Theories of Criminal Law
[Editor's Note: The following new entry by James Edwards replaces the former entry on this topic by the previous author.]
Any theory of criminal law must explain why criminal law is distinctive—why it is a body of law worthy of separate attention. This entry begins by identifying features of criminal law that make this so (§1). It then asks what functions that body of law fulfills (§2), and what justifies its creation and continued existence (§3). If criminal law should be retained, we must consider its proper limits (§4). We must consider the conditions under which agents should be criminally responsible for whatever falls within those limits (§5). And we must ask which rules of procedure and evidence should govern efforts to establish criminal responsibility (§6). The focus of this entry is Anglo-American criminal law and scholarship thereon. Many of the questions raised, and many of the answers considered, are nonetheless of general application.
- 1. Features of Criminal Law
- 2. Functions of Criminal Law
- 3. Justifications of Criminal Law
- 4. The Limits of Criminal Law
- 5. Criminal Responsibility
- 6. Criminal Procedure and Evidence
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1. Features of Criminal Law
The life of the criminal law begins with criminalization. To criminalize an act-type—call it \(\phi\)ing—is to make it a crime to commit tokens of that type. Many claim that if it is a crime to \(\phi\) then \(\phi\)ing is legally wrongful—it is something that, in the eyes of the law, ought not to be done (Hart 1994, 27; Gardner 2007, 239; Tadros 2016, 91). On this view, we are not invited to commit crimes—like murder, or driving uninsured—just as long as we willingly take the prescribed legal consequences. As far as the law is concerned, criminal conduct is to be avoided. This is so whether or not we are willing to take the consequences.
It is possible to imagine a world in which the law gets its way—in which people uniformly refrain from criminal conduct. Obviously enough this is not the world in which we live. Imagine \(D\) is about to \(\phi\). If \(\phi\)ing is a crime, reasonable force may permissibly be used to prevent \(D\) \(\phi\)ing. Police officers and private persons alike have powers to arrest \(D\), and reasonable force may permissibly be used to make arrests effective.
These powers and permissions exist ex ante—prior, that is, to the commission of crime. We can add those that exist ex post—once crime has been committed. Imagine now that \(D\) has \(\phi\)ed. As well as the power to arrest \(D\), the criminal law confers a set of investigative powers designed to help generate evidence of \(D\)’s criminality: these include powers to stop and search, to carry out surveillance, and to detain suspects for questioning. If sufficient evidence is produced, and it is in the public interest to do so, \(D\) may be charged with a crime. To exercise these powers is to impose new duties on \(D\)—\(D\) must submit to the search, remain in detention, and turn up in court when required. For \(D\) to do otherwise—absent justification or excuse—is itself criminal. So reasonable force can permissibly be used against \(D\) if she refuses to co-operate.
The powers and permissions mentioned so far help \(D\)’s accusers put together their case against \(D\). By the time cases reach the courts those accusers are typically state officials (or those to whom the state has delegated official power). Some legal systems do make space for private prosecutions. But such prosecutions can be discontinued or taken over by state officials (and their delegates). Those officials (and delegates) can also continue proceedings in the face of private opposition, even when the opposition comes from those wronged by \(D\). In this way, the state exercises a form of control over criminal proceedings that is absent from legal proceedings of other kinds (Marshall and Duff 1998).
It may seem from the above that criminal proceedings are tilted heavily in favour of the accusing side. But the criminal law also confers rights on the accused that help protect \(D\) against her accusers (Ashworth and Zedner 2010, 82). These typically include the right to be informed of the accusations in question, the right to confidential access to a lawyer, and the privilege against self-incrimination. Most important of all, perhaps, is the right to be tried before an independent court that respects the presumption of innocence—that requires the prosecution to prove beyond a reasonable doubt that \(D\) committed the crime.
At least on paper, the procedural protections on offer in criminal proceedings are more robust than those available to the accused in legal proceedings of other kinds. This is explained in large part by the consequences of criminal conviction. If \(D\) is found guilty in a criminal court, \(D\) gains a criminal record. Depending on the crime, \(D\) may be disenfranchised, banned from certain professions, refused entry to other countries, and declined access to insurance, housing, and education (Hoskins 2014; 2016). This is to say nothing of criminal sentences themselves. Those sentences are typically punishments: the object of the exercise is that \(D\) suffer some harm or deprivation; \(D\) is to be made worse off than she otherwise would have been. This is not to say that suffering or deprivation must be the ultimate end of those who punish. That \(D\) suffer or lose out may be a means to any number of ultimate ends, including deterrence, restoration, or rehabilitation. What it cannot be is a mere side-effect. This is one thing that distinguishes criminal sentences—at least of the punitive kind—from the reparative remedies that are standard fare in civil law. Those remedies are designed to benefit \(P\)—to wipe out losses the plaintiff suffered in virtue of the defendant’s wrong. True, \(D\) often loses in the process of ensuring that \(P\) gains. But we can imagine cases in which this is not so: in which an award of damages leaves \(D\) no worse off than \(D\) was before. The award may remain a reparative success. It cannot be anything other than a punitive failure (Boonin 2008, 12–17; Gardner 2013).
We can now see that criminalizing \(\phi\)ing does much more than make \(\phi\)ing a legal wrong. It also makes it the case that \(\phi\)ing triggers a set of legal rights, duties, powers, and permissions, the existence of which distinguishes criminal law from the rest of the legal system. Those rights, duties, powers, and permissions are constitutive of a criminal process via which suspected \(\phi\)ing turns into arrest, charge, trial, conviction, and punishment. Obviously suspicions are sometimes misplaced. Innocent people’s lives are sometimes ruined in consequence. So it is no surprise that the most destructive powers and permissions are jealously guarded by the criminal law. Trials held in a university’s moot court might be meticulously fair to defendants. But a moot court has no power to detain us in advance, to require us to appear before it, or to sentence us to imprisonment. Force used to achieve any of these things would itself be criminal, however proportionate the resulting punishment might be. As this example shows, criminal law is characterised by an asymmetry—it bestows powers and permissions on state officials (and delegates) which are withheld from private persons, such that the latter are condemned as vigilantes for doing what the former lawfully do (Thorburn 2011a, 92–93; Edwards forthcoming). This remains the case—often to the great frustration of victims and their supporters—even if the official response, assuming it comes at all, will be woefully inadequate.
2. Functions of Criminal Law
Few deny that one function of criminal law is to deliver justified punishment. Some go further and claim that this is the sole function of criminal law (Moore 1997, 28–29). Call this the punitive view. Rules of criminal procedure and evidence, on this view, help facilitate the imposition of justified punishment, while keeping the risk of unjustified punishment within acceptable bounds. Rules of substantive criminal law help give potential offenders fair warning that they may be punished. Both sets of rules combat objections we might otherwise make to laws that authorize the intentional imposition of harm. To combat objections, of course, is not itself to make a positive case for such laws. That case, on the punitive view, is made by the justified punishments that criminal courts impose. This is not to say anything about what the justification of punishment is. It is merely to say that criminal law is to be justified in punitive terms.
Some object that this focus on punishment is misplaced. The central function criminal law fulfills in responding to crime, some say, is that of calling suspected offenders to account in criminal courts (Gardner 2007, 80; Duff 2010c, 16). This view puts the criminal trial at the centre, not just of criminal proceedings, but of criminal law as a whole (Duff 2013a, 196). Trials invite defendants to account for themselves either by denying the accusation that they offended, or by pleading a defence. The prospect of conviction and punishment puts defendants under pressure to offer an adequate account. Call this the curial view. It differs from the punitive view in two ways. First, part of the positive case for criminal law is independent of the imposition of punishment. Second, part of the positive case for imposing criminal punishment is dependent on the punishment being part of a process of calling to account. The following two paragraphs expand on both these claims.
As to the first, we often have reason to account for our actions to others. We can leave open for now the precise conditions under which this is so. But it is plausible to think that if Alisha steals from Bintu she has reason for account for the theft, and that if Chika intentionally kills Dawn she has reason to account for the killing. Defenders of the curial view argue that criminal proceedings are of intrinsic value when defendants (are called to) offer accounts of themselves that they have reason to offer in criminal courts (Gardner 2007, 190–191; Duff 2010c, 15–17). Imagine Alisha stole from Bintu because she was under duress. Imagine Chika intentionally killed Dawn to defend herself or others. Neither of these defendants, we can assume, is justifiably punished. On the punitive view, criminal law’s function does not stand to be fulfilled. On the curial view, things are different. Alisha and Chika both have reason to account for their behaviour—to explain what they did and why they did it. Criminal proceedings invite each to provide that account and put each under pressure to do so. Assuming Alisha and Chika have reason to account in a criminal court, proceedings in which they (are called to) do so are of intrinsic value. One of criminal law’s functions is fulfilled even if no-one is, or should be, punished.
To endorse the curial view is not, of course, to say that we should do away with criminal punishment. But it is to say that the connection between trial and punishment is not merely instrumental. Some think that the facts that make punishment fitting—say, culpable wrongdoing—obtain independently of criminal proceedings themselves (Moore 1997, 33). We use those proceedings to ensure that said facts are highly likely to have obtained—that \(D\) is highly likely to have culpably committed a wrong. On the curial view, the fact that \(D\) has been tried and found guilty (or has entered a guilty plea) is itself part of what makes it fitting that \(D\) is punished. The fitting way to respond to criminal wrongdoing, on this view, is to call the wrongdoer to account for her wrong. To call \(D\) to account is to attempt to both (a) get \(D\) to answer for wrongdoing (as occurs in court), and (b) get \(D\) to confront wrongdoing for which she has no satisfactory answer (as occurs when \(D\) is punished). So it is only because \(D\) has first been tried and found guilty (or has entered a guilty plea) that punishment counts as a fitting response to \(D\)’s wrong (Gardner 2007, 80; Duff 2013a, 205). We can see the implications of this view by imagining a world in which trials are abolished, because some new-fangled machine allows us to identify culpable wrongdoers with perfect accuracy. Having no doubt that \(D\) is guilty, we simply impose punishment on \(D\). On the curial view, the punishments we impose are inherently defective: they are not imposed as part of a process of calling to account. Though our new-fangled machine might justify doing away with trials—once we factor in how expensive they can be—we would lose something of value in doing away with them.
