates a more general phenomenon of philosophical interest: natural language as a source of contract disputes (Farnsworth 1967). Work in this area aims to characterize and distinguish the ways in which the parties’ linguistic choices can interfere with contractual coordination. Famous contract disputes have involved homonymy (two ships bear the name “Peerless” and the parties do not intend to refer to the same ship: Raffles v. Wichelhaus (1864)), semantic ambiguity (the word “chicken” in the trade has a broader and narrower meaning: Frigaliment Importing v B.N.S (1960)), syntactic ambiguity (an insurance policy covers any “disease of organs of the body not common to both sexes”: Business Men’s Assur. Ass’n v. R (1927)), pragmatic or “latent” ambiguity (In re Soper’s Estate, discussed above); vagueness (parties agree that a “materially adverse change” to the financial health of a business qualifies the buyer’s obligations: In re Carter’s Claim (1957)) and under-specification (parties agree to the sale of “one of the seller’s warehouses”). For a general discussion of how to distinguish these and related phenomena, see the entry on ambiguity.

2.2 Freedom and autonomy

Contract law is based on the model (or idealization) of “voluntary exchange … between autonomous individuals” (Radin 2007: 196). Contracts are enforced on the assumption that parties possess the capacities necessary for informed and voluntary choice (R2: §15), while fraud, duress, and various forms of pressure in bargaining represent grounds for recission (R2: §§164, 175, 177). A preliminary question is why the law should be so concerned with freedom and autonomy in contractual exchange. As previously discussed, the rearrangement of private property might be justified on grounds of efficiency or general welfare (see §1.3). The law’s guiding principle could be hypothetical or reasonable consent—what parties would or should consent to—rather than actual consent. The importance of actual consent seems clear enough where exchange impinges on domains over which persons retain special sovereignty, including their own body and mind (Mill 1859; Hill 1991; Enoch 2017). But not every contractual exchange impinges on bodily or mental integrity, and the importance of actual consent to contracts at large is therefore not obvious.

Voluntariness might be important to contracts for a number of reasons. A law of involuntary or forced exchange would risk people’s welfare, not just their autonomy. The parties’ consent better tracks exchange efficiency than a court’s judgment. Apart from welfare concerns, if contractual obligation is grounded in promissory morality (see §1.1), then promissory principles constrain the law of contracts, including those that condition an agent’s responsibility on a promise having been made freely (Hurd 1996). The choice condition avoids unfairly holding individuals to duties that they lacked a reasonable opportunity to avoid incurring (cf. Scanlon 1998, Watson 1996).

Since voluntariness in contract likely serves several distinct normative functions, its analysis presents a challenge. What powers must an agent exercise over her contractual affairs for her obligations to count as voluntarily undertaken? The law deems agents incapable of contracting if they lack either (1) the ability to understand the nature of a transaction and be responsive to reasons for and against agreeing to it (see R2: §15 and Buckareff and Kasper-Buckareff 2014; on reasons-responsiveness as a general criterion for moral responsibility, see Fischer and Ravizza 1998), or (2) the ability to exercise a degree of control over their choices. Bix (2010) suggests that the common law follows Aristotle in treating an agent’s knowledge and capacity to respond to her reasons, and not just her capacity to act on desires she identifies with, as constitutive of her freedom to contract. In addition to general incapacity, the common law recognizes specific threats to contractual freedom, including lack of material information due to fraud or non-disclosure, intoxication, duress, and, to a lesser extent, cognitive biases when preyed upon within a relationship of trust (R2: §§ 16, 161–163, 173–175). The precise content of these rules is controversial. For instance, there is no legal requirement that parties disclose all relevant information in the generic commercial transaction (F. Miller & Wertheimer 2010), and the line separating permissible from impermissible information asymmetries is deeply contested (Kronman 1978; Craswell 2006).

