# Absolute and Relational Theories of Space and Motion

*First published Fri Aug 11, 2006; substantive revision Thu Jan 22, 2015*

Since antiquity, natural philosophers have struggled to comprehend the
nature of three tightly interconnected concepts: space, time, and
motion. A proper understanding of motion, in particular, has been seen
to be crucial for deciding questions about the natures of space and
time, and their interconnections. Since the time of Newton and
Leibniz, philosophers' struggles to comprehend these concepts
have often appeared to take the form of a dispute between
*absolute* conceptions of space, time and motion, and
*relational* conceptions. This article guides the reader
through some of the history of these philosophical struggles. Rather
than taking sides in the (alleged) ongoing debates, or reproducing the
standard dialectic recounted in most introductory texts, we have
chosen to scrutinize carefully the history of the thinking of the
canonical participants in these debates — principally Descartes,
Newton, Leibniz, Mach and Einstein. Readers interested in following up
either the historical questions or current debates about the natures
of space, time and motion will find ample links and references
scattered through the discussion and in the
Other Internet Resources
section below.

- 1. Introduction
- 2. Aristotle
- 3. Descartes
- 4. Newton
- 5. Absolute Space in the Twentieth Century
- 6. Leibniz
- 7. ‘Not-Newton’ versus ‘Be-Leibniz’
- 8. Mach and Later Machians
- 9. Relativity and Motion
- 10. The ‘Dynamical’ Approach
- 11. Conclusion
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Introduction

Things change. A platitude perhaps, but still a crucial feature of the world, and one which causes many philosophical perplexities — see for instance the entry on Zeno's Paradoxes. For Aristotle, motion (he would have called it ‘locomotion’) was just one kind of change, like generation, growth, decay, fabrication and so on. The atomists held on the contrary that all change was in reality the motion of atoms into new configurations, an idea that was not to begin to realize its full potential until the Seventeenth Century, particularly in the work of Descartes. (Of course, modern physics seems to show that the physical state of a system goes well beyond the geometrical configuration of bodies. Fields, while perhaps determined by the states of bodies, are not themselves configurations of bodies if interpreted literally, and in quantum mechanics bodies have ‘internal states’ such as particle spin.)

Not all changes seem to be merely the (loco)motions of bodies in
physical space. Yet since antiquity, in the western tradition, this
kind of motion has been absolutely central to the understanding of
change. And since motion is a crucial concept in physical theories,
one is forced to address the question of what exactly it is. The
question might seem trivial, for surely what is usually meant by
saying that something is moving is that it is moving
*relative* to something, often tacitly understood between
speakers. For instance: the car is moving at 60mph (relative to the
road and things along it), the plane is flying (relative) to London,
the rocket is lifting off (the ground), or the passenger is moving (to
the front of the speeding train). Typically the relative reference
body is either the surroundings of the speakers, or the Earth, but
this is not always the case. For instance, it seems to make sense to
ask whether the Earth rotates about its axis West-East diurnally or
whether it is instead the heavens that rotate East-West; but if all
motions are to be reckoned relative to the Earth, then its rotation
seems impossible. But if the Earth does not offer a unique frame of
reference for the description of motion, then we may wonder whether
any arbitrary object can be used for the definition of motions: are
all such motions on a par, none privileged over any other? It is
unclear whether anyone has really, consistently espoused this view:
Aristotle, perhaps, in the *Metaphysics*; Descartes and Leibniz
are often thought to have but, as we'll see, those claims are suspect;
possibly Huygens, though his remarks remain cryptic; Mach at some
moments perhaps. If this view were correct, then the question of
whether the Earth or heavens rotate would be ill-formed, those alternatives being merely
different but equivalent expressions of the facts.

But suppose, like Aristotle, you take ordinary language accurately to reflect the structure of the world. Then you could recognize systematic everyday uses of ‘up’ and ‘down’ that require some privileged standards — uses that treat things closer to a point at the center of the Earth as more ‘down’ and motions towards that point as ‘downwards’. Of course we would likely explain this usage in terms of the fact that we and our language evolved in a very noticeable gravitational field directed towards the center of the Earth, but for Aristotle, as we shall see, this usage helped identify an important structural feature of the universe, which itself was required for the explanation of weight. Now a further question arises: how should a structure, such as a preferred point in the universe, which privileges certain motions, be understood? What makes that point privileged? One might expect that Aristotle simply identified it with the center of the Earth, and so relative to that particular body; but in fact he did not adopt that tacit convention as fundamental, for he thought it possible for the Earth to move from the ‘down’ point. Thus the question arises (although Aristotle does not address it explicitly) of whether the preferred point is somewhere picked out in some other way by the bodies in the universe —the center of the heavens perhaps? Or is it picked out quite independently of the arrangements of matter?

The issues that arise in this simple theory help frame the debates between later physicists and philosophers concerning the nature of motion; in particular, we will focus on the theories of Descartes, Newton, Leibniz, Mach and Einstein, and their interpretations. But similar issues circulate through the different contexts: is there any kind of privileged sense of motion, a sense in which things can be said to move or not, not just relative to this or that reference body, but ‘truly’? If so, can this true motion be analyzed in terms of motions relative to other bodies — to some special body, or to the entire universe perhaps? (And in relativity, in which distances, times and measures of relative motion are frame-dependent, what relations are relevant?) If not, then how is the privileged kind of motion to be understood, as relative to space itself — something physical but non-material — perhaps? Or can some kinds of motion be best understood as not being spatial changes — changes of relative location or of place — at all?

## 2. Aristotle

To see that the problem of the interpretation of spatiotemporal
quantities as absolute or relative is endemic to almost any kind of
mechanics one can imagine, we can look to one of the simplest theories
— Aristotle's account of natural motion (e.g., *On the
Heavens* I.2). According to this theory it is because of their
natures, and not because of ‘unnatural’ forces, that that
heavy bodies move down, and ‘light’ things (air and fire)
move up; it is their natures, or ‘forms’, that constitute
the gravity or weight of the former and the levity of the latter. This
account only makes sense if ‘up’ and ‘down’
can be unequivocally determined for each body. According to
Aristotle, up and down are fixed by the position of the body in
question relative to the center of the universe, a point coincident
with the center of the Earth. That is, the theory holds that heavy
bodies naturally move towards the center, while light bodies naturally
move away.

Does this theory involve absolute or merely relative quantities? It
depends on the nature of the center. If the center were identified
with the center of the Earth, then the theory could be taken to eschew
absolute quantities: it would simply hold that the natural motions of
any body depend on its position relative to another, namely the Earth.
But Aristotle is explicit that the center of the universe is not
identical with, but merely coincident with the center of the Earth
(e.g., *On the Heavens* II.14): since the Earth itself is
heavy, if it were not at the center it would move there! So the center
is not identified with any body, and so perhaps direction-to-center is
an absolute quantity in the theory, not understood fundamentally as
direction to some body (merely contingently as such if some body
happens to occupy the center). But this conclusion is not clear
either. In *On the Heavens* II.13, admittedly in response to a
different issue, Aristotle suggests that the center itself is
‘determined’ by the outer spherical shell of the universe
(the aetherial region of the fixed stars). If this is what he intends,
then the natural law prescribes motion relative to another body after
all — namely up or down with respect to the mathematical center
of the stars.

It would be to push Aristotle's writings too hard to suggest that he was consciously wrestling with the issue of whether mechanics required absolute or relative quantities of motion, but what is clear is that these questions arise in his physics and his remarks impinge on them. His theory also gives a simple model of how they arise: a physical theory of motion will say that ‘under such-and-such circumstances, motion of so-and-so a kind will occur’ — and the question of whether that kind of motion makes sense in terms of the relations between bodies alone arises automatically. Aristotle may not have recognized the question explicitly, but we see it as one issue in the background of his discussion of the center.