If criminal law does have a particular function, we can ask whether that function is distinctive of criminal law. We can ask, in other words, whether it helps distinguish criminal law from the rest of the legal system. It has been claimed that criminal law is distinctive in imposing punishment (Moore 1997, 18–30; Husak 2008, 72). One might also claim that criminal law alone calls defendants to account. But punishments are imposed in civil proceedings—exemplary damages are the obvious case. And it is arguable that civil proceedings also call defendants to account—that they too invite defendants to offer a denial or plead a defence; that they too use the prospect of legal liability to put defendants under pressure to account adequately (Duff 2014a).
In response, one might try to refine the function that is distinctive of criminal law. Perhaps criminal law’s function is to respond to public wrongs (whether by calling to account or punishing such wrongdoers), whereas the function of civil law is to respond to private wrongs. What we should make of this proposal depends on what a public wrong is (Lamond 2007; Lee 2015; Edwards and Simester 2017). To make progress, we can distinguish between primary duties—like duties not to rape or rob—and secondary duties—like duties to answer, or suffer punishment, for rape or robbery. We incur duties of the latter kind by breaching duties of the former.
If the public/private distinction is cashed out in terms of primary duties, then responding to public wrongs cannot be distinctive of criminal law. Many wrongs are both crimes and torts. So the two bodies of law often respond to breaches of the same primary duty. A more promising proposal looks to secondary duties. Perhaps criminal law’s distinctive function is to respond to wrongs on behalf of us all—to discharge secondary duties owed to the community as a whole (Duff 2011, 140). Perhaps the function of civil law is to respond to wrongs on behalf of some of us—to discharge secondary duties owed to particular individuals. This might be thought to explain why criminal proceedings, unlike civil proceedings, are controlled by state officials: why officials can initiate proceedings that individual victims oppose, and discontinue proceedings that victims initiate.
The view described in the previous paragraph conceives of criminal law as an instrument of the community—a way of ensuring that the community gets what it is owed from wrongdoers. Call it the communitarian view. If we combine this with the curial view, the distinctive function of criminal law is to seek answers owed to the community as a whole. One might doubt that the functions of criminal and civil law can be so neatly distinguished. It is arguable that civil law sometimes responds to wrongs on behalf of all of us—civil proceedings can be brought against \(D\) on the basis that her conduct is a nuisance to the public at large, or on the basis that \(D\) is a public official whose conduct is an abuse of power. More importantly, one might claim that in the case of paradigmatic crimes—like robbery, rape, or battery—criminal law responds to wrongs on behalf of particular individuals—on behalf of those who have been robbed, raped, or battered. On this view, a positive case for criminalization need not await the finding that \(D\) owes something to the whole community. It is at least sometimes enough that \(D\) owes something to those \(D\) has wronged, which \(D\) would fail to provide in the absence of criminal proceedings.
Those who reject the communitarian view might be thought to face the following difficulty: they might be thought to lack an explanation of official control over how far criminal proceedings go. If criminal law seeks what is owed by wrongdoers to the wronged, doesn’t official control amount to theft of a conflict properly controlled by the two parties (Christie 1977)? Not necessarily. First, we should not always require the wronged to have to pursue those who have wronged them. Second, we should not always support those who think themselves wronged in pursuing alleged wrongdoers. As to the first point, some are trapped in abusive relationships with those who wrong them. Others are susceptible to manipulation that serves to silence their complaints. Some wrongdoers can use wealth and social status to stop accusers in their tracks. As to the second point, the temptation to retaliate in the face of wrongdoing is often great. It is all too easy for the pursuit of justice to become the pursuit of revenge, and for the perceived urgency of the pursuit to generate false accusations. Official control can help vulnerable individuals—like those described above—to get what they are owed. And it can mitigate the damage done by those trying to exact vengeance and settle scores (Gardner 2007, 214–216). It can ensure that those in positions of power cannot wrong others with impunity, and reduce the likelihood that vindictiveness begets retaliation, which begets violent conflict from which all lose out (Wellman 2005, 8–10). We can add that criminal proceedings may help protect others against being wronged in future. Those wronged may have a duty to give up control of proceedings in order to provide this protection (Tadros 2011c, 297–299).
These remarks suggest an alternative to the communitarian view. According to the alternative, the secondary duties of concern in civil and criminal proceedings are typically one and the same. The positive case for criminal law’s involvement is not that it discharges duties of interest to the criminal law alone, but that it enables duties of general interest to be discharged less imperfectly than they otherwise would be—than they would be if the criminal law took no interest in them. Call this the imperfectionist view. What is distinctive of criminal law, on this view, is not its function but its mode of functioning: the manner in which it fulfills functions shared with other bodies of law.
Some writers seek criminal law’s distinctiveness in a different place. What is distinctive about criminal law, they claim, is that it publicly censures or condemns. This expressive function is sometimes associated with criminal punishment (Husak 2008, 92–95). Because other bodies of law sometimes punish, and because punishment typically—perhaps necessarily—expresses censure (Feinberg 1970), the expressive function is at least partly shared. But the message sent by criminal law is not sent only at the sentencing stage. It is sent the moment a guilty verdict is reached by a criminal court—by the declaration that \(D\) has been criminally convicted (Simester 2005, 33–36). The social significance of conviction is very different to that of (say) the verdict that \(D\) is a tortfeasor: the former verdict conveys, in and of itself, that \(D\)’s conduct reflects badly on \(D\). Though additional detail may generate the same conclusion in the case of a civil verdict, such detail is not required in the case of criminal conviction. If this is right, the distinctiveness of criminal law turns out not to consist in the fact that it provides for punishment. It turns out to consist (at least in part) in the provision of a technique for condemning wrongdoers which does not require that we punish in order to condemn.
So far, we have focused on the functions criminal law fulfills in response to the commission of crime. It is plausible to think, however, that criminal law’s functions include preventing crime from occurring. We can see this by asking what success would look like for the criminal law. Would criminal law have succeeded if all thieves and murderers were tried and punished? Or would it have succeeded if there was no theft or murder, because criminalization resulted in would-be thieves and murderers refraining from such wrongs? Notice that to pose these two questions as alternatives is not to deny that punishment might be justified in preventive terms. It is rather to suggest that resorting to punishment to achieve prevention is already a partial failure for the criminal law. It is a failure to deter those who, ex hypothesi, have already committed criminal offences. Had the creation of those offences been an unqualified success, there would have been nothing for which to punish anyone.
One might hold that criminal law’s sole function is to prevent criminal wrongdoing. Call this the preventive view. Defenders of this view need not say that we should enact whatever laws will achieve the most prevention. That \(X\) is the function of \(Y\) does not entail that we are justified in doing whatever will achieve most of \(X\) with \(Y\). That cutting is the function of knives does not entail that knife-holders are justified in cutting whatever they see. Holders of the preventive view can, in other words, accept the existence of constraints on prevention, that are not themselves justified in preventive terms (Hart 1968, 35–50). What they cannot accept is a positive case for criminal law that is not preventive.
Some hold a mixed view that combines elements of those considered above (Alexander and Ferzan 2009, 3–19; Simester and von Hirsch 2011, 3–18; Tadros 2016, 159–172). One way to construct such a view is by distinguishing between primary and secondary functions. Primary functions are those that, when all else is equal, we have most reason to want the law to fulfil. Secondary functions are those we have reason to want the law to fulfil if it fails to fulfil its primary functions. Criminal law’s primary functions, it is plausible to think, are preventive. Ceteris paribus, we have most reason to want criminal law to bring about a world in which wrongs like theft or murder do not occur. Failing that, we have reason to want criminal law to call thieves and murderers to account, and to punish those who have no adequate account to offer.
There is some scepticism about mixed views. For some, the worries are conceptual. Moore claims that justified punishment must be imposed for reasons of desert, and that for this reason the punitive and preventive functions cannot be combined. We are unable to ‘kill two birds with the proverbial one stone, for by aiming at one of the birds we will necessarily miss the other’ (Moore 1997, 28). Several replies are available. First, even if this is a problem for a mixed view of punishment, it need not be for a mixed view of criminal law. Grant that punishment must be imposed for reasons of desert. It does not follow that criminal offences cannot be created for reasons of prevention. Criminalization and punishment are different acts, and can be performed for different reasons (Edwards and Simester 2014). Second, to claim that \(X\) is part of the positive case for criminal law—that it is one of criminal law’s functions—is not to claim that \(X\) should be part of the mission of every criminal justice official (Gardner 2007, 202). Reasons that help make a positive case for our actions are often reasons for which we should not act. That one will be financially secure is a reason to get married, but one should not get married in order to be financially secure. Similarly, to say that prevention helps make a positive case for criminal law—and for punishment—is not to say that judges should punish for that reason.
Other worries about mixed views are pragmatic (Duff 2010a). As criminal wrongdoing will persist whatever we do, the preventive function sets criminal law an insatiable goal. There is a standing risk that law-makers who pursue that goal will deprive us of a criminal law that fulfills its other functions. Consider again the curial view. Plausibly, we have reason to account for wrongs like theft and fraud in criminal court, but no reason to account for every interaction with property or all misleading statements from which we stand to gain. If defendants are to be called to account for the wrongs, it is these that must be criminalized. To criminalize trivialities—in pursuit of preventive ends—is to drain criminal proceedings of their intrinsic value (Duff 2010b). No doubt these are important worries. But they do nothing to suggest that we should reject a mixed view. At most, they show that law-makers also should not take prevention to be part of their mission. As we already saw, this conclusion does not show that prevention is not part of the positive case for criminal law. And it may anyway be too strong. Law-makers who exclude prevention from their mission may refuse to create crimes that would prevent a great deal of harm. The cost of refusing to create these crimes might be greater than the cost of calling people to account for trivialities, and this might be so even when alternative means of prevention are factored in. If it would, criminal law’s preventive function should be part of the law-making mission: it is a function law-makers should indeed aim to fulfil.
