Nicolas Malebranche

First published Fri May 24, 2002; substantive revision Tue Nov 28, 2017

The French Cartesian Nicolas Malebranche was hailed by his contemporary, Pierre Bayle, as “the premier philosopher of our age.” Over the course of his philosophical career, Malebranche published major works on metaphysics, theology, and ethics, as well as studies of optics, the laws of motion and the nature of color. He is known principally for offering a highly original synthesis of the views of his intellectual heroes, St. Augustine and René Descartes. Two distinctive results of this synthesis are Malebranche’s doctrine that we see bodies through ideas in God and his occasionalist conclusion that God is the only real cause.

1. Life and Works

Malebranche was born in Paris on August 6, 1638, one month prior to Louis XIV, and died, also in Paris, on October 13, 1715, six weeks after the great French monarch. Malebranche was one of many children born to his mother, Catherine de Lauzon, the sister of a Viceroy of Canada, and his father, also Nicolas Malebranche, a secretary to Louis XIII. As in the case of Descartes and Pascal, Malebranche was born in frail health. His particular affliction was a severe malformation of the spine, and due to this condition as well as his weak lungs he needed to be tutored at home until the age of sixteen. Subsequently he was a student at the Collège de la Marche, and after graduating he went to study theology at the Sorbonne. His education left him with a distaste for a scholasticism that focused on the work of Aristotle. Thus, in 1660 he decided to leave the universities and to enter the Oratory, a religious congregation founded in 1611 by the Augustinian theologian Pierre Bérulle (1575–1629). At the Oratory in Paris, Malebranche studied ecclesiastical history, linguistics, and the Bible, and with his fellow students also immersed himself in the work of Augustine. He was ordained a priest on September 14, 1664.

There is the story that in the same year in which he was ordained, Malebranche happened in a Paris bookstall upon a posthumous edition of Descartes’s Traité de l’homme (Treatise on Man) which provides a sketch of a mechanistic account of the physiology of the human body. Malebranche’s early biographer, Father Yves André, reported that he was so “ecstatic” on reading this account that he experienced “such violent palpitations of the heart that he was obliged to leave his book at frequent intervals, and to interrupt his reading of it in order to breathe more easily” (André 1886, 11–12). While André does not indicate why Malebranche was so moved, one can speculate that he had discovered in this text a way to investigate the natural world without relying on a stagnant Aristotelian scholasticism. In any case, after his encounter with L’homme Malebranche devoted himself to a decade-long study of the Cartesian method and its results in mathematics and natural philosophy.

The fruit of this study is a two-volume work bearing the title, De la recherche de la vérité. Où l’on traitte de la nature de l’esprit de l’homme, et de l’usage qu’il en doit faire pour eviter l’erreur dans les sciences (Search after Truth. In which is treated the nature of the human mind and the use that must be made of it to avoid error in the sciences ) (1674–75). It is primarily this text which provides the basis for Malebranche’s reputation in the modern period. As its full title indicates, the Recherche focuses on the principal sources of human error and on the method for avoiding those errors and for finding the truth. The first five books enumerate the various errors deriving from the senses, imagination, pure understanding, inclinations and passions, respectively, and a sixth book is devoted to the Cartesian method of avoiding such errors through attention to clear and distinct ideas. The centerpiece of the third book, on pure understanding, is a defense of the claim that the ideas through which we perceive bodies exist in God. Tucked away in the final book, on method, is a critique of “the most dangerous error of the ancients,” namely, the Aristotelian position that there are secondary causes in nature distinct from God.

The first volume of the Recherche, containing the first three books, drew an immediate response in 1675 from the abbé Simon Foucher (1644–1696), canon of Sainte Chapelle of Dijon. Foucher was an “academic skeptic” who attacked the assumption that ideas in us can represent objects distinct from us (see Foucher 1675). The Cartesian Benedictine Robert Desgabets (1610–1678) replied to Foucher by insisting that the Cartesian rule that clear and distinct ideas are true presupposes that our thoughts correspond to real external objects. In brief prefaces added to the second volume of the Recherche, Malebranche chastised both thinkers for failing to read the work they were discussing, noting in particular that he had explicitly argued in the Recherche that the ideas we perceive exist in God rather than in us.

Malebranche solicited written responses to the Recherche modeled on the sets of objections published with Descartes’s Meditations. Perhaps put off by Malebranche’s harsh treatment of Foucher and Desgabets, his critics offered instead only informal objections channeled through mutual friends. In 1678, Malebranche appended to the Recherche a set of sixteen Eclaircissements, or clarifications, that respond to these objections. Among the more important objections addressed are those that concern Malebranche’s assertion that we have a freedom to “consent” to certain motives for action (“Eclaircissement I”), his claim that reason provides no conclusive demonstration of the existence of the material world (“Eclaircissement VI”), his doctrine of the vision of ideas in God (“Eclaircissement X”), his conclusion that we know our own soul through a confused consciousness rather than through a clear idea of its nature (“Eclaircissement XI”), and his occasionalist thesis that God is the only true cause (“Eclaircissement XV”). The final 1712 edition includes the addition of a seventeenth Eclaircissement that defends the importance “not only for knowledge of nature but also for knowledge of religion and morals” of the view, only hinted at in the initial edition of the Recherche, that God acts for the most part through “general volitions” (volontez générales) and acts though “particular volitions” (volontez particulières) only in the exceptional case of miracles.

Malebranche developed this last point in his 1680 Traité de la nature et de la grâce (Treatise on Nature and Grace). He published this work over the objections of the Jansenist theologian and Cartesian philosopher Antoine Arnauld (1612–1694), who was disturbed by what he saw as Malebranche’s denial of the assertion in the Scriptures and the tradition of God’s attention to particular details in matters of grace. Arnauld responded to the publication of Nature et grâce by engaging in open combat, and the ensuing battle became one of the major intellectual events of the day. His opening salvo was the 1683 Des vraies et des fausses idées (On True and False Ideas), which attacks not Nature et grâce but rather the Recherche (see Arnauld 1683). Arnauld’s strategy here was to undermine Malebranche’s influence in theological matters by revealing the inadequacy of his philosophical views. In particular, he attacked Malebranche’s assumption that ideas are “representative beings” distinct from our perceptions, offering instead the position, which he plausibly ascribed to Descartes, that ideas are simply a feature of the perceptual modifications of our soul. This argument reflects a sympathy for Descartes’ views that dates back to Arnauld’s set of comments on the Meditations.

