Religious Daoism

First published Fri Aug 19, 2016; substantive revision Mon Aug 31, 2020

It has become a sinological dogma to distinguish between the so-called Taoist school (Daojia), said to have produced the classical mystical texts …, and the so-called Taoist religion (Daojiao), often said to have begun in the Later Han period [i.e., the 1st–2nd centuries CE]. The successive Daozang [Daoist Canons] never made this distinction. When we look at the way the terms Daojia and Daojiao occur in the texts preserved in the Ming Canon [published in 1445], we see that they are practically synonymous and interchangeable. —Kristofer Schipper (Schipper and Verellen 2004: 6)

There could be no better introduction to the present article than the passage quoted above from one of the main Western scholarly works on Daoism (or Taoism), even though it calls into question not only the relevance of this article, but also the actual existence of its subject. Daoist texts do not speak of “philosophy” or “religion”, two words that do not even exist in the premodern Chinese language. They speak, instead, of what they call the “house”, “family” or “lineage of the Dao” (daojia; also translatable in the plural), and of what they call the “teachings of the Dao” or “teachings on the Dao” (daojiao). Daoists, who obviously have understood these terms in their literal senses, have seen them as defining the same entity: there cannot be “teaching” without “lineage”, and vice versa.

Even if the term “religious Daoism” is accepted, it is not clear which entity it should define, and different scholars might explain its meaning in different ways. Should “religion” include all of Daoism except for its “philosophy”? This would probably exclude the views of the Daode jing (Book of the Way and Its Virtue; §1.1 below), which Daoists have seen as an integral part—in fact, as the source—of their tradition. Omitting these views would be something like writing a survey of Christianity that intentionally neglects to consider the thought and works of the theologians. Should “religion” only include communal ritual with the related pantheons of gods, on the one hand, and the priestly and monastic institutions, on the other? If so, an article on “religious Daoism” would exclude meditation, alchemy, and other individual practices that Daoists—including those who did not practice them—have seen as major components of their tradition.

Daoism is a tradition as complex and heterogeneous as Buddhism, Islam, Judaism, or Christianity. The modern categories of philosophy and religion can help to comprehend its “otherness” (Seidel 1997: 39) by interpreting its different manifestations according to a supposedly familiar framework. Yet, the use of these categories can also lead an observer to look only at the aspects of the tradition that fit the chosen framework, and only within the terms of that framework. This may result in creating distinctions and boundaries that do not exist within the tradition itself. Even worse, the whole issue might simply consist of imposing one cultural model over a different one.

The present article attempts to take into account the Western scholarly views on Daoism as well as the Daoists’ views of their own tradition. As a consequence, it is based on a broad definition of what we might call Daoist religion (a term that should replace the more widely-used “religious Daoism”), and also includes views that pertain to what we might call Daoist philosophy (or Daoist thought, a term more appropriate than “philosophical Daoism”).

1. Early Daoist Texts

It would hardly be possible to identify a school or a lineage in the history of Daoism which denies that the entire Daoist tradition, in the forms in which it has been transmitted for about two and a half millennia, ultimately derives from Laozi and from the work that is ascribed to him, the Daode jing or Book of the Way and Its Virtue.

As shown below, neither has Daoism evolved exclusively on the basis of this work, nor does evidence exist of a historical continuity between Laozi and the Daode jing, on the one hand, and the different forms in which Daoism has developed, on the other. Equally significant, however, is the fact that, in a traditional doctrine such as Daoism, history in the ordinary sense of the term can be altered at will to frame a “sacred history” of the teaching. The main point is establishing and exhibiting a bond between an integral exposition of the doctrine—which Daoists find in the Daode jing—and the particular teachings and practices of the individual schools or lineages. To give a few examples, this can be done by asserting that a particular “Way” (dao) derives from a revelation by Laozi, either in his human or in his divine aspect; or by placing Laozi at the origins of (or within) a “pre-historical” line of transmission; or simply by using, in textual sources, key sentences or terms from the Daode jing. In these and several other ways, Laozi and the Daode jing are, for the Daoists, one of the main vehicles used to declare their identity as Daoists.

Among early works, the Daoist tradition usually places the Zhuangzi immediately after the Daode jing. A third text, the Liezi, has fallen into a sort of limbo, especially after A.C. Graham demonstrated that parts of the received text are not authentic and date from not earlier than the 2nd century CE (instead of the 4th century BCE, as was supposed earlier; Graham 1961). Recently, however, there have been efforts to rehabilitate this work (Barrett 2011), also motivated by the fact that it appears to contain lost fragments of the Zhuangzi.

1.1 Laozi and the Daode jing

Current Western scholarship is virtually unanimous in asserting that there was no historical Laozi. The reputed author of the Daode jing, whose name means Old Master, might be best seen as a “collective entity” who embodies the nameless tradition—mainly oral, as far as we know—that is behind the text and the ideal of sainthood that the text describes.

While the author and his work are traditionally dated to the 6th century BCE, the Mawangdui and especially the Guodian manuscripts (discovered in 1972 and 1993, respectively; Henricks 1989 and 2000) have helped to establish that early exemplars of the Daode jing—shorter than the current versions and different from one another—circulated by the latter half of the 4th century BCE. It is also usually acknowledged, though, that the text incorporates earlier oral traditions. While this makes the issue of dating virtually impossible to solve, it also suggests that at first there was no “original” and “complete” exemplar of the text, which probably existed in several versions of varying content and length until, probably in the late 3rd century BCE, it was compiled in a form close to the one we know today. (For overviews of the Daode jing and its exegetical tradition, see Chan 2000 and Robinet 1999, respectively.)

The Daode jing discusses three main subjects: the Dao, the saint (or the realized person), and the ruler and his government. Several early Chinese traditions speak of a Dao, or “Way”, but the Daode jing is the earliest source that uses this word to designate the origin and source of existence. As the absolute principle, the Dao is beyond description or definition. It does not even have a name: the word dao is used only because one “is forced” to refer to it (sec. 25). [Here and below, references are to the number of section in the 81-section editions of the text, a subdivision also adopted in most translations into Western languages.] Being formless, the Dao is “constant” (chang, 1), does not undergo change (41), and is “invisible”, “inaudible”, and “imperceptible” (14). Yet the Dao contains an “essence” (jing) that is the seed of its self-manifestation (21), which occurs without intention and through “non-doing” (wuwei; 37). The faculty through which the Dao manifests itself, and generates and nourishes all individual entities, is its de, or “virtue, power”, the second term in the title of the Daode jing. Under this aspect, the Dao is called the “beginning” of the world and its “mother” (1). The two aspects of the Dao—the absolute and its manifestation as the relative—“come forth together”, and their coexistence is “mystery and then again mystery” (1).

The highest realized person in the Daode jing is the shengren, a term that, in a Daoist context, is sometimes translated as “saint” to distinguish it from the Confucian “sage”. While the Confucian sage embodies the highest ethical standards of benevolence (ren) and righteousness (yi), the Daoist saint operates in the world by taking the operation of the Dao as his model: according to the Daode jing, benevolence, righteousness, and the other qualities of the Confucian sage emerge only “when the Dao is abandoned” (18). The Daoist saint does not act on the basis of personal interest, advantage, or desire; he does not take initiative; and he does not intend to lead others (3, 7, 22, 37, 57, 67). Instead, he is in the front by placing himself “behind”, and acts only by responding to what external circumstances require. This is his “non-doing” (wuwei), the perfect action in which “there is no doing, yet nothing is not done” (48; the same is also said of the operation of the Dao, 37).

Although the reciprocal tasks are different, the ruler is supposed to operate in the kingdom in the same way as the saint operates in the world. The Daode jing expresses this view in words analogous to those quoted above for the saint: “Do non-doing, and there is nothing that is not governed” (3). This involves that the ruler should issue few laws and prohibitions (57) and instead allow the people to operate by themselves (37). Since the Confucian virtues arise “when the Dao is abandoned” and “when the country is in confusion” (5, 18), the saintly ruler should not use them as principles of government.

1.2 Zhuangzi

Zhuangzi—whose name was Zhuang Zhou—probably lived between 370 and 280 BCE. He wrote the “Inner Chapters” (1–7) of the eponymous work, which form the first of its three main parts. The two other parts, namely the “Outer Chapters” (8–22) and the “Miscellaneous Chapters” (23–33), contain writings by different groups of authors. (For overviews of the Zhuangzi, its textual layers, and its commentaries, see Graham 1989: 170–211; Mair 2000; and Roth 2014.)

Zhuangzi’s view of the Dao is in agreement with Laozi’s view:

The Way has its reality and its signs but is without action or form. You can hand it down but you cannot receive it; you can get it but you cannot see it. It is its own source, its own root. Before Heaven and Earth existed it was there, firm from ancient times. (ch. 6; trans. Watson 1968: 81)

However, Zhuangzi repeatedly brings forth the issue of whether and how the Dao can be known. As the Dao is the absolute, it cannot be made an object; therefore its knowledge cannot be attained by the ordinary mind, which functions by establishing distinctions between “self and other”, “this and that”, “right and wrong”, and other relative concepts (ch. 2; Watson, 36–49). Zhuangzi’s analysis of the human mind is in fact an epistemology: since the Dao is ultimately unknowable through the ordinary mind, there is only one way to know it: through “the knowledge that does not know” (ch. 4; Watson, 58).

The human ideal of Zhuangzi reflects this view:

The True Man (or realized person, zhenren) of ancient times did not rebel against want, did not grow proud in plenty, and did not plan his affairs … [He] was able to climb all the way up to the Way … [He] knew nothing of loving life, knew nothing of hating death. (ch. 6; Watson, 77–78)

In the Zhuangzi, the theme of “inner freedom” receives more emphasis compared to the Daode jing: freedom from social rules, from ingrained patterns of thought, from “essentialism” (the belief that things have permanent characteristics that make them what they are), and from conventional “self-identity”.

In the “Inner Chapters”, the refusal to elevate ethics to a primary principle follows the views of the Daode jing:

The way I see it, the rules of benevolence and righteousness and the paths of right and wrong are all hopelessly snarled and jumbled. (ch. 2; Watson, 45–46)

In agreement with this view, Zhuangzi is disillusioned about the possibility of using ordinary ethical virtues as a basis for politics and government:

To try to govern the world like this is like trying to walk the ocean, to drill through a river, or to make a mosquito shoulder a mountain! (ch. 7; Watson, 93; see also 66–67)

For Zhuangzi, the enlightened ruler is the one whose achievements “appear not to be his own doing”. Thus “the people do not depend on him … [and] he lets everything find its own enjoyment” (ch. 7; Watson, 94). The speaker of this passage is Laozi himself, whose views on “non-doing” in government are accepted by Zhuangzi.

