Theories of the Common Law of Torts

First published Mon Sep 22, 2003; substantive revision Thu Dec 17, 2015

Tort is a branch of private law. The other main branches are contract, property, and restitution (sometimes known as unjust enrichment).

Section 1 offers a brief overview of tort law and tort theory. Section 2 discusses economic analysis, which is the historically dominant tort theory and the primary foil for philosophical perspectives on tort law. Section 3 discusses the most influential non-economic tort theories, theories that emphasize such normative concepts as justice, rights, and duties.

1. Overview of Tort Law and Tort Theory

1.1 Tort Law: Basic Features

A tort suit enables the victim of a wrong to seek a remedy from the person who injured her. Unlike a criminal case, which is initiated and managed by the state, a tort suit is prosecuted by the victim or the victim's estate (or survivors). Moreover, a successful tort suit results in a judgment of liability, rather than a sentence of punishment. Such a judgment normally requires the defendant to compensate the plaintiff financially. In principle, an award of compensatory damages shifts all of the plaintiff's legally cognizable costs to the defendant. (It is controversial whether tort really lives up to this principle in practice.) On rare occasions, a plaintiff may also be awarded punitive damages, which go beyond what it necessary for compensation. In other cases, a plaintiff may obtain an injunction: a court order preventing the defendant from injuring her or from invading her rights (perhaps harmlessly). An example of the former would be awarding a plaintiff (or a class of plaintiffs) an injunction against a polluting manufacturer. An example of the latter would be awarding a plaintiff an injunction against a harmless trespass.

“Tort” means “wrong” and it is natural to think that wrongs are the domain of tort law. But tort law does not concern itself with all the wrongs that people do. Some wrongs are addressed by the criminal law, not private law (some are addressed by both). And not every wrong that falls within the province of private law falls within tort law. A breach of contract, for example, is not traditionally regarded as a tort. More generally, tort law does not provide a remedy for every wrong that a victim might suffer. Rather, tort law offers relief for a canonical set of wrongs, or torts. These include assault, battery, defamation, and trespass, among many others.

Rather than focusing on categories of torts, it is more fruitful to begin by conceptualizing torts in terms of the elements that a plaintiff must prove in order to obtain a remedy. For example, a defendant commits battery if she acts, intending to cause harmful or offensive contact with the plaintiff, and such contact in fact results from her act. If a plaintiff meets the burden of establishing these elements, then he or she has established a prima facie case for battery. A defendant who commits a battery so defined might nevertheless escape liability by asserting a defense. For example, a defendant in a battery action might avoid liability by showing that she acted in self-defense or that the plaintiff consented to the otherwise unlawful touching.

Many think of battery and trespass as the paradigmatic private wrongs and thus as paradigmatic torts. Conceiving of torts in terms of the paradigmatic case invites the thought that tort law proceeds by identifying wrongs that share some important normative characteristics with either trespass or battery—for example, that a tort involves an intention to disregard certain protected rights of others; and perhaps that the fundamental rights protected by torts are those pertaining to the security of person and property. It also invites the thought that the aim or purpose of tort law is to redress those wrongs. In such a view, the core concepts of tort law appear to be “rights”, “wrongs” and “redress” and the dual goals of tort theory are to identify the principle that connects the category of wrongs that torts addresses and to justify the distinctive mode(s) of redress for wrongs that tort law adopts. We will explore this approach to tort law in some detail in what follows.

While not denying or downplaying the significance of the concept of wrong to understanding tort law, other theorists are inclined to express the centrality of it in torts in terms of a more generic formulation: namely, the duty each us has in undertaking various activities not to injure those our undertakings put at risk. On this view, the core duty in torts is not to injure others (either full stop or unjustifiably).

