Supplement to Counterfactuals

B. Formal Constraints on Similarity

In addition to the limit assumption, here is a list of the formal constraints on similarity that have been proposed, where \(p,q\subseteq W\) and \(w\in W\):

(a) \(f(w,p)\subseteq p\) success
(b) \(f(w,p)=\{w\}\), if \(w\in p\) strong centering
(c) \(f(w,p)\subseteq q\) & \(f(w,q)\subseteq p \; {\Longrightarrow}\; f(w,p)=f(w,q)\) uniformity
(d) \(f(w,p)\) contains at most one world uniqueness

Table 5: Candidate Constraints on Selection Functions

While success is discussed in the main entry, (b)–(d) are discussed below, followed by the limit assumption.

B.1 Strong Centering

Strong centering is motivated, in part, by the intuitive concept of similarity: if w is already a p-world, then the p-world most similar to w is w itself. But logical concerns also motivate its inclusion. Something in the vicinity of strong centering is needed to validate modus ponens \((\phi>\psi,\phi\vDash\psi)\), which underwrites reasoning like (59).

  • (59) a. If George were caught, he would face years of prison.
  • b. Actually, George did get caught.
  • c. In that case, he must be facing years of prison.

Similarly, strong centering validates the principle that a subjunctive conditional is false if its antecedent is true and consequent false: \(\phi\land\neg\psi\vDash\neg(\phi>\psi)\). However, weak centering would suffice for both: \(w\in f(w,p)\) if \(w\in p\). The difference is that strong centering, but not weak centering, validates:

  • Conjunction Conditionalization \(\phi\land\psi\vDash\phi>\psi\)

This principle was only meekly promoted by D. Lewis (1973b: §1.7, and has attracted objections leading some to adopt a similarity analysis with only weak centering (e.g., J. Bennett 1974: 387–8). However, Walters and Williams (2013) provide a very thorough defense of Conjunction Conditionalization and offer a helpful survey of the objections to it.

B.2 Uniformity

The constraint uniformity is somewhat more difficult to state intuitively.[52] But its primary purpose is to validate SSE (Stalnaker 1984: 130), which allows one to substitute subjunctive equivalents in the antecedent position. It also bears noting that limited forms of Transitivity and Antecedent Strengthening follow directly from SSE:[53]

  • Substitution of Subjunctive Equivalents (SSE) \(\phi_1>\phi_2,\phi_2>\phi_1,\phi_1>\psi\vDash \phi_2>\psi\)
  • Limited Transitivity (LT) \(\phi_1>\phi_2,(\phi_1\land\phi_2)>\psi\vDash \phi_1>\psi\)
  • Limited Antecedent Strengthening (LAS) \(\phi_1>\phi_2,\neg(\phi_1>\neg\psi)\vDash(\phi_1\land\phi_2)>\psi\)

The intuitive appeal of SSE is fairly clear:

  • (60) a. If Simone had drummed, Jean-Paul would have danced.
  • b. If Jean-Paul had danced, Simone would have drummed.
  • c. If Simone had drummed, Claude would have stayed for another drink.
  • d. So, if Jean-Paul had danced, Claude would have stayed for another drink.

LT and LAS are also important since they provide one way the similarity analysis could explain the fact that some instances of Transitivity and Antecedent Strengthening sound compelling. If the similarity theorist can motivate the claim that the premises of these instances are being interpreted in the manner of LAS rather than Antecedent Strengthening, then these cases can be explained.

Pollock (1976, 1981: 254) rejects uniformity and endorses an even weaker logic. Pollock (1981: 254) does so on the basis of a counterexample to LAS. In the example, there is a circuit where three switches (\(S_1,S_2,S_3\)) control two lights (\(L_1,L_2\)). \(L_1\) comes on either when \(S_1\) is up or when \(S_2\) and \(S_3\) are both up. \(L_2\) comes on when \(S_1\) is up or when \(S_2\) is up. (\(S_3\) is not connected to \(L_2\) in any way.) Now suppose that all three switches are down and both lights are off. Both (61a) and (61b) are intuitively true. What about (61c)?

  • (61) a. \(S_3\) would (still) be down if \(L_2\) were on.
    \(\mathsf{L_2>\neg S_3}\)
  • b. It's not true that if \(L_2\) were on, \(L_1\) would be off. (\(L_2\) might be on because \(S_1\) is up.)
    \(\mathsf{\neg(L_2>\neg L_1)}\)
  • c. \(L_1\) would be on if \(L_2\) were on and \(S_3\) were down.
    \(\mathsf{(L_2\land \neg S_3)>L_1}\)

\(S_3\) would (still) be down if \(L_2\) and \(L_1\) were on. Pollock (1981) contends that (61c) makes the wrong prediction in a scenario where \(S_1\) and \(S_3\) stay down but \(S_2\) is flipped up. Then \(L_2\) will be on and \(S_3\) will be down, but \(L_1\) will be off. Pollock (1981: §2) maintains that this failure of uniformity motivates an account in terms of minimal change instead of one in terms of maximal similarity. This counterexample has received little attention, perhaps because it is sufficiently complex to make intuitions less clear. It is also worth noting that rejecting uniformity makes it harder to explain why some instances of antecedent monotonic patterns sound compelling.

