Géraud de Cordemoy

First published Sat Jan 8, 2005; substantive revision Thu Mar 24, 2022

Géraud de Cordemoy (1626–1684) was one of the more important Cartesian philosophers during the decades immediately following the death of Descartes. While he is in some respects a very orthodox Cartesian, Cordemoy was the only Cartesian to embrace atomism, and one of the first to argue for occasionalism. Though a lawyer by profession, Cordemoy was a prominent figure in Parisian philosophical circles. His two most important works are Le Discernement du corps et de l’âme (1666) and his Discours physique de la parole (1668). In the former he defends atomism, mechanism, occasionalism, and dualism; the latter is a study of the nature of speech.

1. Life and Writings

Géraud (or Gerauld) de Cordemoy was born in October of 1626, the son of a University of Paris professor. He was the third of four children born to Géraud and Nicole de Cordemoy, and the only son. His father died when he was nine years old, and other than this, almost nothing is known of Cordemoy’s early years. While there is not a record of the date of his marriage (to Marie de Chazelles), the first of his five children is known to have been born on December 7, 1651, when Cordemoy was twenty-five.

Cordemoy earned a living as a lawyer, but was very active in Parisian philosophical circles. He attended various philosophy salons, and was acquainted with the Minim Emmanuel Maignan and the physicist Jacques Rohault, both organizers of philosophical conferences. In 1664, Cordemoy’s essay Discours de l’áction des corps (A Discourse on the action of bodies) was included, along with a discourse by Rohault, in the posthumous publication of Descartes’ Le Monde (The World) by Claude Clerselier. That essay would later become the second of the six discourses which make up one of Cordemoy’s two most important works, Le Discernement du corps et de l’âme en six discours pour servir à l’éclaircissement de la physique (The Distinction of the body and the soul in six discourses, in order to be useful for the clarification of physics) (1666). In this work, Cordemoy presents his atomism, his arguments for occasionalism, and his accounts of the distinction of and the interaction between the mind and the body.

Cordemoy’s other important work, the Discours physique de la parole (A Physical discourse on speech), appeared in 1668, as did his Copie d’une lettre ecrite à un sçavant religieux de la Compagnie de Jésus (A Copy of a letter written to a learned religious of the Company of Jesus). The latter is Cordemoy’s attempt to reconcile Cartesian philosophy with the story of creation as found in the Book of Genesis. The former is an account of speech production, and its popularity led to Cordemoy’s being recognized as one of the more important French philosophers of his time. He was even the model for the character of the Master of Philosophy in Molière’s play Le Bourgeois Gentilhomme.

Other, shorter works by Cordemoy include his Traitez de Metaphysique (Treatise on Metaphysics) and his Traitez sur l’Histoire et la Politique (Treatise on History and Politics). At the time of his death, Cordemoy was working on a history of France, which would be completed by his eldest son Louis-Géraud and which appeared in two volumes, in 1685 and 1689. In addition to his philosophical and historical publications, Cordemoy served briefly as the director of l’Academie Français (having been elected a member in 1675) and was for a time the tutor to the Dauphin, son of King Louis XIV. Shortly after his 58th birthday, Cordemoy suffered a brief illness and died, on October 15, 1684.

2. Atomism

Descartes had held that the essence of body is extension, and that as a result matter can be divided without end. If it is the nature of a body to take up space in three dimensions, that is, to have width, length, and height, then we can always conceive of that width, length, or height being divided. Further, according to Cartesian metaphysics, extension is the principle attribute of body, and as such cannot exist independently of body (nor can body exist independently of it). Thus according to Descartes, anywhere there is extended space, there is body occupying that space, making the existence of a void impossible. And so it is surprising to find Cordemoy, whose metaphysics is in most other respects quite Cartesian, arguing at the beginning of the Discernement for the existence of both indivisible atoms and empty space.