The Zhuangzi began to have a noticeable influence on the later Daoist tradition from the 4th century CE, when it became one of the sources of inspiration for the Shangqing (Highest Clarity) school of Daoism (see §3.3). Since then, this work has contributed an impressive number of ideas, concepts, and terms to later Daoist works (Robinet 1983). These include the “fasting of the mind” (xinzhai; ch. 4; Watson, 54–58) and the “sitting and forgetting” (zuowang; ch. 6; Watson, 90–91), two expressions that in later Daoism denote methods of self-cultivation, but in the Zhuangzi describe the inner state of the realized person. (For the view that they refer to actual practices also in the Zhuangzi, see Roth 1997.)

2. Origins of Daoist Religion

In addition to the teachings of the Daode jing and the figure of Laozi, several other major components contributed to the early development of Daoism. Only a few of the most important ones can be surveyed here.

2.1 Exorcism and “Shamanism”

We may begin by mentioning exorcism, a set of diverse practices based on the belief that illnesses and various other disturbances are caused by malevolent entities, including demons. The officiant who takes charge of these phenomena is the wu, a term that denotes a male or female medium or healer but is often translated as “shaman”. The wu is capable of dealing with the realm of demonic creatures and administers proper remedies—for example, protective talismans (fu) and herbal medicines—to those affected by such creatures. While these and analogous practices have continued to exist throughout the history of Daoism, it should be noted that the typical shamanic “trance” has never been part of Daoist practices.

2.2 “Far Roaming”

Some scholars have suggested that “shamanism” is related to another theme developed by later Daoist traditions: the “far roaming” (yuanyou), or imaginary journeys to the extremities of the world or to the farthest regions of the cosmos (Kohn 1992: 96–104). Best known among these accounts is the “Yuanyou” (Far Roaming) poem, dating from the 2nd century BCE (Kroll 1996). Here the author describes an “ecstatic journey” during which he visits the remotest regions of the earth, encounters realized beings, ascends to celestial palaces, and finally enters the realm of the Great Beginning (taichu). Later Daoist traditions have used the “far roaming” imagery in different contexts: breathing techniques for the absorption of the pure energies (qi) found at the boundaries of the cosmos, meditation practices that involve walking on constellations in the heavens, and accounts of initiatory journeys to the four directions of the world made by saints and immortals, who find texts and receive teachings from divine beings (see §9.3).

2.3 The Fangshi, or Masters of the Methods

Besides the wu, a quite different class of practitioners is known under the collective name of fangshi (“masters of the methods” or “of the recipes”). While they also operated within society as a whole, many fangshi were employed by rulers from the 4th century BCE onwards. Their fields of expertise included different cosmological and esoteric arts: astronomy and astrology; divination and hemerology; medicine and healing; alchemy; and sexual, breathing, and other longevity practices. In Anna Seidel’s felicitous definition (1983a: 294), the fangshi were people who had the “know-how”. In a broader perspective, it is important to note that several methods originally associated with the fangshi were later incorporated into Daoist practices. With this class of practitioners, we are in fact much closer to what Daoism would become in later times: as noted by John Lagerwey (1986: 282–83), not the “shaman” (with his or her ecstasies and trances), but the “diviner” (who fashions a “rational” world relying on images and emblems with precise meanings and functions) is the predecessor of the Daoist master and the Daoist priest.

Unlike those of the wu, several practices associated with the fangshi—in particular, their mantic arts—were based on the Chinese cosmological system, which took shape in the 3rd and 2nd centuries BCE (Harper 1999; Csikszentmihalyi 2000; Kalinowski 2004). Notes on the main features of this system and its uses in Daoism will be found below (§4.3). Here we should briefly note two points. First, Chinese cosmology is not tied to any particular intellectual or technical legacy. Its creation can be seen as the result of an effort to create a comprehensive system open to application to a large variety of fields, with contributions from specialists of various traditional sciences—especially diviners, astronomers, and physicians—and from thinkers of different currents. Second, as was noted by Isabelle Robinet (1997b: 260), “unlike other religions, we must look for the fundamental structure, the unity, and the continuity of Taoism in its cosmological discourse and not in its pantheon”. While Daoism has had different pantheons in different times and places (see §5.2), its views on the relation between Dao and cosmos have remained substantially unchanged throughout its history, and these views have usually been formulated on the basis of the standard Chinese cosmological system.

2.4 Huang-Lao Daoism

With regard to Daoism per se, Huang-Lao dao (Way of the Yellow Emperor and Laozi) is the name under which one part of the tradition was known in the early Han period (2nd century BCE). The precise contours of this “Way” are unclear, but it may be equivalent to the early meaning of the term Daojia (“lineage(s) of the Dao”) as defined by Sima Tan (fl. ca. 135 BCE) in the Shiji (Records of the Historian; see Roth and Queen 2000). The Huang-Lao adepts saw Laozi as the master who set forth the principles of government in the Daode jing, and Huangdi (the Yellow Emperor) as the ruler who applied them for the first time in human history. Huangdi continued to play the role of the perfect “Daoist” ruler in later times: having received teachings in various disciplines—medicine, alchemy, sexual practices, dietetics, etc.—from different gods, goddesses, and immortals, he would become the patron of some of them. In later times, Laozi and Huangdi were even associated with one another as a single deity under the name Huanglao jun, lit., Yellow Old Lord.

In addition to the central notion of government by “non-doing” (wuwei), the Huang-Lao dao appears to have promoted not only other teachings of the Daode jing, such as the requirement of self-cultivation by the ruler, but also—displaying the first hints of the integration of Daode jing teachings and cosmological thought—the regulation of political and social life according to cosmic cycles, such as those of the seasons. The Huang-Lao ideology enjoyed some success at court during the early decades of the Han dynasty, but quietly disappeared after Confucianism was adopted as official state doctrine by Emperor Wu of the Han (r. 140–87 BCE). Nevertheless, its political views continued to form one of the bases of the Daoist teachings.

In the past few decades, scholars have described some excavated manuscripts as Huang-Lao sources (e.g., Yates 1997), but no firm conclusion has been reached on this point. The same is true of the Huainan zi (The Master of Huainan), a major work completed in 139 BCE under the patronage of Liu An (180–122 BCE), the ruler of the southern kingdom of Huainan (in present-day Anhui). The Huainan zi contains sections devoted to thought, government, self-cultivation, ethics, mythology, hagiography, astronomy, topography, music, military affairs, and other traditional sciences (Le Blanc and Mathieu 2003; Major et al. 2010). Its aims of synthesis are also shown by more than 800 quotations drawn from other texts, including about one hundred from the Daode jing and over 250 from the Zhuangzi. Yet, although the Huainan zi is included in the Daoist Canon and later Daoist hagiography has welcomed Liu An as an “immortal”, the text as a whole can hardly be described as Daoist. In a historical perspective, the Huainan zi is, rather, the main source that documents the integration of early Daoist thought with cosmology and with several cosmological sciences. More broadly, as was noted by Nathan Sivin (1995), it is one of a series of important texts, written between the 3rd and the 1st century BCE, that provide extensive overviews of cosmology, government, and self-cultivation in view of the creation of a comprehensive ideology that would serve as the foundation for a newly created Chinese empire. These works also include the Lüshi chunqiu (Springs and Autumns of Sire Lü; Knoblock and Riegel 2001), the Chunqiu fanlu (Luxuriant Dew on the Spring and Autumn Annals; Queen 1996), and—with focus on medicine, but sharing the same foundations—the Huangdi neijing (Inner Book of the Yellow Emperor; Unschuld and Tessenow 2011).

2.5 The Divinization of Laozi

In addition to the components outlined above, the process that, in the second half of the 2nd century CE, led to the formation of the first major Daoist religious movement (see §3.1) could not be understood without paying attention to the political ideologies of ancient China. These ideologies are synthesized in the concept of the Great Peace (taiping), which was shared by different traditions including Confucianism (Seidel 1983b; Espesset 2009). With regard to Daoism, the main source that documents these views is the Taiping jing (Book of the Great Peace), originally dating from the 1st or the 2nd centuries CE (Hendrischke 2006). The central idea in the Taiping jing is the advent of an era of “peace” (ping, also meaning “equity”) in which a perfect ruler would establish a perfect society. This era would follow calamities designed to eliminate the corrupted ones, but would come only if the ruler governs according to the principle of “returning to the Dao”.

The views of the Taiping jing are the first important example of Chinese millenarianism, which would become a further major theme in the Daoist tradition from the 2nd until at least the 7th centuries (Mollier 2008b). Amid the social tumults and the natural calamities that marked the last part of the Han rule, expectations and prophecies of a forthcoming messiah—often predicted to be surnamed Li—grew during the 2nd century of our era (Seidel 1969–70 and 1983b).

That savior turned out to be Laozi himself—one of whose names was Li Er—who became a deity under the name of Laojun, or Lord Lao (Seidel 1969). In 165 and 166, rites were celebrated in Huxian, Laozi’s supposed birthplace; and in 166, Emperor Huan (r. 147–168) performed—for the first and only time in Chinese history—a ceremony in his honor in the imperial palace. However, the deification process may have begun even earlier, and the possibility that the “secular” Laozi was already the object of cults is suggested by one of the main sources on his deification, namely the Laozi ming (Inscription for Laozi; Seidel 1969: 43–50 and 121–28; Csikszentmihalyi 2006: 105–12). This work, written on the occasion of Emperor Huan’s ceremony, contains a biography of Laozi, an account of the events that led Huan to perform the rite, and a poetical eulogy of Laozi as a saint who follows the doctrines of “non-doing” and eliminating desires. Significantly, in this source Laozi is not yet called “god” (shen) and not even “lord” (jun).

The Laozi bianhua jing (Book of the Transformations of Laozi), dating from the late 2nd century and possibly originating from a popular cult in Sichuan (Seidel 1969: 59–75), enjoins recitation of the Daode jing and confession of sins, and is the first of several works that mention one of the main features of Laozi as a deity: in addition to personifying the Dao and to being a model of the Daoist sage, Lord Lao periodically descends to earth in order to bestow teachings to humanity and especially to rulers. This has two important consequences. First, from this time onwards the Dao takes an active role in the human world, either through its divine emissaries or by granting revelations to certain adepts. Second, the “historical” Laozi—the author of the Daode jing—is only one of the different forms that Lord Lao has taken in order to guide humanity.

3. Main Schools and Lineages

This section does not intend to provide a historical overview of the Daoist tradition, but only brief notes on its principal schools and lineages. (The only book-length study of the history of Daoism in a Western language is Robinet 1997b, which however only covers the period from the origins to the 14th century. Shorter, reliable historical surveys include Schipper 2000 and Bokenkamp 2005a.)