Such a general approach to conceptualizing tort law has many appealing features, not the least of which is the fact that in the modern context tort suits typically begin with the plaintiff’s allegation that the defendant wronged her by breaching a duty not to injure her. In addition, this alternative view captures the centrality of the notion of a wrong without inviting the idea that the wrongs that fall within the domain of tort law must exhibit some of the normatively significant features of battery or trespass. Beyond that, the alternative view introduces the notion of injury and invites the idea that the concern of tort law is to address injuries in some way or other; either, for example, by addressing their costs or the suffering that normally attends them. Thus, while the notion of a wrong remains important to our understanding of tort law, the alternative view invites the thought that the underlying concern of tort law is to address the costs, suffering, or more generally, the losses that victims suffer as a result.

As helpful as the focus on injuries is, it is important to see that the concept of an injury cannot, by itself, play the foundational role in a theory of tort law. After all, the law does not recognize just any injury as the basis of a claim in tort. If you beat me in tennis or in competition for the affections of another, I may well be injured. Yet I have no claim in tort to repair my bruised ego or broken heart. Since you lack a legal duty not to beat me in tennis or in competition for the affections of another, you do not act tortiously when you succeed at my expense. Thus, even if we take tort to be an institution that addresses injuries, will still stand in need of an account of just which injuries it is wrong to cause.

Tort law distinguishes between two general classes of duties not to injure: (i) duties not to injure “full stop” and (ii) duties not to injure negligently. When you engage in an activity the law regards as extremely hazardous (e.g., blasting with dynamite), you are subject to a duty of the first sort—a duty not to injure “full stop”. When you engage in more common activities (e.g., driving), you are subject to a duty of the second sort—a duty not to injure negligently. Your conduct is governed by strict liability when you are subject to a duty not to injure “full stop”. Your conduct is governed by fault liability when you are subject to a duty not to injure negligently or carelessly.

1.2 The Difference between Strict Liability and Fault Liability

It is worth exploring the difference between strict liability and fault liability in greater detail, since the development of both tort law and tort theory is in part a story about the choice between them.

Strict liability. Suppose I make a mess on my property and present you with the bill for cleaning it up. Absent some prior agreement, this would seem rather odd. It is my mess, after all, not yours. Now suppose that instead of making a mess on my property and presenting you with the bill, I make a mess on your property and walk away, claiming that the mess is your problem. If it was inappropriate of me to present you with the bill for the mess I made on my property, it hardly seems that I have improved matters making my mess on your property. I have a duty to clean up my messes and the existence of this duty does not appear to depend on how hard I have tried not to make a mess in the first place. In other words, it does not depend on whether I made the mess absentmindedly or carelessly. All that matters is that it is my mess; that is to say, I made it. And if I make it, it is mine to clean. This is a helpful way of capturing the underlying intuition expressed by the rule of strict liability.

Fault liability. Unless we stay home all day, we are each bound to make the occasional mess in one another's life. This being so, it would be unreasonable of me to demand that you never make any kind of mess in my life. What I can reasonably demand is that you take my interests into account and moderate your behavior accordingly. In particular, I can reasonably demand that you take ordinary care (i.e., the care that a reasonable person would take) not to injure me. In other words, I can reasonably demand that you refrain from negligently injuring me. This is a useful way of capturing the underlying intuition expressed by the rule of fault liability.

People sometimes misunderstand the nature of fault liability in tort because they misunderstand the nature of strict liability in tort. And they misunderstand the nature of strict liability in tort because their inclination is to model it on the notion of strict liability in the criminal law, with which many theorists and laypersons alike are more familiar. Strict liability in the criminal law is a form of responsibility without culpability. If you are strictly liable for a criminal offense, you are punishable for the offense even if your conduct is not morally blameworthy. The standard way to express this is to say that strict liability in criminal law is not defeasible by the kind of excuse one would offer in order to defeat an attribution of culpability or blameworthy (e.g., duress).

If we conceived similarly of strict liability in tort, we would then understand fault liability, incorrectly, as liability that is defeasible by excuses that establish the absence of culpability, in other words, as liability (only) for one's culpable conduct. But you can be at fault in tort even if your conduct is not morally blameworthy. Under a regime of fault liability, you are liable for injuries you cause while failing to comport yourself as a reasonable person would in the circumstances. It won't get you off the hook that you are not a reasonable person, or that could not come up to that standard in this case. Nor will it matter that your failure to come up to that standard is a failure for which you are utterly blameless. Fault liability is not defeasible by excuses that establish the absence of culpability.