B.3 Uniqueness

According to uniqueness, there is always a unique most similar \(\phi\)-world when evaluating \(\phi>\psi\). For such a simple principle, uniqueness has stimulated a surprisingly complex debate, beginning with Stalnaker’s (1968: 46) endorsement and Lewis’ (1973b: §3.4) rejection of it. This debate centers on two issues: the fact that uniqueness (together with the limit assumption discussed below) entails Conditional Excluded Middle and the fact that uniqueness impacts one’s analysis of subjunctive conditionals containing might in the consequent. Consider first Conditional Excluded Middle and two consequences, CN and CD:[54]

  • Conditional Excluded Middle (CEM)
    \(\vDash (\phi>\psi)\lor(\phi>\neg\psi)\)
  • Conditional Negation (CN)
    \({\Diamond}\phi\land\neg(\phi>\psi)\,\leftmodels\vDash {\Diamond}\phi\land\phi>\neg\psi\)
  • Consequent Distribution (CD)

Uniqueness leads to CEM, since if there is a unique most similar \(\phi\)-world it is either a \(\psi\)-world—in which case the left disjunct is true—or it is a \(\neg\psi\)-world—in which case the right disjunct is true. A natural concern, voiced by D. Lewis (1973b: §3.4), is that there might be a tie among a \(\psi\)-world and a \(\neg\psi\)-world for being the most similar \(\phi\)-world.

Consider the antecedent If I were older... What is my age in the unique most similar world where I am older? One might be tempted to deny both (62a) and (62b), instead affirming (62c).

  • (62) a. If I were older, I would be 35.
  • b. If I were older, I wouldn't be 35.
  • c. If I were older, I might be 35. And, if I were older, I might not be 35.

It seems appealing that all worlds where I am older than my present age, say 32, are tied. The advocate of uniqueness has two problems here. First, they cannot deny both (62a) and (62b), since by CEM at least one of them is true. Second, it is unclear what they can say about the meaning of (62c). It is tempting to say, as D. Lewis (1973b: §1.5) does, that a might subjunctive is true when some of the most similar antecedent worlds are consequent worlds. But if there is a unique most similar antecedent world, the difference between requiring all for would subjunctives and some for might subjunctives collapses.

Stalnaker (1980, 1984: Ch.7) responds to both challenges. He begins by highlighting favorable data for CEM, contending, as D. Lewis (1973b: §3.4) grants, that (63c) sounds inconsistent with (63a) and (63b).

  • (63) a. It's not true that if I were older, I would be 35.
  • b. And, it's not true that if I were older, I wouldn't be 35.
    \(\mathsf{\neg(O>\neg T)}\)
  • c. But, if I were older, I either would or would not be 35.
    \(\mathsf{\neg(O>(T\lor\neg T))}\)

But (63c) is only inconsistent with (63a) and (63b) when CEM is assumed. This is easy to see from the fact that CEM entails CD, and by CD (63c) entails \(\mathsf{(O>T)\lor(O>\neg T)}\), which is clearly inconsistent with (63a) and (63b). And, yet, CEM also conflicts with our intuition that (63a) and (63b) are consistent with each other. Stalnaker (1980, 1984: Ch. 7) proposes to treat such cases as vagueness in the similarity of worlds, on par with the vagueness of color gradients where one might be tempted to deny both that a certain patch is red and that it is not red. The basic idea is that there is indeterminacy in the selection function being used and under one resolution (63a) is true while under another (63b) is true. Stalnaker (1980, 1984: Ch.7) sketches a view along these lines using the supervaluational Fraassen (1966) approach to vagueness. The remaining challenge, then, is to formulate an approach to might subjunctives like (62c) which is compatible with uniqueness. Stalnaker (1980, 1984: Ch.7) develops just such an account.

For the advocate of uniqueness, it is difficult to treat might subjunctives as involving a subjunctive conditional whose consequent is an existentially quantified modal. Since the antecedent delivers a single most similar world, it is not possible to truth-conditionally distinguish a universal from an existential quantifier over the antecedent worlds. Thus, a might or could and a would will come to the same thing.[55] As a result, Stalnaker (1980, 1984: Ch.7) pursues an analysis where might takes scope over the entire subjunctive conditional and expresses a kind of epistemic possibility. Stalnaker (1984: 43–44) motivates this by observing that (64b) seems equivalent to (64a).

  • (64) a. If John had been invited, he might have come to the party.
  • b. It might be that if John had been invited, he would have come to the party.

Stalnaker (1984: 144–146) goes on to present examples to support this analysis and compare it favorably with Lewis’ (1973b: §1.5).