The same year that Arnauld presented his initial critique, Malebranche published the Méditations chretiennes et métaphysiques (Christian and Metaphysical Meditations), in which “the Word” (i.e., the Second Person of the Trinity) offers a summary of his system that highlights the central role that God plays in both metaphysics and morality. This work was in some ways a follow up to his Conversations chrétiennes (Christian Conversations), published in 1677. In that earlier text, Malebranche presented a defense of the Christian religion that emphasizes the Augustinian theme of our dependence on God for knowledge and happiness. In 1684, Malebranche further developed his views on moral theory in the Traité de morale (Treatise on Ethics), in which he argued that moral virtue requires a love of the “immutable order” that God reveals to those who seek to know it.

In 1684, Malebranche also responded to Arnauld’s Idées, and after a further exchange on the topic of the nature of ideas the debate turned to the theological issues concerning divine providence, grace and miracles. The battle became increasingly bitter, and as a result of a campaign on the part of Arnauld and his supporters, Malebranche’s Nature et grâce was put on the Catholic Index librorum prohibitorum (Index of Prohibited Books) in 1690 (the Recherche was added in 1709). The Malebranche-Arnauld polemic continued even after Arnauld’s death in 1694, with the publication in 1704 of two letters Arnauld wrote in 1699 and of Malebranche’s responses to those letters.

In 1688, Malebranche published his Entretiens sur la métaphysique et la religion (Dialogues on Metaphysics and Religion), a concise summary of his main metaphysical doctrines of the vision in God and occasionalism that also addresses the problem of evil. In 1696, he appended to this text the Entretiens sur la mort (Dialogues on Death), which he composed after a life-threatening illness.

In 1692, Malebranche published a short study, the Lois de la communication des mouvements (Laws of the Communication of Motions), in which he endorsed Descartes’s law of the conservation of the quantity of motion but offered rules governing collision that, unlike Descartes’s own rules, involve no appeal to a force in bodies to remain at rest. In correspondence with Malebranche, Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz (1646–1716) emphasized difficulties with Descartes’s conservation law, and that correspondence led Malebranche to insert into a 1700 edition of the Lois the admission that experience reveals that such a law does not hold.

In 1693, Malebranche responded to the criticisms of the Recherche in the 1690 Systême de philosophie (System of Philosophy) of the French Cartesian Pierre-Sylvain Régis (1632–1707). Régis had defended an account of ideas similar to the one that Arnauld had defended against Malebranche during the 1680s, and Arnauld used the Régis-Malebranche exchange as an occasion to return to the issue of ideas during the last year of his life. Despite their dispute, Malebranche and Régis were both appointed as honorary members of the Paris Académie des sciences when it was reorganized in 1699. Malebranche presented an inaugural lecture to the Académie that defends against Descartes an account of color in terms of the frequency of vibrations of light. In later published versions of the lecture, Malebranche revised his discussion to take into account the theory of the nature of color in the work of Sir Isaac Newton.

In 1697, Malebranche published the Traité de l’amour de Dieu (Treatise on the Love of God) with Trois lettres à Lamy (Three Letters to Lamy), in which he rejected the claim in the Benedictine François Lamy (1636–1711) that the Traité de morale supports the “quietist” position that moral action derives from a disinterested “pure love of God.” This rejection of Lamy’s quietism provided the basis for Malebranche’s reconciliation with the famous French cleric, Jacques-Bénigne Bossuet (1627–1704). Bossuet had earlier enlisted the aid of François de Fénelon (1651–1715) in writing against Malebranche’s occasionalism and his appeals to God’s “general will,” but later became a bitter enemy of Fénelon’s quietism.

With the support of the apostolic vicar in China, Malebranche published in 1708 an Entretien d’un philosophe chrétien et d’un philosophe chinois, sur l’existence et la nature de Dieu (Dialogue between a Christian Philosopher and a Chinese Philosopher on the Existence and Nature of God). A sixth and last edition of the Recherche appeared in 1712, and in 1715 Malebranche published his final work, Réflexions sur la prémotion physique (Reflections on Physical Premotion), in which he responded to the claim of the abbé Laurent-François Boursier (1679–1749) that occasionalism leads naturally to the Thomistic position that God determines our action by means of a “physical premotion.” In his response, Malebranche defended the claim, present from the first edition of the Recherche, that our free action involves a “consent” that God does not determine.

The Œuvres complètes de Malebranche [OC], which consists of 20 volumes, is the standard critical edition of Malebranche’s writings. In France, Malebranche has always been a major figure in the history of early modern philosophy, and there is an extensive earlier literature on him from this country; see, for instance, Gouhier (1926), Gueroult (1939), Gouhier (1948), Gueroult (1955–59), Robinet (1955), Rodis-Lewis (1963), and Robinet (1965). This is supplemented by the important discussion in Alquié (1974), and there is a continuation of substantive French scholarship on Malebranche in works such as Moreau (1999), Bardout (1999), Bardout (2000), and Pellgrin (2006). Despite the relative neglect of him in the corresponding Anglophone literature during the earlier part of the twentieth century, Malebranche has become increasingly popular among English-language scholars more recently. This change is indicated by the presence of recent English translations of his writings; see Malebranche [DM], [DC], [TE], [DMR], and [ST]. More recent book-length studies of Malebranche in English include McCracken (1983), Jolley (1990), Nadler (1992), Schmaltz (1996), Nadler (2000), Pyle (2003), and Peppers-Bates (2009), which add to earlier trail-blazing studies such as Walton (1972) and Radner (1978). Easton, Lennon and Sebba (1991) is a comprehensive bibliography of work on Malebranche in various languages. This work supersedes the bibliography in volume 20 of Malebranche [OC], which had superseded Sebba (1959).