This raises the question of how to distinguish fault liability from strict liability in tort law, since neither is defeasible by a showing of blamelessness. The difference between the two regimes of liability is that only under fault can you avoid liability if you comport yourself as a reasonable person—in other words, if you act reasonably or justifiably—whereas you remain subject to strict liability even if you had sufficient reason for what you did. Thus, fault liability, but not strict liability, can be undermined by justification.

Some find it helpful to distinguish between strict liability and fault liability in terms of the content of the underlying legal duty. In the case of blasting—an activity traditionally governed by strict liability—the blaster has a duty not-to-injure-by-blasting. In the case of driving—an activity traditionally governed by fault liability—the driver has a duty not-to-injure-by-driving-negligently. No matter how much care he takes, the blaster fails to discharge his duty whenever his blasting is causally connected in the right way to another’s injury or damage to someone’s property. In contrast, the driver fails to discharge his duty only when he injures someone negligently.

1.3 Theoretical Perspectives on Tort Law

1.3.1 Analytical and Normative

Analytical theories seek to interpret and explain tort law. More specifically, they aim (i) to identify the concepts that figure centrally in tort's substantive norms and structural features (the latter being the procedures and mechanisms by which the institution of tort law enforces its substantive norms) and (ii) to explain how tort's substantive norms and structural features are related. Key substantive norms include the wrongs that tort recognizes and the remedies that it provides for those wrongs. Key structural features include the fact that tort suits are brought by the victim rather than by the state and the fact that such suits are “bilateral”: victims (plaintiffs) sue their putative injurers instead of drawing on a common pool of resources, as in New Zealand’s accident compensation scheme (which was adopted as a substitute for tort law).

Normative theories seek to justify or reform tort law. Justificatory theories aim to provide tort with a normative grounding, often by defending the values tort embodies or the goals it aims to achieve. Reformist theories seek to improve tort law, say, by recommending changes that would bring the institution closer in line with its core values or would help it do a better job of achieving its goals.

The distinction between analytical and normative theories is not exclusive. On the contrary, few analytical theories are altogether devoid of normative elements and no normative theory is ever devoid of analytical elements. Analytical theories frequently invoke concepts that are fundamentally normative, since such theories (following Dworkin) often seek to portray tort's substantive norms and structural features in their “best light”. All the more so, normative theories are always at least partly analytical, since such theories must either provide or presuppose some account of the institution they seek to justify or reform.

1.3.2 Instrumental and Non-Instrumental

Along another axis, we can distinguish between theories of tort based on whether they are instrumental or non-instrumental. (This distinction cuts across the distinction between the analytical and the normative.) Instrumental theories regard tort's essential features as explicable in terms of an overarching purpose, typically, the remediation of some social problem, such as the problem of allocating the costs of life's misfortunes. These theories do not always agree on the specific principles that govern (or ought to govern) the allocation of costs. This is in part because they disagree about the further purposes that tort serves (or ought to serve) in allocating costs. Some theorists believe that tort aims (or ought to aim) at allocating costs efficiently. Others believe that tort aims (or ought to aim) at allocating costs fairly. Both sorts of theorist treat tort instrumentally, as a tool for solving a social problem. In contrast, non-instrumental theorists do not see tort primarily as responding to a social problem. They believe that tort is better understood as a way of giving expression to certain moral or political principles.