The First Discourse of the Discernement opens with five claims about bodies which lay the ground for Cordemoy’s physics (which he goes on to discuss in Discourses Two and Three). He tells us that bodies are: (1) limited in their extension, and this limit is called the ‘figure’ of the body; (2) inasmuch as each body is a substance, bodies are not divisible into smaller bodies, nor are bodies penetrable by other bodies; (3) the relation a body has to other bodies is called its ‘place’; (4) a change in this relation is the motion of the body; and (5) when the relation continues unchanged, the body is at rest. Cordemoy then declares that matter is clearly and distinctly understood as an assembly of bodies. Properly considered, bodies are parts of matter, and depending how these bodies are related to each other determines what sort of portion of matter the collection is: if they are very near each other, it is a heap (un tas); if they are “changing their position incessantly” (1968, 96), it is a fluid (une liqueur); and if the bodies are not moving and cannot be separated from each other, it is a mass (une masse).

While not stated explicitly, Cordemoy’s reason for accepting atomism seems to be based on his understanding of the concept of substance. Following Descartes, Cordemoy takes substance to be that which requires nothing else for its existence. Strictly speaking, this would make God the only substance, but in the created world, Descartes held that we may consider minds and body to be substances in a qualified sense. Each of these substances has a principle attribute distinguishable from it only by reason. It is this attribute through which we conceive the substance, and it is that to which all of the substance’s other properties are referred. For minds this attribute is thought, and for body it is, as mentioned above, extension.

With regard to body, Cordemoy warns that we must be careful to avoid the mistake made by other Cartesians, who have conflated what are in fact two distinct things, namely, ‘bodies’ and ‘matter’. The former are, according to Cordemoy, the true extended substances, while the latter are assemblages, or collections, of the former. The key point is that as substances, bodies must be simple: if bodies had parts, they would depend on those parts to be what they are, and in this way the parts would threaten a body’s very status as a substance. Thus we are led to atomism on strictly a priori grounds: in positing bodies as substances, we are precluded from attributing parts to them, for if we did, they would no longer be substances. Matter on this account is divisible not because its nature is extension and any extension can always be divided, but rather because it is composed of bodies which can be separated from each other, though each one is itself indivisible.

The reason for this confusion between body and matter is due, says Cordemoy, to an over-reliance on the senses: “we have a very clear idea of body, and as we know that they are extended substances, without thinking clearly we join this notion which we have of body to that which we have of matter. Taking a mass for a body, we consider it as a substance, believing that all that we see is only the same extension. And because all that we see as extended is divisible, we thus join the notion of that which is extended to the notion of that which is divisible, such that we believe divisible all that is extended” (1968, 97). The bodies being too small to be perceived, we can be misled into thinking that a collection of bodies, that is, matter, is the true extended substance, and from matter’s divisibility wrongly conclude that material substance can therefore be divided.

Cordemoy also maintains the possibility of a void, that is, space which is truly empty, and as before, his argument is based on his understanding of the concept of substance. If we have three contiguous bodies and the one in the middle is destroyed in an instant, we will, Cordemoy claims, be left with an empty space between the two remaining bodies (that is, the two would not instantaneously rush together). These two bodies, being substances, possess a metaphysical independence from what happens to other bodies. For Cordemoy, to hold otherwise would disqualify bodies (atoms) from being substances, on his understanding of the concept of substance. Likewise, if one could remove all of the matter filling a vase, the sides of the vase, pace Descartes and others, would not collapse, according to Cordemoy. The bodies that compose the sides are each themselves substances, and as such are ontologically independent of what happens to other bodies (for again, if they were not, they would not qualify as a substance).