2. Ideas and the Vision in God

In a section of the third book of the Recherche devoted to “the nature of ideas,” Malebranche argued for his famous doctrine of the vision in God. More precisely, the thesis in this section is that we see external objects by means of ideas in God. The argument for this thesis begins with the claim at the beginning of this section that “everyone agrees that we do not perceive objects external to us by themselves” since it can hardly be the case that “the soul should leave the body to stroll about the heavens to see the objects present there” (Malebranche [OC], 1:413). Arnauld later took exception to this starting point, countering that “ideas, taken in the sense of representative beings, distinct from perceptions, are not needed by our soul in order to see bodies” (Arnauld 1683, 18). His main objection is that Malebranche stacked the deck in favor of his doctrine that we see ideas of bodies in God by assuming from the start that these ideas are distinct from our own perceptions.

In developing his own position, Arnauld appealed to Descartes’ distinction in “Meditation III” between the formal reality of an idea as a perceptual modification of mind and its objective reality as something that represents an object. Arnauld insisted that a representative idea is simply the objective reality of a perception, and thus not something distinct from that perception. However, it is important to note that Malebranche’s definition of an idea does not rule out such a position from the start. As he himself insisted to Arnauld, the claim that we must perceive external objects through ideas leaves open the question of whether an idea is “a modality of the soul, according to the opinion of M. Arnauld; an express species, according to certain philosophers, or an entity created with the soul, according to others; or finally intelligible extension rendered sensible by color or light, according to my opinion” (Malebranche [OC], 6:95).

Malebranche’s description of his own opinion goes beyond what can be found in the original edition of the Recherche. However, his description of the other alternatives is drawn directly from this text. In particular, Malebranche had argued there that there are only four alternatives to the conclusion that we see bodies through ideas in God: (1) Bodies transmit resembling species to the soul; (2) Our soul has the power to produce ideas when triggered by non-resembling bodily impression; (3) Ideas are created with the soul or produced in it successively by God; and (4) Our soul sees both the essence and the existence of bodies by considering its own perfections. Malebranche told Arnauld that since this list constitutes “an exact division … of all the ways in which we can see objects” and since each of the alternative accounts yields “manifest contradictions,” his argument from elimination serves to demonstrate the doctrine of the vision in God (Malebranche [OC], 6:198–99).

It is difficult to determine from the Recherche the precise source of the enumeration. However, Connell (1967) has established that Malebranche’s argument was drawn from the account of angelic knowledge in the work of the Spanish scholastic, Francisco Suárez (1548–1617). Particularly crucial for Malebranche’s enumeration is Suárez’s claim that angels must know material objects through species that God adds to their mind given that God alone can know them through His own substance. In light of this claim, we can take Malebranche’s first three hypotheses to cover the various ways in which we could perceive bodies through immaterial species “superadded” to our soul, and his fourth hypothesis to cover the possibility that we perceive bodies in the perfections of our soul. In arguing against the last hypothesis, Malebranche noted that since a finite being can see in itself neither the infinite nor an infinite number of beings (as Suárez had argued in the case of angels), and since we in fact perceive both the infinite and infinity in external objects, it must be that we see these objects by means of perfections contained in the only being that can possess an infinity of ideas, namely, God Himself.

Malebranche took the conclusion here to confirm the view in “an infinity of passages” in Augustine that “we see God” in knowing eternal truths. This appeal to the Augustinian theory of divine illumination provides the basis for an argument for the vision in God that bypasses the unusual enumeration in the Recherche. This more direct argument is introduced in “Eclaircissement X,” where Malebranche urged that the ideas we perceive must exist in an “immutable and necessary Reason” since they are themselves immutable and necessary (Malebranche [OC], 3:129f). Malebranche emphasized that the Augustinian view that eternal truths derive from uncreated features of the divine intellect conflicts directly with the voluntarist conclusion in Descartes that these truths derive rather from God’s free and indifferent will. Particularly in his exchanges with Arnauld, Malebranche attempted to present his doctrine of the vision in God as a natural consequence of Descartes’ account of ideas. However, his Augustinian argument serves to show that Descartes himself could not have accepted this doctrine. Moreover, such an argument reveals the most fundamental reason for Malebranche’s rejection of Arnauld’s Cartesian identification of ideas with our own perceptions. Since Malebranche identified these ideas with necessary and immutable essences, and since he held that these ideas derive their necessity and immutability from the divine intellect, he concluded that Arnauld’s position can only result in a radical subjectivism that renders impossible any sort of a priori knowledge of the material world.

“Eclaircissement X” also introduces the notion of “intelligibile extension” mentioned in Malebranche’s claim to Arnauld quoted above concerning his own opinion. According to this Eclaircissement, God has a single ideal extension that serves to represent particular bodies to Him. Arnauld objected that this position involves a retraction of the claim in the Recherche that we perceive bodies by means of distinct ideas in God. In response, Malebranche insisted that his view all along was that God represents particular bodies by means of His own simple “absolute being.” For Arnauld, however, the view that God contains extension in this way is objectionable since it is connected to the heretical view in the work of the Dutch thinker Benedict Spinoza that God is extended substance. The charge of Spinozism reappears in Malebranche’s 1713–14 correspondence with one of his former students, J.J. Dortous de Mairan (1678–1771), who later became the Secretary of the Académie des sciences. As in the case of Arnauld, so in this correspondence Malebranche vigorously denied this charge. In both cases, he responded by emphasizing that the infinite and indivisible ideal extension that exists in God differs from the finite and divisible extension in the material world. (For more on Malebranche’s notion of intelligible extension, see Reid 2003; cf. the different interpretation of this notion in Nolan 2012.)

A final feature of Malebranche’s doctrine of the vision in God is connected to the notion in his writings of the “efficacious idea” (idée efficace). As first noted in Robinet (1965), this notion became entrenched in Malebranche’s system around 1695, after his encounter with his Cartesian critic Régis. In his Systême de philosophie, Régis had challenged the claim in the preface to the Recherche that our mind is united to God in a manner that “raises the mind above all things” and is the source of “its life, its light, and its entire felicity” (Malebranche [OC], 1:9). While he granted the commonplace claim that God must create and conserve our soul, Régis denied that we are enlightened by means of a union with ideas of bodies in God. Rather, he insisted that God conserves in us ideas that derive directly from the bodies they represent. In the 1693 Réponse à Régis (Response to Régis), Malebranche emphasized his Augustinian position that we can be instructed as to the nature of bodies only through a union with God. However, he put a new spin on this position when he noted that the union with God involves an “affecting” or “touching” of our mind by God’s idea of extension.