2. Theories of Tort Law: Economic Analysis

For many decades now, an economic analysis of tort law has been ascendant, especially (but not only) in American law schools. Rather than surveying the range of economic theories, this entry focuses in depth on what is arguably the dominant strain of economic analysis: optimal deterrence theory. Proponents of this approach, like economic analysts more generally, see tort liability primarily as a mode of allocating the costs of accidents (though an economic analysis can be extended to cover intentional torts, like assault and battery, too). Their principal claim is that tort should be understood as aiming to minimize the sum of the costs of accidents and the costs of avoiding them. Since shifting costs is itself costly, economic analysis begins with the following question: when is it worth incurring costs in order to shift costs? The obvious answer is that it makes sense to incur costs in order to reduce costs only when doing so is itself cost justified: that is, when the cost incurred are less than the costs avoided. This leads to the well known economic view that the goal of tort law is to minimize the sum of the costs of accidents and the costs of avoiding them—so-called, optimal deterrence.

2.1 The Economic Interpretation of Fault Liability

Taking the relevant social problem to be the problem of costly accidents, economic analysts deem the paradigmatic tort to be that of negligence. The law holds a person to be negligent when she imposes an unreasonable risk of injury on another. Imposing an unreasonable risk of injury is in turn a matter of failing to take precautions that a reasonable person would take. But which precautions would a reasonable person take?

Economists offer the following answer: a precaution is reasonable when it is rational; a precaution is rational when it is cost-justified; and a precaution is cost-justified when the cost of the precaution is less than the expected injury (the latter being the cost of the anticipated injury discounted by the probability of the injury's occurrence). Imagine that you are engaged in an activity that carries a benefit of $100 and an expected injury of $90. Now suppose that the only way to prevent the injury is to stop the activity. Other things being equal, you would be irrational to forego a benefit of $100 in order to avoid a cost of $90. Foregoing the benefit would not be a cost-justified precaution; you’d rather incur the injury and keep the $10 profit from the activity. Now imagine that things are the other way around: the benefit is $90 and the expected injury is $100. Under these circumstances, foregoing the benefit would be a cost-justified precaution. You would be irrational not to forego the benefit, since you would have to incur a $10 loss to engage in the activity. This is the calculation that a rational agent would make when the costs and benefits are his alone.

As economists see things, the same standard of rationality should apply when the benefit and the injury accrue to different parties. That is because the rationality of an action depends of the expected costs and benefits and not on their distribution. If I can spare you some injury by taking precautions less costly than your expected injury, my failure to take such precautions would be irrational, hence, unreasonable and thus negligent. Should you be injured as a result of my failure to take those precautions, then I would be at fault for your loss; and under the rule of fault liability, I would be required to make good your costs. By the same token, if I can spare you some injury only by taking precautions costlier than your expected injury, my failure to take these precautions is not irrational, hence, not negligent. If the injury is governed by the rule of fault liability, its costs will be yours, not mine, to bear.

The rule of fault liability has much to recommend it from an economic point of view. In particular, it induces all rational persons—injurers and victims alike—to take all and only cost-justified precautions. If all potential injurers behave rationally, losses will always lie where they fall: with victims. Rational victims will therefore approach all accidents assuming that they will have to bear the costs. But then they, too, will take all and only cost-justified precautions. So the rule of fault liability is economically efficient: it produces an optimal level of risk-taking.

2.2 The Economic Interpretation of Strict Liability

If fault liability is efficient, what are we to make of strict liability? Can it be efficient as well? Since someone facing strict liability will bear the costs of his conduct whether or not he is at fault, one might think that a potential defendant under a regime of strict liability will have no incentive to invest in precautions. This is wrong. Suppose that I am strictly liable for some costs that I impose on you—costs of $100. Suppose further that by taking $90 worth of precautions I can eliminate the chance of my imposing these costs on you. What is it rational for me to do? The answer is obvious. It is rational for me to invest in $90 worth of precautions, since I come out $10 ahead if I prevent the injury and thereby avoid liability for it. So even under a regime of strict liability, potential defendants have an incentive to take cost-justified precautions. And they won’t take any precautions that are not cost-justified. If it would cost $110 to take a precaution that would eliminate the chance that you would suffer an injury with an expected cost of $100, I would prefer to pay for your injury than take the precaution. So strict liability does not induce extra care. Under a regime of strict liability, potential defendants have an incentive to take all cost-justified precautions—just as they do under fault liability.