3.1 Tianshi dao (Way of the Celestial Masters)

In one of his transformations, Laojun (Lord Lao) appeared—in 142 CE, according to the traditional date—to Zhang Daoling and established with him the Covenant with the Powers of Orthodox Unity (zhengyi mengwei). Zhang Daoling, who may have been a healer, was named Celestial Master (tianshi), and he in turn pledged to establish a community that would follow Daoist principles. His grandson and third Celestial Master, Zhang Lu, created and presided over a politically and economically autonomous “theocracy” in Hanzhong (in present-day Sichuan), subdivided into 24 zhi (“administrations”, sometimes rendered as “parishes” by scholars who see analogies with the early Christian Church).

Since its origins, Tianshi dao, or the Way of the Celestial Masters, proposed to provide an exemplary and comprehensive model of religious and social organization (Hendrischke 2000; Schipper 2008; Kleeman 2010 and 2016). The population was organized and governed on the basis of “registers” (lu), which existed in two forms: household registers (recording births, marriages, and deaths) and individual registers (conferring rank in the social and celestial bureaucracies, and listing the spirits under a person’s command, whose number increased according to age). Healing rites were one of the main practices. Importantly, illnesses were seen as owed neither to demonic influences (as in exorcism) nor to imbalance of cosmic forces (as in classical medicine), but to moral faults. As part of the healing ritual, an officiant submitted petitions—reporting the petitioner’s fault, confession, repentance, and request for aid—to the Officers of Earth, Water, and Heaven, the three main original Tianshi dao deities. An analogous emphasis on ethics and morals is the main feature of the best-known early Tianshi dao text, a partially-preserved commentary to the Daode jing (Bokenkamp 1997: 29–148).

The diaspora of the Celestial Masters’ communities after the end of the Han (early 3rd century) had the unintended result of spreading the religion throughout China. Under the name Way of the Correct Unity (Zhengyi dao), Tianshi dao is in the present day one of the two main branches of Daoism, where it takes charge of the main forms of communal ritual.

3.2 The “Southern Tradition”

After the period of the Three Kingdoms (220–80), China was reunified by the Jin dynasty. Unification, however, lasted only for a few decades. The southward migrations that followed the fall of the capital Luoyang to the Xiongnu in 311 involved not only members of the court and the aristocracy, but also representatives of Tianshi dao. As a result, the religion of the Celestial Masters reached Jiangnan, the region south of the lower Yangzi river, and apparently for the first time came in touch with the traditions of that region. The events that followed left a permanent mark on the history of Daoism.

The native “Southern tradition” comprised methods for summoning benevolent deities and expelling demonic entities, various types of “longevity practices”, as well as meditation and alchemy (Andersen 1994; Campany 2002: 18–97; Steavu 2015). A survey of these traditions is given by Ge Hong (283–343) in the “Inner Chapters” (“Neipian”) of his Baopu zi (Book of the Master Who Embraces Spontaneous Nature, ca. 320). This work (trans. Ware 1966; part. trans. Che 1999) provides a comprehensive overview of religion in Jiangnan shortly before the arrival of the Celestial Masters, seen through the eyes of a member of one of the main families of Jiangnan aristocracy.

According to Ge Hong, three textual bodies incorporated the higher religious traditions of Jiangnan. The first consisted of scriptures based on talismans (fu), mainly represented by the Sanhuang wen (Script of the Three Sovereigns; Steavu 2019). Owning them, or even holding them in one’s hands, granted protection against assaults of demons, dangers brought by external forces, and even death. The second and third textual bodies were based on meditation and alchemy, respectively, described by Ge Hong as the highest forms of self-cultivation. The main meditation practice is “guarding the One” (shouyi), which consists in visualizing the god that represents Unity in its multiple residences within the human being. Alchemical elixirs, instead, were superior to herbal drugs: while the “medicines of herbs and plants” can only heal illnesses and grant a long life, the elixirs grant immortality.

3.3 Shangqing (Highest Clarity) and Lingbao (Numinous Treasure)

Against this background, the representatives of the religious legacies of Jiangnan responded to the newly-imported cults and rites of the Celestial Masters by reformulating and recodifying certain aspects of their own traditions in ways that also admitted elements of the new religion. This led to the creation of two major new “schools”, which actually consist in two textual corpora and the related practices. The first one is Shangqing (Highest Clarity), based on revelations that occurred from 364 to 370 near present-day Nanjing (Strickmann 1977; Robinet 2000). Its main scripture, the Dadong zhenjing (True Book of the Great Cavern), describes visualization methods of the inner gods, including illustrations, chants, and talismans (fu). This and other works make clear that Shangqing incorporates earlier traditions, but reorganizes and ranks them in a different way compared to the past: meditation is now the main practice, and even alchemy is modified to include processes that cannot take place in the laboratory but only within the adept’s own person.

While the main function of the Shangqing master is to transmit texts and oral instructions, the priest is at the center of the second corpus. The Lingbao (Numinous Treasure) revelations occurred in the years 397–402, when Ge Chaofu—Ge Hong’s grand-nephew—received another set of scriptures (Bokenkamp 1983; Yamada 2000). The Lingbao synthesis of different traditions is even more visible compared to Shangqing: it incorporates elements of Tianshi dao ritual and pantheon, as well as certain aspects of Shangqing itself (including visualization, performed for instance by the priest when he sends off his own inner gods to submit petitions to the highest celestial deities). In addition, Lingbao shows the first substantial signs of the integration of Buddhist elements into Daoism: in particular, its notion of “universal salvation” (including a version of the “Bodhisattva vow”) and also its cosmology, reflected in a system of ranked “heavens” (see §5.1). At the center of Lingbao lies communal ritual. The new codification by Lu Xiujing (406–77), which followed the original revelations by a few decades, served as the blueprint for several later ones, and clear traces of it are still apparent in present-day Daoist ritual.

3.4 The “Three Caverns”

With the creation of the Shangqing and Lingbao corpora, Daoism for the first time clearly defined its two main poles, which consist of both individual practices (codified in the Shangqing corpus) and communal practices (codified in the Lingbao corpus). In the 5th century, the relations among these corpora and the other traditions of Jiangnan were formally defined in the system of the Three Caverns (sandong), which is traditionally attributed to Lu Xiujing but clearly reflects the perspectives of the Daoist community as a whole (Schipper and Verellen 2004: 14–17). In this system, the main Daoist traditions and scriptural corpora of southeastern China are arranged into three hierarchical groups, namely (1) Shangqing, (2) Lingbao, and (3) Sanhuang (Three Sovereigns, understood as the Sanhuang wen and related textual materials). Each Cavern corresponds to a heaven and is ruled by one of the three highest Daoist gods: Yuanshi tianzun (Celestial Venerable of the Original Commencement), Lingbao tianzun (Celestial Venerable of the Numinous Treasure), and Daode tianzun (Celestial Venerable of the Dao and Its Virtue, another name of the deified Laozi). The Three Caverns also provided a model for other aspects of doctrine and practice, including the ranks of priestly ordination and the classification of scriptures in the future Daoist Canons (id., 17–37). (On the Daoist Canon see Schipper and Verellen 2004; a shorter survey is found in Bokenkamp and Boltz 1986.)

3.5 Tang and Five Dynasties

The founding of the Tang dynasty (618–907) was accompanied by millenarian prophecies about the advent of a sage-emperor surnamed Li (Bokenkamp 1994). As we saw before (§2.5), this was also the surname of the Han-dynasty messiah; four centuries later, the powerful Li clan claimed to belong to Laozi’s lineage, and its rise to the throne was supported by representatives of the Shangqing lineage. The Shangqing patriarch Wang Yuanzhi (528–635) predicted the rise of the Tang, informed Li Yuan that he would become the next emperor, and secretly transmitted to him the “registers” of the Celestial Mandate (tianming). Li Yuan—the future Emperor Gaozu—finally founded the Tang dynasty. These events marked the beginning of the ascent of Shangqing to a status similar to “state religion”, which it maintained throughout the first half of the dynasty (Barrett 1996; Kohn and Kirkland 2000). The support of the court culminated in ca. 740 with the compilation of the Kaiyuan daozang (Daoist Canon of the Kaiyuan Reign Period), the first of a series of imperially-sponsored collections of Daoist texts.

While the disastrous An Lushan rebellion of 755–63 put an end to the glory of the Tang dynasty, for Daoism as a whole the Tang was an age of consolidation, but also of major changes and innovations. With regard to ritual, the Tang period and the successive decades of the Five Dynasties (907–60) were marked by two important new codifications, respectively created by Zhang Wanfu (fl. 710–13; Benn 1991) and by Du Guangting (850–933), one of the foremost “court Daoists” of all times (Verellen 1989). After its introduction in the 1st century and its development during the Six Dynasties, in the Tang period Buddhism became substantially “sinified” with the rise of new schools, the most important of which are Tiantai and Chan (Jpn. Zen), and with the spread of “popular” Tantric practices. (On Daoism and Buddhism see Zürcher 1980 and Mollier 2008a; for an overview of the main points, see Bokenkamp 2004.) This led to two phenomena that became constant in the second millennium: competition for state patronage, on the one hand, and repeated attempts to synthesize the “Three Teachings” (Confucianism, Daoism, and Buddhism), on the other. Intersections of Daoist and Buddhist thought and religion are visible in doctrines (Robinet 2004), cults (with several shared deities, e.g., Avalokiteśvara/Guanyin; Mollier 2008a, 174–208), and meditation practices (see §9.4).

Finally, this period marked not only the highest stage of development of Waidan (External Alchemy), but also the beginnings of Neidan (Internal Alchemy; see §10). The first clearly identifiable Neidan lineage is the Zhong-Lü (named after the two immortals, Zhongli Quan and Lü Dongbin), which appears to have developed from the second half of the Tang period.

3.6 New Lineages in the Song Dynasty

After China was reunified by the Song dynasty (960–1279), major changes in society—in particular urbanization, the creation of a market economy, and the rise to prominence of new classes, especially in the southeastern regions—led to major transformations in religion. The institution of “lay associations”, whose main function was (in addition to performing various meritorious actions) supporting the local temple, was especially important in the development of Daoism, and at the same time in furthering the incorporation of cults to local deities and saints into the Daoist pantheon and liturgy.

The Way of the Celestial Masters (then based at Mount Longhu, in present-day Jiangxi) was officially assigned the task of ordaining priests, but a series of revelations resulted in the creation of lineages that, in several cases, claimed to have been originated by Zhang Daoling himself. Between the mid-10th and the mid-13th centuries, five main lineages were established: Tianxin (Celestial Heart), Shenxiao (Divine Empyrean), Yutang dafa (Great Rites of the Jade Hall), Lingbao dafa (Great Rites of the Numinous Treasure), and Qingwei (Pure Tenuity). All of them were based on different codifications of ritual—including exorcist rites—but with little variation in the basic practices (Boltz 1987: 26–49; Skar 2000). Local communities, in addition, had their own ritual specialists, known as fashi (“ritual masters”), a term that designated, as it still does in the present day, lay officiants who specialize in exorcist practices (Davis 2001).