## 3. Descartes

The issues are, however, far more explicit in the entry on
Descartes' physics;
and since the form of his theory is different the ‘kinds of
motion’ in question are quite different — as they change
with all the different theories that we discuss. For Descartes argued
in his 1644 *Principles of Philosophy* (see Book II) that the
essence of matter was extension (i.e., size and shape) because any
other attribute of bodies could be imagined away without imagining
away matter itself. But he also held that extension constitutes the
nature of space, hence he concluded that space and matter were one and
the same thing. An immediate consequence of the identification is the
impossibility of the vacuum; if every region of space is a region of
matter, then there can be no space without matter. Thus Descartes'
universe is ‘hydrodynamical’ — completely full of
mobile matter of different sized pieces in motion, rather like a
bucket full of water and lumps of ice of different sizes, which has
been stirred around. Since fundamentally the pieces of matter are
nothing but extension, the universe is in fact nothing but a system of
geometric bodies in motion without any
gaps.^{[1]}

### 3.1 The Nature of Motion

The identification of space and matter poses a puzzle about motion: if the space that a body occupies literally is the matter of the body, then when the body — i.e., the matter — moves, so does the space that it occupies. Thus it doesn't change place, which is to say that it doesn't move after all! Descartes resolved this difficulty by taking all motion to be the motion of bodies relative to one another, not a literal change of space.

Now, a body has as many relative motions as there are bodies but it
does not follow that all are equally significant. Indeed, Descartes
uses several different concepts of relational motion. First there is
‘change of place’, which is nothing but motion relative to
this or that arbitrary reference body (II.13). In this sense no motion
of a body is privileged, since the speed, direction, and even curve of
a trajectory depends on the reference body, and none is singled out.
Next, he discusses motion in ‘the ordinary sense’
(II.24). This is often conflated with mere change of arbitrary place,
but strictly it differs because according to the rules of ordinary
speech one correctly attributes motion only to bodies whose motion is
caused by some action, *not* to arbitrary relative motion. (For
instance, a person sitting on a speeding boat is ordinarily said to be
at rest, since ‘he feels no action in himself’.) This
distinction is important in some passages, but arguably not in those
that we discuss. Finally, he defined motion ‘properly
speaking’ (II.25) to be a body's motion relative to the matter
contiguously surrounding it, which the impossibility of a vacuum
guarantees to exist. (Descartes' definition is complicated by the fact
that he modifies this technical concept to make it conform more
closely to the pre-theoretical sense of ‘motion’; however,
in our discussion transference is all that matters, so we will ignore
those complications.) Since a body can only be touching one set of
surroundings, Descartes (dubiously) argued that this standard of
motion was unique.

What we see here is that Descartes, despite holding motion to be the
motion of bodies relative to one another, also held there to be a
privileged sense of motion; in a terminology sometimes employed by
writers of the period, he held there to be a sense of ‘true
motion’, over and above the merely relative
motions. Equivalently, we can say that Descartes took motion
(‘properly speaking’) to be a complete predicate: that is,
*moves-properly-speaking* is a one-place predicate. (In
contrast, *moves-relative-to* is a two-place predicate.) And
note that the predicate is complete despite the fact that it is
analyzed in terms of relative motion. (Formally, let
*contiguous-surroundings* be a function from bodies to their
contiguous surroundings, then *x*
*moves-properly-speaking* is analyzed as *x*
*moves-relative-to contiguous-surroundings*(*x*).)

This example illustrates why it is crucial to keep two questions distinct: on the one hand, is motion to be understood in terms of relations between bodies or by invoking something additional, something absolute; on the other hand, are all relative motions equally significant, or is there some ‘true’, privileged notion of motion? Descartes' views show that eschewing absolute motion is logically compatible with accepting true motion; which is of course not to say that his definitions of motion are themselves tenable.

### 3.2 Motion and Dynamics

There is an interpretational tradition which holds that Descartes only
took the first, ‘ordinary’ sense of motion seriously, and
introduced the second notion to avoid conflict with the Catholic
Church. Such conflict was a real concern, since the censure of
Galileo's Copernicanism took place only 11 years before publication of
the *Principles*, and had in fact dissuaded Descartes from
publishing an earlier work, *The World*. Indeed, in the
*Principles* (III.28) he is at pains to explain how
‘properly speaking’ the Earth does not move, because it is
swept around the Sun in a giant vortex of matter — the Earth
does not move relative to its surroundings in the vortex.

The difficulty with the reading, aside from the imputation of
cowardice to the old soldier, is that it makes nonsense of Descartes'
mechanics, a theory of collisions. For instance, according to his laws
of collision if two equal bodies strike each other at equal and
opposite velocities then they will bounce off at equal and opposite
velocities (Rule I). On the other hand, if the very same bodies
approach each other with the very same *relative* speed, but at
different speeds then they will move off together in the direction of
the faster one (Rule III). But if the operative meaning of motion in
the Rules is the ordinary sense, then these two situations are just
the same situation, differing only in the choice of reference frame,
and so could not have different outcomes — bouncing apart
*versus* moving off together. It seems inconceivable that
Descartes could have been confused in such a trivial way.
(Additionally, as Pooley 2002 points out, just after he claims that
the Earth is at rest ‘properly speaking’, Descartes argues
that the Earth is stationary in the ordinary sense, because common
practice is to determine the positions of the stars relative to the
Earth. Descartes simply didn't need motion properly speaking to avoid
religious conflict, which again suggests that it has some other
significance in his system of thought.)

Thus Garber (1992, Chapter 6–8) proposes that Descartes actually took
the unequivocal notion of motion properly speaking to be the correct
sense of motion in mechanics. Then Rule I covers the case in which the
two bodies have equal and opposite motions *relative to their
contiguous surroundings*, while Rule VI covers the case in which
the bodies have different motions *relative to those
surroundings* — one is perhaps at rest in its surroundings.
That is, exactly what is needed to make the rules consistent is the
kind of privileged, true, sense of motion provided by Descartes'
second definition. Insurmountable problems with the rules remain, but
rejecting the traditional interpretation and taking motion properly
speaking seriously in Descartes' philosophy clearly gives a more
charitable reading.

## 4. Newton

### 4.1 Newton Against the Cartesian Account of Motion — The Bucket

In an unpublished essay — *De Gravitatione* (Newton,
2004) — and in a *Scholium* to the definitions given in
his 1687 *Mathematical Principles of Natural Philosophy* (see
Newton, 1999 for an up-to-date translation), Newton attacked both of
Descartes' notions of motion as candidates for the operative notion in
mechanics. (See Stein 1967 and Rynasiewicz 1995 for important, and
differing, views on the issue; for lessons to be drawn from both see
Huggett 2012. Newton's critique is studied in more detail in the entry
Newton's views on space, time, and motion.)

The most famous argument invokes the so-called ‘Newton's bucket’ experiment. Stripped to its basic elements one compares:

- a bucket of water hanging from a cord as the bucket is set spinning about the cord's axis, with
- the same bucket and water when they are rotating at the same rate about the cord's axis.

As is familiar from any rotating system, there will be a tendency for
the water to recede from the axis of rotation in the latter case: in
(i) the surface of the water will be flat (because of the Earth's
gravitational field) while in (ii) it will be concave. The analysis of
such ‘inertial effects’ due to rotation was a major topic of
enquiry of ‘natural philosophers’ of the time, including
Descartes and his followers, and they would certainly have agreed with
Newton that the concave surface of the water in the second case
demonstrated that the water was moving in a mechanically significant
sense. There is thus an immediate problem for the claim that proper
motion is the correct mechanical sense of motion: in (i) and (ii)
proper motion is *anti*-correlated with the mechanically
significant motion revealed by the surface of the water. That is, the
water is flat in (i) when it is in motion relative to its immediate
surroundings — the inner sides of the bucket — but curved
in (ii) when it is at rest relative to its immediate
surroundings. Thus the mechanically relevant meaning of rotation is
not that of proper motion. (You may have noticed a small lacuna in
Newton's argument: in (i) the water is at rest and in (ii) in motion
relative to that part of its surroundings constituted by the air above
it. It's not hard to imagine small modifications to the example to
fill this gap.)