The concept of duress is similarly fraught. The law distinguishes “physical duress”, which bypasses the coercee’s rational control over her actions, from duress via “wrongful threats” which operates through the will of the coercee (R2: §§ 174-5; cf. Nozick 1969). A threat is considered wrongful when the threatened consequence leaves the coercee with “no reasonable alternatives” to compliance. The law does not give detailed guidance on the baseline of “reasonable alternatives” against which the wrongfulness of a threat might be measured. The question of the baseline has attracted significant commentary in the philosophical literature on coercion. Nozick (1969: 446) offers a characterization in terms of the “normal or natural or expected course of events”. Others have analyzed the baseline in explicitly normative terms, as a set of options that persons ought to have as a matter of right (Wertheimer 1987; cf. Berman 2002). While the paradigmatic threat (“your money or your life”) makes the coercee worse off relative to her baseline regardless of compliance, threats in commercial exchange are often more subtle. An offeror might threaten to worsen the offeree’s situation if she refuses an offer, even if its acceptance would be baseline-improving. To illustrate, if workers refuse to work under the terms of an existing contract unless the employer consents to a modification, the employer may be under duress even if the proposed modification is mutually beneficial.

A precise account of when an agent lacks “reasonable alternatives” might help distinguish wrongful threats from permissible offers, given that offers, like threats, aim to influence behavior, and might be experienced by the offeree as leaving her no option but to accept. Several theorists have argued that baseline-improving offers can be coercive. On David Zimmerman’s (1981) view, an offer is coercive if its acceptance locks the offeree into a life situation that prevents her from seeking better alternatives than what the offeror proposes. Joan McGregor (1988) suggests shifting focus from baseline improvement to whether the offeror exercises power over the offeree within a relationship of dependence. On McGregor’s analysis, an offeror exercises power when she has control over a considerable harm that might fall on the offeree (see also O’Neill 1991; Pettit 1996). While the analysis may not quite fit the law’s concept of duress, it is arguably implicit in the common law’s unconscionability doctrine, which polices one-sided contracts between parties with unequal bargaining power. For a more detailed discussion of the distinction between offers and threats, see the entry on coercion.

In addition to threats and exploitative offers, agents may be subject to influences in the bargaining process that impair their ability to decide rationally or based on their considered and robust desires (on conceptions of freedom that identify some but not all of the agent’s desires with her will, see, e.g., Frankfurt 1973 [1988], Yaffe 2007). A seller might take advantage of a buyer’s innumeracy or cognitive biases in eliciting her consent. While the law recognizes a category of “undue influence” as grounds for recission, the doctrine’s application, in addition to being undertheorized, is usually limited to cases involving a special relationship of trust. It is widely acknowledged, however, that rationality failures can be exploited within exchange relationships, and the potential for exploitation is often the basis for regulatory intervention. A comprehensive analysis of freedom in contract should therefore clarify what forms of persuasion count as instances of wrongful control, a question that accounts of duress and uninformed consent do not necessarily address.

2.3 Intentionality

On the standard picture, contractual obligations are grounded in the parties’ promissory intentions, or in such intentions as might reasonably be inferred from the parties’ speech acts. The standard picture needs a philosophy of action if modern doctrine is to be convincingly justified. The demands of mass contracting mean that contracts are often entered into without bespoke drafting or indeed any dickering at all. The law finds contractual obligations in such thoughtless acts as selecting “I agree” on a software license form without reading its terms (Rakoff 1983; Barnett 2002; Radin 2014). Form-drafters usually have reason to know that such actions are thoughtless and, also, that the average consumer is generally not in the position of being able to bargain for better terms. Indeed, form-drafters often arrange their contractual practices to make bespoke bargaining impossible, for example by having their forms presented electronically or by employees who are not empowered to modify terms. The reasonableness of imputing promissory intent in such circumstances seems questionable (Radin 2007; 2014).

The puzzle is magnified by the pervasiveness of form contracting in modern markets and by the details of contract law doctrine. For example, the law’s treatment of standard forms as agreements is not so easily dismissed as a “convenient fiction” justified by the general need to enforce standard forms given the many important functions they serve, from allowing large organizations to solve agency problems to saving the consumer costs associated with bargaining over low probability events (Rakoff 1983: 1220–1245). Anglo-American contract law has long recognized a category of “as if” or “quasi-contracts” (see, e.g., Baily v. West (1969)) whose enforcement is justified on exceptional, non-promissory grounds. That is, the law acknowledges cases where promissory intent may be lacking but duties of a contractual form are imposed anyway. In a paradigm case, justification is said to reside in hypothetical consent: an unconscious patient who receives life-saving treatment from a physician without previously consenting owes remunerative duties on a quasi-contractual basis insofar as the patient would have consented if she could have. The law does not subsume standard forms under the category of quasi-contracts. On the contrary, the law enforces standard forms as bona fide agreements.