The Song dynasty and the successive Mongol Yuan dynasty (1271–1368) also saw important developments in the traditions of Internal Alchemy (Neidan), especially with the creation of Nanzong, the Southern Lineage, which is ascribed with one of the main codifications of the alchemical practice (see §10.3).

3.7 Quanzhen (Complete Reality, or Complete Perfection)

In 1127, the Jurchen Jin dynasty (1115–1234) captured Kaifeng, and the Song dynasty was obliged to move its capital to Hangzhou, establishing the Southern Song dynasty (1127–1279). It was under the Jin rule that Quanzhen (Complete Reality, or Complete Perfection) was created (Yao 2000; Goossaert 2001; Marsone 2010). This monastic order is, with the Way of the Celestial Masters, the main branch of present-day Daoism.

Quanzhen was founded by Wang Zhe (1113–70), who was active as a preacher in Shandong in the late 1160s, and by his seven main disciples, among whom Ma Yu, Sun Bu’er (the latter’s wife), and Qiu Chuji deserve mention. Five “lay associations” were established to support the teaching, which spread rapidly. Controversies with Buddhism led to proscriptions in the second half of the 13th century, which included the burning of a Daoist Canon recently compiled by Quanzhen representatives. Quanzhen, however, maintained a strong local presence, and after the reunification of China under the Yuan dynasty it obtained again the favor of the court. While the Ming dynasty (1368–1644) gave priority to the Celestial Masters, Wang Changyue (1592–1680) gained the support of the newly-established Manchu Qing dynasty (1644–1912). Since then, his Longmen (Dragon Gate) lineage has been the main branch of Quanzhen (Esposito 2004). In the present day, Wang Changyue’s temple, the Baiyun Guan (Abbey of the White Cloud) in Beijing, is the seat of the China Daoist Association (Zhongguo daojiao xiehui).

Unlike Tianshi dao, whose priests are married and live with their families, Quanzhen is a celibate monastic order, and under this form it has propagated mainly in northern China. In addition to certain forms of ritual, the main practices of Quanzhen monks include meditation and Internal Alchemy (Eskildson 2004). However, the overall image of Quanzhen (and Longmen) is complex, as it also includes non-institutional and non-monastic forms. At their origins lies the fact that Wang Zhe and his seven disciples are also identified as the so-called Beizong, or Northern Lineage, of Neidan; and especially the fact that Longmen as a whole traces its origins to the above-mentioned Qiu Chuji, who is traditionally known as a Neidan practitioner. From the Yuan period onwards, therefore, several masters and adepts of Neidan have claimed affiliation to Quanzhen and/or Longmen, and have created innumerable sub-lineages throughout China with little or no connection to the central institution.

4. Dao and Cosmos

This and the following three sections are concerned with subjects that are relevant to Daoism as a whole: cosmology, gods and rituals, soteriology, and the views of the human being and the human body. In different ways and to different extents, all of them have contributed to frame doctrines and practices of several Daoist schools or lineages.

4.1 The Dao and the “Ten Thousand Things”

Whether it addresses itself to the community or the individual, Daoism purports to provide ways and methods for “returning to the Dao” (fandao, huandao). Discussing the main points of doctrine before approaching their particular subjects is—in addition to references to Laozi and the Daode jing, already noted above—the other main way used in Daoist texts to declare their affiliation to Daoism.

In the Daoist view, the Dao is both the “ultimateless” (or “limitless”, wuji, a term akin in meaning to “absolute” or “infinite”) and the “great ultimate” (taiji). In the first sense, the Dao is devoid of definition, determination, form, name, attributes, and qualities. Yet, it comprises all definitions, determinations, forms, etc., none of which could exist outside it. From the perspective of the “ten thousand things” (wanwu, the objects and phenomena that exist and occur in the manifested world), all that can be said is that they come about “within” the Dao, but the Dao is not the same as any of them, or else it would be subject to, and limited by, their individuality, form, change, and transitoriness. When the Dao, in the second sense, is understood as the “great ultimate”, it is seen as the supreme principle of Unity. This Unity, or Oneness, is meant as the transcendent unity both beyond multiplicity (1 as the origin of numbers, but itself not a number) and as the origin of the many (1 as the first number).

In the Daode jing, these two aspects of the Dao correspond to the Dao as “absolute” and as “mother”. The two main ontologic and cosmogonic stages respectively prior and posterior to the creatio continua of the cosmos are often referred to as xiantian (precelestial, “before Heaven”) and houtian (postcelestial, “after Heaven”).

4.2 Essence, Breath, Spirit

With its self-manifestation, the Dao gives birth to the three main components of the cosmos. Collectively called the “three treasures” (sanbao), these components are jing, or Essence, qi, or Breath, and shen, or Spirit.[1] Each of them has two aspects, related to their unmanifested or “precelestial” natures and to their “postcelestial” forms in the manifested world. The same three components are also seen as the primary components of the human being.

In their precosmic aspects, shen, qi, and jing (in this order) represent three consecutive stages in the process of the generation of the cosmos, from the initial state of Non-Being and Emptiness (wu, xu) to the coagulation of the Essence that finally generates the “ten thousand things”. Shen is the principle that presides over non-material entities (including the celestial deities, which are also called shen, “spirits” or “gods”); jing is the principle that presides over material entities; and qi is the principle that maintains the whole cosmos for its entire extent and duration and throughout its continuous changes. Under these aspects, jing, qi, and shen are usually prefixed by the word yuan, “original” (yuanjing, yuanqi, yuanshen). In certain cases, Original Breath (yuanqi) is also seen as a principle prior to the emergence of Essence, Breath, and Spirit; when it is used in this sense, it is also called Ancestral Breath (zuqi) and is equated to the Dao itself.

In the manifested world, the three components take on different aspects. With regard to the human being, shen emerges as the mind (the “cognitive spirit”, shishen, or “thinking spirit”, sishen); qi appears as breath; and the main materializations of jing are—in addition to other liquid components of the body, such as saliva and tears—semen in men and menstrual blood in women.

4.3 Cosmogony

To explain the relation between Dao and cosmos, the Daode jing describes a sequence of states taken on by the Dao, including the Dao itself, unity, duality (Yin and Yang), and finally multiplicity: “The Dao generates the One; the One generates the Two; the Two generate the Three; the Three generate the Ten Thousand Things” (sec. 42). This basic sequence is always respected even though other texts or authors may mention additional intermediate stages or exclude them (as does the Zhuangzi: “The ten thousand things come forth from Non-Being”; ch. 23; Watson 1968: 257). The vertical arrangement of the stages illustrates the process of descent from the Dao to the cosmos, but also implies—and often explicitly outlines—a corresponding process of ascent from the cosmos to the Dao, to be performed gradually and with the support of suitable practices.

When this hierarchical arrangement is represented as a sequence of metaphoric time stages, the discourse shifts from ontology to cosmogony. In addition to the one mentioned above, Daoism has elaborated several other accounts of cosmogony during its history (Robinet 1997a). Many of them focus on hundun, a term usually rendered as “chaos” or “the inchoate”, in the sense of something that has just begun to be and therefore is not yet fully formed or developed, but from which the cosmos finally emerges (cf. Daode jing 25: “There is something inchoate and yet accomplished, born before Heaven and Earth”). In a famous passage of the Zhuangzi, this state is represented by an emperor called Hundun who ruled “on the Center”. As his body had no openings, the Emperors of the North and of the South decided to make him look similar to a human, providing him with eyes, ears, nostrils, and mouth. “Each day they bored one opening, and on the seventh day Hundun died” (ch. 7; Watson 1968: 97). As shown by Norman Girardot (1983: 113–33), this story attributes the cause of Hundun’s death and the shift from chaos to cosmos not only to the emergence of duality—the Emperors of the North and the South—but also to the creation of social institutions. What brings the harmony of the “chaotic order” to an end is the emergence of the “social order”.

Among later accounts (Kohn 1998: 179–97; Robinet 2002), Laojun (Lord Lao) began to be seen as the “body” of the Dao, from which the cosmos is generated (Seidel 1969: 84–91). The Way of the Celestial Masters (Bokenkamp 1997: 188–92; Seidel 1969: 79–84) and Lingbao Daoism (Lagerwey 1981: 104; Bokenkamp 1997: 380–81; Robinet 2002: 148–55) also created their own cosmogonies.

4.4 Cosmology

After the cosmos is generated, it is subject to the laws of cosmology. The Chinese cosmological system—often called “correlative cosmology” by Western scholars—is a structured and coherent corpus of knowledge that uses abstract emblems (xiang, lit. “images”) to analyze and explain the features of the cosmic domain and the relations that occur among its components (Schwartz 1985: 350–82; Graham 1989: 319–56; Kalinowski 1991). Among the main emblems are the following:

  1. The Northern Dipper (beidou, Ursa Major), which represents the center and the unity of the cosmos. Through its apparent rotation around itself, the Dipper distributes its vital energy (or “breath”, qi) throughout the compass of space and the cycles of time.
  2. Yin and Yang, which are the main emblems of duality. They denote the two complementary forces—one “positive”, the other “negative”—that perform two main functions: they generate entities and phenomena through their conjunction, and they regulate the functioning of the cosmos through their cyclical alternation.
  3. The five agents (or five phases, wuxing), which serve to classify and relate items belonging to different domains to one another. Their names are Wood (mu), Fire (huo), Soil (tu), Metal (jin), and Water (shui). The agent Wood, for instance, classifies the direction east, the season spring, the numbers 3 and 8, the color green (or blue), the planet Jupiter, the organ liver, and the acoustic phenomenon jue in the same category. Four of the five agents also represent different states of Yin and Yang: “minor Yang” (Wood), “great Yang” (Fire), “minor Yin” (Metal), and “great Yin” (Water). In the Daoist view, the five agents emblematize different modes or states taken on by the Original Breath (yuanqi) or the One Breath (yiqi) of the Dao in the cosmos. The function of the fifth agent, Soil, is especially important: being placed at the center, Soil stands for the source from which the other four agents derive, and guarantees the conjunction of the world of multiplicity to Unity.
  4. The eight trigrams of the Yijing (Book of Changes), which are formed by different combinations of three broken (Yin) or solid (Yang) lines. Their names are Zhen ☳, Li ☲, Dui ☱, Qian ☰, Xun ☴, Kan ☵, Gen ☶, and Kun ☷. The trigrams are related to divination practices, but their primary use in Daoism is purely emblematic; in particular, they represent different states of Yin and Yang. With regard to space, for instance, the trigrams refer to the directions; in this case, four of them represent the cardinal directions (just like four of the five agents), and the other four represent the intermediate directions.