Newton also points out that the height that the water climbs up the inside of the bucket provides a measure of the rate of rotation of bucket and water: the higher the water rises up the sides, the greater the tendency to recede must be, and so the faster the water must be rotating in the mechanically significant sense. But suppose, very plausibly, that the measure is unique, that any particular height indicates a particular rate of rotation. Then the unique height that the water reaches at any moment implies a unique rate of rotation in a mechanically significant sense. And thus motion in the sense of motion relative to an arbitrary reference body, is not the mechanical sense, since that kind of rotation is not unique at all, but depends on the motion of the reference body. And so Descartes' change of place (and for similar reasons, motion in the ordinary sense) is not the mechanically significant sense of motion.

### 4.2 Absolute Space and Motion

In our discussion of Descartes we called the sense of motion operative
in the science of mechanics ‘true motion’, and the phrase
is used in this way by Newton in the *Scholium*. Thus Newton's
bucket shows that true (rotational) motion is anti-correlated with,
and so not identical with, proper motion (as Descartes proposed
according to the Garber reading); and Newton further argues that the
rate of true (rotational) motion is unique, and so not identical with
change of place, which is multiple. Newton proposed instead that true
motion is motion relative to a temporally enduring, rigid,
3-dimensional Euclidean space, which he dubbed ‘absolute
space’. Of course, Descartes also defined motion as relative to
an enduring 3-dimensional Euclidean space; the difference is that
Descartes space was divided into parts (his space was identical with a
plenum of corpuscles) in motion, not a *rigid* structure in
which (mobile) material bodies are embedded. So according to Newton,
the rate of true rotation of the bucket (and water) is the rate at
which it rotates relative to absolute space. Or put another way,
Newton effectively defines the complete predicate *x
moves-absolutely* as *x moves-relative-to absolute space*;
both Newton and Descartes offer competing complete predicates as
analyses of *x moves-truly*.

#### 4.2.1 Absolute Space vs. Galilean Relativity

Newton's proposal for understanding motion solves the problems that he
posed for Descartes, and provides an interpretation of the concepts of
constant motion and acceleration that appear in his laws of motion.
However, it suffers from two notable interpretational problems, both
of which were pressed forcefully by Leibniz (in the Leibniz-Clarke
Correspondence, 1715–1716) — which is not to say that
Leibniz himself offered a superior account of motion (see below). (Of
course, there are other features of Newton's proposal that turned out
to be empirically inadequate, and are rejected by in relativity theory: Newton's
account violates the relativity of simultaneity and postulates a
non-dynamical spacetime structure.) First, according to this account,
absolute velocity is a well-defined quantity: more simply, the
absolute speed of a body is the rate of change of its position
relative to an arbitrary point of absolute space. But the Galilean
relativity of Newton's laws (see the entry on
space and time: inertial frames)
means that the evolution of a closed
system is unaffected by constant changes in velocity; Galileo's
experimenter cannot determine from observations inside his cabin
whether the boat is at rest in harbor or sailing smoothly. Put another
way, according to Newtonian mechanics, in principle Newton's absolute
velocity cannot be experimentally determined. So in this regard
absolute velocity is quite unlike acceleration (including rotation).
Newtonian acceleration is understood in absolute space as the rate of
change of absolute velocity, and is, according to Newtonian mechanics,
in general measurable; for instance by measuring the height that the
water ascends the sides of the bucket. (It is worth noting that Newton
was well-aware of these facts; the Galilean relativity of his theory
is demonstrated in Corollary V of the laws of the *Principia*,
while Corollary VI shows that acceleration is unobservable if all
parts of the system accelerate in parallel at the same rate, as they
do in a homogeneous gravitational field.) Leibniz argued (rather
inconsistently, as we shall see) that since differences in absolute
velocity are unobservable, they are not be genuine differences at all;
and hence that Newton's absolute space, whose existence would entail
the reality of such differences, must also be a fiction. Few
philosophers today would immediately reject a quantity as
unreal simply because it was not experimentally determinable, but this
fact does justify genuine doubts about the reality of absolute
velocity, and hence of absolute space.

#### 4.2.2 The Ontology of Absolute Space

The second problem concerns the nature of absolute space. Newton quite
clearly distinguished his account from Descartes' — in
particular with regards to absolute space's rigidity versus Descartes'
‘hydrodynamical’ space, and the possibility of the vacuum
in absolute space. Thus absolute space is definitely not material. On
the other hand, presumably it is supposed to be part of the physical,
not mental, realm. In *De Gravitatione*, Newton rejected both
the traditional philosophical categories of substance and attribute as
suitable characterizations. Absolute space is not a substance for it
lacks causal powers and does not have a fully independent existence,
and yet it is not an attribute since it would exist even in a vacuum, which
by definition is a place where there are no bodies in which it might
inhere. Newton proposes that space is what we might call a
‘pseudo-substance’, more like a substance than property,
yet not quite a substance. (Note that Samuel Clarke, in his
*Correspondence* with Leibniz, which Newton had some role in
composing, advocates the property view, and note further that when
Leibniz objects because of the vacuum problem, Clarke suggests that
there might be non-material beings in the vacuum in which space might
inhere.) In fact, Newton accepted the principle that everything that
exists, exists somewhere — i.e., in absolute space. Thus he
viewed absolute space as a necessary consequence of the existence of
anything, and of God's existence in particular — hence space's
ontological dependence. Leibniz was presumably unaware of the
unpublished *De Gravitatione* in which these particular ideas
were developed, but as we shall see, his later works are characterized
by a robust rejection of any notion of space as a real thing rather
than an ideal, purely mental entity. This is a view that attracts even
fewer contemporary adherents, but there is something deeply peculiar
about a non-material but physical entity, a worry that has influenced
many philosophical opponents of absolute space.

## 5. Absolute Space in the Twentieth Century

### 5.1 The Spacetime Approach

After the development of relativity (which we will take up below), and
its interpretation as a *spacetime* theory, it was realized
that the notion of spacetime had applicability to a range of theories
of mechanics, classical as well as relativistic. In particular, there
is a spacetime geometry — ‘Galilean’ or
‘neo-Newtonian’ spacetime — for Newtonian mechanics
that solves the problem of absolute velocity; an idea exploited by a
number of philosophers from the late 1960s (e.g., Earman 1970,
Friedman 1983, Sklar 1974 and Stein 1968). For details the reader is
referred to the entry on
spacetime: inertial frames,
but the general idea is that although a spatial distance is
well-defined between any two simultaneous points of this spacetime,
only the temporal interval is well-defined between non-simultaneous
points. Thus things are rather unlike Newton's absolute space, whose
points persist through time and maintain their distances: in absolute
space the distance between *p*-now and *q*-then (where
*p* and *q* are points) is just the distance between
*p*-now and *q*-now. However, Galilean spacetime has an
‘affine connection’ which effectively specifies for every
point of every continuous curve, the rate at which the curve is
changing from straightness at that point; for instance, the straight
lines are picked out as those curves whose rate of change from
straightness is zero at every point. (Another way of thinking about
this space is as possessing — in addition to a distance between
any two simultaneous points and a temporal interval between any points
— a three-place relation of colinearity, satisfied by three
points just in case they lie on a straight line.)

Since the trajectories of bodies are curves in spacetime, the affine connection determines the rate of change from straightness at every point of every possible trajectory. The straight trajectories thus defined can be interpreted as the trajectories of bodies moving inertially (i.e., without forces), and the rate of change from straightness of any trajectory can be interpreted as the acceleration of a body following that trajectory. That is, Newton's First Law can be given a geometric formulation as ‘bodies on which no net forces act follow straight lines in spacetime’; similarly, the Second Law can be formulated as ‘the rate of change from straightness of a body's trajectory is equal to the forces acting on the body divided by its mass’. The significance of this geometry is that while acceleration is well-defined, velocity is not — in accord with the empirical determinability of acceleration but not of velocity, according to Newtonian mechanics. (A simple analogy helps see how such a thing is possible: betweenness on a curve, but not ‘up’ is a well-defined concept in Euclidean space.) Thus Galilean spacetime gives a very nice interpretation of the choice that nature makes when it decides that the laws of mechanics should be formulated in terms of accelerations not velocities.