3. Justifications of Criminal Law
In light of the resources it consumes, and the damage it does to people’s lives, it is far from clear that we are justified in having criminal law. If we should not be abolitionists, criminal law must be capable of realizing some value that gives us sufficient reason to retain it. To offer an account of this value is to offer a general justification of criminal law. Obviously enough, the functions of criminal law tell us something about what this might be. If the punitive view is correct, criminal law’s value consists in delivering justified punishment. If the curial view is correct, that value consists (in part) in people offering answers that they have reason to offer. If the preventive view is correct, it consists in preventing criminal wrongs. So stated, however, these views do not tell us what the value of fulfilling each function actually is. The punitive view tells us nothing about what justifies criminal punishment. The curial view tells us nothing about the value of calling people to account in criminal courts. The preventive view tells us nothing about the value of preventing crime. A general justification of criminal law fills this explanatory gap.
We can make progress by distinguishing between value of different kinds. Some value is relational—it exists in virtue of relationships in which people stand. That a relationship has such value is a reason to do what will bring it into existence. The value of friendship is a reason to make friends. The value of egalitarian social relations is a reason to break down barriers of status and rank. Some argue that we have sufficient reason to have criminal law because it helps us enter a valuable relationship: it helps transform our relations with one another from relations of mutual dependence, to relations of independence from the power of others (Ripstein 2009, 300–324; Thorburn 2011a, 2011b).
This argument can be developed as follows. Just as slaves are dependent on their masters, so we are dependent on one another in the absence of a framework of legal rights: just as masters wrong their slaves, however well they treat them, so we are doomed to wrong one another if no such framework exists. To avoid this, we need more than just rights that exist on paper. We need sufficient assurance that our rights will be respected, and we need a mechanism by which their supremacy can be reasserted in the face of wilful violation. Criminal law’s value lies in giving us what we need. Criminal punishment amounts to reassertion. Crime prevention provides reassurance. At the level of function, this is what the last section called a mixed view. But the value of fulfilling both functions is one and the same: it is the value of securing our independence from one another, so we cease to relate to one another as master and slave, and begin to do so as independent beings. As it is often associated (rightly or wrongly) with Kant’s political philosophy, we can call this the Kantian view.
It is sometimes suggested that criminal law’s general justification is exhausted by its contribution to our independence. It is not clear why we should accept this claim. One source of doubt is the fact that some agents are unavoidably dependent—they lack the capacities required to live as independent beings. This is true of some non-human animals, and some of those with serious disabilities. Precisely because of the capacities they lack, these agents are especially vulnerable to being abused or exploited. Part of criminal law’s general justification is that it protects the vulnerable against such wrongs. Ex hypothesi, this does nothing to secure independence. So it is not something that can be accommodated by (the exhaustive form of) the Kantian view (Tadros 2011b).
For defenders of the Kantian view, criminal law’s value derives from a relationship it helps create. On another view, the value of criminal law derives from a relationship that pre-exists it: the relationship in which we stand as members of a political community (Duff 2011). Any such community has values in terms of which it is understood by its members. If this self-understanding is to be more than a charade, the community must actually value its defining values—it must do what those values are reasons to do. Imagine that life is one such value, and a member takes another’s life. Part of what it is for a community to value life is for it to respond to the taking: for the killer to be required to account to fellow members, thereby communicating the community’s judgment that the killing was wrong. Criminal law is a body of law that requires the accounting. Functionally, this is a version of the curial view. But the value of fulfilling that function is relational: it is the value of making the community one that is true to itself—one that does not betray the values in terms of which members understand what it is and who they are (Duff and Marshall 2010, 83–84). This line of thought lends support to what I earlier called the communitarian view. On that view, criminal proceedings discharge secondary duties owed to the community as a whole. That such duties are part and parcel of a valuable form of relationship helps explains why we should think that they exist.
One objection to the view described in the previous paragraph is that it is unduly conservative. What justifies criminalizing a wrong—on that view—is that the wrong has a pre-existing foothold in the defining values of the community: it is because of that foothold that failing to criminalize would be a form of self-betrayal. Some communities, however, are characterised by systematic neglect of important values—by patriarchy, or racism, or distributive inequality. When this is so, part of the justification for criminalization is not that it helps the community remain true to itself, but that it helps transform the community by reconstituting it in valuable ways (Dempsey 2009; 2011). One source of criminal law’s value, on this alternative view, is its ability to help alter social morality, such that neglected values come to be taken seriously by community members (Green 2013a). Where this is successful, criminal law can largely disappear from members’ motivational horizons: we come to refrain from conduct for the moral reasons that make it wrong, without reference to the fact that the conduct is criminal.
Both versions of the relational view—Kantian and communitarian—face another doubt. Imagine \(D\) robs \(V\). It is plausible to think that this wrong is of concern to the criminal law in its own right. It is plausible to think that whatever further effects it might have, preventing the wrong of murder itself helps justify criminalizing murder, and bringing criminal proceedings against murderers. On both the Kantian and communitarian views this is not the case. What justifies criminalizing wrongs, and bringing criminal proceedings against wrongdoers, is that this contributes to some larger social good—to the framework of legal rules we need for independence, or to the community remaining true to itself. We may reasonably doubt that wrongs like murder matter to the criminal law only for these further reasons. In claiming that this is why they matter, both versions of the relational view instrumentalize criminal law’s concern with wrongdoing: both hold that we have reason to prevent wrongs via the criminal law only because this is a means of establishing healthy relations in which all share.
The above remarks concern the kind of value that justifies having criminal law. We can also ask who is capable of realizing that value. On both the views sketched above, criminal law’s value is grounded in a relationship in which all stand. If that value is to be realised, someone must act on behalf of those who stand in the relationship. In most systems of criminal law, the job is done by the state—agents of the state create, apply, and enforce criminal laws. Some argue that in a legitimate system of criminal law this is the only possibility. Criminal law’s value, it is claimed, is essentially public—it is value that can only be realised, even in principle, by agents of the state. This view can be developed in a number of ways. Consider again the Kantian view. Some claim that coercion secures independence only if the coercer speaks for all those coerced. Otherwise it is just another independence violation. Only state agents can speak for all of us. So the enforcement of the criminal law must remain in their hands (Thorburn 2011a, 98–99). Defenders of the communitarian view tell a similar story. If the value of criminal proceedings is that they express the community’s judgment about wrongdoing, and if only state agents can convey our collective judgment, trials must be carried out, and punishments imposed, by those agents (Duff 2013a, 206). On both views, it is impossible for private persons to realise the values that justify criminal law. If these arguments go through, they have obvious implications for debates about the privatization of prison and police services (Dorfman and Harel 2016). They also offer us a sense in which criminal law theory must be political. It must face up to the question of whether there are essentially public goods, and ask what role they play in justifying the existence of criminal law (Harel 2014, 96–99).
Some find criminal law’s general justification in value that is neither relational nor essentially public. Consider the prevention of harm, or the prevention of moral wrongdoing. A number of writers appeal to one or both values to justify the existence of criminal law (Feinberg 1987, 146–155; Alexander and Ferzan 2009, 17; Simester and von Hirsch 2011, 29–30). Because there are wrongless harms (think of sporting injures caused without foul play) and harmless wrongs (think of botched conspiracies or undiscovered attempts) the aforementioned values do not always wax and wane together. One possibility is that criminal law’s concern with wrongs is derivative of its concern with harms: criminal law should prevent wrongs (e.g., conspiracy to injure) when and because harm is thereby prevented (e.g., injury itself). Another possibility is that criminal law’s concern with harms is derivative of its concern with wrongs: criminal law should prevent harms (e.g., physical injury) when and because those harms are wrongfully caused (e.g., by assault) (Feinberg 1987, 151–155; Moore 1997, 647–649). A third possibility is that harms and wrongs provide two independent sources of general justification (compare Tadros 2016, 162–166). Whatever the answer, this preventive value is impersonal in two ways: it is not grounded in any special relationship; and it is value that might in principle be realised by any of us.
Anyone who seeks criminal law’s justification in the coin of impersonal value must also account for what the criminal law does when prevention fails. Imagine \(D\) assaults \(V\), thereby causing \(V\) physical injury. Some claim that \(D\) thereby incurs secondary moral duties, not in virtue of any relationship in which \(D\) stands, but simply in virtue of facts about the wrong \(D\) committed (Moore 1997, 170–172; Tadros 2011c, 275–283). Criminal law’s responses to crime discharge these duties, it is claimed, and this is what justifies those responses.
It is worth distinguishing between two versions of this view. According to Moore, all culpable wrongdoers incur a duty to allow themselves to suffer. Retributive justice is done when punishment imposes that suffering, and this is what justifies the imposition of criminal punishment (Moore 1997, 70–71). Moore argues that the suffering of culpable wrongdoers is intrinsically good. On a rival view, suffering is always intrinsically bad. We must accept, however, that in some cases not all suffering can be avoided. Sometimes we must choose between wrongdoers suffering now and others suffering at the hands of wrongdoers later. Only by imposing the former can we protect against the latter. It might look as though punishing wrongdoers for these protective reasons amounts to treating them as mere means. But this is not necessarily so. Tadros argues that some wrongdoers incur duties to protect others at the cost of some harm to themselves. We can justify imposing punishments that come at this cost to these wrongdoers, when the punishments protect others by preventing future wrongs. As those punished are only doing their duty, we can reasonably claim that they are not treated as mere means (Tadros 2011c; 2016). Though Moore and Tadros disagree on many things, their views also have something in common. Both claim that, as a matter of principle, anyone might impose punishment that discharges wrongdoers’ secondary duties. The value to which both appeal to justify punishment is impersonal: it is neither relational nor essentially public (Moore 2009a, 42; Tadros 2011c, 293).