In addition to those mentioned above, Daoist traditions draw several other images, concepts, and terms from the standard Chinese cosmological system, but one point requires mention. Cosmology provides Daoism with tools to represent the unfolding of Unity into multiplicity; to express the relation between Dao, cosmos, and human being; and to frame practices supported by microcosmic frameworks—the ritual area, the alchemical laboratory, or the human body itself. These practices aim to provide means for “returning to the Dao”. This implies that, while the emblems of cosmology are suitable to represent the differentiation of Unity into the “ten thousand things”, they also serve as pointers for reverting from the “ten thousand things” to Unity. To give one example, alchemists often represent the return to Unity as the reduction of the five agents to three and then to one.

5. Gods and Rituals

In China, the boundaries among Daoism, Buddhism, and the common religion are much less marked compared to those among monotheistic religions. According to individual needs and circumstances, lay persons may perform cults and address prayers and petitions indifferently to Daoist, Buddhist, or popular deities.

This has placed Daoism in close touch with the common religion, but has also been the reason for a controversial relation. Daoism attempts to undertake the dual task—by no means always successful—of drawing people closer to the deities that represent the Dao, while at the same time responding to their immediate religious demands. As a consequence, in the words of Peter Nickerson (2008: 148),

Taoists, precisely because they relied upon traditions of practice they claimed to have superseded, were compelled to try to distinguish themselves from their popular predecessors and competitors.

Demonizing the gods of popular religion was one of the options (Mollier 2005): in the course of its history Daoism has prohibited cults to minor deities and spirits, just like it has proscribed acupuncture (healing is supposed to occur by confession of sins or other ritual means overseen by a Daoist officiant) and divination (performed by lay specialists who do not belong to Daoist schools or lineages). Yet, plenty of examples show that the opposite attitude was also applied. To quote Nickerson again,

already in early medieval times, Taoism was including in its rites a number of prohibited practices, and the popular cults themselves were beginning to employ Taoist priests. (Nickerson, id.; on this subject see also Stein 1979; Lagerwey 1987: 241–52).

One reason at the basis of these divergent—more precisely, contradictory—attitudes may be the intent of exploiting the popularity of certain cults and the demand for certain basic religious services. Another reason may be the attempt of not alienating lay persons and of paying tribute to local religious traditions. In any of these cases, Daoism incorporates certain practices of common religion into its rites and includes certain gods of common religion into its pantheon. Yet, the stated purpose of Daoism remains the one of “transforming” (hua) the people, a term that in this context means educating them to venerate the deities that impersonate the Dao, instead of relying on cults to minor deities and spirits and on rites performed by other officiants—in particular, the spirit-medium. Such cults and rites are defined in Daoism as “vulgar” (or “profane”, su) and “excessive” (or “illicit”, yin), and have been condemned throughout its history (Kleeman 1994). As has been noted, the first competitor of the Daoist priest within local communities, in past and present times, is not the Buddhist monk or the Confucian officer, but the spirit-medium (Seidel 1997: 62; see Lagerwey 1987: 216–18, for an amusing but revealing episode).

5.1 Daoist Heavens

Daoism represents the celestial realm as different systems of “heavens”, usually arranged hierarchically. In several cases, these domains are not only the residences of deities, but also correspond to degrees of priestly ordination and to inner spiritual states, and are associated with revelations of teachings and textual corpora. The existence of multiple systems reflects the development of the religion. Different traditions created their own systems in order to demonstrate that the respective methods derive from a superior celestial domain compared to those of other traditions, and therefore are more effective or grant access to a higher spiritual state.

The thirty-two heavens of Lingbao are arranged horizontally, with each heaven occupying one sector of an imaginary circle. At their center is the Grand Veil (Daluo), the highest celestial domain. The language spoken in these heavens is based on sounds represented in a form of pseudo-Sanskrit called Secret Language of the Great Brahmā (Bokenkamp 1997: 385–89). The thirty-six heavens of Shangqing, instead, are arranged vertically. This system was created after the Lingbao model and draws in part from it. In one of several lists, the highest heaven is again the Grand Veil. Below it are the heavens of the Three Clarities, followed by the four heavens of the “Seed People” (zhongmin, who survive beyond the end of the present cosmic cycle) and further below by the four heavens of Formlessness, the eighteen of Form, and the six of Desire.

As mentioned above (§3.4), the Three Clarities (Sanqing) reflect the systematization of Daoist traditions after the Shangqing and Lingbao revelations. The term itself defines both the three highest deities and the heavens in which they reside. While this became the classic Daoist model of the celestial realms, it could be modified in several ways. Different systems were devised in later times; these include the Shenxiao cosmography, which places the eponymous Divine Empyrean (shenxiao) at the center of nine celestial realms (Boltz 1987: 26–33; Despeux 2000: 513).

5.2 The Pantheon

The supreme Daoist deities are the Three Clarities (or Three Pures, Sanqing), each of which rules over one heaven (for their names, see §3.4). They are associated with different pre-cosmic eras and are deemed to be at the origins of the textual corpora associated with the Three Caverns. Along the history of Daoism, the Three Clarities have been supplemented, but never replaced, by other deities that effectively might share with them the title of “highest Daoist deities”. Most important among them are Taiyi, or Great One, who represents the fundamental Unity of the cosmos in a deified form; and Yuhuang, or Jade Sovereign, the highest god of popular religion before his incorporation in the Daoist pantheon in the Song period.

Several other gods, such as the “emperors” (or “thearchs”, di) of the five directions, represent cosmological principles. In addition, a multitude of deities, most of which originate from local cults and are shared with the common religion, contribute to form a pantheon that is impossible to describe in full, as it takes different forms in different places and times (Lagerwey 2010: 19–55; iconography in Little 2000, Delacour et al. 2010, Huang 2012, and Fava 2013). To give a few examples, these deities include the Queen Mother of the West (Xiwang Mu, an ancient goddess of the immortals); the Mother of the Dipper (a deity of Indian origin, especially associated with children and childbirth); Mazu (a woman who lived in the late 10th century and was deified as the protector of sailors and fishermen, but also of women seeking children); Zhenwu (the protector of the Ming dynasty, related to the Northern Dipper and provided with exorcist and healing powers); Marshall Wen (Wen Yuanshuai, who gave up his life to prevent “plague spirits” from poisoning local wells); and the “plague spirits” themselves, who are appeased in Daoist rituals called Plague Offerings (wenjiao).

5.3 The Function of Writing

The highest gods reveal texts, teachings, and methods either directly or through their representatives. For instance, the Shangqing and Lingbao scriptures are deemed to have taken shape from self-generated graphs coagulated from Original Breath (Robinet 1993: 21–24), or from sounds generated by its vibration (Bokenkamp 1997: 386–87), in the early stages of the formation of the cosmos. They were transmitted in Heaven until a “divine being” or an “immortal” transcribed them into characters understandable to humans.

Just like the gods usually grant revelations in the form of scriptures, the typically Daoist form of communicating with the gods is by writing: as Anna Seidel remarked, the Chinese deities “neither speak nor listen, but write and read” (1997: 43). In Daoist ritual, the priest delivers a “memorial” (or “statement”, shu) to the gods in order to announce the ceremony performed in their honor, declare its purpose, specify its program, and list the names of those who sponsor it (Schipper 1974). The so-called talismans (fu, a word almost exactly corresponding to the original meaning of Greek symbolon) are traced on paper or other supports in graphs hardly comprehensible to humans but intelligible to the gods (Despeux 2000; Mollier 2003). Like the revealed scriptures—some of which, in fact, are deemed to have evolved from them—talismans have counterparts in Heaven, and thus serve to identify and authenticate their possessors in front of the gods. They confer the power to summon certain deities and to control demons, but also protect space and heal illnesses; they are worn on one’s body, affixed at the four directions, placed along the path that leads to one’s dwelling, or made into ashes and drunk with water.

5.4 Rituals

The two main Daoist ceremonies in the present day are the Offering (jiao) and the Merit (gongde) rituals. (On their history and on earlier forms of ritual see Benn 2000; Andersen 2008; Lagerwey 2010: 58–93). The Offering ritual (Lagerwey 1987: 51–167; Schipper 1993: 72–99; Dean 2000: 670–77) is performed to renovate the bond between a community—from the village to the empire—and its gods. The Merit ritual (Lagerwey 1987: 169–237) is a funerary ceremony performed to ensure that the deceased is not kept in the netherworld but may ascend to Heaven.

The communal ritual is requested and organized by the representatives of community via the local “lay association”, which is also in charge of the local temple or shrine. The main officiant is the Daoist priest, or daoshi (lit. “Daoist master”), a function typically transmitted within families. When he receives a request to celebrate an Offering, the daoshi convenes his assistants to perform the ritual. The celebration typically lasts one, two, three, five, or ten days, but arrangements (especially the preparation of the necessary paperwork) require a much longer time. While the Offering is celebrated in the temple, a festival is performed in the streets outside, with processions—the statue of the local tutelary god is carried through the neighborhood—music, and theatrical performances. In addition to this dual “outer” and “inner” aspect of the celebration, another important distinction is the one between the portions of the ritual that are public and those that are performed behind closed doors, in which only the priests and selected representatives of the local community can participate.

6. Soteriology

Terms meaning “long life” (shou, changsheng) and “immortality” (busi, etc.) are among the most recurrent ones in Daoist literature. Both have been understood in different ways according to the perspectives of the respective texts and authors. In general, liberation has been represented in Daoism according to two main models: “union with the Dao” (hedao and similar terms) and incorporation into the celestial bureaucracy (not as a deity, but as an officer of that bureaucracy). The highest form of liberation is often described as “ascension to Heaven” (shengtian), attaining “celestial immortality” (tianxian), or in analogous terms, but the general concept of immortality has been construed in many ways.

6.1 The Immortals

According to hagiographic works, the Daoist immortals are historical, semi-historical, or entirely legendary persons who transcend the limits of ordinary human existence, sometimes by birth but usually by means of their practices. As described by Benjamin Penny (2000: 125–26), their powers include the ability to transform themselves into different creatures or objects; the possession of extraordinary bodies, devoid of signs of aging and capable of stunning feats; the skill of controlling people, animals, and objects by means of mastery of qi (the life-giving “breath”); the gift of healing; and the faculty of predicting the future. The main power possessed by the immortals, however, is certainly the ability to reach indefinitely long lifespans. It is especially in hagiographic works that the idea of human “perfectibility” is understood in a sense that is, at the same time, most elementary and most idealistic: not only an exceptional longevity, but also the immortality of the physical body.