A natural thought is that the basis for contractual obligation may be found in a vague promissory intention. Most promises leave room for further specification while still being sufficiently specific to produce reasonable reliance. Sam promises to help Susan move homes but without specifying whether he intends to labor personally or pay a mover. Sam incurs a general duty owed to Susan that can be variously satisfied. Modern contract law, moreover, is quite comfortable with filling in gaps in incomplete contracts (for example, imputing a market price where no price is mentioned: UCC: § 2-204(3)) and rendering vague terms precise (for example, fixing the payment meant by an employer’s promise of “reasonable recognition” for inventions made by an employee, see Corthell v. Summit Thread Co. (1933)). A consumer’s intention in agreeing to a form contract may be some underspecified form of compliance with its terms, which the law can render precise as it usually does.

The problem with this approach is that agents are usually able to precisely state the contents of a vague promise when invited to do so, whereas the average consumer, having never read a standard form, is hardly in the same position. More generally, even vague promissory intentions must satisfy minimal criteria for being an intention. On the simplest analysis of prospective intention, to intend an action is to believe that one will perform it and to have an appropriate guiding desire (Audi 1973, 395; cf. Harman 1976; Davis 1984). That consumers form beliefs about all their contractually contemplated future actions when they agree to a form contract seems questionable. On an alternative picture, intentions are a distinctive mental state (not reducible to beliefs or desires) with a unique functional role of guiding and controlling the agent’s behavior as well as her reasoning (Bratman 1987: 20; see, more generally, the entry on intention). Whether the average consumer forms any such future-directed, action- or reasoning-guiding mental state when she agrees to a standard form is similarly doubtful.

Barnett (2002) suggests that the puzzle is best addressed by shifting from a promissory theory of contracts to an adjacent consent-based theory (Barnett 1986). While the concepts of consent and promise fall in the same normative family (Hurd 1996), the criteria for consent may be less demanding. Nevertheless, the view confronts parallel worries, since what was consented-to remains opaque. Barnett suggests that a consumer’s consent is limited to those terms that are not radically unexpected (637), but the basis for such empirical assumptions about consumer intent remains unclear. It is doubtful that the average consumer considers the question of what, if anything, she is consenting to when she mindlessly clicks “I agree” (Radin 2007; 2014; Kar & Radin 2019). Ultimately, the problem is not even due to standard forms including standard(or non-bespoke) terms or the terms being unread by the consumer. The problem stems directly from the fact that the consumer’s actions in virtue of which the law finds an intention to be bound appear thoughtless—that is, lacking in intentionality.

The point of the discussion is not to critique the orthodox view of contracts as promissory (or chosen) obligation (for general criticisms, see §1.1), but to suggest that the standard picture needs an account of prospective intention. Not just any view of what an intention is fits both the standard picture and modern legal practice. It may be that an agent’s intention, in the relevant contractual sense, is revealed not by her articulable beliefs or action-guiding attitudes in the moment, but her unconscious dispositions. Given that most consumers comply with standard forms without contesting their validity, this general fact about consumer behavior might make it reasonable to impute a disposition to be bound. On the other hand, behavioral research suggests that people “are more likely to comply with contracts they participated in negotiating” (Eigen 2012: 67). At the same time, a consumer’s reasons for complying in subsequent disputes may be entirely disconnected from her original intentions. The view risks conflating the fact that a person’s compliance is predictable ex ante with the fact that she intends to comply. If these and other challenges can be overcome, however, then a dispositional theory of contractual intention may offer a better fit with orthodox contract theory and modern practice than the available alternatives.

2.4 Distributive fairness and the ethics of surplus sharing

Contract law raises questions of distributive fairness. Should the design of legal doctrine be sensitive to its distributive effects? Should parties consider distributive fairness in fixing the contents of particular agreements? The individual and institutional questions are of course related. Interpersonal obligations arising out of contract’s internal normative structure might serve as a basis for institutional design.