General justifications of criminal law like those sketched in the last few paragraphs face a number of criticisms. One objection has it they are unduly expansive: much moral wrongdoing—even much that generates secondary duties to suffer or protect—is no business of the criminal law. Failing to help one’s friend move house because one is lazy is a culpable wrong. But as the failure is a private matter—to be resolved by the friends themselves—there is no reason for law-makers to criminalize the wrong (Duff 2014b; Husak 2014, 215–216). There is certainly no reason for them to criminalize it when the friends are both citizens of another state, and the failure occurs in the other jurisdiction (Duff 2016). Reasons to criminalize exist, as it is often put, only where law-makers have standing. And the mere fact that a wrong generates the aforementioned secondary duties does not itself give law-makers standing to criminalize it.
According to a second objection, the focus on moral wrongdoing is unduly restrictive: much that is not morally wrong—and which generates no secondary duties—is the business of the criminal law. According to one argument for this conclusion, the stable existence of (almost) any valuable social institution—be it financial, educational, familial, military, or political—depends on widespread compliance with its rules. Under realistic conditions, criminal liability for violation is necessary for stability. It is the value of stable institutions, not the moral wrongfulness of violating their rules, that justifies bringing criminal law into existence (Chiao 2016).
A third objection returns us to the asymmetry discussed at the end of section 1. Many of the powers and permissions by means of which criminal justice is done are withheld from private persons. Most obviously, private persons are not typically permitted to use force to punish others for crime. Few think that this should be changed. Vigilantism should remain criminal. If the values that justify having criminal law are essentially public, we appear to have an easy explanation of this fact: private persons cannot, even in principle, realise the values that justify criminal punishment; so they should not be permitted to punish. If those values are not essentially public, things are more difficult. There will surely be cases in which private persons are best placed to discharge \(D\)’s secondary duties—in which the state will not punish \(D\), but our imagined moot court would fine \(D\) a proportionate amount. It is not immediately clear that those who find criminal law’s general justification in impersonal values can explain why the moot court may not extract the money (Thorburn 2011a, 92–93).
Let us take the third objection first. If impersonal values justify having criminal law, we have reason to opt for whichever set of legal rules will realise those values most efficiently. If one set of powers and permissions will achieve more of the value in question at a lower cost, we should—all else being equal—opt for that set. Now compare two sets of rules. One permits state officials and private persons alike to use force to punish criminals. Another withholds the permissions granted to the former from the latter. We have good reason to think that the first set of rules would bring with it significant costs. Private persons are likely to make more mistakes about who committed crimes, and about how much punishment is appropriate for criminality. Different private punishers are unlikely to punish similarly placed offenders in similar amounts. And as their actions are less easily subjected to public scrutiny, private persons are less easily compelled to punish for the right reasons—in order to do justice rather than settle scores, get revenge, or maximise their profit margins (Moore 2009a, 42; Edwards forthcoming). Avoiding these costs is a strong reason to opt for the second set of rules. True, that set prevents proportionate punishment being imposed by our imagined moot court. But it is plausible to think that this benefit is outweighed by the aforementioned costs. If it is, those who appeal to impersonal values to justify criminal law can explain why the moot court is not permitted to force us to give up our money.
According to the second objection, what justifies having criminal law is its role in stabilizing valuable institutions. Notice, however, that if violating the rules of a valuable institution contributes to its destabilization, we will often have a moral duty to conform to the institution’s rules. By preventing these wrongs, and holding wrongdoers responsible, we stabilize the institutions. The contrast between a general justification focused on moral wrongdoing, and one focused on institutional stability, therefore turns out to be a false contrast (Tadros 2016, 135). These observations help make a more general point. We can accept that criminal law is a tool properly used to support financial, educational, familial, military, and political institutions. We can also accept that it is not any old tool—that criminal law is ‘a great moral machine, stamping stigmata on its products, painfully “rubbing in” moral judgments on the people who entered at one end as “suspects” and emerged from the other end as condemned prisoners’ (Feinberg 1987, 155). It is precisely because criminal law is a tool of this special kind—a ‘morally loaded sledgehammer’ (Simester and von Hirsch 2011, 10)—that its general justification is plausibly found in preventing and responding to moral wrongs (cf. Tadros 2016, 68–70).
If this kind of general justification is not too restrictive, is it nonetheless too expansive? This was the first of the three objections raised above. Let us grant that some moral wrongs are not the criminal law’s business. We need not infer that criminal law is unconcerned with moral wrongness. We need only accept that there are facts about criminalization which give law-makers a duty not to criminalize some moral wrongs. There are many such facts, and their force varies depending on the wrong (Simester and von Hirsch 2011, 189–211; Moore 2014). In some cases, criminalizing a wrong will inevitably result in selective enforcement, raising concerns about selection being made on discriminatory grounds. In others, enforcement would necessitate gross invasions of privacy, and require the law to take sides in conflicts better resolved by the parties themselves. There is often value in freely choosing not to act wrongly, and in so choosing for the right reasons, rather than because one was coerced: criminalizing a wrong may result in this value disappearing from the world. It will almost inevitably divert scarce resources from other valuable priorities. And there is often reason to think that criminalization will not result in there being less wrongdoing in the world. Criminal conduct may be driven underground rather than made less common. Institutions of punishment may house unseen abuse and victimization. Ex-offenders may be driven towards crime by their reduced prospects in life. Where reasons like these generate a duty not to criminalize a wrong, the conduct in question is no business of the criminal law. There is nothing here to cast doubt on the thought that criminal law’s general justification consists in preventing, and holding people responsible for, moral wrongs.
4. The Limits of Criminal Law
No-one denies that some things should not be criminalized. What is less clear is how we are to work out what these things are. One approach is to seek constraints on permissible criminalization. Even if the values that justify having criminal law count in favour of criminalization, our reasons to do so may be defeated by reasons that count against. A constraint identifies conditions under which the latter reasons always win. Consider, for example, the wrongfulness constraint:
- (W) It is only permissible to criminalize \(\phi\)ing if \(\phi\)ing is morally wrongful conduct.
Principles like (W) give us a line we can draw without reference to (at least some) morally salient particulars. Conduct that falls outside the line may not be criminalized come what may. Imagine we are considering whether to make it a crime to possess guns. Doing so will prevent a great deal of harmful wrongdoing that cannot be prevented otherwise. This is a powerful moral reason to criminalize. But if (W) is sound, and gun possession is not morally wrongful, that powerful reason is irrelevant to the decision with which we are faced. We are not permitted to criminalize, however much harm criminalization would prevent (Moore 1997, 72–73; Simester and von Hirsch 2011, 22–23; Duff 2014b, 218–222).
Some suspect that all purported constraints on criminalization fail (Duff et al 2014, 44–52; Tadros 2016, 91–107). This is not to say that anything goes. It is rather to say that we cannot use a line like that drawn by (W) to work out what is permissibly criminalized. To trace the limits of the criminal law, we must engage in a more complex normative exercise: we must consider all morally salient particulars of proposed criminal laws—giving those particulars due weight in our deliberations—and thereby determine whether each proposal should be enacted. The limits of the criminal law cannot be traced in advance of this exercise. Instead, they are determined by it.
The constraint to which most attention has been paid is the so-called harm principle. It is nowadays widely recognised that there is no single such principle. Rather, there are many harm principles (Tadros 2011a; Tomlin 2014b; Edwards 2014). One important distinction is between the harmful conduct principle (HCP) and the harm prevention principle (HPP):
- (HCP) It is only permissible to criminalize \(\phi\)ing if \(\phi\)ing is harmful conduct, or conduct that unreasonably risks harm.
- (HPP) It is only permissible to criminalize \(\phi\)ing if criminalizing \(\phi\)ing is necessary to prevent harm, and if the harm done by criminalization is not disproportionate to the harm prevented.
These principles have very different implications. That conduct is harmful, or unreasonably risks harm, does not show that we will prevent a proportionate amount of harm by criminalizing it. Conversely, we may be able to prevent harm only by criminalizing conduct that is harmless, and that does not unreasonably risk harm.
To see the first point, consider the use of drugs. Criminalizing use may turn a drug into forbidden fruit that is more attractive to potential consumers, and place production in the hands of criminal gangs who make consumption ever more harmful. Users may become less willing to seek medical treatment for fear of exposing their criminality, and may end up with criminal records that lead to social exclusion, and damage their employment prospects for years to come (United Nations 2015). Where criminalization does have these effects, the harm it does is out of all proportion to any harm prevented. Even if (HCP) is satisfied, (HPP) is not.
To see the second point, consider the possession of guns. Possessing a gun is not itself harmful. And many possess guns without unreasonably risking harm. If one endorses (HCP), one must either weaken one’s chosen principle or accept that gun possession cannot be criminalized. If one endorses (HPP), things are different. What matters is not the effect of each instance of gun possession, but the effect of criminalizing all of them: if criminalizing possession will prevent harm that would not otherwise be prevented—and do so at a not disproportionate cost—the fact that some owners possess guns safely is beside the point. Whether or not (HCP) is satisfied, (HPP) is.