The earliest extant hagiographic collections are the Liexian zhuan (Biographies of Exemplary Immortals; Kaltenmark 1953), probably dating from the 1st century BCE, and the Shenxian zhuan (Biographies of Divine Immortals; Campany 2002), traditionally attributed to Ge Hong although no conclusive evidence is available about his authorship (Penny 1996). With the exception of works devoted to a single deity (in particular, Laozi in his divine aspect; Kohn 1998: 7–36), hagiographies contain exemplary stories about men and women who have risen to a saintly state (but not a “godlike” state: the immortals are not gods). These stories are often related to local cults and reflect oral traditions, but are typically composed by literati, including some who do not have much to do with Daoism but are interested in the “extraordinary” and the unusual, or in the preservation of local traditions. More importantly, hagiographic works are intended for open circulation and are not the object of transmission among initiated or ordained Daoists. One may read them as “introductions to Daoism” addressed to the general public, whose knowledge of their subject matter often would not go much beyond what they read there.

6.2 “Feigning Death”

When we look at other sources, belonging to the various traditions that have evolved during the history of Daoism, a different picture emerges. These sources show that Daoist adepts did not intend to reach immortality in their physical body; they intended, instead, to make use of their physical body in order to generate a new “person” (shen) that is not subject to death. The related views and practices cover a wide spectrum of Daoism: from the early Way of the Celestial Masters to late Internal Alchemy (Neidan).

Some Daoist texts describe liberation as a rebirth that takes place in life, but only after one forsakes one’s mortal body. In the earliest account of this process, related to the Way of the Celestial Masters, the adept goes through a “feigned death” (tuosi) and moves to a region of Heaven called Palace of Taiyin, or Great Darkness, where his physical body is refined. This process culminates in a “rebirth”, or “second birth” (fusheng), in a body that preserves itself indefinitely (Bokenkamp 1997: 46–48 and 102).

No details are given on how this process actually occurs. “Refining the bodily form in Great Darkness”, however, is similar and for some aspects identical to what many later Daoist texts call shijie, “release from the mortal body” or “from the corpse” (Robinet 1979: 57–66; Seidel 1987: 230–32; Cedzich 2001; Campany 2002: 52–60; Pregadio 2004: 121–26). After once again going through a “feigned death”, the adept departs, only to return to live in the world, typically on a mountain but at times among other human beings, in a perfected body that subsists indefinitely. A rare description of a relevant practice, found in a source originally dating from the late 3rd century, suggests that “release from the corpse” occurs in meditation. The adept is instructed to draw a talisman and to visualize himself as “being dead”. Then he takes off his clothes—an act symbolic of his forsaken personality—and walks into the mountains, never to return where he was born or lived (Cedzich 2001: 27–28; Campany 2002: 54–55). Ritual elements are also involved. The adept stages his death, and his associates (family or Daoist companions) participate in the performance: they state that his corpse has disappeared and has been replaced by other objects—typically a sword (signifying a higher form of release), a staff (signifying a lower one), or a pair of sandals (on which see Kaltenmark 1953: 40 and 52).

The adept who performs “release from the mortal body” is also said to change his name, so that he could escape the spirits belonging to the bureaucracy of the underworld that manage the “registers of life and death”. For this reason, this practice has been called “deceptive”, in contrast to direct ascension to Heaven, which would be a “nonillicit method of transcendence” (Campany 2002: 59). Yet, Daoist texts never define shijie as illicit, and state instead that this form of liberation is lower because of its temporary nature: those who undergo “release from the mortal body” have not yet attained a state sufficiently advanced to attain complete liberation in life, and need a further period of refinement that cannot occur in the bodily form in which they presently dwell. Significantly, the Chinese term for “changing name” (gaiming) is homophonous of the term for “changing destiny”.

6.3 Re-Generation in Life

Shangqing (Highest Clarity) scriptures are the first ones to describe meditation methods for the creation of an immortal body, or an immortal self, through the generation of a new inner embryo. An account of “refining the bodily form in Great Darkness”, found in a Shangqing source, adds an important detail to what we have seen above, saying that the adept receives his second birth by going again through his embryonic development (Robinet 1979: 63–66; Strickmann 1979: 182–83; Pregadio 2004: 124–25). Another example is the practice of “untying the knots” (jiejie). In the Shangqing view, human gestation accounts for the creation of “knots” and “nodes” that serve to support the five viscera, but are ultimately responsible for one’s death. To untie them, the adept is instructed to create a new embryo through a complex meditation practice (Robinet 1993: 139–43; on the “change of destiny” involved in this practice see Bokenkamp 2005b, 160–62).

Shangqing texts also describe meditation practices performed in order to save one’s ancestors confined in the netherworld, who are transformed into immortals by first returning to the embryonic state (Lagerwey 1981: 206–8; Robinet 1984: 1:170–73). Lingbao sources describe ritual practices performed for the same purpose (Bokenkamp 1989: 7–14). Several centuries later, these practices would evolve in two main ways. The first is the method of Salvation through Refinement (liandu), in which a priest descends into the hells to release the souls of the deceased and lead them to the realm of Jade Clarity. Combining ritual and meditation, the entire practice takes place within the officiant: the celestial and infernal regions correspond to loci found within his own person, and the deities involved in the practice are enabled to perform their salvific work through his own body (Lagerwey 1987: 232–35; Boltz 1983). The second development is Neidan, or Internal Alchemy, whose practice is often described as the conception, gestation, and delivery of an immortal embryo (see §10.3).

7. Views of the Human Body

It is virtually impossible to distinguish the Daoist understanding of the human body from its understanding of the human being as a whole, and this point constitutes on its own a central aspect of the Daoist way of seeing. Daoism is not interested in anatomy or physiology. The physical body performs a different function: it supports various sets of metaphors that express the relation of the whole person to the ultimate principle, the Dao.

The emphasis given to the symbolic aspects of the body is also the main aspect under which Daoism differs from Chinese traditional medicine: Daoism sees the body as an instrument for “returning to the Dao”. Catherine Despeux draws attention to this point by noting that Daoists

have considered the body in its practical ends, in its uses, developing all kinds of body techniques that intend to liberate the individual from the constraints of the physical body, and consequently to entrust a major role to the symbolic body. (translated from Despeux 1996: 87–88)

7.1 Terminology

The ordinary Western understanding of the body as physical frame or structure cannot convey the complexity of the premodern Chinese view. This view revolves around three main terms. The first, ti, or “body”, refers to the corporeal frame as an ordered whole made of interdependent parts; it denotes the physical body made of skin, flesh, limbs, bones, muscles, tissues, vessels, and all other material components. The second term, xing, or “form”, is best understood—at least in a Daoist perspective—in contrast to the idea of “formlessness” (wuxing), which pertains to the Dao. In this sense, “form” refers to the embodiment as the feature that identifies each entity in the “world of form”, distinguishing it from—and relating it to—all other entities. Therefore the “form”, rather than the “body”, is the principle of individuality at the physical level. The third term, shen, is the most comprehensive: it denotes the human being in all of its physical and non-physical aspects. Shen often is best translated as “person” and at times can also be rendered as “oneself”. For example, an expression such as xiushen means “cultivating one’s person” or “cultivating oneself”; it refers to cultivating not only the body, but the entire person. (Explications of these terms, some of which differ from the understanding suggested here, are found in Kohn 1991: 241–47; Sivin 1995: 14; Despeux 1996: 88–89; Engelhardt 2000: 95–96.)

Each facet of the “body” mentioned above requires the other two, but the variety of concepts embraced by these terms raises the question of which among them is at the center of the Daoist discourse. It could hardly be said that Daoism focuses on the physical body: as shown below, several loci at the basis of Daoist practices—for instance, the three Cinnabar Fields (dantian)—do not even exist at the purely physical level. In other cases, the loci at the basis of Daoist practices have corporeal counterparts, but their emblematic functions are more significant than those performed by the body parts themselves. The main example is the five viscera (wuzang). In its discourse on the viscera, Daoism shows little or no interest in the physical organs per se; the viscera serve, instead, as material supports for the network of correspondences that tie the human being to its immediate and remote surroundings: society and cosmos.

7.2 Models of “Symbolic Body”

A merely anatomical view of the body, therefore, is the least of all concerns in Daoism. Rather than ti (the physical body), the Daoist discourse and practices focus on xing (the “form”) and shen (the whole person). Maintaining the physical body in good health is not an end in itself; it serves to ensure that the body and its parts and organs may fulfill their emblematic functions.

These emblematic functions pertain to what Kristofer Schipper has called the “symbolic vision” of the body (1993: 104 ff) and Catherine Despeux has called the “symbolic body” (1996: 98). This view is centered on several key notions and representations, which receive more or less emphasis according to the individual cases. Five different models of the body can be distinguished within Daoism as a whole:

  1. The cosmological model, where the human being is seen as a microcosm that contains and reproduces all of the main features of the macrocosm.
  2. The political model, where the human being is likened to an administrative system, which in turn parallels the bureaucratic systems of the state and of the heavens.
  3. The theological model, which sees the body as the residence of inner gods visualized and nourished in meditation (see §9.1 below).
  4. The natural model, which pertains to representations of the body as a landscape—in particular, a mountain—with peaks, watercourses and other features corresponding to specific internal loci or to “flows of energy” (for graphic representations, see Huang 2012: 78–81).
  5. The alchemical model, where the body is seen as containing the ingredients of the elixir and the tools required to compound it, including furnace, tripod, and fire.

These five representations are not competing models, and in fact often overlap one another. For instance, the principles that operate in the cosmos and the inner deities that personify those principles are to a large extent equivalent: one may understand and represent those principles in abstract terms, in deified forms, or simultaneously in both ways. Certain aspects of the cosmological and the alchemical models are identical. Similarly, illustrations of the body as a landscape also include the palaces that function as headquarters for the administration of the body (Huang 2012: id.).

7.3 Main Components and Loci

In addition to the different models outlined above, the Daoist view of the body is grounded on several components and loci that are not physical in the ordinary sense, or that perform functions going beyond those of the corresponding physical organs. The three main components—jing or “essence”, qi or “breath”, and shen or “spirit”—have been discussed above (§4.2). Only a few of the others will be mentioned here.

The center of the human being is represented in different ways; and not being material, it may have different symbolic locations and names. Most important among them is the Heart (xin, a word also meaning “center”). Related images and terms include the Yellow Court and the Mysterious-Female. The Yellow Court (huangting, where “yellow” is the color of the central agent Soil, and the “court” is the central courtyard in traditional Chinese houses) has different definitions. When the framework of reference is the three Cinnabar Fields, it may denote any of them, and especially the central one, corresponding to the heart; when it is the five agents, it denotes the spleen, which is placed at the center of the five viscera and corresponds to Soil. The Mysterious-Female (xuanpin, a term derived from the Daode jing and often translated as “mysterious female”) is the immaterial locus of the conjunction of Yin (the “female”) and Yang (the “mysterious”).