Already in the 1688 Entretiens sur la métaphysique, Malebranche had suggested that the union with God can be explicated in terms of a causal relation between God’s ideas and our mind. After 1695, he developed this suggestion by introducing the notion of “pure” or non-sensory intellectual perceptions that are produced by God’s efficacious idea of extension. Yet he also stressed in this later period that such an idea is the causal source of our sensations. One advantage of this extension of the doctrine of efficacious ideas to sensations is that it yields a fairly clear explanation of Malebranche’s claim to Arnauld that an idea is “intelligible extension rendered sensible by color or light.” Prior to 1695, Malebranche explained how intelligible extension is so rendered by appealing somewhat obscurely to the fact that the soul “attaches” colors to a non-sensory idea. However, the theory of efficacious ideas allowed him to say that this idea is rendered sensible by causing in us the appropriate sensations of color and light. The claim that we see ideas in God is thus transformed into the claim that our soul has intellectual and sensory perceptions that yield an understanding of the truth concerning bodies in virtue of their causal relation to God’s idea of extension. Drawing on Robinet’s results, one scholar has concluded that while Malebranche started with the vision in God, he ended with a vision by God (Alquié 1974, 209).

3. Cartesian Dualism

Malebranche told Arnauld that it was Augustine’s authority “which has given me the desire to put forth the new philosophy of ideas” (Malebranche [OC], 6:80). By contrast, he emphasized in the preface of the Recherche that Augustine had failed to see that sensible qualities “are not clearly contained in the idea we have of matter,” adding that “the difference between mind and body has been known with sufficient clarity for only a few years” (Malebranche [OC], 1:20). The allusion here is to Descartes’s recent discovery of an idea of matter that reveals that its nature consists in extension alone. This idea dictates that sensible qualities such as colors, tastes and odors that are not reducible to modes of extension cannot exist external to mind. But since these qualities exist in the mind, and in particular in the mind’s perception of the qualities, the mind itself must be distinguished from body. In this way the Cartesian idea of matter reveals “the difference between mind and body.”

In the initial book of the Recherche, on the senses, Malebranche proposed that the erroneous belief in the Aristotelians as well as in Augustine that sensible qualities exist in bodies has its source in a misuse of “natural judgments” that help in the conservation of the human body. Here he was following Descartes’ account in “Meditation VI” of the “teachings of nature,” and in particular the claim there that the purpose of sensations is not to teach us about the nature of bodies but simply to inform us of what is beneficial or harmful to the human composite. Just as Descartes had urged that erroneous beliefs about the nature of body can be avoided by attending to the clear and distinct perceptions of the intellect, so Malebranche counseled that we avoid error by attending to what the clear idea of matter reveals to us about the nature of body. As we have seen, Malebranche had Augustinian reasons for saying that the idea that so instructs us exists in God. By his own admission, however, the conclusion that the idea that instructs us is an idea of extension derives from the recent discoveries of Descartes.

Malebranche emphasized that the clear idea of extension must be distinguished from our confused sensations. One point he wanted to make is that the idea exists in God while the sensations are only modifications of our mind. However, his emphasis on the fact that this idea is “pure” or non-sensory indicates that our experience of the material world has an intellectual component. We have seen that his late doctrine of the efficacious idea involved the position that we have pure intellectual perceptions produced by God’s intellectual idea of extension. But his mature position that this idea is also the cause of our sensations allows for the claim that our most basic sensory contact with the material world has an intellectual component.

We know that Malebranche’s doctrine of the vision in God conflicts with Descartes’ doctrine of the creation of the eternal truths. However, there are further departures from orthodox Cartesianism that are linked to two qualifications of this doctrine. The first qualification is that God’s idea of extension can reveal only the nature of bodies and not their existence. This qualification is not explicit in the initial edition of the Recherche, which says only that the existence of properties of bodies external to us is “very difficult to prove” (Malebranche [OC], 1:122). Foucher had objected that Malebranche has no good reason to affirm the external existence of these properties. In “Eclaircissement VI,” Malebranche urged that the idea of extension does reveal the possible existence of the material world, and that Descartes has shown that we have a probable argument for its actual existence deriving from our natural propensity to believe that there are bodies. However, he conceded in this text—without crediting Foucher—that neither he nor Descartes can provide an argument from reason that demonstrates “with evidence” or “with geometric rigor” that this belief is true. His conclusion is that such an argument must appeal to faith in the veracity of the report in the Scriptures that God has created the heavens and the earth.

According to the second qualification of the vision in God—which is found in the original edition of the Recherche—we perceive the nature of our soul not through a clear idea in God, but only through a confused “consciousness or inner sensation” (conscience ou sentiment intérieur). Malebranche accepted the Cartesian commonplace that consciousness reveals immediately the existence of the soul. He allowed that we know the nature of our soul to consist in thought, moreover, and he embraced the Cartesian conclusion that the soul as a thinking thing is distinct from body as an extended thing. Yet he insisted that we know that the soul is distinct from the body not by means of any direct insight into the nature of thought, but rather by seeing that thought is not contained in the idea of matter. More generally, Malebranche claimed that our lack of access to a clear idea of the soul is evident from the fact that we do not have knowledge of thought that matches our knowledge of the mathematical features of bodies. This last point turns on its head Descartes’ own conclusion in “Meditation II” that the nature of the human mind is “better known” than the nature of body; for Malebranche, it is the nature of body that is better known than the nature of mind.

In “Eclaircissement XI,” Malebranche attempted to counter “the authority of Descartes” by arguing that the Cartesians themselves must admit that they have only a confused awareness of the nature of the sensory modifications of the soul. He noted that while the intellectual idea allows the various modes of extension to be related in a precise manner, there is no clear scale on which we can order our sensations of different shades of the same color, not to mention our sensations of sensible qualities of different kinds. Malebranche took the confusion in the sensations to reveal a confusion in our perception of the nature of the soul. He added that Cartesians can discern that sensible qualities are modifications of an immaterial soul only by seeing that they are “not clearly contained in the idea we have of matter.” For a discussion sympathetic to Malebranche’s critique of Descartes’s account of our knowledge of mind, see Schmaltz (1996); for more recent discussions that defend Descartes against this critique, see Nolan and Whipple (2005) and LoLorodo (2005).