### 5.2 Substantivalism

Put another way, we can define the complete predicate *x
accelerates* as *trajectory*(*x*)
*has-non-zero-rate-of-change-from-straightness*, where
*trajectory* maps bodies onto their trajectories in Galilean
spacetime. And this predicate, defined this way, applies to the water
in the bucket if and only if it is rotating, according to Newtonian
mechanics formulated in terms of the geometry of Galilean spacetime;
it is the mechanically relevant sense of the word in this theory. But
this theoretical formulation and definition have been given in terms of the
geometry of spacetime, not in terms of the relations between bodies; acceleration is
‘absolute’ in the sense that there is a preferred (true)
sense of acceleration in mechanics and which is not defined in terms
of the motions of bodies relative to one another. (Note that this
sense of ‘absolute’ is broader than that of motion
relative to absolute space, which we defined earlier. In the remainder
of this article we will use it in the broader sense. The reader should
be aware that the term is used in many ways in the literature, and
such equivocation often leads to significant misunderstandings.) Thus if
any of this analysis of motion is taken literally then one arrives at
a position regarding the ontology of spacetime rather like that of
Newton's regarding space: it is some kind of ‘substantial’
(or maybe pseudo-substantial) *thing* with the geometry of
Galilean spacetime, just as absolute space possessed Euclidean
geometry. This view regarding the ontology of spacetime is usually
called ‘substantivalism’ (Sklar, 1974). The Galilean
substantivalist usually sees himself as adopting a more sophisticated
geometry than Newton but sharing his substantivalism (though there is
room for debate on Newton's exact ontological views; see DiSalle,
2002). The advantage of the more sophisticated geometry is that
although it allows the absolute sense of acceleration apparently
required by Newtonian mechanics to be defined, it does not allow one
to define a similar absolute speed or velocity — *x*
accelerates can be defined as a complete predicate in terms of the
geometry of Galilean spacetime but not *x* moves in general
— and so the first of Leibniz's problems is resolved. Of course
we see that the solution depends on a crucial shift from speed and
velocity to acceleration as the relevant senses of
‘motion’: from the rate of change of position to the rate
of rate of change.

While this proposal solves the first kind of problem posed by Leibniz, it seems just as vulnerable to the second. While it is true that it involves the rejection of absolute space as Newton conceived it, and with it the need to explicate the nature of an enduring space, the postulation of Galilean spacetime poses the parallel question of the nature of spacetime. Again, it is a physical but non-material something, the points of which may be coincident with material bodies. What kind of thing is it? Could we do without it? As we shall see below, some contemporary philosophers believe so.

## 6. Leibniz

There is a ‘folk-reading’ of Leibniz that one finds either explicitly or implicitly in the philosophy of physics literature which takes account of only some of his remarks on space and motion. The reading underlies vast swathes of the literature: for instance, the quantities captured by Earman's (1999) ‘Leibnizian spacetime’ do not do justice to Leibniz's view of motion (as Earman acknowledges). But it is perhaps most obvious in introductory texts (e.g., Ray 1991, Huggett 2000 to mention a couple). According to this view, the only quantities of motion are relative quantities, relative velocity, acceleration and so on, and all relative motions are equal, so there is no true sense of motion. However, Leibniz is explicit that other quantities are also ‘real’, and his mechanics implicitly — but obviously — depends on yet others. The length of this section is a measure, not so much of the importance of Leibniz's actual views, but the importance of showing what the prevalent folk view leaves out regarding Leibniz's views on the metaphysics of motion and interpretation of mechanics. (For further elaboration of the following points the reader is referred to the entry on Leibniz's philosophy of physics)

That said, we shall also see that no one has yet discovered a fully
satisfactory way of reconciling the numerous conflicting things that
Leibniz says about motion. Some of these tensions can be put down
simply to his changing his mind (see Cover and Hartz 1988 for an
explication of how Leibniz's views on space developed). However, we
will concentrate on the fairly short period in the mid 1680–90s during
which Leibniz developed his theory of mechanics, and was most
concerned with its interpretation. We will supplement this
discussion with the important remarks that he made in his
*Correspondence* with Samuel Clarke
around 30 years later
(1715–1716); this discussion is broadly in line with the earlier
period, and the intervening period is one in which he turned to other
matters, rather than one in which his views on space were dramatically
evolving.

### 6.1 The Ideality of Space

Arguably, Leibniz's views concerning space and motion do not have a
completely linear logic, starting from some logically sufficient basic
premises, but instead form a collection of mutually supporting
doctrines. If one starts questioning why Leibniz held certain views
— concerning the ideality of space, for instance — one is
apt to be led in a circle. Still, exposition requires starting
somewhere, and Leibniz's argument for the ideality of space in the
*Correspondence* with Clarke is a good place to begin. But bear
in mind the caveats made here — this argument was made later
than a number of other relevant writings, and its logical relation to
Leibniz's views on motion is complex.

Leibniz (LV.47 — this notation means Leibniz's Fifth letter,
section 47, and so on) says that (i) a body comes to have the
‘same place’ as another once did, when it comes to stand
in the same relations to bodies we ‘suppose’ to be
unchanged (more on this later). (ii) That we can define ‘a
place’ to be that which any such two bodies have in common (here
he claims an analogy with the Euclidean/Eudoxan definition of a
rational number in terms of an identity relation between ratios). And
finally that (iii) space is all such places taken together. However,
he also holds that properties are *particular*, incapable of
being instantiated by more than one individual, *even at different
times*; hence it is impossible for the two bodies to be in
literally the same relations to the unchanged bodies. Thus the thing
that we take to be the same for the two bodies — the place
— is something added by our minds to the situation, and only
ideal. As a result, space, which is constructed from these
ideal places, is itself ideal: ‘a certain order, wherein the
mind conceives the application of relations’.

It's worth pausing briefly to contrast this view of space with those
of Descartes and of Newton. Both Descartes and Newton claim that space
is a real, mind-independent entity; for Descartes it is matter, and
for Newton a ‘pseudo-substance’, distinct from matter. And
of course for both, these views are intimately tied up with their
accounts of motion. Leibniz simply denies the mind-independent
reality of space, and this too is bound up with his views concerning
motion. (Note that fundamentally, in the metaphysics of monads that
Leibniz was developing contemporaneously with his mechanics,
*everything* is in the mind of the monads; but the point that
Leibniz is making here is that even within the world that is logically
constructed from the contents of the minds of monads, space is
ideal.)

### 6.2 Force and the Nature of Motion

So far (apart from that remark about ‘unchanged’ bodies)
we have not seen Leibniz introduce anything more than relations of
distance between bodies, which is certainly consistent with the folk
view of his philosophy. However, Leibniz sought to provide a
foundation for the Cartesian/mechanical philosophy in terms of the
Aristotelian/scholastic metaphysics of substantial forms (here we
discuss the views laid out in Sections 17–22 of the 1686 *Discourse
on Metaphysics* and the 1695 *Specimen of Dynamics*, both
in Garber and Ariew 1989). In particular, he identifies primary matter
with what he calls its ‘primitive passive force’ of
resistance to changes in motion and to penetration, and the
substantial form of a body with its ‘primitive active
force’. It is important to realize that these forces are not
mere properties of matter, but actually constitute it in some sense,
and further that they are not themselves quantifiable. However because
of the collisions of bodies with one another, these forces
‘suffer limitation’, and ‘derivative’ passive
and active forces result. (There's a real puzzle here. Collision
presupposes space, but primitive forces constitute matter
*prior* to any spatial concepts — the primitive active
and passive forces ground motion and extension respectively. See
Garber and Rauzy, 2004.) Derivative passive force shows up in the
different degrees of resistance to change of different kinds of matter
(of ‘secondary matter’ in scholastic terms), and
apparently is measurable. Derivative active force however, is
considerably more problematic for Leibniz. On the one hand, it is
fundamental to his account of motion and theory of mechanics —
motion fundamentally *is* possession of force. But on the other
hand, Leibniz endorses the mechanical philosophy, which precisely
sought to abolish Aristotelian substantial form, which active force
represents. Leibniz's goal was to reconcile the two philosophies, by
providing an Aristotelian metaphysical foundation for modern
mechanical science; as we shall see, it is ultimately an open question
exactly how Leibniz intended to deal with the inherent tensions in
such a view.