The three Cinnabar Fields (dantian) are the lower Cinnabar Field (the dantian proper), which is found in the region of the abdomen and is the seat of the Essence (jing); the middle Cinnabar Field, which is found in the region of the heart and is the seat of Breath (qi); and the upper Cinnabar Field, which is found in the region of the brain and is the seat of Spirit (shen). In meditation practices, the three Fields are the residences of the Three Ones (Sanyi), who represent the One and its subdivision into the Two. In Neidan (Internal Alchemy, on which see §10.3), they are the loci of the conception, nourishment, and delivery of the alchemical embryo.

Important symbolic functions are performed by the five viscera (wuzang), namely the liver, heart, spleen, lungs, and kidneys. They are related, in this order, to the agents Wood, Fire, Soil, Metal, and Water. This makes the viscera the main support for the macrocosm-microcosm doctrine in Daoism. The three Cinnabar Fields and the five viscera respectively reproduce the vertical and horizontal dimensions of the cosmos within the human being.

Many Daoist texts also refer to the hun and the po, two untranslatable terms often rendered as “spiritual and material souls”, “celestial and earthly souls”, or in similar ways. The hun stands for the Yang and lighter components of the human being that pertain to Heaven and return there after death. The po stands for the Yin and grosser components that pertain to the Earth and return there when death occurs. According to different views, the hun and the po may be single or multiple; in the latter case, the hun are three, and the po are seven.

Finally, the human body also hosts two sets of parasites: the “three corpses” (sanshi), which reside in the head, the chest, and the legs; and the “nine worms” (jiuchong), which live in different parts of the body. All of them cause weakening, diseases, and death. The “three corpses” are also said to report periodically one’s transgressions to Heaven, which results in the shortening of one’s life span. As these parasites feed on cereals, “abstaining from grains” (bigu) was one of the ways to expel them.

8. “Nourishing Life”

Daoist self-cultivation teachings and practices can be subdivided into three main groups:

  1. Yangsheng (Nourishing Life), including such methods as daoyin, breathing, sexual practices, and dietetics
  2. Meditation, including visualization of the inner gods, meditation on Unity, “inner journeys” to constellations or to the remote corners of the cosmos, and methods focused on contemplation and insight
  3. Alchemy, including Waidan (External Alchemy) and Neidan (Internal Alchemy)

While Confucianism saw the cultivation of ethical and moral principles as the highest pursuit in a person’s life, Daoism deems those principles to be the foundation of one’s self-cultivation. In the Daoist perspective, ethics and morals therefore are not a branch of “philosophical thought”, but also pertain to the basic field of Nourishing Life. (On Daoist precepts see Schipper 2001, and the translation of a representative text in Hendrischke and Penny 1996.)

This and the next sections are concerned with the three main groups of teachings and practices mentioned above.

8.1 Practices

Yangsheng or Nourishing Life is the general designation of a variety of practices designed to benefit the body (Engelhardt 2000). The term is so indefinite that no precise list can be drawn of what pertains to “nourishing life”. Nevertheless, relevant methods would certainly include daoyin, breathing, and sexual practices. Present-day practices often defined as “Daoist”, such as Qigong and Taiji quan, may also be seen as belonging to Yangsheng.

Daoyin (lit., “guiding and pulling”; Despeux 1989; Kohn 2008) can be defined, in Western terms, as a sort of gymnastics, in the sense that it grants physical agility and coordination. In a different reference frame, its formal features and its place in Daoism bear analogies to what hatha yoga is in Hinduism. The purpose of daoyin postures and movements is to allow the unhindered flow of qi within the body. The practice is known to have existed at least by the 3rd or 2nd century BCE (trans. of a Mawangdui manuscript, Harper 1998: 310–27). Only one text on daoyin is found in the Daoist Canon (trans. Kohn 2012, in a chapter oddly entitled “Internal Alchemy”).

Breathing practices exist in many varieties. The most common general terms are xingqi (“circulating breath”) and tuna (“exhaling [the old] and inhaling [the new breath]”). Particular practices include biqi (“retaining breath”), buqi (“spreading breath”), lianqi (“refining breath”), and tiaoqi (“harmonizing breath”). Another celebrated term is zhongxi (“breathing through the heels”), used in the Zhuangzi to designate the spontaneous breathing of the realized person, which does not stop at the lungs but circulates throughout the entire body (ch. 6; Watson 1968: 78). Two especially important practices are the ingestion of the “breaths” of the four directions (Raz 2013), and the so-called “embryonic breathing” (taixi), which purports to replicate the breathing of an embryo in its womb (Maspero 1981: 459–505).

Sexual practices are commonly defined in Chinese as fangzhong shu or “arts of the bedroom” (Maspero 1981: 517–41). The large amount of literature existing on this subject shows that these arts are, with few exceptions, primarily addressed to males (another common term that defines them is yunü, “riding women”). Their main purpose is to avoid ejaculation: semen should be prevented from being emitted and should instead be “returned to the brain” (which is deemed to be the origin of the marrow, in its turn the source of semen). This method is known as huangjing bunao, “reverting the essence to replenish the brain”.

8.2 Criticism

While in Chinese popular culture and in the Western re-invention of Daoism the “arts of the bedroom” are often seen as Daoist, sexual practices performed in the history of Daoism are of a different kind. They include the heqi (“joining breaths” or “pneumas”) ritual, practiced in the early Tianshi dao (Way of the Celestial Masters) between married couples in order to generate the “seed people” (zhongmin), who would survive the impending end of world (Raz 2012: 186–202; Kleeman 2014; Mollier 2016). Certain traditions of Neidan (Internal Alchemy) also involve sexual conjunction, performed in order to enable the male practitioner to collect the True Yang from the Yin (represented in this case by the sexual essences produced by the female). In Neidan, these practice are contrasted with qingxiu, literally meaning “pure cultivation”.

Several Daoist texts emphasize that the Yangsheng methods should not be performed as the only way for “returning to the Dao”. Others—beginning with the Zhuangzi (ch. 15; Watson 1968: 167–68)—express criticism towards them. While some scholars have looked at these contrasts as examples of competition taking place in a sort of “self-cultivation market”, Daoist authors take into account the state of realization afforded by the Yangsheng methods, which in their view is lower compared to other practices.

9. Meditation

Daoist meditation practices can be divided into four main types: (1) Visualization of inner gods; (2) Meditation on Unity, or the One; (3) “Excursions” to astral bodies and constellations, or to the remotest poles of the cosmos; (4) Inner contemplation.

9.1 Inner Gods

According to Daoist traditions documented from around 200 CE, the human being hosts a veritable pantheon of gods. These deities perform multiple roles related to one another: they allow the human being to communicate with the corresponding gods of the celestial pantheon, serve as administrators of the human body, and guard the balance of the body’s main functions.

Several texts describe the features of the inner gods. One of the main sources, the Huangting jing (Book of the Yellow Court; ca. 200 CE; Robinet 1993: 55–96; Despeux 2012: 128–49), mentions, for instance, a major series of gods that live within the five viscera. Significantly, each of these organs is called a “department” (bu), the same term that denotes a government “ministry”, and each of these gods is said to reside in a “palace”. These and other details, such as names, appearances, dimensions, and garments of the gods, are mentioned as supports for meditation practices. In agreement with the classical Chinese views on the fateful separation of the spirit (shen) from the body, several works warn that if the inner gods (also called shen) leave their residences, a person dies. “Maintaining one’s thoughts” (cun) on them enables one to keep them in their corporeal dwellings.

These deities are not deemed to possess physical existence in the ordinary sense of the word. They pertain, instead, to a domain that lies midway between formlessness and form; as noticed by Isabelle Robinet, they are “images” (xiang) that play an intermediary function “between the world of sensory realities and the world of the unknowable” (1993: 50). The person in whom the gods reside is neither possessed by them nor is “deified” by their presence (for a different view, see Puett 2002: 226–27). The practitioner, instead, becomes the focus of a divine representation, of which he is the lone creator and the lone spectator. The organs and loci in which the gods reside cease to be mere “body parts”, and become the supports that make that representation possible.

The inner gods are literally innumerable and different texts describe different pantheons (Pregadio 2005: 131–41), but here only the most important one can be mentioned. Known as the Red Child (Chizi), he is featured in the Laozi zhongjing (Central Book of Laozi; probably ca. 200 CE; Schipper 1993: 100–12; Schipper 1995; Lagerwey 2004a). The speaker of this text is Laozi; in fact, the Red Child is no other than Laozi himself, now playing the role of “true self” (zhenwu) of each human being. He defines himself as “the child of the Dao”, adding that he resides in the stomach (another symbolic center of the person) where he is nourished by his mother and protected by his father. Like other inner gods, however, the Child should also be nourished by the person in whom he lives: in particular, a “yellow essence” (huangjing) and a “red breath” (chiqi), respectively associated with the Moon (Yin) and the Sun (Yang), should be delivered to him by the adept in meditation.

As an image of the “true self”, the Red Child is the main precursor of the “embryo” that, several centuries later, adepts of Neidan would generate and nourish by means of their own practices (§10.3).

9.2 The One and the Three Ones

Meditation practices focused on the principle of Unity are known as “guarding Unity” or “guarding the One” (shouyi), an expression analogous in meaning to “embracing Unity” (baoyi) found in the Daode jing (sec. 10 and 22). In his famous speech to the Yellow Emperor, recorded in the Zhuangzi, Guangcheng zi says, “I guard this Unity and thus abide in this harmony” (ch. 11; Watson 1968: 120).

While in these examples “guarding Unity” refers to the constant awareness of the One as the principle of the many, in later times the same expression designates meditation practices based on the visualization of the One as an anthropomorphic inner deity. A classical description is found in the Baopu zi, where Ge Hong reckons “guarding the One” as the superior way of transcendence together with the ingestion of elixirs. The main practice consists in visualizing the features that the One as a god takes within the human being as it moves among the three Cinnabar Fields. Meditation on the One as an inner god is also described in the Laozi zhongjing and in the Dadong zhenjing.

Later, this practice evolved into “guarding the Three Ones” (shou sanyi), which again exists in several varieties (Andersen 1979; Robinet 1993: 119–38). For instance, the Three Ones are represented as three children who live in the Cinnabar Fields. Another practice combines external and internal aspects: after visualizing the descent of the Northern Dipper above his head, the adept sees the Three Ones emerging among its stars; he breaths three times, and each time one of the Three Ones reaches its residence in the respective Cinnabar Field.