4. Occasionalism

Malebranche is known for his occasionalism, that is, his doctrine that God is the only causal agent, and that creatures merely provide the “occasion” for divine action. On the old textbook account, occasionalism was an ad hoc response to the purported problem in Descartes of how substances as distinct in nature as mind and body are can causally interact. According to this account, Malebranche was driven by this problem with Cartesian dualism to propose that it is God who brings it about that our sensations and volitions are correlated with motions in our body.

However, occasionalism was already an old doctrine at the time that Thomas Aquinas (1225–1274) wrote against it. (There is a helpful survey, in German, of the earlier history of occasionalism in Perler and Rudolph 2000.) Thomas indicated that the primary concern of the occasionalists was to strengthen the assertion of God’s omnipotence. Though he allowed that God must “concur” with creatures in producing effects, Thomas also claimed that there is reason to conclude that creatures are true secondary causes. For instance, he urged that it is more in accord with divine greatness to say that God communicates His power to creatures. Moreover, he claimed that it is simply evident to the senses that creatures have the power to bring about effects. Thomas also argued that if there were no natures in creatures that explain effects, there could be no true scientific explanation of effects through their natural causes.

Malebranche was concerned to respond to all of these arguments against occasionalism, particularly as they were developed in the work of scholastics such as Suárez. Against the first point that God’s greatness requires the communication of His power, he countered that it is in fact idolatrous to attribute divine power to creatures. Malebranche’s argument that God alone can produce effects relies on the assumption that “a true cause … is one such that the mind perceives a necessary connection [liaison nécessaire] between it and its effects” (Malebranche [OC], 2:316). He claimed that there is such a connection neither among bodily states, nor between bodily and mental states, nor among mental states. In all of these cases, one can deny the connections without contradiction. There can be a necessary causal connection in only one case, namely, the connection between the volitions of an omnipotent agent and its upshots. Thus, only such an agent, namely, God, can be a true cause. (For different interpretations of this argument, cf. Lee 2008 and Ott 2008).

In the Entretiens sur la métaphysique, Malebranche offered a different argument based on Descartes’s suggestion in “Meditation III” that God conserves the world by continuously creating it. The argument begins with the claim that God must create bodies in some particular place and in determinate relations of distance to other bodies. If God conserves a body by creating it in the same place from moment to moment, that body remains at rest, and if he conserves it by creating it in different places from moment to moment, it is in motion. We cannot even create motion in our own bodies. Rather, it is God who must produce it on the occasion of volitional states. Moreover, it is not motions in our brain that cause our sensory states, but God who produces them on the occasion of the presence of such motions. Finally, I have indicated the view in the Entretiens that God produces our intellectual states through the union of our mind with His “intelligible extension.” While the argument from the necessity of the causal connection yields the result that only an omnipotent being can be a cause, the argument here is that only that being which creates/conserves the world can cause various bodily and mental states. However, both arguments converge on the conclusion, which Malebranche claimed to find in Augustine, that all creatures depend entirely on God. (For further discussion of Malebranche’s various arguments for occasionalism, see Lee 2007 and Lee 2008.)

The second scholastic argument against occasionalism appealed to the purported fact that it is evident to the senses that creatures have causal power. For Malebranche, however, this argument is no more persuasive than the argument that bodies must have colors and tastes since our senses tell us that they do. As indicated above, Malebranche offered Cartesian grounds for thinking that the purpose of our sensations is not to reveal the true nature of the material world, but rather to indicate what is helpful or harmful to our body. Malebranche held that our attribution of causal powers to bodies manifests in particular an attachment to the body that is an effect of original sin. Due to this attachment, we take objects in the material world to be a cause of our happiness rather than God.

In “Eclaircissement XV,” Malebranche responded to the scholastic point that occasionalism renders scientific explanation impossible by appealing to the fact that God is not an arbitrary agent, but acts in accord with His wisdom. This wisdom dictates that He act “almost always” by means of a “general and efficacious will.” Such a will produces effects that are perfectly law-like. For instance, God acts by a general will in producing changes in bodies in accord with the law of the communication of motion. Malebranche did allow that God can produce miracles by “particular volitions” that are not law-like. However, he emphasized that there are relatively few such volitions in God. Thus, we can offer scientific explanations that appeal to the laws of motion that reflect the nature of God’s general will.

There is an important non-scholastic objection to Malebranche’s occasionalism in the work of Bernard le Bovier de Fontenelle (1657–1757), who was to become the perpetual secretary of the Paris Académie des Sciences. In his 1686 Doutes sur le système physique des causes occasionelles, Fontenelle argued that Malebranche’s mechanistic physics is incompatible with his occasionalism. This is so because according to mechanism, bodily collision necessitates change in motion. But then bodily collision satisfies Malebranche’s main requirement for being a true cause insofar as it has a necessary connection to its effect; thus the conflict with occasionalism. In his 1688 Entretien sur la métaphysique, Malebranche offered the response that the laws governing the bodily effects of collision derive from God’s will rather than from the nature of bodies (Malebranche [OC], 12:164). For different assessments of this response to Fontenelle, cf. Downing (2005) and Schmaltz (2008).

Malebranche was not the first Cartesian to endorse occasionalism. There were followers of Descartes such as Louis de la Forge (1632–1666) and Claude Clerselier (1614–1684) who stressed that God must be the cause of the communication of motion in bodily collisions given the passivity of Cartesian matter. These Cartesians attempted to preserve some room for the action of finite minds on body, but the Cartesian Geraud de Cordemoy (1626–1684) went further in claiming that only God can cause changes in the material world. However, none of these thinkers went as far as Malebranche in arguing that God must produce all real changes in nature. Moreover, Malebranche is distinctive in providing an explanation of God’s action that distinguishes His general will from His particular volitions. For a recent discussion of issues connected to Malebranche’s notion of particular volitions, see Walsh and Stencil (2016).