Constraints like (W), (HCP), and (HPP) require clarification. To apply (W) we need to know what makes something morally wrongful. Plausibly enough, it is morally wrongful to \(\phi\) only if there is decisive reason not to \(\phi\). But while this is necessary, it may not be sufficient. I have decisive reason not to go out in the rain without my umbrella. But it does not seem morally wrongful to do so (Tadros 2016, 11–46). Whatever the correct criterion, we must ask how law-makers are to apply it. Are law-makers to ask whether most members of society believe \(\phi\)ing to be morally wrongful—a matter of conventional morality—or are they to ask whether this is what members would ideally believe—a matter of critical morality (Hart 1963; Devlin 1965)? We must also ask whether just any morally wrongful act will do. Some wrongful acts also violate rights, such that those who commit them wrong others. On one view, it is only when \(\phi\)ing meets this additional test that it is permissible to criminalize \(\phi\)ing (Feinberg 1984; Stewart 2010).
Some crimes are mala in se—they criminalize conduct that is morally wrongful independently of the law. Most crimes are mala prohibita—they criminalize conduct that, if morally wrongful at all, is morally wrongful partly in virtue of the fact that it is unlawful. Is (W) compatible with the existence of mala prohibita? That depends on the extent to which changes in the law can produce changes in morality. The rules of the road are the classic case. Apart from the law, it is morally wrongful to drive dangerously. Such conduct is malum in se. What we should do to conform to this moral norm is not always obvious. To help, the law puts in place rules that tell us which side of the road to drive on, when to stop, and how fast we may go. Imagine we obey these rules. In doing so, we drive more safely than we otherwise would have: we better conform to the moral norm that prohibits dangerous driving. One proposal is that it is morally wrongful to violate legal norms that have this effect: that help us better conform to moral norms that exist independently of the law (Gardner 2011, 19–21). Mala prohibita of this kind would then be compatible with (W). Of course, things are not so straightforward. Even if legal conformity generally improves our moral conformity, there may be exceptional cases in which it does not—in which we can violate the rules of the road without putting anyone in danger, or in which violation helps keep everyone safe. And there may be people for whom even the generalization is not true—whose expertise enables them to systematically violate legal norms without creating risks any greater than those created by the rest of us. Can an explanation be given of why these violations are nonetheless morally wrongful? If not, (W) implies that even morally beneficial mala prohibita—like the rules of the road—must ultimately be removed from the criminal law (Husak 2008, 103–119; Simester and von Hirsch 2011, 24–29; Wellman 2013).
To apply (HCP) and (HPP) we need a conception of harm. Most views are comparative: we are harmed by some event if and only if that event renders us worse off in some way relative to some baseline. One challenge is to identify the relevant baseline. Are we harmed by an event if we are worse than we would have been if things had been different? If so, different how? Are we harmed if we are worse off than we were immediately beforehand? Or should we focus not on the position we were or would have been in, but on the position we should have been in morally speaking (Holtug 2002; Tadros 2016, 187–200)? A second challenge is to determine in what way we must be worse off. The wider our answer to this question, the more likely it is that harm principles collapse into their supposed rivals. Some say we are harmed when our interests are set back (Feinberg 1984, 31–64). But it is plausible to think that we have interests in avoiding disgust, annoyance, and dismay. Many people are disgusted, annoyed, or dismayed by what they take to be morally wrongful. On an interest-based view, they are also harmed. Any harm principle that uses this notion of harm thus threatens to permit criminalization of much conventional immorality (Devlin 1965). A narrower view has it that we are harmed only if our future prospects are reduced, because we are deprived of valuable abilities or opportunities (Raz 1986, 413–414; Gardner 2007, 3–4; Simester and von Hirsch 2011, 36–37). Disgust, annoyance, and offence need not—and often do not—have this effect. So they need not be—and often are not—harmful. But as blinding pain also need not reduce one’s prospects in life, it is arguable that this view avoids collapse only at the cost of underinclusion (Tadros 2016, 179–180).
Whatever view of harm we take, we must also decide whether all harms count for the purposes of a given harm principle. People sometimes harm themselves, they are sometimes harmed by natural events, and harm is sometimes done consensually. Recall that if we endorse (HPP), we must decide whether the harm criminalization prevents is proportionate to the harm it does. Can we include all the aforementioned harms in our calculations? Or must we only include harm done to others without their consent (Mill 1859; Dworkin 1972; Feinberg 1986; Coons and Weber 2013)? Some point out that whatever law-makers’ aims, most criminal laws will prevent some non-consensual harm (Feinberg 1986, 138–142; Tadros 2016, 103). Be that as it may, whether we take into account other harms remains important: where the scales would otherwise point against criminalization, giving weight to a wider range of harms may tip the balance decisively in its favour.
As well as asking how constraints might be clarified, we must ask how they might be defended. One type of defence proceeds from within our theory of ideals. A theory of ideals includes an account of the values that bear upon how we should act, and of the priority relations between those values (Hamlin and Stemplowska 2012). To see how such a theory might generate constraints, consider (W). One argument for that principle is the argument from conviction (Simester and von Hirsch 2011, 19–20):
- (1) To criminally convict \(D\) of \(\phi\)ing is to censure \(D\) for having \(\phi\)ed;
- (2) To censure \(D\) for having \(\phi\)ed is to convey that \(D\)’s \(\phi\)ing was morally wrongful;
- (3) It is morally defamatory to send false messages about the moral status of \(D\)’s conduct;
- ∴(4) It is impermissible to criminalize conduct that is not morally wrongful.
A second argument is the argument from punishment (Husak 2008, 92–103):
- (1) To criminally punish \(D\) is to intentionally harm \(D\), and expose \(D\) to social stigma;
- (2) We have a right not to be intentionally harmed in a way that exposes us to such stigma;
- (3) That right is permissibly infringed only if we are punished for wrongful conduct;
- ∴(4) It is impermissible to criminalize conduct that is not morally wrongful.
One response to these arguments is that criminal law does not always censure or stigmatize. Another is that the arguments rely on priority claims that cannot be sustained. The argument from conviction depends on our accepting that moral defamation cannot be justified. The argument from punishment depends on our accepting that those who do not act wrongly have an absolute right not to be punished. These claims may be too strong. To test the second, think again about possession of guns. Imagine that we criminalize possession, and that we have good reason to think that we can thereby save many lives. \(D\) possesses a gun safely because \(D\) likes how it looks hanging on the wall. We can grant that \(D\) would act wrongly if \(D\)’s conduct risked harm to others, or prevented the state from saving others’ lives. But as \(D\)’s possession is safe, and the state has in fact criminalized possession, neither is the case. Would the state violate \(D\)’s rights if it punished \(D\)? It is plausible to think not. \(D\) could very easily have refrained from possessing the gun. And if the state were to refrain from punishing safe possessors like \(D\), more people would be likely to possess guns in the mistaken belief that this was safe. This would likely result in some lives being lost. The fact that not punishing safe possessors would probably have this effect is a good reason to think that safe possessors lack a valid complaint if they are punished. It is a good reason to think that it sometimes is permissible to punish the morally innocent. If it is, premise (3) of the argument from punishment is false (Tadros 2016, 329–333).
Now consider (HPP). We can imagine a world in which we could flick a switch, sending an electronic signal to \(D\)’s brain, the only effect of which would be that \(D\) would not act wrongly. Whatever one thinks of this means of prevention, it is not the means we utilize when we make use of criminal law. Absent perfect compliance, criminal law prevents wrongs by publicly making accusations, condemning people as wrongdoers, and punishing them for their wrongs. Public accusations often stick even if nothing comes of them. Punishment is harmful by its very nature. The lives of \(D\)’s family and friends are collateral damage as \(D\)’s prospects are reduced. Some claim that we can justify causing such harm—at least when the state does the harming—only if this is a necessary and proportionate means of preventing people being harmed. So it is impermissible to criminalize when this condition is not satisfied. Hence (HPP) (Raz 1986, 418–420; Edwards 2014, 259–262).
One might reply that the harm internal to justified punishment is harm we lack reason not to impose. Leaving this aside, it is far from obvious that harm has lexical priority over other values. The above argument for (HPP) seems to depend on this claim. But there is wrongdoing that is both serious and harmless. Imagine \(D\) violates the bodily integrity or sexual autonomy of an unconscious \(V\), but this is never discovered and has no further effects (Gardner and Shute 2000; Ripstein 2006, 218–229). It is plausible to think that the value of preventing such wrongs, even when this does not prevent harm, is at least sometimes capable of justifying the harm done by criminalization (Tadros 2016, 106–107).
A second defence of constraints proceeds from within non-ideal theory: from our account of what should be done when some people will not act as they should. One might say that all criminal law theory is part of non-ideal theory—that we have reason to have criminal law precisely because people will (otherwise) act wrongly. Be that as it may. As well as fallible agents who (would otherwise) commit crimes, there are fallible agents who make, apply, and enforce criminal laws. Any non-ideal theory must also take account of the errors the latter are disposed to make. Some are errors of application and enforcement—errors made when police officers arrest, prosecutors charge, and courts punish the innocent. More important for present purposes are the errors law-makers are disposed to make when creating crimes. These errors matter here for the following reason. Prescriptive norms are often justified on the grounds that they prevent/mitigate errors that would be made in their absence (Schauer 1991, 135–166). If followed, speed limits prevent some drivers from driving in ways that are impeccable in isolation. But the limits are justified if they prevent/mitigate errors that drivers would make if we did without speed limits, and if preventing/mitigating the errors is worth the cost of preventing some driving that is otherwise impeccable. Let us grant that, when followed, constraints like (W) or (HPP) prevent some law-makers from criminalizing in ways that are impeccable in isolation. The constraints may be justified if they prevent/mitigate errors law-makers would make if they did without them, and if preventing/mitigating the errors is worth the cost of preventing criminalization that is otherwise impeccable.