Cordemoy concludes the First Discourse with a discussion of three inconveniens, problems with which Descartes’ plenum theory must deal but which Cordemoy’s atomism escapes. The first involves a distinction between two concepts, ‘indefinite’ and ‘infinite’, which Cordemoy claims amount to the same thing: “When I ask [the Cartesians] if this substance, which they believe to be divisible, is divisible to infinity, as it seems to me their supposition would give them to understand, they respond that it is not, but that it is divisible indefinitely. When I begged them to explain this indefinite division to me, I was led to understand it in the same way that the whole world understands the infinite” (1968, 99). Descartes was (usually) careful to distinguish between that to which we cannot see or comprehend an end, which he termed ‘indefinite’, and that which we know in a positive way to be without limit, which he termed ‘infinite’. The divisibility of matter is for Descartes indefinite, while only God can properly be said to be infinite. Cordemoy’s complaint is that if ‘indefinite’ and ‘infinite’ really amount to the same thing—and he thinks according to the Cartesians’ own account they do—then “there is something inconceivable” (ibid.) in claiming that bodies are divisible ad infinitum, since this would threaten their status as substances. (Clearly, though, this objection goes through only given a prior acceptance of Cordemoy’s atomism.)

The second and third inconveniens both deal with Descartes theory of the individuation of physical bodies. For Descartes, bodies are individuated in terms of motion: an individual body is that portion of matter which moves together, that is, which changes place with respect to the bodies which are its neighbors. Cordemoy’s first question is how, on this account, can we individuate a body at rest: “According to their doctrine, we cannot conceive of a body at rest between other bodies, because supposing that it is touching them, this doctrine teaches that together with them it makes only one body. Yet it seems to me that we have a very clear and very natural idea of a body perfectly at rest between other bodies, where nothing is in motion, and what I say of each body accords perfectly well with this idea” (1968, 99). It is, then, our clear conception of a body at rest between other bodies but at the same time distinct from them which signals trouble for the Cartesians theory. Cordemoy, on the other hand, faces no such problem, since for him the only true physical individuals are bodies/atoms; all other ‘bodies’ are rightly called matter, and are individuals only in a loose sense of the word.

The third problem raised by Cordemoy concerns a body which has its different parts in motion in different directions, such as a tree and its branches being blown in the wind. According to Descartes’ own definition of a physical individual, we would seem to have a problem, since the different parts are changing differently with respect to the other individuals which would be considered its neighbors. In such cases, it would seem to “follow that when neighboring bodies push it in different spots along opposing lines, they will divide it in as many ways as it is pushed” (ibid.). As with the second complaint, this violates the clear idea we have of the object as one thing. And as before, Cordemoy notes that no such problem arises for his atomism.

Cordemoy was, as mentioned previously, alone among Descartes’ followers in his acceptance of atomism. One of his harshest critics was his fellow Cartesian Dom Robert Desgabets, who accused Cordemoy of giving ammunition to the enemies of Descartes, namely the Gassendists, themselves atomists. Desgabets had been sent a copy of the Discernement by Clerselier, and quickly responded to it with his Lettre écrite a M. Clerselier touchant les nouveaux raisonnements pour les atomes et le vide contenus dans le livre du discernement du corps et de l’âme (A Letter written to M. Clerselier concerning the new arguments for atoms and the void contained in the book on the distinction of the body and the soul). In addition to his accusation of betraying the true philosophy, Desgabets defends the intelligibility of the indefinite/infinite distinction and offers several criticisms of Cordemoy’s position. He notes that in Cartesian terms, as distance is a mode, it can only exist as a mode of a substance. Thus wherever we have a distance, it must be a distance of something, and as distance is expressed quantitatively, that something can always be divided, even if only by God. The same line of thinking shows the impossibility of the void: if it is claimed that between two points there is only empty space, there is nothing there which could posses any properties, including length. So of what is the length between the two points a property? Cordemoy did not respond to Desgabets in print, but the Benedictine would seem to have raised some important questions for anyone holding atomism grounded upon a Cartesian metaphysics.

3. Occasionalism

Cordemoy was one of the first, if not the first, to argue that Cartesian metaphysics leads to occasionalism, the doctrine that God is the one true cause active in the world. (Louis de La Forge’s Traité de l’esprit de l’homme et de ses facultez et fonctions, et de son union avec le corps (Treatise on the mind of man and its faculties and functions, and on its union with the body), which also argued for occasionalism on Cartesian grounds, appeared just months before the Discernement, though Cordemoy claims to have accepted occasionalism as early as 1658 (1968, 145). It is unlikely that either Cordemoy or de La Forge influenced the other.)