#### 6.2.1 *Vis Viva* and True Motion

The texts are sufficiently ambiguous to permit dissent, but arguably
Leibniz intends that one manifestation of derivative active force is
what he calls *vis viva* — ‘living
force’. Leibniz had a famous argument with the Cartesians over
the correct definition of this quantity. Descartes defined it as
*size* times *speed* — effectively as the
magnitude of the momentum of a body. Leibniz gave a brilliant argument
(repeated in a number of places, for instance Section 17 of the
*Discourse on Metaphysics*) that it was *size* times
*speed ^{2}* — so (proportional to) kinetic
energy. If the proposed identification is correct then kinetic energy
quantifies derivative active force according to Leibniz; or looked at
the other way, the quantity of

*virtus*(another term used by Leibniz for active force) associated with a body determines its kinetic energy and hence its speed. As far as the authors know, Leibniz never explicitly says anything conclusive about the relativity of

*virtus*, but it is certainly consistent to read him (as Roberts 2003 does) to claim that there is a unique quantity of

*virtus*and hence ‘true’ (as we have been using the term) speed associated with each body. At the very least, Leibniz does say that there is a real difference between possession and non-possession of

*vis viva*(e.g., in Section 18 of the Discourse) and it is a small step from there to true, privileged speed. Indeed, for Leibniz, mere change of relative position is not ‘entirely real’ (as we saw for instance in the

*Correspondence*) and only when it has

*vis viva*as its immediate cause is there some reality to it. (However, just to muddy the waters, Leibniz also claims that as a matter of fact, no body ever has zero force, which on the reading proposed means no body is ever at rest, which would be surprising given all the collisions bodies undergo.) An alternative interpretation to the one suggested here might say that Leibniz intends that while there is a difference between motion/

*virtus*and no motion/

*virtus*, there is somehow no difference between any strictly positive values of those quantities.

It is important to emphasize two points about the preceding account of
motion in Leibniz's philosophy. First, motion in the everyday sense
— motion *relative* to something else — is not
really real. Fundamentally motion is possession of *virtus*,
something that is ultimately non-spatial (modulo its interpretation as
primitive force limited by collision). If this reading is right
— and something along these lines seems necessary if we aren't
simply to ignore important statements by Leibniz on motion —
then Leibniz is offering an interpretation of motion that is radically
different from the obvious understanding. One might even say that for
Leibniz motion is not movement at all! (We will leave to one side the
question of whether his account is ultimately coherent.) The second
point is that however we should understand Leibniz, the folk reading
simply does not and cannot take account of his clearly and repeatedly
stated view that what is real in motion is force *not* relative
motion, for the folk reading allows Leibniz *only* relative
motion (and of course additionally, motion in the sense of force is a
variety of true motion, again contrary to the folk reading).

### 6.3 Motion and Dynamics

However, from what has been said so far it is still possible that the
folk reading is accurate when it comes to Leibniz's views on the
phenomena of motion, the subject of his theory of mechanics. The case
for the folk reading is in fact supported by Leibniz's
resolution of the tension that we mentioned earlier, between the
fundamental role of force/*virtus* (which we will now take to
mean *mass* times *speed ^{2}*) and its
association with Aristotelian form. Leibniz's way out (e.g.,

*Specimen of Dynamics*) is to require that while considerations of force must somehow determine the form of the laws of motion, the laws themselves should be such as not to allow one to determine the value of the force (and hence true speed). One might conclude that in this case Leibniz held that the only quantities which can be determined are those of relative position and motion, as the folk reading says. But even in this circumscribed context, it is at best questionable whether the interpretation is correct.

#### 6.3.1 Leibniz's Mechanics

Consider first Leibniz's mechanics. Since his laws are what is now
(ironically) often called ‘Newtonian’ elastic collision
theory, it seems that they satisfy both of his requirements. The laws
include conservation of kinetic energy (which we identify with
*virtus*), but they hold in all inertial frames, so the kinetic
energy of any arbitrary body can be set to any initial value. But they
do not permit the kinetic energy of a body to take on any values
throughout a process. The laws are only Galilean relativistic, and so
are not true in every frame. Furthermore, according to the laws of
collision, in an inertial frame, if a body does not collide then its
Leibnizian force is conserved while if (except in special cases) it
does collide then its force changes. According to Leibniz's laws one
cannot determine initial kinetic energies, but one certainly can tell
when they change. At very least, there are quantities of motion
implicit in Leibniz's mechanics — change in force and true
speed — that are not merely relative; the folk reading is
committed to Leibniz simply missing this obvious fact.

#### 6.3.2 The Equivalence of Hypotheses

That said, when Leibniz discusses the relativity of motion —
which he calls the ‘equivalence of hypotheses’ about the
states of motion of bodies — some of his statements do suggest
that he was confused in this way. For another way of stating the
problem for the folk reading is that the claim that relative motions
alone suffice for mechanics and that all relative motions are on a par is
a principle of general relativity, and could Leibniz — a
mathematical genius — really have failed to notice that his laws
hold only in special frames? Well, just maybe. On the one hand, when
he explicitly articulates the principle of the equivalence of
hypotheses (for instance in *Specimen of Dynamics*) he tends to
say only that one cannot assign *initial* velocities on the
basis of the outcome of a collision, which requires only Galilean
relativity. However, he confusingly also claimed (*On
Copernicanism and the Relativity of Motion*, also in Garber and
Ariew 1989) that the Tychonic and Copernican hypotheses were
equivalent. But if the Earth orbits the Sun in an inertial frame
(Copernicus), then there is no inertial frame according to which the
Sun orbits the Earth (Tycho Brahe), and vice versa: these hypotheses
are simply not Galilean equivalent (something else Leibniz could
hardly have failed to notice). So there is some textual support for
Leibniz endorsing general relativity for the phenomena, as the folk reading maintains.

A number of commentators have suggested solutions to the puzzle of the
conflicting pronouncements that Leibniz makes on the subject: Stein
1977 argues for general relativity, thereby imputing a
misunderstanding of his own laws to Leibniz; Roberts 2003 argues for
Galilean relativity, thereby discounting Leibniz's apparent statements
to the contrary; see also Lodge 2003. Jauernig 2004 and 2008 points
out that in the *Specimen*, Leibniz claims that all motions are
composed of uniform rectilinear motions: an apparently curvilinear
motion is actually a series of uniform motions, punctuated by
discontinuous collisions. This observation allows one to restrict the
scope of claims of the kind ‘no motions can be attributed on the
basis of phenomena’ to inertial motions, and so helps read
Leibniz as more consistently advocating Galilean relativity, the
reading Jauernig favors (see also Huggett's 2006 ‘Can Spacetime
Help Settle Any Issues in Modern Philosophy?’, in the Other
Internet Resources, which was inspired by Jauernig's work). Note that
even in a pure collision dynamics the phenomena distinguish a body in
uniform rectilinear motion over time, from one that undergoes
collisions changing its uniform rectilinear motion over time: the laws
will hold in the frame of the former, but not in the frame of the
latter. That is, apparently contrary to what Jauernig says, Leibniz's
account of curvilinear motion does not collapse Galilean relativity
into general relativity. In that case, Leibniz's specific claims of
the phenomenal equivalence of Copernican and Tychonic hypotheses still
need to be accommodated.