5. Theodicy

The presence of various evils in the world is problematic for anyone who claims that this world was created by a God who has infinite power, knowledge and goodness. However, the problem is particularly acute for an occasionalist such as Malebranche who holds that God is the only true cause of effects in nature. Malebranche offered a theodicy that addresses the problem of evil by emphasizing that in the “order of nature” God acts for the most part through His general will. In Nature et grâce, he started by admitting that God could have acted by particular volitions to prevent natural evils such as malformed offspring (a fitting example given his own malformed spine), and thus could have produced a more perfect world than He actually did create. In correspondence with Leibniz, Malebranche emphasized this point in distinguishing his theodicy from Leibniz’s (see Schmaltz 2010). However, Malebranche also claims that God could have created a more perfect world only by departing from simple laws, thereby sacrificing the simplicity and uniformity of action that is a supreme mark of His wisdom. God produces the natural evils that follow from simple laws not because He wills those particular effects, but because He wills a world that best reflects His wisdom by possessing the most effects governed by the fewest laws.

In his Réflexions on Malebranche’s Nature et grâce, Arnauld objected to what he took to be the suggestion in his target text that God has concern only for general features of the world and does not will the details of His effects. For Arnauld, divine providence requires that God intend all of the particularities of the world He creates. In the recent Anglophone literature, there is a debate over whether Arnauld’s critique is based on a proper interpretation of Malebranche. This debate was promoted by the claim in Nadler (1993) that when Malebranche says that God acts by means of general laws or volitions, he means only that God has volitions in accord with general laws, and that his doctrine of God’s continual creation in the Entretiens sur la métaphysique in fact requires distinct volitions for distinct effects (cf. the development of this interpretation in Pessin 2001 and Stencil 2011). Other commentators have countered that Arnauld was correct in thinking that Malebranche’s claim in Nature et grâce that God acts by relatively few general volitions involves a rejection of the position that He has volitions for each particular effect . Some evidence for this view is provided by the fact that Malebranche emphasized that the laws themselves are “efficacious,” and that God employs relatively few volitions in producing effects in the order of nature (see Black 1997, Jolley 2002, and Schmaltz 2003).

Malebranche insisted that God’s general will is operative not only in the order of nature, but also in the “order of grace.” However, he noted that the production of effects in the latter order also involves human action that is free in the strong sense of not being determined by anything external to the agent. His appeal to this sort of freedom is in fact central to his solution to the problem of moral evil, that is, the compatibility of sin with God’s goodness. According to Malebranche, God is not responsible for sinful action since such action derives not from Him but from sinful agents. Arnauld objected that this solution is “more pelagian than anything in Pelagius,” and that one must side with Augustine, who declared Pelagianism a heresy. Malebranche responded that he did not follow Pelagius in denying the importance of grace, and that Augustine himself had emphasized our freedom in action.

Malebranche also held that it is obvious by “inner sensation” that we are genuinely free. However, there is some question whether this introspective report is compatible with Malebranche’s occasionalist claim that God is the only real cause. This question has generated considerable discussion in the recent Anglophone literature (cf. Schmaltz 2005, Greenberg 2008 and 2015, and Peppers-Bates 2009). Malebranche did hold that God alone is the cause of our inclination to love “the good in general.” However, he also insisted that we are free to “consent” to the stopping of that inclination at a particular object other than God. Such consent results in an “absolute and intrinsic” love of that object that is sinful given that this love is worthy only of God. The consent is free because one is always able to suspend consent and to search for objects more worthy of our love.

There is the claim that Malebranche’s account of consent remained essentially the same over the course of his philosophical career (see Kremer 2000, 206). However, there is some reason to think that this account in fact was subject to significant development. In the initial discussion of freedom in the Recherche, there is the suggestion that consent consists in our “determination” of our natural inclination toward the good in general (Malebranche [OC], 1:46). However, this suggestion conflicts with the claim in the very same text that it is God who directs our natural inclination toward particular objects prior to any free act on our part. Indeed, in his later discussion of freedom in “Eclaircissement I,” Malebranche held that our freedom consists not in an active turning of our natural inclination, but rather in the inactivity of our resting with a particular good (Malebranche [OC], 3:548). This view is further developed in the Traité de morale, which in the case of free action distinguishes between the force involved in the search for truth and the liberté that directs this search. Free acts of consent fall under the latter, whereas the former involves the dispositions of our free inclinations that God produces in us on the occasion of these acts (Malebranche [OC], 11:70). In contrast to his earlier suggestion that our free acts involve either a turning of our natural inclination or an inactivity coupled with such an inclination, Malebranche’s view here is that such acts are inactivities coupled with a distinct sort of free inclination. There are different answers to the question of whether this account serves to reconcile Malebranche’s occasionalism with his claim that we have genuine freedom of action; cf. Schmaltz (2005), which defends the coherence of Malebranche’s final position on this issue (in line with the earlier view in Laporte 1951), and Greenberg (2015), which argues that this position is not fully consistent.

6. Moral Theory

The theocentrism that is evident in Malebranche’s doctrines of the vision in God and occasionalism would lead us to expect that God plays a central role in his moral theory. This expectation is borne out by his discussion in the Traité de morale. Indeed, Malebranche’s two doctrines are present in that work. The vision in God is reflected in the insistence there that moral duties are dictated by “relations of perfection” revealed in God’s wisdom. As in the case of necessary truths concerning body, so in the case of moral truths Malebranche unequivocally rejected Cartesian voluntarism. The doctrine of occasionalism is reflected in Malebranche’s insistence that God is our greatest good since He alone can cause our happiness. This point indicates that Malebranche took moral action to require a consideration not only of abstract relations of perfection, but also the happiness of the self.

Malebranche starts from the Augustinian position that morality concerns the proper ordering of our love. Given the importance of human freedom for his theodicy, it is not surprising that Malebranche insisted that the love required for moral action involve the free exercise of the will. His version of the “good will” is one that freely strives to be guided in action by objective relations of perfection that hold among the various objects of love. God is the most perfect being, and hence the most worthy of our love, while human beings are more perfect than mere material beings, and thus more worthy of our love. When the intensity of our love matches the order among perfections, we have a right love that provides the basis for virtue, that is, a habitual inclination to love objects according to their perfections.