In a crucial respect, the plight of the defendant (injurer) under strict liability is identical to that of the plaintiff (victim) under fault liability. If we assume that the injurer is rational, we can infer that under fault liability he will take all cost-justified precautions. As a result, any losses that his conduct turns out to cause will lie where they fall: with the victim. This means that we can characterize the victim as herself facing a sort of strict liability, namely, strict liability for losses not caused by another's fault. (Strictly speaking, this is a misnomer, since one cannot be liable to oneself, but the analogy is nevertheless helpful.) The victim cannot shift these losses to the injurer because the injurer has insulated himself from liability by taking cost-justified precautions. So the rational victim will ask herself the following question: which is lower—the cost of taking precautions or the expected cost of incurring an injury? She will take precautions when (and only when) taking precautions is cheaper than remaining vulnerable to injury. The upshot is that strict liability and fault liability both induce rational persons to take all and only cost-justified precautions. If efficiency requires that individuals take all and only cost-justified precautions, then strict and fault liability can both be efficient.

If both rules can be efficient, why might we prefer one to the other? Strict liability and fault liability have different distributional consequences. A rule of strict liability makes the costs of the defendant's conduct higher than a rule of fault liability would; he pays for the injuries he causes whether or not he has taken reasonable care to avoid them. A rule of fault liability raises the costs of those who are injured relative to strict liability, since they are compensated for fewer accidents. So if we have an independent reason to privilege the plaintiff's activity over the defendant's (or vice versa)—maybe we want less of the first activity to occur or we feel that people should have to pay a steeper price for engaging in it—then we have an independent reason to prefer strict liability to fault liability (or vice versa).

2.3 Objections to Economic Analysis

There is no doubt that economic analysis offers valuable insight into tort law's capacity to increase overall safety and reduce the costs of misfortune or bad luck. For all its insight, however, economic analysis is vulnerable to difficult objections. These objections speak both to tort's substantive norms and to its structural features. We discuss some of the most significant objections here.

2.3.1 Substance

Many theorists believe that economic analysis offers a questionable interpretation of the legal duty to behave reasonably. In characterizing negligence as the failure to take cost-justified precautions, economic analysis identifies reasonable risk-taking with rational risk taking. Economic analysis effectively invites us to determine what risks it would be acceptable for a potential defendant to take on the assumption that he owns both the resultant benefits and the resultant injuries. This way of articulating the fault standard treats an activity's costs and benefits as being of the same importance regardless of where they fall. But what I owe you may not be the same as what I owe myself. Indeed, it might be reasonable for me to be more solicitous of your well-being than my own, since we might think me entitled to make tradeoffs with respect to my own well-being that I am not entitled to make with respect to yours.

Besides offering a questionable interpretation of the legal duty to behave reasonably, economic analysis arguably fails to make good sense of the concept of legal duty more generally. The norms of tort law impose duties not to injure. There are two questions we can ask about these duties: What do they require of us? And to whom do we owe them? Tort consequently distinguishes between a duty's content and its scope. This is a distinction much emphasized by Judge Cardozo in Palsgraf v. Long Island Rail Road, the most famous American tort case. In Cardozo's view, I have a duty to guard against injuring those who fall within the ambit of foreseeable risk associated with my conduct. Others might be injured by what I do, and what I do might be lamentable or mischievous, but those who fall outside the ambit of foreseeable risk have no claim against me in tort. This is not because my careless behavior does not injure them. Ex hypothesi, it does. They have no claim against me because I have no legal duty to take their interests into account. The only individuals who can have a claim against me in tort are those to whom I have a legal duty. The problem for economic analysis is that the duty restriction on liability is arguably incompatible with the goal of inducing individuals to take appropriate precautions. In order for injurers to have an incentive to take appropriate precautions, each must face the costs of his activity in full. But the duty requirement allows injurers to displace at least some of these costs on their victims. Economic analysts have responded to this problem alternately by (i) offering an efficiency rationale for the foreseeability limitation and (ii) arguing that the duty requirement is an imperfection in tort law.