9.3 “Pacing the Celestial Net”

Shangqing Daoism also developed meditation practices that take adepts to the extremities of the cosmos or to the Sun, the Moon, and other astral bodies (Robinet 1993: 171–85 and 187–230). For some of their features, these practices are related to the “far roaming” described in pre-Han and Han literary works (see §2.2). The Dipper, in particular, is the heavenly residence of the Great One (Taiyi); it is made of nine stars, two of which are said to be visible only by advanced adepts. One of the nine stars, called Heavenly Pass (tianguan), allows the adept to exit the cosmos and access the domains placed above and beyond it. The meditative walk on the stars was called Pacing the Celestial Net (bugang). It incorporated the ancient ritual practice of the Steps of Yu (yubu), which imitated the lamely way of walking of the mythical Emperor Yu, but also included cosmological and numerological elements (Andersen 1989–90).

9.4 Contemplation

From approximately the 7th century, the meditation practices outlined above were largely replaced by methods of contemplation and introspection (Kohn 2010). While their closeness to Buddhism is manifest, their roots also lie in early teachings and practices such as those described in the Neiye (Internal Training), dating from the second half of the 4th century BCE (Kirkland 2004: 39–52; Roth 1999; Graziani 2001), and in the above-mentioned speech of Guangcheng zi to the Yellow Emperor (Zhuangzi, ch. 11; Watson 1968: 118–20).

One of the main sources on contemplation (guan) methods is the Neiguan jing (Book of Inner Contemplation; Kohn 2010: 179–87), another text spoken by Laozi in his deified aspect. This work emphasizes that the original state of clarity and purity is lost when the mind is overcome by passions and attachments caused by sensual cravings. When the mind is stabilized, disordered thoughts do not arise; one then does not only reach the state of quiescence, but the state in which both movement and quiescence are transcended.

The Qingjing jing (Book of Clarity and Quiescence; Kohn 1993: 24–29) is another influential work, also dating from the Tang period and also spoken by Laozi. It states that the innate clarity and quiescence of the mind and the spirit are defiled by passion and lust owed to the separation of original Unity into the two complementary principles. Only by realizing that mind, forms, and individual objects are devoid of an underlying nature is it possible to awaken to their fundamental emptiness. This is attained by contemplation, and leads one to the recovery of the “clarity and quiescence” mentioned in the title (an expression derived from the Daode jing, sec. 45). Among the main uses of this work was, and still is, its daily recitation by Quanzhen monks, nuns, and adepts.

10. The External and the Internal Elixirs

Alchemy developed in China in two main branches. Waidan, or External Alchemy, is based on compounding elixirs through the manipulation of natural substances—primarily minerals and metals—which release their essences when they are submitted to the action of fire. Neidan, or Internal Alchemy, aims to produce the elixir within the alchemist’s person according to two main models of doctrine and practice: first, by causing the primary components of the cosmos and the human being—Essence, Breath, and Spirit—to revert to their original states; and second, by purifying one’s mind of defilements and passions, in order to “see one’s Nature” (jianxing), which is equated to the elixir.

10.1 Waidan or External Alchemy

In the Taiqing (Great Clarity) tradition of Waidan, which developed from the 3rd century CE, the alchemical practice is framed as a complex ritual sequence (Pregadio 2006). The initial stage is the ceremony of transmission, followed by a period of retirement and purifications. Then, having protected the ritual space by means of talismans (fu), the alchemist builds the laboratory, or “chamber of the elixirs” (danshi). At a time deemed to be suitable according to traditional hemerology, the alchemist performs a ceremony for kindling the fire—including a request of assistance addressed to Laojun (Lord Lao) and other deities—and only then does he devote himself to the compounding. The process is concluded by the consecration and the ingestion of the elixir. It is this entire sequence, and not only the work at the furnace, that constitutes the alchemical practice.

The main tool, from both a ritual and a technical point of view, is the crucible. To reproduce the state of the cosmos at its inception (hundun; see §4.3), the vessel should be hermetically sealed so that the vital “breath” (qi) is not dispersed. Under these conditions, the elixir ingredients “revert” (huan) to their original state. This refined matter is equated with the Essence (jing) that is hidden within the Dao and gives birth to the world (“Vague and indistinct! Within it there is something. Dim and obscure! Within it there is an essence”; Daode jing, sec. 21). The elixir therefore is a tangible sign of the seed that generates the cosmos.

Ingesting an elixir is said to confer, in the first place, transcendence, immortality, and admission into the ranks of the celestial bureaucracy. One also gains the ability of summoning benevolent gods and obtains protection from demons, spirits, and several other disturbances, including weapons, wild animals, and even thieves. Remarkably, in order to provide these benefits, the elixir does not need to be ingested: it may simply be kept in one’s hand or carried at the belt as a powerful apotropaic talisman.

10.2 Alchemy and Cosmology

Early Waidan sources do not rely on the system of correlative cosmology. This system, instead, becomes essential in the later Waidan traditions and in virtually the whole of Neidan. The foundations of this new model of doctrine and practice were provided by the Cantong qi (Seal of the Unity of the Three), traditionally said to be written in the 2nd century CE but dating from between the mid-5th and the mid-7th century (Pregadio 2011). Scores of texts both within and outside the Daoist Canon are related to this work. Although its views have been understood mainly in relation to Neidan, they also apply to Waidan.

The Cantong qi and its tradition use several sets of emblems that represent different aspects of the relation of the cosmos to the Dao. The main set is formed by four trigrams of the Book of Changes, namely Qian ☰, Kun ☷, Kan ☵, and Li ☲, which represent the modes taken on by the Dao in its self-manifestation. Qian stands for the active (Yang) aspect of the Dao, and Kun stands for its passive (Yin) aspect. Their permanent conjunction in the precosmic domain gives birth to the cosmos. The Yang of Qian ☰ moves into Kun ☷, which becomes Kan ☵; in response, the Yin of Kun ☷ moves into Qian ☰, which becomes Li ☲. In the cosmos, therefore, the Yin contains True Yang (the inner solid line of Kan ☵), and the Yang contains True Yin (the inner broken line of Li ☲).

On the basis of these principles, the only form of alchemical practice sanctioned by the Cantong qi and by the works that follow its system is the one that enables the conjunction of Qian and Kun, or True Yang and True Yin. According to the Cantong qi, only True Lead and True Mercury are “of the same kind” (tonglei) as Qian and Kun. The Yin and Yang entities that contain these authentic principles are “black lead” (i.e., native lead) and cinnabar, respectively. In the strict sense of the term, alchemy therefore consists in extracting True Lead from “black lead” and True Mercury from cinnabar, and in joining them to one another. This is accomplished in Waidan by using the corresponding minerals and metals, and in Neidan by operating on various components of the human body—both physical and non-physical—which are symbolically denoted by the same terms.

10.3 Neidan or Internal Alchemy

Although the Cantong qi forever changed the history of Daoist alchemy, by no means are all Waidan works written in the Tang period (7th-9th centuries) inspired by its doctrines (Sivin 1968; Needham 1976: 132–74). During this period, however, Waidan methods increasingly tend to mirror features of the cosmological system (Sivin 1976 and 1980).

The shift of focus from ritual to cosmology also paved the way for the development of Neidan. However, the roots of Neidan are multiple, and it would be reductive to see it as a mere transposition of Waidan to an “inner” plane: Neidan owes its origins to meditation methods on the inner gods more than it does to Waidan (Pregadio 2005). To summarize a complex phenomenon, Waidan terminology and imagery were combined with concepts and emblems drawn from the cosmological system according to the model of the Cantong qi, and with elements inherited from the early meditation practices. This necessarily caused the disappearance of the inner gods themselves: incorporating them into Neidan would require an impossible “re-mapping” of the inner pantheon onto a different cosmological model. The only, but major, exception is the Red Child, the innermost deity of early Daoist meditation (see §9.1). When he reappears in Neidan, however, the Red Child is no longer a god possessed by all human beings: he is now an image of the “embryo” generated by means of the alchemical practice.

Especially in its forms that integrate elements defined (or re-defined) by Buddhism and Neo-Confucianism, Neidan focuses its discourse and practice on xing and ming, two cardinal concepts in its view of the human being (Robinet 1995: 165–95; Pregadio 2014). Xing denotes the “inner nature”, which is related to Spirit (shen) and pertains to one’s “heart” or “mind” (xin). Neidan texts often discourse on xing by using Buddhist terms and expressions, such as “seeing one’s nature” (jianxing), and even use the term “Buddha-nature” (foxing). Ming, an even more complex term, is related to Breath (qi) and pertains to the “body” (shen). The term means in the first place the “command” or “mandate” conferred by Heaven, but its senses also include “life”, “existence”, “lifespan”, as well as “destiny”. While one’s xing is unborn and is therefore free from death, everything in the domain of ming has a beginning and an end.

As far as we know, Neidan developed from the early 8th century onwards. Two of its main branches, which emerged between the 12th and the 13th centuries, are traditionally ascribed with the creation of models of self-cultivation based on the concepts summarized above (Yokote 2015). The first model, associated with the Nanzong (Southern Lineage), gives initial priority to the cultivation of one’s ming (existence), gradually shifting to the cultivation of xing (inner nature) as the practice progresses. The second model, associated with the Beizong (Northern Lineage), emphasizes instead the cultivation of one’s xing by means of “clarity and quiescence” (qingjing); this is also said to involve the cultivation of one’s ming. Despite the differences between these two models, Neidan as a whole insists that both xing and ming should be cultivated, a view reflected in the term “conjoined cultivation of nature and existence” (xingming shuangxiu).

In its most widespread codification, which originates in the Southern Lineage, the Neidan practice consists of three main stages (Despeux 1979: 55–82; Robinet 1995: 147–64; Wang Mu 2011). Its purpose is to lead an adept from the postcelestial to the precelestial domains through the gradual reintegration of each of the three main components of the human being—Essence, Breath, and Spirit—into the one that precedes it, culminating in the reversion to the state of Non-Being (wu), or Emptiness (xu, kong). While this is the function of alchemy per se, certain authors indicate that the process of ascent to the precelestial domain should be followed by a new descent or return to the postcelestial domain, in order to merge them with one another.

The practice outlined above is often described as the generation of “a person outside one’s person” (or “a self outside oneself”, shen zhi wai shen), defined as the “true person” (zhenshen; compare §6.3). In this case, the main stages of the practice are portrayed as the conception, gestation, and birth of an embryo, which personifies the practitioner’s realized state (Despeux 2016). In another view, the Internal Elixir is seen as already possessed by every human being and as identical to one’s own innate realized state. Liu Yiming (1734–1821) expresses this view by saying: “All human beings have this Golden Elixir complete in themselves: it is entirely realized in everybody”. Other authors of Neidan texts state in their works that “the Golden Elixir is in front of your eyes”.


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The author is grateful to Philipp Hünnebeck, Kelsey Seymour, Song Xiaokun, and Dominic Steavu for their suggestions and corrections. Resposibility for any errors lies entirely with the author.

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