Cordemoy’s argument for occasionalism with regard to body-body interaction appears in the Fourth Discourse of the Discernement (he will later expand his occasionalism to cover all ‘interaction’ in the created world). There we are given a series of definitions and axioms, and conclusions derived from these. Cordemoy begins by asserting as axioms (1) a thing does not have of itself (de soy) that which can be lost without ceasing to be what it is, and (2) bodies are able to lose their motion without ceasing to be bodies. The conclusion drawn is that bodies do not have motion of themselves (that is, they do not possess the property of motion essentially), since they continue to be bodies when not in motion. Nor can one body give motion to another. This is not stated as one of Cordemoy’s axioms, but rather follows from Cartesian metaphysics, which holds motion to be a mode or state of a body, and not a quality distinct from the body. As such, a mode—that is, the very same mode—cannot be transferred from one body to another.

As for the first mover, it could not itself be a body, since if it were, it would have to have motion of itself (for as first mover, where else would it get it?), and this has been shown to be impossible for bodies. Thus we may also conclude that the first mover is not a body. But there being only two kinds of substances (Cordemoy’s third axiom), bodies and minds, only a mind remains as a candidate for the first mover. Further, it is clear that our (finite) minds are not the source of motion in bodies. In the first place, our minds cannot effect our bodies in certain ways, either because they are immune to such influence (e.g., I cannot will the cells in my liver to cease dividing) or because of old age or injury (e.g., a crippled man cannot will himself to walk). Second—and noteworthy in that it anticipates both Malebranche and Hume—if we restrict ourselves to what we observe, we never experience a causal connection but only temporal succession between our volitions at one moment and our body’s actions the next. Third, if we could produce motion in bodies at will, it would, says Cordemoy, upset God’s plan for the quantity of motion which God conserves in the world. Thus he concludes that an infinite will must be the first mover.

It is Cordemoy’s fourth and fifth axioms which, together with this conclusion, get us occasionalism. The fourth axiom states that to move is an action, and the fifth claims that an action can only be continued by the agent which initiated it. Therefore, the mind which initiates the motion of bodies, God, is the same agent who continues their motion in the present. As with those who fail to distinguish bodies from matter, the fault of those who posit finite causes are guilty of making an unsupported inference from their sense experience. Making a point that Malebranche and Hume would later echo, Cordemoy says: “When we say, for example, that body B drives body A away from its place, if we examine well what is acknowledged for certain in this case, we will only see that body B was moved, that it encountered C, which was at rest, and that since this encounter, the first ceased to be moved [and] the second commenced to be moved. But if we recognize that B gave some of its motion to C, that is truly only a prejudice which comes from what we do not see.” In good Cartesian spirit, Cordemoy is claiming that it is reason which points out the way the world must be, and that uncritical acceptance of the deliverances of the senses will only lead to error.

4. The Mind and the Body

Like Descartes’ Meditations, the Discernement contains six sections, and also like the Meditations, it concludes with discussions of the union of and the distinction between the mind and the body (though while Cordemoy addresses them in this order, Descartes, in the 6th Meditation, first tackles the distinction, and later the nature of the union). But unlike Descartes, who had gone to some length to argue that the nature of the mind is to think, Cordemoy’s Fifth Discourse accepts this as a given. Further, Cordemoy does not provide an argument that the mind and body form a substantial union, but gives an example to show that they are united, that of the body moving when the mind wills that it do so. In fact, the union is defined in terms of this sort of interaction: to say that the mind and body are united simply is to say that they interact. (Thus the question of whether the problem of the mind-body union is distinct from that of mind-body interaction, which has been much discussed in Descartes scholarship, does not arise for Cordemoy.) The Fifth Discourse also contains Cordemoy’s expansion of his occasionalism to cover interaction between the mind and the body. God’s activity is required here on the grounds that as the union is defined in terms of the interaction of essentially distinct substances with mutually exclusive essences, we must go outside that union to account for the ability of one substance to effect change in the other.