2.3.2 Structure

Economic analysis cares about the relationship between a particular injurer and victim only to the extent that the nature of this relationship provides evidence of the ability of either party to reduce accident costs. As far as economic analysis is concerned, there is no intrinsic reason why a victim should sue the person who injured him. Nor is there any intrinsic reason why a plaintiff should argue in court that the defendant wronged him, rather than that the defendant was in a better position to reduce overall costs.

The most basic relationship in our actual institution of tort law is the relationship between an injurer and his victim—not the relationship between each litigant, taken separately, and the goal of minimizing the sum of the costs of accidents and the costs of avoiding them. If the victim of another's mischief brings an action in tort, he brings it against the person he believes has injured him, not against the person best situated to reduce overall costs.

We will learn the most from economic analysis if we view it as a reformist, normative theory, a theory that asks questions of the following sort: What substantive liability rules have the greatest impact on reducing the incidence of accidents at the lowest cost? What procedural rules at a trial will induce those with relevant information to reveal it? What substantive and procedural rules will lead to optimal investments in safety? These are the questions of a reformer less interested in the actual state of tort law than in how tort law can be improved. Economic analysis is less convincing if its aim is to illuminate the law from the perspective of a judge or a litigant.

3. Theories of Tort Law: Justice, Rights, and Duties

3.1 Corrective Justice

Corrective justice theory—the most influential non-economic perspective on tort law—understands tort law as embodying a system of first- and second-order duties. First order duties prohibit conduct (e.g., assault, battery, and defamation) or inflicting an injury (either full stop or negligently). (Some theorists believe that corrective justice has nothing to say about the character of these norms; others think that it helps define their scope and content.) Second order duties in torts are duties of repair. These duties arise upon the breach of first-order duties. That second-order duties so arise follows from the principle of corrective justice, which (in its most influential form) says that an individual has a duty to repair the wrongful losses that his conduct causes. For a loss to be wrongful in the relevant sense, it need not be one for which the wrongdoer is morally to blame. It need only be a loss incident to the violation of the victim's right— a right correlative to the wrongdoer's first-order duty.

So understood, corrective justice neatly accounts for the central features of tort law. It explains why tort law links victim and injurer, since it takes the injurer to have the duty to repair the wrongful losses that he causes. And it explains why tort law presents itself as a law of wrongs, rather than as a tool for inducing efficient behavior.

We can bring out what is distinctive about the corrective justice approach to tort law by contrasting it with various alternatives.

3.1.1 Corrective Justice versus Economic Analysis

From the standpoint of economic analysis, all legal liabilities are just costs of one sort or another. From an economic perspective, there are no significant normative differences among such things as licensing fees, tort liability, and taxes: normative differences that would in any event make a difference in how the law should approach them. From an economic perspective, the choice among them is based on their relative comparative advantages in securing the goals the law seeks to reach. All are tools for achieving social goals, and in some cases, taxes are better tools than licenses are. In other cases, tort liability is better than both. In many cases a mix of tools will prove optimal. The important point is that within the economic analysis, the “fit”or “aptness” of a response to wrongdoing is determined by its effectiveness in securing the aim in question; and in tort law, that aim is optimal deterrence. Tort liability is a tool that achieves that aim by shifting costs.

In contrast, corrective justice theory maintains that tort liability is not simply a mechanism for shifting costs. A licensing fee imposes a cost, as does a tax, but we would not say that in levying fees or taxes we are holding people responsible or accountable for their wrongdoing. In contrast, when we hold a defendant liable in tort, we say that he committed a wrong—assault, battery, negligence, or the like—and it is in respect of that wrong that he must be made to pay. For this reason, corrective justice theory insists that different legal liabilities are not simply interchangeable cost-shifting implements in the legal tool box, as they can have radically different expressive consequences, and some are appropriate, apt, or fitting responses to the wrongdoing in question while others are not.