Many defenders of (HPP) offer defences that proceed in the manner just described. One error is that of underestimating the value in lives very different from our own: of mistaking the virtues required to succeed in those lives for vices, and of concluding that these supposed vices ought to be suppressed (Raz 1986, 401–407; Gardner 2007, 118–120). A second error is that of underestimating the value of toleration. That value includes making space for experiments in living, which both help combat prejudice by exposing people to the unfamiliar, and help people develop deliberative faculties by exposing them to that with which they disagree (Mill 1859; Brink 2013). A third error is that of underestimating the harm one’s policies do to those who live in very different circumstances (Green 2013b, 202). If the main effects of criminalizing drug use are felt in communities the affluent shun, it is not hard to see how law-makers could be blind to the amount of damage criminalization does. Law-makers who make each of these errors will be tempted to create criminal laws that are anything but impeccable—laws designed to suppress activities the value in which has been missed, which do much more harm than their designers anticipated. The case for (HPP) is that it stands in the way of this temptation. Those who follow it must tolerate conduct—however offensive or immoral they deem it to be—unless they can show that criminalization is a necessary and proportionate means of preventing harm.
Harm-based arguments are nowadays ubiquitous when proposed criminal laws are discussed. Some think this shows that (HPP) is no constraint at all (Harcourt 1999). But it is no surprise that those who merely pay lip service to a principle are not constrained by it. The argument of the previous paragraph was an argument that (HPP) should be followed. To follow that principle is to take seriously the need for an empirical showing—grounded in adequate evidence—that a given law is necessary to prevent a proportionate amount of harm. A better objection is that the error-based argument is incomplete. How widespread would error be if law-makers took themselves to be free of (HPP)? When are the benefits of following (HPP)—in errors prevented—worth the costs—in otherwise impeccable criminal laws? Might there be some other rule that brings us those benefits at a lower cost than (HPP)? We need answers to all these questions, and more, to know if an argument from within non-ideal theory can support (HPP) (Tadros 2016, 94–96).
A number of other possible constraints on the criminal law have been proposed (Dan-Cohen 2002, 150–171; Ripstein 2006). As mentioned earlier, some are skeptical of all such principles. To determine the limits of the criminal law, they think, we must refer to a ‘more disorderly set of considerations’, none of which gives us anything as simple as a (set of) constraint(s): the resulting account of criminal law’s limits will be ‘messier’ than its rivals; but this is ‘what the messy worlds in which we live require’ (Duff et al 2014, 51–52). The correct response to this skepticism remains unclear. One possibility is that a defensible general line can indeed be found. The question is where the line is, and how it is to be defended against objections like those sketched above. A second possibility is that we need the ‘messier’ theory. If so, we must ask what shape that theory ought to take, and how lofty should be the ambitions of those who construct it. We need to know how much order can be imposed, at the theoretical level, on the ‘disorderly set of considerations’ with which we are confronted (for one answer, see Tadros 2016, 159–172). As the criminal law’s scope in many jurisdictions continues to expand at a dizzying pace, these remain the most urgent questions facing today’s philosophers of criminal law.
5. Criminal Responsibility
Imagine that \(D\) takes \(V\)’s property without \(V\)’s consent. Is \(D\) criminally responsible for the taking? Not necessarily. In English law, \(D\) commits the offence of theft only if \(D\) acts dishonestly, and intends for \(V\) to be deprived of her property permanently. Theft is one of many offences commission of which depends on one’s state of mind. Elements of offences that require particular mental states are known as mens rea elements. Other elements are known as actus reus elements.
Some claim that if \(D\) satisfies all elements of an offence—if D commits the actus reus with mens rea—this suffices to make \(D\) criminally responsible, but not to make D criminally liable. Responsibility is understood here as answerability (Duff 2007, 19–36). While we are answerable to the courts for committing offences, we may avoid liability by offering satisfactory answers in the form of defences. This account of criminal responsibility—call it the answerability account—relies on a distinction between offence and defence to which we will return. One argument for the answerability account invokes rules of criminal procedure and evidence. To obtain a conviction, the prosecution must prove that \(D\) committed the offence beyond a reasonable doubt. \(D\) can safely remain silent in the absence of such proof. If the prosecution makes its case, \(D\) has strong prudential reasons to prove a defence: without one, \(D\) will be convicted and punished. The best explanation of these rules, so the argument goes, is that offending acts generate a duty to answer that is otherwise absent. This duty explains why, when we have strong reason to believe \(D\) to be an offender, we put \(D\) under extra rational pressure to explain herself in court.
Some think that, on closer inspection, our rules of procedure and evidence fail to support the answerability account, and help to undermine it. Those rules tell prosecutors to consider evidence both that \(D\) committed an offence and that \(D\) lacks a defence. If there is strong evidence that \(D\) killed in self-defence, D should not be prosecuted. This matters here for the following reason. When prosecutors decide whether to prosecute, they are deciding whether D should be called to answer for what \(D\) did. The fact that prosecutors should not prosecute if \(D\) clearly killed in self-defence, suggests that those who have defences are not answerable in court. It suggests that we owe the criminal courts answers not for acts that are offences but for acts that are crimes—for offending acts which do not satisfy an available defence. Obviously enough, it is for crimes that we are criminally liable. If responsibility is answerability, and we are answerable for crimes, the conditions of criminal responsibility and the conditions of criminal liability are one and the same. The answerability account, as described above, then fails (Duarte d’Almeida 2015, 239–267).
5.1 Mens Rea
On any view, the conditions under which \(D\) commits an offence are conditions of criminal responsibility. What should these conditions be? There has been much discussion of the mens rea principle (MR):
- (MR) \(D\) should be criminally responsible for \(\phi\)ing only if \(\phi\)ing is partly constituted by an element of mens rea.
Standard mens rea requirements include intention and recklessness. Paradigmatically, we intend \(X\) if, and only if, \(X\) is one of our reasons for acting: if, and only if, we act in order to bring \(X\) about. We are reckless about \(X\) if, and only if, (i) we are aware there is a risk of \(X\), and (ii) running the risk of which we are aware is unjustified.
Whether criminal responsibility should require mens rea, and what mens rea it should require, both depend on the reasons we have to accept (MR). Perhaps the most familiar defence appeals to the culpability principle (C):
- (C) \(D\) should be criminally liable for \(\phi\)ing only if \(D\) is culpable for having \(\phi\)ed.
Culpability, as that term is used here, is a moral notion. It is synonymous with moral fault or moral blameworthiness. Mens rea is not sufficient for culpability—even intentional killings are sometimes excused. But it may well be necessary—culpability may presuppose at least some element of mens rea (Simester 2013; cf. Gardner 2007, 227–232). If this is so, the debate shifts to whether we should accept (C). One worry about this principle is its generality. The consequences of criminal liability are not always especially burdensome. And the benefits of liability without culpability may be especially significant. To take but one example, think of regulations that govern the activities of corporations, and which protect the health and safety of the public at large. Making it a criminal offence to violate these regulations, and imposing hefty fines, need have none of the destructive effects of imprisoning individuals. Dispensing with culpability requirements may increase the deterrent effects of the law, by making it harder for violators to escape conviction. Whether (C) is sound depends on whether effects like these—which, ex hypothesi, protect the health and safety of many—can justify imposing criminal liability without culpability.
That (C) may admit of exceptions does not, of course, show that (C) is not generally sound. I suggested above that, where (C) does apply, it entails (MR). How much mens rea (C) requires is a further question. Take the offence of causing death by dangerous driving. The actus reus of the crime requires two things: \(D\)’s driving must exhibit deficiencies that we reasonably expect a qualified driver to avoid, and those deficiencies must cause the death of another person. Some think that (C) calls for two mens rea requirements: \(D\) must have been aware of the deficiencies that made her driving dangerous, and she must have been aware of a risk that they would cause death. The idea that each actus reus element should have a corresponding mens rea element is known as the correspondence principle (Ashworth 2008). Whether (C) in fact supports that principle is a matter of debate. It is sometimes the case that the risk of causing some harmful outcome (like death) helps make it the case that an act (like dangerous driving) is wrongful. There is an internal connection, in these cases, between our assessment of the act and the risk of the outcome. Some claim that where this internal connection exists, \(D\)’s awareness that she was engaged in the wrongful act establishes that she is culpable for the harmful outcome. If this is right, \(D\) need not have any mens rea as to that outcome in order to be culpable for it when it occurs: the correspondence principle cannot be derived from (C) (Simester 2005, 44–46; Duff 2005, 143–147).
A second defence of (MR) appeals to the rule of law (RL):
- (RL) the law should be such that those to whom it applies can use its norms to guide their conduct.
Conformity to (RL) is a matter of degree. But an especially high degree of conformity is expected of the criminal law. One reason for this is the special powers criminal law confers on \(D\)’s accusers. Another is the damage a guilty verdict does to the life of the accused. The connection between (RL) and (MR) is clearly stated by Gardner:
According to the ideal known as the rule of law, those of us about to commit a criminal wrong should be put on stark notice that that is what we are about to do. The criminal law should not ambush us unexpectedly. Of course, to avoid unexpected ambushes we all need to know what the law requires of us. For that reason, criminal laws should be clear, open, consistent, stable, and prospective. … Even all this, however, is not enough to ensure that those of us about to violate the criminal law are put on stark notice that we are about to violate it. For we may know the law and yet have no grasp that what we are about to do might constitute a violation of it. That is because often we have no idea which actions we are about to perform. I make a light-hearted remark and (surprise!) I offend one of my guests. I turn on my oven and (surprise!) I blow all the fuses. The mens rea principle is the principle according to which such actions – the self-surprising ones – should not be criminal wrongs (Gardner 2005, 69–70).