The final of the six discourses which make up the Discernement addresses the question of the distinction between the mind and the body, as well as an argument that the existence of the mind is better known than the existence of the body (but note: not that the nature of the former is better known than the nature of the latter, as Descartes had claimed) and a glossary of the affects of the mind, the body, and the mind-body union. Cordemoy’s first argument for the distinction begins by listing a number of features of bodies, and contrasts this with a list of features of minds. Seeing that what is most fundamental to body is absent from the list of properties of the mind, and vice versa, he concludes that we thus “have reason to judge that they are two completely different things” (1968, 153).

Cordemoy employs a second argument for the distinction, one which, while much less rigorous than Descartes’, follows in spirit the argument from the Discourse on Method by appealing to doubt: “I even see that when I wish to doubt everything that I know when I think of bodies, I am not able at the same time to doubt my thought. For let it be false, if you will, that there are any bodies in the world; it cannot be that there are no thoughts, inasmuch as I would be thinking. How could I believe that my thought might be the same thing that I call ‘body’? I can suppose that there aren’t any bodies, and I cannot suppose that I do not think, the supposition itself being a thought. Thus I know firstly that the soul, or that which thinks, is different from the body” (1968, 153). Cordemoy goes on to argue along similar lines that he can be assured of the existence of his mind, but that the existence of his body, and all other bodies, must be taken as an article of faith.

5. Language and Speech

Though it is in the Discernement that we find the basics of Cordemoy’s philosophy, it was his Discours physique de la parole which was most identified with him. (Unlike the Discernement, the Discours was translated into English during Cordemoy’s lifetime.) The Discours opens with the question of other minds: while I know that I am a thinking thing, how can I be certain that other humans are—might not they be mindless automata who only behave as if there were clever thoughts behind their behavior? Following Descartes, Cordemoy claims that it is other humans’ use of language—both in its complexity and its creativity—which assures me that they have minds, in that such communication cannot be explained on mechanical principles alone. Cordemoy then concludes this discussion, saying: “Now that it is no longer possible for me to doubt that the bodies which resemble mine are united to souls, and since I am sure that there are other men than me, I think that I ought to look with care at what remains to be known about speech” (1968, 209). The remainder of the Discours is taken up with this investigation.

‘True’ language use, as opposed to the mere production of sound, is according to Cordemoy a matter of “giving signs to one’s thoughts” (1968 196). Language is on his account an artificial system of signs, the purpose of which is to communicate our thoughts, the words standing as their representatives, to one another. It is the creative aspect of language which demands the presence of a rational soul. True speech requires two things, says Cordemoy: “the formation of the voice, which can only come from the body, and the signification or idea that is joined with it, which can only come from the soul” (1968, 198). Yet while there is a need for a soul in order to engage in what would rightly be called genuine language use, the ability to make sounds can be explained on entirely mechanistic grounds (the explanation being for Cordemoy very similar to how musical instruments produce sound). In this way sound production is like nutrition, circulation, and respiration, none of which, as Descartes had also believed, require a soul, but which result instead from a proper disposition of one’s organs. As for animals such as parrots which not only make sounds, but utter words, Cordemoy claims that ‘returning words’ is not a sign of a soul in such creatures, any more than a canyon’s echo requires rocks to have souls. As a testament to the significance of Cordemoy’s study of language, one scholar has written that Cordemoy “picked up one of Descartes’ arguments—based on the lack of true speech among animals—and developed it fully; so fully, in fact, that after Cordemoy the point was given very little attention, as if subsequent authors considered this the last word on the subject” (Rosenfield 1968, 40).


