Notes to Descriptive Decision Theory

1. Disclaimer: The literature on the topic is absolutely vast, comprising thousands of papers spread across a number of academic disciplines. Accordingly, only an extremely selective glimpse at some of the relevant work can be provided. One particularly noteworthy omission is the issue of sequential, aka “dynamic”, choice, which would have required an entire further entry to present in a satisfactory manner. Space considerations have also precluded a discussion of a number of important empirical phenomena associated with choice behaviour, including so-called framing effects and preference reversals. For further details regarding these issues, as well as the points touched upon in this entry, the interested reader is referred to the excellent surveys listed below in Section 6.

2. Each will consist in those points \((P(x_1), P(x_3))\) such that

\[u(x_1)P(x_1)+ u(x_2)(1-P(x_1)-P(x_3)) + u(x_3)P(x_3)\]

is equal to some constant expected utility value \(c\). Rearranging this, one obtains the linear equation

\[P(x_3)= [u(x_2) - u(x_1)]/[u(x_3) - u(x_4)]P(x_1)+c-u(x_2),\]

the slope of the line being independent of \(P(x_1)\) and \(P(x_2)\).

3. In what follows, the various methodological and statistical issues pertaining to the assessment of the models on offer have been glossed over. Hey (2014) provides a useful discussion, from this angle, of a number of important studies. Salient issues include the choice of methods of preference elicitation, the stochastic specification of the models, and a set of more fundamental problems connected with hypothesis testing and model selection.

4. It is well known that Independence, a principle governing single choices, can be recovered from a number of conditions on temporal sequences of choices. Violations of the principle therefore immediately raise the question of where further to pin the blame. Due to space considerations, discussion of these issues has been omitted. The interested reader is referred to Section 4 of Sugden’s (2004) excellent survey article.

5. This presentation of Allais’ paradoxes as respectively pertaining to the Common Consequence and Common Ratio principles is owed to Mongin (2009).

6. Regarding the empirical adequacy of Stochastic Dominance, Tversky and Kahneman (1986) observe, perhaps not entirely surprisingly, significant violations of the principle when (but only when) the dominance relation is not immediately evident. It should be noted that a number of early Mixture-Independence-free models did not satisfy this requirement. These included most famously the weighted probability model of Handa (1977) and Kahneman & Tversky’s closely related Prospect Theory (1979), which essentially restricted the violations tolerated by Handa’s model to those cases that are “transparent”. Stochastic Dominance is however a feature of the successors of these proposals, discussed below.

7. It should be noted that this general pattern of fanning out that must be imposed by WU to accommodate the local pattern of fanning out characteristic of Allais preferences lands the model in trouble elsewhere. Indeed further data has been collected that is consistent with an additional local pattern of fanning in towards the northwest of the triangle (see for instance Camerer 1989). Other Betweenness-satisfying models of probabilistically sophisticated preferences can better accommodate this data by allowing for mixed fanning patterns. These include Chew’s Implicit Utility (Chew 1989), which generalises WU, and Gul’s Disappointment Aversion (Gul 1991).

8. Other models in this category include Quadratic Utility (Chew, Epstein, & Segal 1991) and Lottery Dependent Utility (Becker & Sarin 1987), which generalises WU.

9. In note 7 above, it was pointed out that WU is unable to accommodate certain mixed fanning patterns suggested by the data. This is not the case with RDU, which shares in this respect the flexibility noted in relation with Implicit Utility and Disappointment Aversion.

10. This formulation is due to Quiggin (1992).

11. For more on this, see Sections 10.1 to 10.5 of Wakker (2010).

12. It should be noted that Cumulative Prospect Theory can also be formulated as a sign-dependent generalisation of CEU. In this formulation, the functional form involves both a positive and a negative capacity. Wakker & Tversky (1993) offer an axiomatisation that notably restricts the Sure-Thing principle to sets of acts that are not only comonotonic but also cosigned, i.e., such that for all acts \(f,g\) in that set, there exists no state \(s\) such that \(f(s)\succ 0\) but \(g(s)\prec 0\), where \(0\) designates the reference point.

13. Gilboa & Schmeidler (1989) provided their initial axiomatic characterisation in a special case of the Savage setup, the Anscombe-Aumann (AA) framework (Anscombe & Aumann 1963), which has not been discussed in this entry. In this setting, additional structure is imposed on the set of outcomes, which are modeled as assignments of objective probabilities to the members of a set of further alternatives. Gilboa & Schmeidler’s axioms were more recently translated into the classic Savage model by Ghirardato et al. (2003), who also present a analogue of the AA-style axiomatisation of CEU due to Schmeidler (1989).

14. It is not clear, however, what value of this parameter would correspond to ambiguity-neutrality. As Etner et al. (2012) note, the most likely candidate, the value \(\nicefrac{1}{2}\), does not lead one to recover SEU, which is a plausible model for ambiguity neutral preferences.