### 6.4 Where Did the Folk Go Wrong?

So the folk reading simply ignores Leibniz's metaphysics of motion, it
commits Leibniz to a mathematical howler regarding his laws, and it is
arguable whether it is the best rendering of his pronouncements
concerning relativity; it certainly cannot be accepted
unquestioningly. However, it is not hard to understand the temptation
of the folk reading. In his *Correspondence* with Clarke,
Leibniz says that he believes space to be “something merely
relative, as time is, … an order of coexistences, as time is an
order of successions” (LIII.4), which is naturally taken to mean
that space is at base nothing but the distance and temporal relations
between bodies. (Though even this passage has its subtleties, because
of the ideality of space discussed above, and because in Leibniz's
conception space determines what sets of relations are
*possible*.) And if relative distances and times exhaust the
spatiotemporal in this way, then shouldn't *all* quantities of
motion be defined in terms of those relations? We have seen two ways
in which this would be the wrong conclusion to draw. *Force*
seems to involve a notion of speed that is not identified with any
relative speed. And (unless the equivalence of hypotheses is after all
a principle of general relativity), the laws pick out a standard of
constant motion that need not be any constant relative motion. Of
course, it is hard to reconcile these quantities with the view of
space and time that Leibniz proposes — what is *speed* in
*size times speed ^{2}* or

*constant speed*if not speed relative to some body or to absolute space? Given Leibniz's view that space is literally ideal (and indeed that even relative motion is not ‘entirely real’) perhaps the best answer is that he took

*force*and hence

*motion*in its real sense not to be determined by motion in a relative sense at all, but to be primitive monadic quantities. That is, he took

*x moves*to be a complete predicate, but he believed that it could be fully analyzed in terms of strictly monadic predicates:

*x moves*iff

*x possesses-non-zero-derivative-active-force*. And this reading explains just what Leibniz took us to be supposing when we ‘supposed certain bodies to be unchanged’ in the construction of the idea of space: that they had no force, nothing causing, or making real any motion.

### 6.5 Leibniz's Response to Newton's *Scholium*

It's again helpful to compare Leibniz with Descartes and Newton, this
time regarding motion. Commentators often express frustration at
Leibniz's response to Newton's arguments for absolute space: “I
find nothing … in the *Scholium* that proves or can
prove the reality of space in itself. However, I grant that there is a
difference between an absolute true motion of a body and a mere
relative change …” (LV.53). Not only does Leibniz apparently
fail to take the argument seriously, he then goes on to concede the
step in the argument that seems to require absolute space! But with
our understanding of Newton and Leibniz, we can see that what he says
makes perfect sense (or at least that it is not as disingenuous as it
is often taken to be). Newton argues in the *Scholium* that
true motion cannot be identified with the kinds of motion that
Descartes considers; but both of these are purely relative motions,
and Leibniz is in complete agreement that merely relative motions are
not true (i.e., ‘entirely real’). Leibniz's
‘concession’ merely registers his agreement with Newton
against Descartes on the difference between true and relative motion;
he surely understood who and what Newton was refuting, and it was a
position that he had himself, in different terms, publicly argued
against at length. But as we have seen, Leibniz had a very different
analysis of the difference to Newton's; true motion was not, for him,
a matter of motion relative to absolute space, but the possession of
quantity of force, ontologically prior to any spatiotemporal
quantities at all. There is indeed nothing in the *Scholium*
explicitly directed against that view, and since it does potentially
offer an alternative way of understanding true motion, it is not
unreasonable for Leibniz to claim that there is no deductive inference
from true motion to absolute space.

## 7. ‘Not-Newton’ versus ‘Be-Leibniz’

### 7.1 *Non Sequiturs* Mistakenly Attributed to Newton

The folk reading which belies Leibniz has it that he sought a theory
of mechanics formulated in terms only of the relations between bodies.
As we'll see presently, in the Nineteenth Century, Ernst Mach indeed
proposed such an approach, but Leibniz clearly did not; though certain
similarities between Leibniz and Mach — especially the rejection
of absolute *space* — surely helps explain the confusion
between the two. But not only is Leibniz often misunderstood, there
are influential misreadings of Newton's arguments in the
*Scholium*, influenced by the idea that he is addressing
Leibniz in some way. Of course the *Principia* was written 30
years before the *Correspondence*, and the arguments of the
*Scholium* were not written with Leibniz in mind, but Clarke
himself suggests (CIV.13) that those arguments — specifically
those concerning the bucket — are telling against Leibniz. That
argument is indeed devastating to the parity of all relative motions but we have seen
that it is highly questionable whether Leibniz's equivalence of
hypotheses amounts to such a view. That said, his statements in the
first four letters of the *Correspondence* could understandably
mislead Clarke on this point — it is in reply to Clarke's
challenge that Leibniz explicitly denies the parity of relative
motions. But interestingly, Clarke does not present a true version of
Newton's argument — despite some involvement of Newton in
writing the replies. Instead of the argument from the uniqueness of
the rate of rotation, he argues that systems with different velocities
must be different because the effects observed *if they were
brought to rest* would be different. This argument is of course
utterly question begging against a view that holds that there is no
privileged standard of rest (the view Clarke mistakenly attributes to Leibniz)!

As we discuss further in Section 8, Mach attributed to Newton the fallacious
argument that because the surface of the water curved even when it was
not in motion relative to the bucket, it must be rotating relative to
absolute space. Our discussion of Newton showed how misleading such a
reading is. In the first place he also argues that there must be some
privileged sense of rotation, and hence not all relative motions are
equal. Second, the argument is *ad hominem* against Descartes,
in which context a disjunctive syllogism — motion is either
proper or ordinary or relative to absolute space — is
argumentatively legitimate. On the other hand, Mach is quite correct
that Newton's argument in the *Scholium* leaves open the
logical possibility that the privileged, true sense of rotation (and
acceleration more generally) is some species of relative motion; if
not motion properly speaking, then relative to the fixed stars
perhaps. (In fact Newton rejects this possibility in *De
Gravitatione* (1962) on the grounds that it would involve an
odious action at a distance; an ironic position given his theory of
universal gravity.)

### 7.2 The Best Explanation Argument Mistakenly Attributed to Newton

However the kind of folk-reading of Newton that underlies much of the
contemporary literature replaces Mach's interpretation with a more
charitable one. According to this reading, Newton's point is that his
mechanics — unlike Descartes' — could *explain* why
the surface of the rotating water is curved, that his explanation
involves a privileged sense of rotation, and that absent an
alternative hypothesis about its relative nature, we should accept
absolute space. But our discussion of Newton's argument showed that
it simply does not have an ‘abductive’, ‘best
explanation’ form, but shows deductively, from Cartesian
premises, that rotation is neither proper nor ordinary motion.

That is not to say that Newton had no understanding of how such
effects would be explained in his mechanics. For instance, in
Corollaries 5 and 6 to the Definitions of the *Principles* he
states in general terms the conditions under which different states of
motion are not — and so by implication *are* —
discernible according to his laws of mechanics. Nor is it to say that
Newton's contemporaries weren't seriously concerned with explaining
inertial effects. Leibniz, for instance, analyzed a rotating body (in
the *Specimen*). In short, parts of a rotating system collide
with the surrounding matter and are continuously deflected, into a
series of linear motions that form a curved path. (Though the system
as Leibniz envisions it — comprised of a plenum of elastic
particles of matter — is far too complex for him to offer any
quantitative model based on this qualitative picture. So he had no
serious alternative explanation of inertial effects.)

### 7.3 Substantivalism and The Best Explanation Argument

#### 7.3.1 The Rotating Spheres

Although the argument is then not Newton's, it is still an important
response to the kind of relationism proposed by the folk-Leibniz,
especially when it is extended by bringing in a further example from
Newton's *Scholium*. Newton considered a pair of identical
spheres, connected by a cord, too far from any bodies to observe any
relative motions; he pointed out that their rate and direction of
rotation could still be experimentally determined by measuring the
tension in the cord, and by pushing on opposite faces of the two globes
to see whether the tension increased or decreased. He intended this
simple example to demonstrate that the project he intended in the
*Principia*, of determining the absolute accelerations and
hence gravitational forces on the planets from their relative motions,
was possible. However, if we further specify that the spheres and cord
are *rigid* and that they are the only things in their
universe, then the example can be used to point out that there are
infinitely many different rates of rotation all of which agree on the
relations between bodies. Since there are no differences in the
relations between bodies in the different situations, it follows that
the *observable* differences between the states of rotation
cannot be explained in terms of the relations between
bodies. Therefore, a theory of the kind attributed to the folk's
Leibniz cannot explain all the phenomena of Newtonian mechanics, and
again we can argue abductively for absolute space. (Of course, the
argument works by showing that, granted the different states of
rotation, there are states of rotation that cannot merely be relative
rotations of any kind; for the differences cannot be traced to any
relational differences. That is, granted the assumptions of the
argument, rotation is not true relative motion of any kind.)