Malebranche held that due to original sin, we are inclined not to right love directed by our perception of relations of perfection in God’s wisdom, but rather to a disordered love directed by bodily pleasures deriving from the soul-body union. This is the counterpart to the disordered inclination of our will to make judgments about the nature of the material world that are based on sensations deriving from the union. For Malebranche, a corrective to both of these disorders of the will is to attend to clear ideas that exist in God.

Malebranche sometimes suggested that disordered love of bodily pleasure derives from self-love. Encouraged by this suggestion, one of his followers, François Lamy, claimed that his position leads to the quietist view in Fénélon that moral conduct requires a “pure love of God” that involves no concern for the self or its pleasure. This position, which Lamy himself endorsed, was later condemned by the Catholic Church, due in large part to a campaign against Fénélon directed by his critic, Bossuet. But Malebranche insisted that such a position directly conflicts with his own view that pleasure itself is a good that is required as a motive for action. When critics such as Arnauld and Régis charged that this view results in hedonism, Malebranche responded that it is only ordered pleasures that bring the greatest good. This response is reflected in his claim to Lamy that a disordered love of self is to be contrasted not with pure love of God, but rather with an ordered love that seeks happiness in the contemplation of the greatest good, God. In emphasizing the need for this sort of love of God, Malebranche was returning to his view in the preface to the Recherche that it is through a union with God that the mind “receives its life, its light, and its entire felicity.” For more on Malebranche’s engagement with quietism, see Montcheuil (1947). But cf. the critical evaluation of Montcheuil’s decidedly pro-Malebranche view of this exchange with Lamy in Dreyfus (1958), 318–22. There is a recent discussion of the relation of Malebranche to quietism in Walsh and Lennon (2012).

Bardout (2000), 111–62, includes the argument that Malebranche’s exchange with Lamy on pure love in fact marks a transition in his thought from a “metaphysical morality” that stresses the purely intelligible nature of our moral end, to a “sensible morality” that stresses a conception of that end in terms of the cause of our pleasure. However, this shift may not be as dramatic as in the case of Malebranche’s conception of freedom. For the view that God is our sole good insofar as He is the sole cause of our pleasure is present already in the first edition of the Recherche (Malebranche [OC], 172–73). Even so, there is reason to think that this view becomes increasingly important to Malebranche’s moral theory.


Malebranche’s Works

  • [OC], Œuvres complètes de Malebranche (20 volumes), A. Robinet (ed.), Paris: J. Vrin, 1958–84.
  • [DM], Dialogues on Metaphysics, W. Doney (trans.), New York: Abaris Books, 1980.
  • [DC], Dialogue between a Christian Philosopher and a Chinese Philosopher on the Existence and Nature of God, D. A. Iorio (trans.), Washington, DC: Catholic University Press, 1980.
  • [TE], Treatise on Ethics, C. Walton (trans.), Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1993.
  • [DMR], Dialogues on Metaphysics and on Religion, N. Jolley and D. Scott (trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997.
  • [ST], The Search after Truth, T. M. Lennon and P. J. Olscamp (trans.), New York: Cambridge University Press, 1997b; Columbus: Ohio State University Press, 1980.

Related Early Modern Works

  • André, Y. M., La vie du R. P. Malebranche, Paris: Ingold, 1886; Geneva: Slatkin Reprints, 1970.
  • Arnauld, A., Des vrayes et des fausses idées, 1683; On True and False Ideas, E. J. Kremer (trans.), Lewiston: The Edwin Mellen Press, 1990.
  • Fontenelle, B. de le B. de, Œuvres complètes (9 volumes), A. Niderst (ed.), Paris: Fayard, 1989–2001.
  • Foucher, S., Critique de la recherche de la verité, Paris: Coustelier, 1675; reprinted, R. A. Watson (ed.), New York: Johnson Reprint, 1969.

Bibliographical Sources

  • Easton, P., Lennon, T. M., and Sebba, G., 1992, Bibliographia Malebranchiana: A Critical Guide to the Malebranche Literature into 1989, Carbondale and Edwardsville: Southern Illinois Press.
  • Sebba, G., 1959, Nicolas Malebranche, 1638–1715: A Preliminary Bibliography, Athens: University of Georgia Press.

