Notes to Curry's Paradox

1. The term “Curry’s paradox” appears to originate in Fitch 1952; other influential early formulations include Moh 1954, Geach 1955, and Prior 1955. These will be discussed in section 2. Precursors to Curry’s paradox are also found in the work of medieval and late scholastic logicians: for references and discussion, see Ashworth 1974: 125, Read 2001 and Hanke 2013.

2. Curry’s paper is entitled “The Inconsistency of Certain Formal Logics” (1942b). By “inconsistency”, he means absolute inconsistency, i.e., triviality.

3. Typically, a theory’s consequence relation will be a closure relation, in the sense that \(\Gamma \vdash_{\mathcal{T}} \alpha\) if and only if \(\alpha\) is among the sentences in \(Cn(\Gamma)\), where \(Cn\) is a closure operation. See entry on algebraic propositional logic. However, Ripley (2015b) shows that the consequence relations of many of the theories that yield “contraction-free” responses to Curry’s paradox (see section 4.2.1) fail to be closure relations.

4. The term “Curry sentence” is sometimes used in a narrower sense, namely for a sentence that says of itself (only) that if it is true, then \(p\) (or, alternatively, an absurdity) is true (e.g., Beall 2009: 33; Zardini 2011: 503). Some discussions (e.g., Restall 1994: vii; Humberstone 2006) demarcate the relevant notion using a biconditional rather than intersubstitutability, namely as any \(\kappa\) such that \(\vdash_{\mathcal{T}} \kappa {\leftrightarrow}(\kappa {\rightarrow}\pi)\). The disadvantage here is that the behavior of the \({\rightarrow}\) is tied to that of the \({\leftrightarrow}\), even though they play very different roles in generating paradox. Note that the mere existence of a Curry sentence for a sentence-theory pair poses no paradox, nor is it an objection to the theory in question. For example, \(\pi {\rightarrow}\pi\) will be a Curry sentence for \(\pi {\rightarrow}\pi\) and the theory that consists of the theorems of classical logic, since \(\pi {\rightarrow}\pi\) will be intersubstitutable with \((\pi {\rightarrow}\pi) {\rightarrow}(\pi {\rightarrow}\pi)\). The authors thank Lorenzo Rossi for raising this issue.

5. If the consequence relation \(\vdash_{\mathcal{T}}\) is assumed to be transitive, condition (ii) can be replaced with the condition that \(\pi' \vdash_{\mathcal{T}} \pi\). However, one of the responses to Curry’s paradox considered below rejects transitivity.

6. Section 6 will consider a somewhat broader family of paradoxes.

7. The letter \(h\) is chosen to correspond with the \(\mathfrak{H}\) that Curry 1942b uses to denote this property; likewise for \(u\) below.

8. Fitch considers the paradox in both its property-theoretic and set-theoretic versions (Fitch 1952: 89).

9. This is noted in Church’s contemporaneous review (Church 1942).

10. Strictly speaking, in his presentation, the “names” are numerals that denote numbers, not properties; properties are then given numerical codes.

11. Geach actually uses diagonalization based on a theory of syntax to achieve the required self-reference. He adds that “we might instead use the familiar Gödelian devices” for simulating self-reference using diagonalization based on a theory of arithmetic. See entry on Gödel’s incompleteness theorems.

12. On the relationship between Curry’s paradox and Löb’s theorem, see van Benthem (1978), who remarks on the “strange anti-parallel between Gödel’s proof, where a well-known semantic paradox inspired a formal result in terms of provability rather than truth, and Löb’s proof, where a semantic paradox … was extracted from a formal result about provability” (1978: 59).

13. This is not to be confused with a result in proof theory known as Curry’s Lemma following Anderson & Belnap (1975: 136).

14. Zardini (2015), who calls Cont the rule of “absorption”, notes that given MP it entails there can be no Curry sentence for an “unacceptable sentence” \(\pi\).