3.1.2 Corrective Justice versus Retributive Justice

Many theorists believe that a principle of retributive justice—say, that the blameworthy deserve to suffer—does a good job of interpreting and justifying criminal law. Yet most theorists think that such a principle does a rather poor job of interpreting and justifying tort law (except, perhaps, for the part of tort law concerned with punitive damages). First, tort liability does not communicate condemnation, since (as explained above) a defendant can be liable in tort even though he did nothing blameworthy. Second, the duty of repair in tort is treated as a debt of repayment, in that it can be paid by third parties—and not just when the creditor (the plaintiff) has authorized repayment. By contrast, “debts” incurred as a result of criminal mischief can never be paid by third parties. You cannot serve my prison sentence. Third, a person cannot guard against liability to criminal sanction by purchasing insurance. Yet it is common to purchase insurance to guard against the burdens of tort liability. Indeed, in some areas of life (e.g., driving), purchasing third-party insurance is mandatory.

3.1.3 Corrective Justice versus Distributive Justice

Some theorists are skeptical of the idea that corrective justice is really an independent principle of justice. Their concern is twofold: considerations that make corrective justice seem like a genuine principle of justice also seem to undermine its independence from distributive justice (justice in the distribution of resources); at the same time, considerations that support the principle's independence from distributive justice also seem to undermine its status as a genuine principle of justice. This twofold concern stems from the fact that corrective justice requires the reversal of wrongful changes to an initial distribution of resources. If, on the one hand, some initial distribution of resources is just, then corrective justice seemingly does no more than require that we return individuals to the position to which they are entitled merely as a matter of distributive justice. This suggests that corrective justice is but distributive justice from an ex post perspective rather than an independent principle of justice. If, on the other hand, an initial distribution of resources is unjust, then corrective justice seemingly requires that we sustain, enforce, or entrench what is ex hypothesi an injustice. This suggests that corrective justice is not really a matter of justice at all: independent, yes; a genuine principle of justice, no.

First Response: Corrective Justice as Transactional Justice. Some theorists respond by suggesting that we understand corrective justice as a kind of transactional justice. These theorists identify the domain of distributive justice with the initial distribution of holdings and take corrective justice to be concerned exclusively with norms of transfer, norms that govern whether departures from an initial distribution are legitimate. Whatever the underlying pattern of holdings, we can distinguish legitimate modes of transfer from illegitimate ones. If agreement or gift moves resources from one person to another, then the mode of transfer is legitimate. Never mind whether the resultant allocation of resources is unequal or unfair: that is a concern of distributive, not transactional, justice. If fraud or force moves resources from one person to another, then the mode of transfer is illegitimate. Even if an illegitimate transfer gives rise to an equitable distribution, the transaction is unjust and must therefore be annulled.

Second Response: Justice versus Legitimacy. Other theorists respond by distinguishing between a distribution's justness and its legitimacy. These theorists allow that a legitimate distribution of resources may fall short of being a fully just distribution. But they insist that a (merely) legitimate distribution can suffice to generate duties of repair.

3.2 Civil Recourse Theory

Civil recourse theory agrees with corrective justice theory that tort's normative structure involves a variety of first-order duties, duties that establish norms of conduct. Yet civil recourse theory takes a different view of the legal consequence of a first-order duty's breach. Whereas corrective justice theory holds that such a breach saddles the would-be defendant with a second-order duty—in particular, a duty of repair—civil recourse theory holds that no such second-order duty results directly from the breach. Rather, the breach of a first-order duty endows the victim with a right of action: a legal power to seek redress from her injurer. That this power so arises follows from what proponents regard as a deeply embedded legal principle—the principle of civil recourse—which says that one who has been wronged is legally entitled to an avenue of recourse against the perpetrator.

Civil recourse theory has substantial explanatory power. Perhaps most obvious, it explains why tort suits have a bilateral structure—why the victim of a tortious wrong seeks redress from the wrongdoer herself instead of drawing on a common pool of resources. It also explains why tort suits are privately prosecuted—why the state does not act of its own accord to impose liability on those who breach first-order duties. According to civil recourse theory, the breach of a first-order duty gives rise not to a legal duty but to a legal power, a power the victim can choose not to exercise.