The debate regarding CEM has continued to attract arguments on each side. Bennett (2003: §§72,73,76) presents a sustained critique of CEM, while Williams (2010) responds on its behalf. Fintel and Iatridou (2002) examine quantified conditionals and suggest that a semantics which validates CEM is needed. Klinedinst (2011) develops this argument further against intervening disputes. Swanson (2012) shows that the supervaluationist approach can also be applied to handle failures of the limit assumption, thereby allowing for a theory that validates CEM despite having mechanisms for treating failures of both uniqueness and the limit assumption.

There is another issue raised by the discussion of might conditionals which has attracted much attention. There is an imperfect match between the representation language being used and English. The connective “\(>\)” builds in would, and might subjunctives contain no would. Rather than being analyzed as a might scoping over a would conditional Stalnaker 1980, 1984: Ch.7) or a distinct conditional connective (D. Lewis 1973b: §1.5), it would be more accurate to have an analysis that separates the contribution of conditionals in general from the modals that interact with them. This is not an idle linguistic issue. Neither (Stalnaker 1984: Ch.7) nor (D. Lewis 1973b: §1.5) can capture examples like (65).

  • (65)If John had come to the party, he would have had a drink and he might have liked it.

Scoping the might over the conditional would erase the crucial distinction made in the consequent: John definitely would have had a drink, but there’s only a chance that he would have liked it.[56] These issues can only be addressed by a more serious engagement with the research discussed in the supplement Indicative and Subjunctive Conditionals, especially Kratzer’s (1981a, 1991) general approach to modality and conditionals.

B.4 The Limit Assumption

The basic idea of the limit assumption is that there is are most similar antecedent worlds:

  • Limit Assumption As one proceeds to \(\phi\)-worlds more and more similar to w, one hits a limit and cannot get to a \(\phi\)-world any more similar to w.

While Stalnaker (1968, 1980) accepts this assumption, D. Lewis (1973b: 20) rejects it. D. Lewis (1973b: 20) provides the following rationale. Consider this 1 inch line:


Suppose, counterfactually, that this line were more than an inch long. How long is it in the world most similar to our own? For any length of line and corresponding world \(1+x\), there is a real number \(y<x\) such that the line is \(1+y\) in some other world. This other world is yet more similar to our own, since the line is closer to its actual length. D. Lewis (1973b: 20) grants that this is not a decisive objection, but suggests that it is better to formulate a theory of counterfactuals which does not essentially depend on the limit assumption to operate. D. Lewis (1973c: 423–4) prefers an analysis according to which \(\phi>\psi\) is true in w just in case some \(\phi\land\psi\)-world is more similar to w than any \(\phi\land\neg\psi\)-world, if there are any \(\phi\)-worlds. This analysis can be formalized in terms of a three-place comparative similarity relation over worlds that is subject to constraints analogous to those devised for selection functions (D. Lewis 1973b: §2.3).

Stalnaker (1980, 1984: 141–142) replies that in most contexts not every minute difference will count towards the similarity of antecedent worlds. Stalnaker (1968) and D. Lewis (1973b) share the commitment that the respects which matter for similarity are radically context-sensitive. Thus, in cases like the line, they both seem to agree that there will be a threshold below which differences don’t matter. Stalnaker 1980, 1984: 141–142) contends that this threshold provides the limit needed to safely make the limit assumption. In the context of the line, the threshold is likely the smallest unit of measure which people can be assumed to care about, e.g., a millimeter. As for contexts where every difference matters, Stalnaker (1984: 141–142) says that it is inappropriate to use imprecise antecedents like if this line were more than an inch long, much as it is inappropriate to use a definite description like the shortest lines longer than an inch. If correct, this response eliminates the need to countenance failures of the limit assumption. However, Swanson (2012) shows that even if one must countenance such failures, there is a supervaluationist method—extending considerably Stalnaker’s (1980)—for treating them within a theory that makes the limit assumption.

Pollock (1976: 20) and Herzberger (1979) also highlight one advantage of making the limit assumption. All theories on offer agree that if \(\phi_1>\phi_2\) is true and \(\phi_2\vDash\psi\) then \(\phi_1>\psi\) is true. And, they agree that if \(\phi_1>\phi_2,{\ldots},\phi_1>\phi_n\) are true and \(\phi_2,{\ldots},\phi_n\vDash\psi\) then \(\phi_1>\psi\) is true. But what about the more general version: where \(\Gamma={\{\phi_2,\phi_3,{\ldots}\}}\), if \(\phi_1>\phi_2,\phi_1>\phi_3,{\ldots}\) are true and \(\Gamma\vDash\psi\) then \(\phi_1>\psi\) is true? The more general version only holds when the limit assumption is made. The appeal of this general consequence principle, plus the above resources, mean that the limit assumption is often safely made in discussion of counterfactuals. If for nothing else, this assumption often simplifies already complex formal definitions. However, Kaufmann (2017) demonstrated a rather important caveat: formalizing the Limit Assumption reveals it to be not one assumption, but a family of assumptions which must be stated differently depending on other features of the formalization. While the formulations of it given in D. Lewis (1973b) are accurate given certain assumptions about the underlying ordering relations, different formulations are required when those assumptions are changed.

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