This argument (neither the premises nor conclusion) is not Newton's, and must not be taken as a historically accurate reading, However, that is not to say that the argument is fallacious, and indeed many have found it attractive, particularly as a defense not of Newton's absolute space, but of Galilean spacetime. That is, Newtonian mechanics with Galilean spacetime can explain the phenomena associated with rotation, while theories of the kind proposed by Mach cannot explain the differences between situations allowed by Newtonian mechanics, but these explanations rely on the geometric structure of Galilean spacetime — particularly its affine connection, to interpret acceleration. And thus — the argument goes — those explanations commit us to the reality of spacetime — a manifold of points — whose properties include the appropriate geometric ones. This final doctrine, of the reality of spacetime with its component points or regions, distinct from matter, with geometric properties, is what we earlier identified as ‘substantivalism’.

#### 7.3.2 Relationist Responses

There are two points to make about this line of argument. First, the relationist could reply that he need not explain all situations which are possible according to Newtonian mechanics, because that theory is to be rejected in favor of one which invokes only distance and time relations between bodies, but which approximates to Newton's if matter is distributed suitably. Such a relationist would be following Mach's proposal, which we will discuss next. Such a position would be satisfactory only to the extent that a suitable concrete replacement theory to Newton's theory is developed; Mach never offered such a theory, but recently more progress has been made.

Second, one must be careful in understanding just how the argument
works, for it is tempting to gloss it by saying that in Newtonian
mechanics the affine connection is a crucial part of the explanation of the
surface of the water in the bucket, and if the spacetime which carries
the connection is denied, then the explanation fails too. But this
gloss tacitly assumes that Newtonian mechanics can only be understood
in a substantial Galilean spacetime; if an interpretation of Newtonian
mechanics that does not assume substantivalism can be constructed,
then all Newtonian explanations can be given without a literal
connection. Both Sklar (1974) and van Fraassen (1985) have made
proposals along these lines. Sklar proposes interpreting
‘true’ acceleration as a primitive quantity not defined in
terms of motion relative to anything, be it absolute space, a
connection or other bodies. (Notice the family resemblance between
this proposal and Leibniz's view of force and speed.) Van Fraassen
proposes formulating mechanics as ‘Newton's Laws hold in
*some* frame’, so that the form of the laws and the
contingent relative motions of bodies — not absolute space or a
connection, or even any instantaneous relations — pick out a
standard of true motion, namely with respect to such an
‘inertial frame’. These proposals aim to keep the full
explanatory resources of Newtonian mechanics, and hence admit
‘true acceleration’, but deny any relations between bodies
and spacetime itself. Like the actual Leibniz, they allow absolute
quantities of motion, but claim that space and time themselves are
nothing but the relations between bodies. Some may question how the
laws can be such as to privilege frames without prior spacetime
geometry. Huggett 2006 proposes that the laws be understood as a
Humean ‘best system’
(see the entry on
laws of nature) for a
world of bodies and their relations; the laws don't reflect prior
geometric structure, but systematic regularities in patterns of
relative motions. For obvious reasons, this proposal is called
‘regularity relationism’. Note that Sklar and van
Fraassen are committed to the idea that in some sense Newton's laws
are capable of explaining all the phenomena without recourse to
spacetime geometry; that the connection and the metrical properties
are explanatorily redundant. This idea is at the core of the
‘Dynamical Approach’, discussed below.

## 8. Mach and Later Machians

Between the time of Newton and Leibniz and the 20th century, Newton's
mechanics and gravitation theory reigned essentially unchallenged, and
with that long period of dominance, absolute space came to be widely
accepted. At least, no natural philosopher or physicist offered a
serious challenge to Newton's absolute space, in the sense of offering
a rival theory that dispenses with it. But like the action at a
distance in Newtonian gravity, absolute space continued to provoke
metaphysical unease. Seeking a replacement for the unobservable
Newtonian space, Neumann (1870) and Lange (1885) developed more
concrete definitions of the reference frames in which Newton's laws
hold. In these and a few other works, the concept of the set of
inertial frames was first clearly expressed, though it was implicit in
both remarks and procedures to be found in the
*Principia*. (See the entries on
space and time: inertial frames
and
Newton's views on space, time, and motion)
The most sustained, comprehensive, and influential attack on absolute
space was made by Ernst Mach in his *Science of Mechanics*
(1883).

In a lengthy discussion of Newton's *Scholium* on absolute
space, Mach accuses Newton of violating his own methodological
precepts by going well beyond what the observational facts teach us
concerning motion and acceleration. Mach at least partly
misinterpreted Newton's aims in the *Scholium*, and inaugurated
a reading of the bucket argument (and by extension the globes
argument) that has largely persisted in the literature since. Mach
viewed the argument as directed against a ‘strict’ or
‘general-relativity’ form of relationism, and as an
attempt to establish the existence of absolute space. Mach points out
the obvious gap in the argument when so construed: the experiment only
establishes that acceleration (rotation) of the water *with respect
to the Earth, or the frame of the fixed stars*, produces the
tendency to recede from the center; it does not prove that a strict
relationist theory cannot account for the bucket phenomena, much less
the existence of absolute space. (The reader will recall that Newton's
actual aim was simply to show that Descartes' two kinds of motion are
not adequate to accounting for rotational phenomena.) Although Mach
does not mention the globes thought experiment specifically, it is
easy to read an implicit response to it in the things he does say:
nobody is competent to say what would happen, or what would be
possible, in a universe devoid of matter other than two globes. So
neither the bucket nor the globes can establish the existence of
absolute space.

### 8.1 Two Interpretations of Mach on Inertia

Both in Mach's interpretations of Newton's arguments and in his replies, one can already see two anti-absolute space viewpoints emerge, though Mach himself never fully kept them apart. The first strain, which we may call ‘Mach-lite’, criticizes Newton's postulation of absolute space as a metaphysical leap that is neither justified by actual experiments, nor methodologically sound. The remedy offered by Mach-lite is simple: we should retain Newton's mechanics and use it just as we already do, but eliminate the unnecessary posit of absolute space. In its place we need only substitute the frame of the fixed stars, as is the practice in astronomy in any case. If we find the incorporation of a reference to contingent circumstances (the existence of a single reference frame in which the stars are more or less stationary) in the fundamental laws of nature problematic (which Mach need not, given his official positivist account of scientific laws), then Mach suggests that we replace the 1st law with an empirically equivalent mathematical rival:

Mach's Equation (1960, 287)

The sums in this equation are to be taken over all massive bodies in the universe. Since the top sum is weighted by distance, distant masses count much more than near ones. In a world with a (reasonably) static distribution of heavy distant bodies, such as we appear to live in, the equation entails local conservation of linear momentum in ‘inertial’ frames. The upshot of this equation is that the frame of the fixed stars plays the role of absolute space in the statement of the 1st law. (Notice that this equation, unlike Newton's first law, is not vectorial.) This proposal does not, by itself, offer an alternative to Newtonian mechanics, and as Mach himself pointed out, the law is not well-behaved in an infinite universe filled with stars; but the same can perhaps be said of Newton's law of gravitation (see Malament 1995, and Norton 1993). But Mach did not offer this equation as a proposed law valid in any circumstances; he avers, “it is impossible to say whether the new expression would still represent the true condition of things if the stars were to perform rapid movements among one another.” (p. 289)

It is not clear whether Mach offered this revised first law as a first
step toward a theory that would replace Newton's mechanics, deriving
inertial effects from only relative motions, as Leibniz desired. But
many other remarks made by Mach in his chapter criticizing absolute
space point in this direction, and they have given birth to the
Mach-heavy view, later to be christened “Mach's Principle”
by Albert
Einstein.^{[2]}
The Mach-heavy viewpoint calls for a new mechanics that invokes only
relative distances and (perhaps) their 1st and 2nd time derivatives,
and thus ‘generally relativistic’ in the sense sometimes
read into Leibniz's remarks about motion. Mach wished to eliminate
absolute time from physics too, so he would have wanted a proper
relationist reduction of these derivatives also. The Barbour-Bertotti
theories, discussed below, provide this.