Furthermore, civil recourse theory accommodates a number of tort's central substantive features, features that arguably elude corrective justice theory. Prominent among these are (i) the fact that tort offers a variety of different remedies, only some of which are designed to restore the plaintiff's antecedent holdings, and (ii) the fact that the defendant incurs a legal duty to pay damages only upon a lawsuit's successful conclusion (either by settlement or by the final judgment of a court), rather than immediately upon the breach of a first-order duty.

Despite its explanatory power, civil recourse theory is vulnerable to a potentially serious objection—or else it seems to leave tort law vulnerable to such an objection. Because civil recourse theory offers little guidance as to what sort of redress is appropriate, the theory depicts tort law primarily as an institution that enables one person to harm another with the aid of the state's coercive power. Tort law may well be such an institution, of course. But if it is, it may be deeply flawed—indeed, it may be unjust. This problem can be posed in the form of a dilemma. Either the principle of civil recourse is grounded in a principle of justice or it is not. If the principle of civil recourse is grounded in a principle of justice, then civil recourse theory threatens to collapse into a kind of a justice-based theory. If the principle of civil recourse is not so grounded, then the principle apparently does no more than license one party to inflict an evil on another. If that is what the principle does, we might reasonably wonder whether it can justify or even make coherent sense of an entire body of law.

3.3 Reconciling Civil Recourse and Corrective Justice

One way to rescue civil recourse theory from this objection is to see it as a kind of corrective justice theory, though doing so requires adjusting the picture of corrective justice presented above. Earlier, we said that corrective justice requires that a wrongdoer repair the wrongful losses that she causes. But some think this an inadequate account of corrective justice, since all too often, it is not possible for a wrongdoer to repair the injury that she inflicted on her victim. When a victim suffers a serious bodily injury, for example, it may be possible for the wrongdoer to pay her medical bills or compensate her for lost wages, but the physical damage the victim suffered is probably beyond repair. And the problem is all the more striking when the wrong involves a serious affront to the victim’s dignity. For example, it is doubtful that a rapist could repair the “loss” suffered by his victim. In cases such as these, we must find a way to respond to the wrongdoing that does not require repair, since repair is not possible. With this in mind, some have suggested that what corrective justice corrects is not a disturbance in the prevailing distribution of goods brought about by the wrong, but rather the expressive significance of the wrong. We do corrective justice, on this picture, by responding to the wrongdoing in a way that reasserts the victim’s right. We cannot restore the victim of a rape to the position she was in before the wrong, but we can treat her rape as a wrong, and thereby reassert her right not to be raped.

This picture of corrective justice can be used to ground the principle of civil recourse. If a person has a right not to be assaulted, for example, then we must treat an assault against her as wrong, so as to reassert that right. One way to do that is to maintain a system of civil recourse, which entitles her to demand a remedy from anyone who assaults her. Oftentimes, repair will be a sensible form of recourse, since ensuring that the plaintiff does not suffer the consequences of the wrong will be one way of communicating that she had a right not to be wronged in that fashion. But this approach can also explain why tort allows victims to demand compensation even when their injuries are irreparable. The payment of damages in respect of the wrong reinforces the victim’s right even if it does not repair her injury.

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Other Internet Resources

  • Tort Law & Unjust Enrichment, links to relevant articles from the Encyclopedia of Law and Economics, supported by the Economic Institute/CIAV of Utrecht University and the Department of General Jurisprudence and History of Law, University of Ghent.
  • TortsProf Blog, edited by Professor William G. Childs, Western New England School of Law; Professor Sheila B. Scheuerman, Charleston School of Law; Professor Christopher J. Robinette, Widener University School of Law.

Copyright © 2015 by
Jules Coleman <jules.coleman@nyu.edu>
Scott Hershovitz <sahersh@umich.edu>
Gabriel Mendlow

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