15. It is also closely related to the method used in Löb’s original proof of Löb’s theorem (1955).

16. A third counterpart of the Curry-Paradox Lemma replaces Cont with a rule which, in light of Peirce’s Law \(\vdash_{\mathcal{T}} ((\alpha {\rightarrow} \beta ) {\rightarrow}\alpha)) {\rightarrow}\alpha\), could be called Peirce’s Rule:

  • (PR)If \(\alpha {\rightarrow}\beta \vdash_{\mathcal{T}} \alpha\) then \(\vdash_{\mathcal{T}} \alpha\).

The proof of the Lemma is then structurally analogous to that in section 3.1. Here, too, one could instead use IdL and Peirce’s Law. Cf. Bunder 1986, Rogerson & Restall 2004. Unlike the principles used so far, Peirce’s Law and Peirce’s Rule fail in intuitionistic logic.

17. However, once a response rejects enough standard logical principles involving \({\rightarrow}\), it may be indeterminate whether it counts as a Curry-completeness or Curry-incompleteness response. That’s because the connective \({\rightarrow}\) appearing in the definition of a Curry sentence (Definition 1) was stipulated to be a conditional.

18. The grounds given for denying that a target theory \(\mathcal{T}\) is Curry-complete are typically parallel to grounds for denying that there is a sentence \(\lambda\) such that it and its negation \(\lnot\lambda\) are intersubstitutable according to \(\mathcal{T}\). And the respective moves will have parallel philosophical ramifications. An exception may be the early response to Curry’s paradox by Fitch (1952, 1969). Fitch presents several possible restrictions on the inference rules of a natural deduction system that are motivated specifically by Curry’s paradox. Since their effect is to ensure violations of (Property) and (Set), these are Curry-incompleteness responses. In particular, Fitch’s systems allow a derivation of \(\vdash_{\mathcal{T_P}} h \ \epsilon \ h {\rightarrow}\pi\). Yet, based on global features of that derivation, his “special restriction” and “restriction on nonrecurrence” would both block its extension to a derivation of \(\vdash_{\mathcal{T_P}} h \ \epsilon \ h\). For helpful discussion, see Anderson 1975 and Rogerson 2007.

19. Counterparts of the Curry-Paradox Lemma can be formulated using principles involving negation. For example, \(\lnot\alpha \vdash_{\mathcal{T}} \alpha {\rightarrow}\beta\) together with the classical reductio rule

If \(\lnot\alpha \vdash_{\mathcal{T}} \alpha\) then \(\vdash_{\mathcal{T}} \alpha\)

yield Peirce’s Rule of note 16. (Of course, in a language whose only “conditional” \(\alpha {\rightarrow}\beta\) is the material conditional \(\lnot\alpha \lor \beta\), the corresponding version of Curry’s paradox will involve negation. In that setting, Curry’s paradox poses a less distinctive challenge.)

20. Like Geach, they add that Curry’s paradox shows that “the properties of implication … do us in on their own”. (By “implication”, they mean a conditional; see note 23.)

21. Meyer et al. (1979) cite the relevant logics \(E\) and \(R\); the same is true of the contraction-free relevant logic \(RWX\) (Slaney 1989). Glutty responses to paradox that do admit of Curry-complete theories include Priest 2006, Beall 2009, and Beall 2015.

22. See also Restall 1993. Geach cites Moh’s paper, but there is little reason to think he had Ł\(_{3}\) in mind as a logic with which one “might … hope” to avoid the Liar paradox but which remains vulnerable to Curry’s paradox. That is because Curry sentences with respect to the primitive conditional \({\rightarrow}\), which fails to satisfy Cont, pose no problem for a theory based on Ł\(_{3}\). Gappy responses to paradox that admit of nontrivial Curry-complete theories include Kripke 1975, White 1979 and Field 2008.

23. See also Curry & Feys 1958: 259. By “implication”, Prior means a conditional. Several years earlier, Quine had remarked that the use of “conditional” in place of “implication” is “encouragingly on the increase” (1953: 451).