If \(D\) must be aware of those aspects of her actions that make them of interest to the criminal law, she is less likely to be ambushed by criminal offences that prohibit those actions. In this way, mens rea requirements contribute to personal autonomy by increasing our ability to steer our lives away from criminal conviction and punishment. So (RL) supports (MR). Does it also support the correspondence principle? This is less clear. One view has it that \(D\)’s awareness of the facts that made her driving dangerous disqualifies \(D\) from complaining that she was ambushed by liability for \(V\)’s death (at least as long as said liability was adequately publicized). On another view, \(D\)’s autonomy not only counts in favour of helping \(D\) to anticipate criminal liability, it also counts in favour of helping \(D\) to anticipate its legal consequences, such that \(D\) can decide if the price of those consequences is worth paying (Hart 1968, 47; Ashworth 2008). If it does not occur to \(D\) that \(\phi\)ing might cause death, it also does not occur to \(D\) that \(\phi\)ing might result in her suffering the additional punishment prescribed for causing it. \(D\) is more likely to factor this information into her decision-making if the criminal law insists that \(D\) is aware of the risk—if it insists on correspondence between actus reus and mens rea.
A third argument for (MR) appeals to liberty (Simester and Chan 2011, 393–395). Consider an offence that prohibits damaging other people’s property. If the mens rea requirement is one of intent, \(D\) is free to knowingly take risks with \(V\)’s possessions. If the mens rea requires awareness, \(D\) is free to put \(V\)’s possessions in harm’s way without giving thought to the risks. If there is no mens rea at all, no amount of care will help \(D\) if she causes property to be damaged. These examples help show that mens rea requirements affect the range of options legally available to \(D\). Obviously enough, the degree to which we should care about taking options off the table depends on how much value they have. This makes the liberty-protecting role of mens rea especially important where criminal responsibility extends beyond paradigmatic cases of wrongdoing. Consider the law of complicity. Under what conditions should S be criminally responsible for participating in wrongs committed by P? Imagine it is sufficient that S realises P might act wrongly. Anyone who sells goods that are liable to misuse is then in danger of being turned into a criminal by their customers. Shopkeepers must run the gauntlet or close their doors. Narrower mens rea requirements enable them to both stay in business and ensure they remain on the right side of the law (Simester 2006, 591–592).
It is worth concluding this section by returning to two questions distinguished at its outset: (i) should criminal responsibility require mens rea? (ii) what mens rea should it require? Question (i) is often discussed under the heading of strict liability. The literature distinguishes between various senses in which liability can be strict (Duff 2005; Gardner 2005, 68–69; Simester 2005, 22–23). Criminal liability for \(\phi\)ing is substantively strict if we can \(\phi\) without being culpable for \(\phi\)ing. It is formally strict if \(\phi\)ing lacks elements of mens rea. This second category can itself be subdivided. Liability is formally strict in the strong sense when there is no mens rea element at all. Liability is formally strict in the weak sense when at least one actus reus element has no corresponding element of mens rea. If (C) is a sound principle, criminal liability should not be substantively strict. If (MR) is sound, there should be no criminal liability that is formally strict in the strong sense. If the correspondence principle is sound, liability that is formally strict in the weak sense also should not exist.
So much for question (i). What about question (ii)? The above discussion assumed that mens rea at the very least requires awareness. But criminal liability sometimes turns not on what D noticed, but on what \(D\) failed to notice—on circumstances that would have caused a reasonable person to refrain from doing what \(D\) did. It is where such circumstances exist that \(D\)’s actions are negligent. Some writers claim that negligence has no place in criminal law. If (C) is sound, and culpability requires awareness, then criminal liability should require recklessness at the very least. Others take a different view. They claim that when we are unaware of risks because of vices like arrogance or indifference, this makes us culpable for running those risks. So (C) is compatible with at least some instances of negligence liability in criminal law (Hart 1968, 136–157; Simester 2000, Alexander and Ferzan 2009, 69–85; Moore and Hurd 2011).
5.2 Actus Reus
Whether or not mens rea should be necessary for criminal responsibility, it is rarely claimed that it should be sufficient. The widespread belief that we should not countenance thought crimes, leads most writers to claim that there should be an actus reus element to each criminal offence. Paradigmatically, this element is satisfied only if \(D\) acts in a way that causes some outcome, such as death, or property damage, or fear of violence. This paradigm does, of course, admit of a number of exceptions. As well as inchoate offences—like attempts or conspiracies—most systems of criminal law include liability for some omissions. Imagine \(D\) sees \(V\) drowning in a shallow pond and chooses to do nothing. There is no prior connection between \(D\) and \(V\). If the pond is in London, \(D\) commits no offence. Move the drama to Paris and we have ourselves a crime. As this example suggests, both academics and legal systems remain divided over the positive obligations that should be imposed by criminal law (Alexander 2002; Ashworth 2015).
Exceptions aside, the building blocks of our paradigm are each open to interpretation. Consider, for instance, the need for causation. Is the conclusion that \(D\) caused \(V\)’s death a matter of physical fact—something that is, in Hume’s well-known phrase, part of the cement of the universe? Or do the rules of causation—at least in criminal law—lie downstream of moral judgments about the fair attribution of responsibility? Does the truth, perhaps, lie somewhere in between? (Hart and Honoré 1959; Moore 2009b; Simester 2017). The criminal liability of many—as well as the punishments they face—turns on the answer we give to such questions.
Academic debate about causation and omissions largely takes our paradigm for granted. Some writers, however, take a more radical view: they favour a paradigm shift in our thinking about criminal responsibility. One group of radicals focuses on outcomes. Imagine D shoots at \(V\), intending to cause death. In any system of criminal law this is an attempt. The radicals claim that what happens next should make no difference: \(D\) should be convicted of the same crime whether or not \(V\) is killed. Criminal responsibility, in short, should be insensitive to the outcomes of what we do (Ashworth 1993; Alexander and Ferzan 2009, 171–196). Consider again what I earlier called (C):
- (C) \(D\) should be criminally liable for \(\phi\)ing only if \(D\) is culpable for having \(\phi\)ed.
If this principle is sound, we can offer the following argument:
- (1) We are culpable only for what is within our control;
- (2) There are always factors that bear on the outcomes of our actions that we do not control;
- ∴(3) We should not be criminally responsible for outcomes.
This argument relies on the following suppressed premise:
- (2\('\)) We only control \(X\) if there is no factor that bears on \(X\) that we do not control.
It is only if (2\('\)) is true that we never control outcomes. Alas, (2\('\)) has unpalatable implications. Uncontrolled factors do not only bear on whether we succeed. They also bear on whether we try, on the choices we make, and on the character traits that influence our choices. (2\('\)) implies that we are never culpable for any of these things—for our successes, our endeavours, our choices or our character. Pursued to its logical conclusion, it implies that we are never culpable for anything (Nagel 1979; Moore 1997, 233–246). If, as most people believe, we sometimes are culpable for what we do, (2\('\)) must be false. We can add that (3) radically understates the conclusion of the argument offered above. When combined with (C), that argument does not imply that we should not be criminally responsible for outcomes. It implies that no one should ever be criminally responsible.
We might try to salvage the argument from (1)–(3) by revising our account of control:
- (2\(''\))We control \(X\) if we have a reasonable chance of preventing \(X\) or bringing \(X\) about.
This revision avoids the unpalatable implications of (2\('\)). But it also renders the argument from (1)–(3) invalid. If (2\(''\)) states the correct account of control, we do sometimes have control over outcomes. Imagine \(D\) holds a loaded gun to \(V\)’s head and pulls the trigger. \(D\) has a reasonable chance—indeed, an extremely high chance—of killing \(V\). On this account of control, (1) and (2) do not support (3): they give us no reason to accept that we are never criminally responsible for outcomes (Moore 2009, 24–26).
We have already seen that, for some, we are criminally responsible for committing offences and criminally liable for committing crimes. This distinction relies on a further distinction between offences and defences: crimes are committed by those who satisfy all the elements of an offence, without satisfying all the elements of any available defence.
One account of the offence/defence distinction is procedural. Offence elements must be proved if conviction is to be the legally correct verdict of the court. So if absence of consent is an offence-element—as it is in the offences created, in England and Wales, by the Sexual Offences Act 2003—it must be proved that consent was absent or \(D\) must be acquitted. The same is not true of defence elements, like those that make up the defence of duress. For a conviction to be correctly entered, it need not be proved that \(D\) did not act under duress. It is enough that there is no evidence that \(D\) acted under duress. The same is true where consent is a defence-element—as it is in the offences created, in England and Wales, by the Offences Against the Person Act 1861. If \(D\) punches \(V\) and is charged with assault occasioning actual bodily harm, the court need not be convinced that \(V\) did not consent. If the issue of consent never comes up, a conviction may still be the legally correct verdict of the court. Simply put, that \(D\) satisfied each offence element is something that must be proved. Whether \(D\) satisfied each defence element can remain uncertain. It is in this procedural distinction, on the view under consideration, that the offence/defence distinction consists (Duarte d’Almeida 2015).
This last claim is denied by those who believe that the offence/defence distinction is substantive. These writers accept that offences and defences are governed by different procedural rules. Their claim is that the distinction between offences and defences explains why those rules differ. Perhaps the most well-known version of this view runs as follows. Offence elements are individually necessary, and jointly sufficient, to describe an act that there is general reason not to perform. Defence elements block the transition from the existence of that reason to the conclusion that \(D\) ought to be convicted of a crime. On this view, whether we should think of the absence of consent as an element of the offence of sexual assault, depends on whether we think that there is a general reason not to have consensual sex with others. If there is no such reason, the absence of consent is necessary to give us an act we have general reason not to perform. So it is an element of the offence of sexual assault. If, on the other hand, there is a general reason not to have consensual sex, consent is properly thought of as a defence to sexual assault (Campbell 1987; Gardner 2007, 144–149).
In addition to distinguishing between offences and defences, many writers distinguish between types of criminal defence. The most familiar distinction is between justifications and excuses. The most familiar account of the distinction has it that while justified actors deny wrongdoing, excused actors deny either responsibility or culpability (Austin 1956; Fletcher 1978; Greenawalt 1984; Baron 2005). Two questions are worth asking here. Is the familiar distinction worth drawing? If so, is the familiar account of the distinction the right way to draw it?