Recommended Secondary Literature

  • Alquié, F., 1974, Le cartésianisme de Malebranche, Paris: J. Vrin.
  • Bardout, J.-C., 1999, Malebranche et la métaphysique, Paris: Presses Universitaires de France.
  • –––, 2000, La vertu de la philosophie: Essai sur la morale de Malebranche, Hildesheim: Georg Olms Verlag.
  • Barry, G., 2015, “Cartesian Modes and the Simplicity of Mind,” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, 96: 54–76.
  • Black, A. G., 1997, “Malebranche’s Theodicy,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 35: 27–44.
  • Brown, S., 1991, Nicolas Malebranche: His Philosophical Critics and Successors, Assen: Van Gorcum.
  • Chappell, V. (ed.), 1992, Nicholas Malebranche, New York: Garland.
  • Connell, D., 1967, The Vision in God: Malebranche’s Scholastic Sources, Louvain: Nauwelaerts.
  • Detlefsen, K., 2014, “Biology and Theology in Malebranche’s Theory of Organic Generation,” in The Life Sciences in Early Modern Philosophy, O. Nachtomy and J. E. H. Smith (eds.), 137–56, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Downing, L., 2005, “Occasionalism and Strict Mechanism: Malebranche, Berkeley, Fontenelle,” in Early Modern Philosophy: Mind, Matter, and Metaphysics, C. Mercer and E. O’Neill (eds.), 206–30, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2014, “Erficient Causation in Malebranche and Berkeley,” in Efficient Causation: A History, T. M. Schmaltz (ed.), 198–230, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Dreyfus, G., 1958, La volonté selon Malebranche, Paris: J. Vrin.
  • Fisher, A. R. J., 2011, “Causal and Logical Necessity in Malebranche’s Occasionalism,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 41(4): 523–48.
  • Gouhier, H., 1926, La Vocation de Malebranche, Paris: J. Vrin.
  • –––, 1948, La philosophie de Malebranche, Paris:J. Vrin.
  • Greenberg, S., 2008, “Things that Undermine Each Other: Occasionalism, Freedom, and Attention in Malebranche,” Oxford Studies in Early Modern Philosophy, 4: 113–40.
  • –––, 2010, “Malebranche on the Passions: Biology, Morality and the Fall,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 18: 191–207.
  • –––, 2015, “Occasionalism, Human Freedom, and Consent in Malebranche: ‘Things that Undermine Each Other’?” Oxford Studies in Early Modern Philosophy, 7: 151–86.
  • Gueroult, M., 1939, Etendue et psychologie chez Malebranche, Paris: Les Belles Lettres. 2nd ed., Paris: J. Vrin, 1987.
  • –––, 1955–59, Malebranche, (3 vols.). Paris: Aubier.
  • Jolley, N., 1990, The Light of the Soul: Theories of Ideas in Leibniz, Malebranche, and Descartes, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • –––, 2002, “Occasionalism and Efficacious Laws in Malebranche,” Midwest Studies in Philosophy, 26: 245–57.
  • Kremer, E. J., 2000, “Malebranche on Human Freedom,” in Nadler (2000), 190–219.
  • Laporte, J., 1951, “La liberté selon Malebranche,” in Études d’Histoire de la philosophie française au XVIIe siècle, 193–248. Paris: J. Vrin.
  • Lee, S., 2007, “Passive Natures and No Representations: Malebranche’s Two ‘Local’ Arguments for Occasionalism,” Harvard Review of Philosophy, 15: 72–91.
  • –––, 2008, “Necessary Connections and Continuous Creation: Malebranche’s Two Arguments for Occasionalism,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 46: 539–65.
  • LoLordo, A., 2005, “Descartes and Malebranche on Thought, Sensation and the Nature of Mind,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 43: 387–402.
  • McCracken, C., 1983, Malebranche and British Philosophy, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Montcheuil, Y. de., 1946, Malebranche et le quiétisme, Paris: Aubier.
  • Moreau, D., 1999, Deux cartésiens: La polemique entre Antoine Arnauld et Nicolas Malebranche, Paris: J. Vrin.
  • Nadler, S., 1992, Malebranche and Ideas, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 1993, “Occasionalism and General Will in Malebranche,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 31: 31–47; reprinted, with a postscript, in Nadler (2011), 48–73.
  • –––, 2011, Occasionalism: Causation Among the Cartesians, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Nadler, S. (ed.), 2000, The Cambridge Companion to Malebranche, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Nolan, L., 2012, “Malebranche on Sensory Cognition and ‘Seeing As’,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 50: 21–52.
  • Nolan, L., and J. Whipple, 2005, “Self Knowledge in Descartes and Malebranche,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 43: 55–81.
  • Ott, W., 2008, “Causation, Intentionality, and the Case for Occasionalism,” Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie, 90: 165–87.
  • –––, 2017, Descartes, Malebranche, and the Crisis of Perception, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Pellegrin, M.-F., 2006, Le Système de la loi de Nicolas Malebranche, Paris: J. Vrin.
  • Peppers-Bates, S., 2009, Nicolas Malebranche: Freedom in an Occasionalist World, New York: Continuum.
  • Perler, D. and U. Rudolph., 2000, Occasionalismus: Theorien der Kausalität in arabisch-islamischen und im europäischen Denken, Göttingen: Vandenhoeck & Ruprecht.
  • Pessin, A., 2001, “Malebranche’s Distinction Between General and Particular Volitions,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 39: 77–99.
  • Priarolo, M., 2017, “Universals and Individuals in Malebranche’s Philosophy,” in The Problem of Universals in Early Modern Philosophy, S. Di Bella and T. M. Schmaltz (eds.), 142–165, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Prost, J., 1907, Essai sur l’atomisme et l’occasionalisme dans la philosophie Cartésienne, Paris: J. Vrin.
  • Pyle, A., 2003, Malebranche, London: Routledge.
  • Radner, D., 1978, Malebranche: A Study of a Cartesian System, Assen: Van Gorcum.
  • Reid, J., 2003, “Malebranche on Intelligible Extension,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 11: 581–608.
  • –––, 2015, “Henry More and Nicolas Malebranche’s Critiques of Spinoza,” European Journal of Philosophy, 23: 764–92.
  • Robinet, A., 1955, Malebranche et Leibniz: Relations personelles, Paris: J. Vrin.
  • –––, 1965, Système et existence dans l’œuvre de Malebranche, Paris: J. Vrin.
  • Rodis-Lewis, G., 1963, Nicolas Malebranche, Paris: Presses Universitaires de France.
  • Rozemond, M., 2016, “Descartes, Malebranche and Leibniz: Conceptions of Substance in Arguments for the Immateriality of the Soul,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 24: 836–57.
  • Schmaltz, T. M., 1996, Malebranche’s Theory of the Soul: A Cartesian Interpretation, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2003, “Cartesian Causation: Body-Body Interaction, Motion, and Eternal Truths,” Studies in History and Philosophy of Science, 34: 373–62.
  • –––, 2005, “Malebranche on Natural and Free Loves,” in The Concept of Love in Seventeenth and Eighteenth Century Philosophy, G. Boros, H. De Dijn, and M. Moors (eds.), 41–52. Brussels: KVAB.
  • –––, 2008, “Occasionalism and Mechanism: Fontenelle’s Objections to Malebranche,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 16: 293–313.
  • –––, 2010, “Malebranche and Leibniz on the Best of All Possible Worlds,” Southern Journal of Philosophy, 48: 28–48.
  • –––, 2015, “The Metaphysics of Rest in Descartes and Malebranche,” Res Philosophica, 92: 21–40.
  • Stencil, E., 2011, “Malebranche and the General Will of God,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 19: 1107–29.
  • Walsh, J., 2011, “Malebranche, Freedom, and the Divided Mind,” in Gods and Giants in Early Modern Philosophy, P. Easton and K. Smith (eds.), 194–216, Toronto: University of Toronto Press.
  • Walsh, J., and T. Lennon., 2012, “Malebranche, the Quietists, and Freedom,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 20: 69–108.
  • Walsh, J., and E. Stencil, 2016,“Malebranche on the Metaphysics of Particular Volitions,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 54: 227–55.
  • Walton, C., 1972, De la Recherche du Bien: A Study of Malebranche’s Science of Ethics, The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff.

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