Beginning with legal doctrine, we can distinguish rules that seem more concerned with procedural aspects of justice, especially freedom and autonomy in the lead up to agreement, than justice in the final distribution of benefits and burdens. Any number of doctrines—fraud, duress, and undue influence, for example—protect weaker parties from being deceived, coerced, or manipulated into contractual obligations (see §2.2). Moreover, the duty of good faith in performance, one of the few mandatory duties that the law imposes on every contract (UCC §1-304; R2: §205), prevents one party from exploiting her counterparty’s strategic vulnerabilities (often incurred on account of the contract itself) to “recapture opportunities forgone at formation” (Burton 1980: 387). This approach to good faith is procedural insofar as it makes the contract—the allocation of opportunities the parties opted into —the measure of what good faith requires.

However, a few contract law doctrines address distributive concerns more directly. For a time, it looked as if the doctrine of “unconscionability” might inscribe substantive limits on contractual inequality into consumer law, at least with respect to low-income consumers (UCC: §2-302). The doctrine of unconscionability has two components: “procedural unconscionability” arises when one side exploits inequalities of bargaining sophistication or power to its advantage; and “substantive unconscionability” arises when the terms struck unreasonably, and extremely, favor one side. Traditionally, both elements must be separately demonstrated to establish unconscionability, but for a brief period, it looked as if substantive unconscionability, standing alone, might allow a consumer to avoid an onerous contractual obligation (see, e.g., Jones v. Star Credit Corp., 1969). This line of doctrine was quickly narrowed (see, e.g., Patterson v. Walker-Thomas Furniture Co., Inc., 1971). Today, unconscionability requires (to varying degrees in different jurisdictions) a procedural element, so that a contract’s substantive injustice is not, without more, sufficient to render it unenforceable. Moreover, on the conventional interpretation, the procedural element requires some sort of bargaining abuse so that it is not enough that one contracting party is less economically privileged and therefore more economically vulnerable. Other doctrines that subject contractual terms to distributive scrutiny similarly emphasize procedural and transactional aspects of justice. The doctrine of contra proferentum, for example, calls for contracts to be interpreted against their drafters. And any number of provisions in the UCC authorize courts to fill contractual gaps, interpret ambiguous terms, or regulate renegotiation, with courts often exercising their discretion in ways that favor unsophisticated (and often poorer) parties (Rakoff 2016). For this reason, although the application of doctrines like unconscionability might be driven by considerations of distributive justice, the law does not make distributive justice a freestanding criterion for the enforceability of contracts. An argument might be made that the law embodies an Aristotelian conception of commutative justice (Gordley 1991), so that contractual exchange must deploy a “just price,” which allows neither party to enrich itself at the expense of the other; but an analogous claim that the law exemplifies a general concern for social and income inequality would be hard to maintain.

Several theorists have favored broadening the egalitarian doctrines of contract law. On one proposal, forms of advantage-taking in contractual exchange through non-disclosure of information should be tolerated only to the extent that permissive rules confer long-term benefits on those who are most vulnerable (Kronman 1980). The proposal draws support from a prioritarian principle of weighted beneficence, according to which benefits to the worse off have greater moral weight. Along similar lines, Aditi Bagchi (2014) argues that ambiguous terms in contracts should be interpreted in ways that promote distributive justice by benefiting the economically worse off. The law of contracts thus becomes a tool for improving the unequal background conditions in which exchange occurs, conditions that undermine the validity and authenticity of people’s choices, and, relatedly, the moral basis for enforcing contracts in the first place (Ackerman 1983; Kennedy 1982).

Contract law egalitarianism draws support from an extensive literature in moral and political philosophy that has questioned the legitimacy of exchange relations in unequal societies. John Rawls’ seminal work has been especially influential. Rawls (2005: 266–267) observes that the free market allows everyone to gain through private exchange, but it also allows those who are already more advantaged to capture as much of the contractual surplus as they are able to, so that “the invisible hand guides things in the wrong direction … maintaining unjustified inequalities and restrictions on fair opportunity.”