There are two reasons to answer the first question in the affirmative. One invokes (C). If courts are to develop criminal defences so that their contours track culpability, they need to know why each defence makes it the case that those who plead it are not culpable. Is there a defence of necessity because we sometimes do the right thing by choosing the lesser of two evils? Or does the defence exist because actors sometimes make wrongful choices under enormous pressure, and because there is sometimes nothing culpable about giving into the pressure? How courts should develop the defence depends on how they answer these questions. It depends on whether they conceive of the defence as a justification or an excuse.
A second reason to make the familiar distinction invokes the idea that criminal trials call defendants to account. On this view, trials are in one way continuous with life outside the law—they institutionalize our ordinary moral practice of making and replying to accusations (Gardner 2007, 177–200; Duff, 2010c; 2011; 2013a). When accused of wrongdoing in our everyday lives, most of us do not only care about whether we end up being blamed. Where we did nothing wrong, we try to convince our accusers that this is the case: it matters to us that others not add wrongs to the story of our lives, even if we know that they will otherwise conclude that we acted blamelessly. There is no reason to think that things are different in criminal courts: that those accused of crime should, or do, care only about getting off the hook. By retaining distinct justificatory and excusatory defences, the criminal law gives effect to our interests in presenting ourselves—to our accusers and to others—in the best available rational light (Gardner 2007, 133).
Let us turn, then, to the second of our questions. Is it true that justifications deny wrongdoing? Is it true that excuses deny responsibility? Some think both questions should at least sometimes be answered in the negative. True, those who act in self-defence plausibly benefit from an exception to the duty not to harm others. Having placed \(D\) under attack, many think, \(V\) has no right that \(D\) not use necessary and proportionate force against \(V\) (McMahan 2005). But the same is not true when \(D\) harms an innocent bystander, even if this is the only way to prevent even greater harm to others. \(V\)’s right remains, it is often thought, but is sometimes overridden. So \(D\) still wrongs \(V\). That wrong is justified when and because \(D\) has undefeated reasons to commit it—reasons given by the greater harm prevented by \(D\). If this is right, those who plead a justification do not always deny, but sometimes concede, wrongdoing. It is the wrong that they then try to justify (Gardner 2007, 77–82).
The familiar account might be thought to be on firmer ground when it comes to excuses. Grant that to plead an excuse is indeed to deny culpability. The same is true of a justification. So there is nothing here to distinguish the two. Do excuses, then, deny responsibility? At least sometimes, they do not. True, those who plead insanity deny that they were capable of responding to reasons when they acted. But this is not true of other excusatory pleas. Imagine \(T\) bursts into \(D\)’s house and threatens to shoot \(D\) unless \(D\) shoots \(V\). If \(D\) pleads duress, \(D\) relies on the fact that her capacity to respond to reasons remained intact: her plea is that she offended in order to avoid the harm threatened by \(T\), and in doing so lived up to our reasonable expectations. \(D\) thereby asserts rather than denies responsibility for an offending act (Gardner 2007, 82–87). This does not mean that duress is a justification. \(V\)’s right to life defeats the reasons \(D\) has to save her own. \(D\) has a defence because we do not expect any more from someone in \(D\)’s predicament—because we can understand why saving her own life seemed a good enough reason to \(D\) (Simester 2012, 105).
Two points emerge from these remarks. One is that the familiar account of the justification/excuse distinction should be rejected. The second is that a bipartite classification of criminal defences obscures distinctions we have reason to make. Some respond by distinguishing denials of responsibility (like insanity) from excuses (like duress), and distinguishing both from justifications (like self-defence and necessity). Excuses and justifications, so understood, are both assertions of responsibility and denials of culpability. Justified actors have undefeated reasons for their actions. Excused actors live up to reasonable expectations despite lacking such reasons (Gardner 2007, 91–139; Simester 2012, 99–108). Though this tripartite classification is an improvement, some maintain that further distinctions should be drawn (Duff 2007, 263–298; Simester 2012). Just how numerous the categories of criminal defence are (or ought to be) is a topic for future work.
6. Criminal Procedure and Evidence
Imagine there are reasons to believe that \(D\) is criminally responsible for having \(\phi\)ed. What may officials of the criminal justice system do in response to those reasons? What should they do, and refrain from doing?
As a matter of law, the answer depends on norms of criminal procedure and evidence. Some of these norms confer powers and permissions that help officials build their case against \(D\). Think of stop and search, intrusive forms of surveillance, and pre-trial detention. Other norms regulate the kinds of evidence that may be used against \(D\) in court. Think of hearsay, or statistical evidence, or evidence of \(D\)’s bad (or good) character (Ho 2008; Redmayne 2015). Yet other norms govern the way in which one aspect of the criminal justice system should respond to the misconduct of others. Imagine evidence against \(D\) was gathered illegally, or that \(D\) was entrapped, or that \(D\)’s case should have been discontinued according to the guidelines prosecutors set for themselves. Should the courts throw out \(D\)’s case, even where the evidence against \(D\) is strong? If so, on what grounds should they do so? (Ashworth 2000; Duff et al 2007, 225–257).
The norms I have mentioned are somewhat neglected by philosophers of criminal law. Things are different when it comes to the so-called presumption of innocence (PI). The most well-known judicial formulation of (PI) is found in Woolmington v. DPP  UKHL 1:
Throughout the web of the English Criminal Law one golden thread is always to be seen … No matter what the charge or where the trial, the principle that the prosecution must prove the guilt of the prisoner is part of the common law of England and no attempt to whittle it down can be entertained.
So understood, (PI) allocates the burden of proof in criminal trials to those on the accusing side. Many add that \(D\)’s accusers must meet an especially high standard of proof—they must eliminate all reasonable doubt to secure a conviction. Though these points are widely accepted, they leave open a range of further questions about the scope and basis of (PI). The following remarks touch on just some (for an overview, see Lippke 2016).
One question is whether (PI) has implications for criminal procedure that extend beyond the criminal trial. On one view, (PI) just is a norm that governs the burden and standard of proof at trial. On another, (PI) is something more expansive: it is a norm that tells criminal justice officials—and, perhaps, the rest of us too—how to interact with others, including those suspected of crime (Stewart 2014, Duff 2013b). That norm of course has implications for the moment of trial. But its implications extend both backwards and forwards from that point in time. They extend backwards to decisions about whether to arrest, prosecute, or detain those suspected of criminality (Ashworth 2006, 249; Duff 2013b, 180–185; Stewart 2014, 414). And they extend forwards to decisions both about how much to punish (Tomlin 2014a), and about the appropriate collateral consequences of conviction and punishment (Duff 2013b, 185–192).
A second question is whether (PI) has implications for the substantive criminal law. Some writers—and most courts—think not. They give (PI) a purely procedural interpretation (Roberts 2005; Lippke 2016). It has been argued, however, that all such interpretations are implausibly narrow (Tadros 2007; 2014; Tomlin 2013). Imagine it is an offence to possess information of a kind that might be useful to terrorists, with the intention of committing acts of terror. Intentions like this are often difficult to prove. Legislators might respond by shifting the burden of proof to D: they might make it the case that, once the prosecution proves possession, it is for \(D\) to prove the absence of intention. The Woolmington formulation suggests that this move violates (PI). Now imagine a creative legislature simply eliminates the requirement of intention from the law: it becomes a crime to possess information of a kind that might be useful to terrorists, whatever the possessor’s intentions might be. Assuming that the prosecution must prove every element of the revised offence, this move brings the law into conformity with a purely procedural (PI). Now most writers—and most human rights treaties—consider (PI) to be an important right that protects criminal suspects against the state. Examples like the above show that the purely procedural interpretation has the following implication: legislators who offer suspects less protection somehow better conform to the right. Not only is this counterintuitive, it renders the right toothless in the face of legislative creativity (Tadros 2014). This is, some conclude, sufficient reason to reject the purely procedural (PI).
Imagine \(D\) is charged with a criminal offence and pleads not guilty. On the purely procedural view, (PI) makes it a precondition of conviction and punishment that the prosecution prove \(D\) satisfied all elements of the offence. What those elements are is a separate question. Some endorse a revised view that makes (PI) more demanding. These writers distinguish between elements of offences, and the wrongs taken by offence-creators to justify convicting and punishing offenders. (PI), they claim, not only requires proof that \(D\) satisfied the former; it also requires proof that \(D\) committed the latter (Tadros 2007; 2014).
To see the difference this revision makes, imagine legislators make it an offence to possess information that might be useful to terrorists. An intention to commit acts of terror is no element of the offence as legislated. Our legislators do not, however, think that all those who possess such information should be convicted and punished. This, they know, would be ridiculous overkill. They think that possessors who intend to commit acts of terror should be convicted and punished. This element of intention is omitted from the offence, because omitting it makes securing convictions easier for prosecutors, thereby reducing the risk that those planning acts of terror will get off the hook. (PI), on the revised view, nonetheless requires proof of the intent: ex hypothesi, it is possession with an intention to commit acts of terror that is taken by law-makers to justify convicting and punishing offenders. To comply with (PI), criminal courts must demand proof that \(D\) committed this wrong as a precondition of conviction and punishment.
So understood, (PI) is anything but toothless. It is often claimed, nowadays, that too few suspected wrongdoers are convicted of crimes, and that new criminal laws are needed to help secure more convictions. On the revised view, legislators can create as many criminal laws as they want in pursuit of this objective. But no-one who pleads not guilty may be convicted under them without proof that they are the wrongdoers they are suspected of being. That it provides anyone who faces criminal charges with this kind of protection against the law, is what makes the case for the revised (PI).
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Other Internet Resources
- Duff, Antony, “Theories of Criminal Law,” Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Summer 2018 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/sum2018/entries/criminal-law/>. [This was the previous entry on Theories of Criminal Law in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy — see the version history.]