15. MEU subsumes Wald’s (1950) much earlier Minimax approach to decision making under complete suspension of judgment regarding objective probabilities (the approach is so called, because it involves minimisation of maximum loss). Wald’s model corresponds to the special case in which \(\Gamma =\mathcal{P}\). \(\alpha\)-MEU subsumes Hurwicz’s (1951) Generalized Bayes-Minimax approach in the same manner. See Ch. 13 of Luce & Raiffa (1957) for an overview of these precursors and their axiomatic foundations.

16. This proposal is equivalent, for pairwise choices, to Fishburn’s ()1989 Skew-Symmetric Additive Utility theory.

17. As Loomes & Sugden (1987) later note, in the special case of preferences over independent distributions over three outcomes, Regret Theory yields indifference curves that are consistent with those generated by WU, given certain parameter values, fanning out from a point located in the southwestern quadrant, outside the probability triangle.

18. Regret Theory proposes to replace SEU with a more general model that accommodates certain behaviours that can be plausibly interpreted as violating Transitivity or Independence. It is suggestive, however, of an alternative position which interprets these behaviours in a manner that renders them consistent with the standard model. This position involves “fine-graining” the description of the outcomes involved, so as to distinguish

  • (a)two menu-dependent outcomes (e.g., its being the case that \(x_1\) rather than \(x_3\) versus its being the case that \(x_1\) rather than \(x_2\); denote these respectively by \(\langle x_1, x_3\rangle\) and \(\langle x_1, x_2\rangle\)) with corresponding menu-independent utilities (e.g., \(u(\langle x_1, x_3\rangle)\) versus \(u(\langle x_1, x_2\rangle)\)),

where Regret Theory only recognises

  • (b)one menu-independent outcome (e.g., its being the case that \(x_1\)) with two menu-dependent utilities (e.g., \(M(x_1, x_3)\) versus \(M(x_1, x_2)\)).

Note that the general strategy of fine-graining outcome descriptions to defuse apparent counterexamples to expected utility maximisation has been carried out with respect to a variety cases and in a variety of manners. For more on this, see Buchak (2013: Ch. 4) and works referenced therein, including Broome (1991), Weber (1998), and Weirich (1986).

19. This kind of line of thinking, it appears, may have precedents in the decision theoretic literature. Jallais et al. (2008) claim that the appeal to “expert behaviour” was also pivotal in the emergence of SEU as a popular normative theory, finding such a reliance in both Bernouilli’s writings on the St Petersburg game and Condorcet’s critique thereof.

20. Savage did not elaborate on the rationale underpinning this test, but one view prevalent among some of his contemporaries was that bona fide principles of rationality are self-evident. Morgenstern (1979: 180) provides a case in point, claiming that:

[SEU] is normative in the sense that the theory is “absolutely convincing” which implies that men will act accordingly. If they deviate from the theory, an explanation of the theory and of their deviation will cause them to readjust their behavior

21. For illustrations, see Section 4 of the entry titled normative theories of rational choice: expected utility.

22. This is not to say, of course, that SEU is uncontroversial in philosophy. The completeness requirement has been a long-time suspect, in terms of normative, in addition to empirical, adequacy. Anand (2009) offers a rather critical review of the case for transitivity of rational preferences, as does Maher (1993: Ch. 2), who remains more optimistic. The normative adequacy of the assumption of probabilistic belief has also been under scrutiny for many years. It has been claimed for instance that probabilistic beliefs have insufficient structure (i) to be able to model a doxastic state that rationality requires to reflect not only the balance, but also what Keynes (1921) called the “weight”, of evidence (see, e.g., Joyce 2005) or again (ii) to be able to model certain types of rationally permissible agnosticism, as suggested by van Fraassen’s “Water/Wine” problem (van Fraassen 1989). See the entry titled imprecise probabilities for further various endorsements of multiple prior models in the philosophical literature, as well as the entry titled formal representations of belief. For cases in which probabilistic belief holds, in cases of decision making under risk, philosophical thinking has tended to take a more orthodox line. One notable recent exception here is Buchak (2013), who has defended the normative adequacy of RDU. See Chs. 5–7 of her book. Doubts regarding Independence are also voiced in an accessible handbook entry by McClennen (2009). See Maher (1993: Ch. 3) for a less pessimistic survey of the considerations.

23. Unsurprisingly, analogous questions crop up in the recent experimental philosophy literature, in which it is suggested that empirical frequencies of intuitions regarding the applicability of a term may serve as defeasible evidence in favour of, or against, a particular theory of how the term ought to be applied. There, for instance, one also finds the recommendation that attention be focused on the judgments of the subset of the population that one would independently identify as “experts” (see, e.g., Hales 2006).

24. The connection has however been noted in the experimental philosophy literature, by Sytsma & Livengood 2014 and Talbot 2014. See List & Pettit (2011: Ch. 4) for accessible presentation of the theorem, which is also discussed in the entry titled social choice theory.

25. Though see Mongin (2009) for an alternative perspective on the development of alternatives to SEU.

Copyright © 2017 by
Jake Chandler <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free