Contract and property law, together with institutions of tax-and-transfer, arguably fall within the “basic structure” of society—that is, the category of institutions that so pervasively influence people’s lives as to demand special justification (Murphy 1998: 260–261). For Rawls, the basic structure’s justification depends on what parties would rationally agree to ignorant of various aspects of their situation, including their economic circumstances. Rawlsian “maximin principles” prioritize the interests of those who are worse off. While a full analysis of Rawls’ work and its influence on modern contract theory is beyond the scope of this entry, readers can see related entries (on distributive justice and the original position) for more detail.

Rawlsians are hardly alone in questioning the legitimacy of private exchange in circumstances of inequality. Marx (Das Kapital, 3:339–40) famously questions the alleged “natural justice” of private exchange and the juristic treatment of economic transactions “as willful acts of the parties concerned”, viewing exchange relations in capitalist societies as invariably exploitative (see discussion in Arneson 1981: 205; cf. Cohen 1995). Exploitation raises questions of meaningful consent and coercion, some of which were discussed earlier (see §2.2). But implicit in Marx’s concept of exploitation (assuming the view to be less than fully skeptical of considerations of justice) is a distinct moral notion: the failure of private exchange to ensure parties receive as much as they deserve based on their productive contributions and sacrifices (cf. Cohen 1995: 116–117; on moral desert, see below).

Contract law egalitarianism at the institutional level confronts two standard criticisms. First, it is not obvious that judges have the authority or competence to promote distributive justice. A tax-and-benefit scheme may be a more effective means of promoting the interests of the economically worse off than private law, though whether this is true remains an open empirical question (Kaplow & Shavell 1994; Lucy 2007: 352–6; Liscow 2021 [Other Internet Resources]). Second, contract disputes are private affairs, and people deserve protection from being singled out to bear the burdens associated with the collective’s moral responsibilities. Thomas Nagel (1991: ch9) describes a division of moral labor between, on the one hand, institutional actors responsible for the basic legal structure, and, on the other, ordinary citizens acting in their private capacity. In general, persons may lead better lives if freed from the obligation to manage their exchange relations altruistically. The point seems consistent, however, with courts being obliged to enforce negative duties—for instance, a duty not to take advantage of the collective’s failure to secure distributive justice (Murphy 1998: 266; Bagchi 2014). The common law’s unconscionability doctrine appears tailor-made to police this kind of predation by the economically privileged of the disadvantaged.

We turn from the institutional-level question to the question of what contracting parties individually owe one another. Contracts generate surplus from cooperation—each side typically stands to benefit through exchange. How that surplus ought to be divided is not necessarily settled by assuming that the parties transact from a place of equality. Robert Nozick’s (1974) famous discussion of “justice in transfer” provides a convenient starting point for exploring the ethics of surplus sharing. Nozick suggests that inequalities arising out of voluntary transactions do not give rise to a question of justice, given fair background conditions. On Nozick’s “voluntarist” view, whatever sharing scheme is voluntarily agreed to (setting aside stealing, fraud, etc.) is just, or, alternatively, no question of justice is raised by a division the parties consented to (for a more detailed statement, see Nozick 1974: 149–182). There are other more qualified strains of voluntarism. A “sufficientarian” might insist that the consented-to division must satisfy a minimal baseline. Sterba (1986: 8) articulates a “Needs and Agreement Principle” under which the results of voluntary agreement and private appropriation are morally justified only insofar as each person is guaranteed the goods necessary to meet the normal costs of satisfying her basic needs. Sufficientarian constraints might entail, for example, that those involved in the provision of essential goods or services—basic medicine or education—owe more robust duties to those with whom they contract.