Primary Texts

  • Cordemoy, Géraud de, Oeuvres philosophiques, Pierre Clair & François Girbal (eds.), Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 1968.
  • –––, 1664, Discours de l’áction des corps, Paris: Jacques Le Gras.
  • –––, 1666, Le Discernement du corps et de l’âme en six discours pour servir à l’eclaircissement de la physique, Paris.
  • –––, 1668, Discours physique de la parole, Paris.
  • –––, 1691, Divers Traitez de metaphysique, d’histoire, et de politique, Paris.
  • –––, 1704, Copie d’une lettre ecrite à un sçavant religieux de la Compagnie de Jésus, Paris: Remy.
  • –––, 1972, A Philosophical Discourse Concerning Speech, Delmar, NY: Scholars’ Facsimiles & Reprints.
  • –––, 2015, Six Discourses on the Distinction Between the Body and the Soul and Treatises on Metaphysics, Steven Nadler (trans.), New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Descartes, René, Oeuvres de Descartes (12 volumes), Charles Adam and Pierre Tannery (eds.), Paris: Vrin/CNRS, 1964–76.
  • –––, The Philosophical Writings of Descartes (3 volumes), J. Cottingham, R. Stoothoff, D. Murdoch, and A. Kenny (eds. and trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1985–91.
  • La Forge, Louis de, Oeuvres philosophiques, Pierre Clair (ed.), Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 1974.
  • –––, 1666, Traité de l’esprit de l’homme et de ses facultez et fonctions, et de son union avec le corps. Suivant les principes de René Descartes, Paris.
  • Rochon, A., 1672, Lettre d’un philosophe à un cartesien de ses amis, Paris: Thomas Jolly.

Selected Studies and Critical Discussions

  • Ablondi, Fred, 2005, Gerauld de Cordemoy: Atomist, Occasionalist, Cartesian, Milwaukee: Marquette University Press.
  • Balz, Albert, 1951, Cartesian Studies, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Battail, Jean-François, 1973, L’avocat philosophe Géraud de Cordemoy, The Hague: M. Nijhoff.
  • Clair, Pierre, 1976, “Louis de la Forge et les origins de l’occasionalisme,” Recherches sur le XVIIe siècle, 1: 63–72.
  • Chomsky, Noam, 1966, Cartesian Linguistics: A Chapter in the History of Rationalist Thought, New York: Harper and Row.
  • Garber, Daniel; Henry, John; Lynn, Joy; and Gabbey, Alan, 1998, “New Doctrines of Body and Its Power, Place, and Space,” in The Cambridge History of Seventeenth-Century Philosophy (2 vols.), D. Garber and M. Ayers (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 553–623.
  • Guerrini, Luigi, 1994, “Occasinalismo e teoria della communicazione in Gerauld de Cordemoy,” Annali di dipartimento di filosophia, 9: 63–80.
  • Lennon, Thomas M., 1974, “Occasionalism and the Cartesian Metaphysic of Motion,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy, (Supplementary Volume I): 29–40.
  • –––, 1993, The Battle of Gods and Giants: The Legacies of Descartes and Gassendi, 1655–1715, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Manning, Gideon, 2012, “Descartes, Other Minds and Impossible Human Bodies,” Philosopher’s Imprint, 12 (16); Manning 2012 available online.
  • Mouy, Paul, 1934, Le développement de la physique cartésienne 1646–1712, Paris: Vrin.
  • Nadler, Steven, 2005, “ Cordemoy and Occasionalism,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 43: 37–54.
  • Platt, Andrew, 2020, One True Cause: Causal Powers, Divine Concurrence, and the Seventeenth Century Revival of Occasionalism, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Prost, Joseph, 1907, Essai sur l’atomisme et l’occasionalisme dans la philosophie cartésienne, Paris: Paulin.
  • Rosenfeld, Leonora Cohen, 1968, From Beast-Machine to Man-Machine: Animal Soul in French Letters from Descartes to Le Mettre, New York: Octagon Books.
  • Scheib, Andreas, 1997, Zur Theorie individueller Substanzen bei Géraud de Cordemoy, New York, Frankfurt am Main: P. Lang.
  • Schmaltz, Tad, 2017, Early Modern Cartesianisms: Dutch and French Constructions, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

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