Notes to The Definition of Death

1. What is here called “permanent vegetative state” is often called “persistent vegetative state.” But “persistent” is sometimes understood as longstanding but not permanent. The term “permanent vegetative state” therefore seems more apt.

2. A similar charge may be directed at the view that each of us is essentially a (living) human organism: Since a single body often seems to pass from life to death, becoming a corpse, then either (1) this body, a substance, is distinct from another substance, that of the living human organism, (2) the living human organism is not a substance, implying that you are not a substance, or (3) the living human organism and the later corpse are distinct substances and there is no single thing that is at first living and later dead. (For a defense of option (3), see Olson 2001, 3-4.)

3. These reflections on the difference in meaning between permanence and irreversibility suggest that “irreversible vegetative state” would be more accurate than “permanent vegetative state” (and that “irreversible coma” would be more accurate than “permanent coma”). Nevertheless, the acronym PVS is deeply entrenched and “permanent” has the advantage of preserving it.

4. Indeed, the possibility of cryopreservation—the freezing of living human bodies—reinforces the claim that life and death are not exhaustive categories: an individual in this state of “suspended animation” seems neither alive nor dead.

Copyright © 2021 by
David DeGrazia <>

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