Moving further away from pure voluntarism, a prominent approach distinguishes between deserved and undeserved shares of cooperative surplus. Nozick is sometimes criticized for assuming that persons are entitled to that portion of the market price for their goods and services characterizable as “scarcity rent” (B. Fried 1995: 230). Rent is defined as a gain that exceeds what is necessary to incentivize cooperative exchange. Excess gains in market exchange are often attributable to natural scarcity, including scarcity of natural talents. Whether persons deserve such windfalls flowing from brute luck in the birth lottery remains a deeply contested moral question. Some find a desert-basis in effort and other forms of personal sacrifice, including delayed gratification (as in investment contracts). On this view, parties are owed at least as much of the surplus from a cooperative scheme as would constitute fair compensation for their sacrifices (Reiman 1983; Sadurski 1985; Milne 1986). Others finds a desert-basis in productive contribution. Parties to contractual exchange deserve fair remuneration for their marginal product (D. Miller 1976; Miller 1999; J. Riley 1989). Marginal product is defined as a factor’s distinctive contribution to raising the value of goods and services, holding other factors constant. The central moral intuition, here, is that people ought to receive benefits from exchange in proportion to how much they improve the wellbeing of others (Lamont 1994). The productive contribution theory is sometimes motivated on general consequentialist grounds (rather than notions of moral desert), with rents explained as the premium necessary for incentivizing parties to put their talents to productive and wellbeing-maximizing use (Arnold 1987).

Both the effort and productive contribution theories rely on concepts that invite further specification. Consider the concept of marginal product. What is produced by one’s efforts depends on the productivity of the tools and raw materials one has at one’s disposal. The state is a contributing participant, also, in every cooperative exchange (B. Fried 1995). Given that many people make interdependent contributions to social product, the link between any individual’s labor and output seems too attenuated to ground anything more determinate than the claim that people deserve something based on what they produce (Scanlon 2018: ch8). And it is hard to see how so general a normative claim could bear the weight of justifying any precise proposal for surplus division.

Gauthier (1986: 140–141, 152–153) suggests that cooperative surplus might be split according to the ratio of the parties’ “individual relative benefit from cooperation”. Each party’s relative benefit from exchange is measured by their next best option. If A and B generate $10 of cooperative surplus, and A could have earned $3 acting independently of B, while B could have earned $4, then the maximum A can claim of the surplus is $6 consistent with inducing B’s willing cooperation, and the maximum B can claim is $7 for a parallel reason. When the $10 surplus is split based on a 6:7 ratio, each party receives such benefits as she would expect apart from cooperation and, in addition, receives a share of the surplus proportionate to her potential for benefiting from the exchange. Gauthier defends the proposal as a solution to a bargaining problem confronting self-interested rational agents, but it is morally contestable. It remains unclear why a party should receive more just because they had a better alternative, since the availability of an attractive alternative may be a function of brute luck. Moreover, Gauthier’s principle does not guarantee that parties receive a share commensurate to sacrifice or productive contribution (Van Parijs 1996).

The proposals considered so far invoke considerations of pre-institutional morality and/or rationality. But the ethics of surplus sharing might instead be traced to established customs. Macneil (1986) suggests that markets give rise to complex norms of “gift-giving” in commercial exchange. These gift-giving norms encourage agents to refrain from claiming as much of the surplus as possible and have an important role to play in maintaining social bonds, especially in contexts where constant haggling undermines trust and creates impediments to contracting. For example, sellers of antiques will offer discounts to those who reveal their enthusiastic interest in purchasing an item. By rewarding disclosures against self-interest, the sellers promote solidarity and cooperation in the market for antiques. Macneil observes that norms of gift-giving are more likely to emerge where the cooperative surplus is large and repeat interaction generates high interdependence.

A question facing the social solidarity view is why market participants should feel obliged to comply with customary norms. Custom is sometimes portrayed “as the embodiment of what parties in the relevant community actually, not fictitiously, consent to when they manifest their intention to be legally bound” (Barnett 1992: 1192).

On this view, the parties’ expectations become the grounds for complying with the relevant surplus sharing norms, although expectations, even ones based on longstanding customs, are not always reasonable or fair. Another possibility is that the reasons for compliance may be grounded in general, consequentialist considerations concerning the importance of reinforcing socially beneficial customs. A third is that compliance produces additional surplus by lowering transaction costs.

In the final analysis, a broad range of distributive considerations arguably ought to shape bargaining behavior, and the above discussion is not intended to be exhaustive. As should be apparent from the lack of convergence among theorists, the moral question of justice in transfer that is at the heart of contract remains far from settled.


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