24. The fact that Curry’s paradox calls attention to this general structure could perhaps be what Curry et al. (1972) have in mind when they refer to Curry’s paradox as “the generalized Russell paradox”. However, their point is likely a different one, namely that Russell’s paradox becomes a special case of (the property- or set-theoretic form of) Curry’s paradox provided \(\lnot\alpha\) is defined as \(\alpha {\rightarrow}\bot\), as is possible in intuitionistic and classical logic.

25. The same result obtains if the requirement that \(\odot\) be a Curry connective is replaced with the requirement that it be a Curry\('\) connective, where this is defined by replacing P2 with

  • (P2′) If \(\odot\alpha \vdash_{\mathcal{T}} \alpha\) then \(\vdash_{\mathcal{T}} \alpha\). (See note 16.)

For what are, in effect, quite a number of other ways of generalizing the Curry-Paradox Lemma, see Bimbó 2006 and Humberstone 2006.

26. In the case of Russell’s paradox in set theory, \(\mu\) can be \(\{x: x \notin x\} \in \{x: x \notin x\}\). In the case of the Liar paradox, \(\mu\) can be \(T\langle\lambda\rangle\) where \(\lambda\) is \(\lnot T\langle\lambda\rangle\).

27. See also Curry & Feys 1958: 259. They add: “If one insists on regarding [\(\odot\alpha\), defined as \(\alpha {\rightarrow}\pi\)] as a species of negation, then that negation is a minimal negation”. As noted below, this is strictly speaking incorrect. The explanation is that Curry’s proof of the corresponding claim, in Curry 1952, assumes that the conditional is characterized using an extension of the sequent calculus in Curry 1950: 32–33, which includes the rule of structural exchange. This is what guarantees that \(\alpha \vdash (\alpha {\rightarrow}\pi) {\rightarrow}\pi\), i.e., \(\alpha \vdash _{\mathcal{T}} \odot\odot\alpha\).

28. These include the relevant logics \(T\) and \(E\) of Anderson & Belnap 1975, and many of the logics explored in Brady 2006.

29. More recent work includes Bacon 2015, Barrio et al. forthcoming, Cook 2014, Field 2017, Mares & Paoli 2014, Meadows 2014, Murzi 2014, Murzi & Shapiro 2015, Nicolai & Rossi 2017, Tajer & Pailos 2017, Priest 2015, Shapiro 2013 & 2015, Wansing & Priest 2015, Weber 2014, Zardini 2013 & 2014.

30. The predicate form of v-Curry is discussed in detail by Beall & Murzi (2013); it is mentioned by Whittle (2004) and Shapiro (2011). The connective and predicate forms are equivalent provided \(Val(\langle\alpha\rangle, \langle\beta \rangle)\) and \(\alpha {\Rightarrow}\beta \) are intersubstitutable according to \(\mathcal{T}_{V}\). Accordingly, while the predicate form is a semantic paradox (in the sense that it concerns a feature of expressions that depends on their interpretation), it can be obtained by constructing a property- or set-theoretic Curry sentence \(\kappa\) intersubstitutable according to \(\mathcal{T}_{V}\) with \(\kappa {\Rightarrow}\pi\) and ensuring that the latter sentence is in turn intersubstitutable with \(Val(\langle\kappa\rangle, \langle\pi\rangle)\).

31. The status of rules such as VP and VD is a topic of controversy: see Field 2017.

32. Indeed, Nicolai & Rossi (forthcoming) argue that v-Curry paradoxes motivate responses according to which a third structural principle, namely the reflexivity principle \(\phi \vdash_{\mathcal{T}_{V}}\! \phi\) codified by Id, can fail in cases where \(\phi \) contains a predicate expressing the relation \(\vdash_{\mathcal{T}_{V}}\).

33. The non-uniformity considered at the start of section 4 was a matter of giving different responses to ordinary Curry paradoxes arising in different domains (such as property theory set theory). The non-uniformity considered in section 5.2 was a matter of different connectives failing to qualify as Curry connectives for different reasons.

Copyright © 2017 by
Lionel Shapiro <>
Jc Beall <>

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