Mach-heavy apparently involves the prediction of novel effects due to ‘merely’ relative accelerations. Mach hints at such effects in his criticism of Newton's bucket:

Newton's experiment with the rotating vessel of water simply informs us that the relative rotation of the water with respect to the sides of the vessel produces no noticeable centrifugal forces, but that such forces are produced by its relative rotation with respect to the mass of the earth and the other celestial bodies. No one is competent to say how the experiment would turn out if the sides of the vessel [were] increased until they were ultimately several leagues thick. (1883, 284.)

The suggestion here seems to be that the relative rotation in stage (i) of the experiment might immediately generate an outward force (before any rotation is communicated to the water), if the sides of the bucket were massive enough. (Note that this response could not have been made by Leibniz — even if he had wanted to defend Machian relationism — because it involves action at a distance between the water and the parts of the bucket.)

More generally, Mach-heavy involves the view that all inertial effects
should be derived from the motions of the body in question relative to
all other massive bodies in the universe. The water in Newton's bucket
feels an outward pull due (mainly) to the relative rotation of all the
fixed stars around it. Mach-heavy is a speculation that an effect
something like electromagnetic induction should be built into gravity
theory. (Such an effect does exist according to the General Theory of
Relativity, and is called ‘gravitomagnetic induction’. The
recently finished Gravity Probe B mission was designed to measure the
gravitomagnetic induction effect due to the Earth's rotation.) Its
specific form must fall off with distance much more slowly than
1/r^{2}, if it is to be empirically similar to Newtonian
physics; but it will certainly predict experimentally testable novel
behaviors. A theory that satisfies all the goals of Mach-heavy would
appear to be ideal for the vindication of strict relationism and the
elimination of absolute quantities of motion from mechanics.

### 8.2 Implementing Mach-heavy

Direct assault on the problem of satisfying Mach-heavy in a classical framework proved unsuccessful, despite the efforts of others besides Mach (e.g., Friedländer 1896, Föpl 1904, Reissner 1914, 1915), until the work of Barbour and Bertotti in the 1970s and 80s. (Between the late 19th century and the 1970s, there was of course one extremely important attempt to satisfy Mach-heavy: the work of Einstein that led to the General Theory of Relativity. Since Einstein's efforts took place in a non-classical (Lorentz/Einstein/Minkowski) spacetime setting, we discuss them in the next section.) Rather than formulating a revised law of gravity/inertia using relative quantities, Barbour and Bertotti attacked the problem using the framework of Lagrangian mechanics, replacing the elements of the action that involve absolute quantities of motion with new terms invoking only relative distances, velocities etc. Their first (1977) theory uses a very simple and elegant action, and satisfies everything one could wish for from a Mach-heavy theory: it is relationally pure (even with respect to time: while simultaneity is absolute, the temporal metric is derived from the field equations); it is nearly empirically equivalent to Newton's theory in a world such as ours (with a large-scale uniform, near-stationary matter distribution); yet it does predict novel effects such as the ones Mach posited with his thick bucket. Among these is an ‘anisotropy of inertia’ effect — accelerating a body away from the galactic center requires more force than accelerating it perpendicular to the galactic plane — large enough to be ruled out empirically.

Barbour and Bertotti's second attempt (1982) at a relational Lagrangian mechanics was arguably less Machian, but more empirically adequate. In it, solutions are sought beginning with two temporally-nearby, instantaneous relational configurations of the bodies in the universe. Barbour and Bertotti define an ‘intrinsic difference’ parameter that measures how different the two configurations are. In the solutions of the theory, this intrinsic difference quantity gets minimized, as well as the ordinary action, and in this way full solutions are derived despite not starting from a privileged inertial-frame description. The theory they end up with turns out to be, in effect, a fragment of Newtonian theory: the set of models of Newtonian mechanics and gravitation in which there is zero net angular momentum. This result makes perfect sense in terms of strict relationist aims. In a Newtonian world in which there is a nonzero net angular momentum (e.g., a lone rotating island galaxy), this fact reveals itself in the classic “tendency to recede from the center”. Since a strict relationist demands that bodies obey the same mechanical laws even in ‘rotating’ coordinate systems, there cannot be any such tendency to recede from the center (other than in a local subsystem), in any of the relational theory's models. Since cosmological observations, even today, reveal no net angular momentum in our world, the second Barbour & Bertotti theory can lay claim to exactly the same empirical successes (and problems) that Newtonian physics had. The second theory does not predict the (empirically falsified) anisotropy of inertia derivable from the first; but neither does it allow a derivation of the precession of the orbit of Mercury, which the first theory does (for appropriately chosen cosmic parameters).

### 8.3 Mach-lite versus Mach-heavy

Mach-lite, like the relational interpretations of Newtonian physics reviewed in section 5, offers us a way of understanding Newtonian physics without accepting absolute position, velocity or acceleration. But it does so in a way that lacks theoretical clarity and elegance, since it does not delimit a clear set of cosmological models. We know that Mach-lite makes the same predictions as Newton for worlds in which there is a static frame associated with the stars and galaxies; but if asked about how things will behave in a world with no frame of fixed stars, or in which the stars are far from ‘fixed’, it shrugs and refuses to answer. (Recall that Mach-lite simply says: “Newton's laws hold in the frame of reference of the fixed stars.”) This is perfectly acceptable according to Mach's philosophy of science, since the job of mechanics is simply to summarize observable facts in an economical way. But it is unsatisfying to those with stronger realist intuitions about laws of nature.

If there is, in fact, a distinguishable privileged frame of reference in which the laws of mechanics take on a specially simple form, without that frame being determined in any way by relation to the matter distribution, a realist will find it hard to resist the temptation to view motions described in that frame as the ‘true’ or ‘absolute’ motions. If there is a family of such frames, disagreeing about velocity but all agreeing about acceleration, she will feel a temptation to think of at least acceleration as ‘true’ or ‘absolute’. If such a realist believes motion to be by nature a relation rather than a property (and as we saw in the Section 1, not all philosophers accept this) then she will feel obliged to accord some sort of existence or reality to the structure — e.g., the structure of Galilean spacetime — in relation to which these motions are defined. For philosophers with such realist inclinations, the ideal relational account of motion would therefore be some version of Mach-heavy.

## 9. Relativity and Motion

The Special Theory of Relativity (STR) is notionally based on a
principle of relativity of motion; but that principle is
‘special’ — meaning, restricted. The relativity
principle built into STR is in fact nothing other than the Galilean
principle of relativity, which is built into Newtonian
physics.^{[3]}
In other words, while there is no privileged standard of velocity,
there is nevertheless a determinate fact of the matter about whether a
body has accelerated or non-accelerated (i.e., inertial) motion. In
this regard, the spacetime of STR is exactly like Galilean spacetime
(defined in section 5 above). In terms of the question of whether all
motion can be considered purely relative, one could argue that there
is nothing new brought to the table by the introduction of Einstein's
STR — at least, as far as mechanics is concerned. (Once again refer
to the entry on
space and time: inertial frames
for a more detailed discussion.)

### 9.1 Relations Determine State of Motion?

As Dorling (1978) first pointed out, however, there is a sense in which the standard absolutist arguments against ‘strict’ relationism using rotating objects (buckets or globes) fail in the context of STR. Maudlin (1993) used the same considerations to show that there is a way of recasting relationism in STR that appears to be very successful.

STR incorporates certain novelties concerning the nature of time and
space, and how they mesh together; perhaps the best-known examples are
the phenomena of ‘length contraction’, ‘time
dilation’, and the ‘relativity of
simultaneity.’^{[4]}
Since in STR both spatial distances and time intervals — when
measured in the standard ways — are observer-relative (observers
in different states of motion ‘disagreeing’ about their
sizes), it is arguably most natural to restrict oneself to the
invariant spacetime separation given by the *interval* between
two points: [*dx*^{2} + *dy*^{2} +
*dz*^{2} — *dt*^{2}] — the
four-dimensional analog of the Pythagorean theorem, for spacetime
distances. If one regards the spacetime interval relations between
masses-at-times as one's basis on which space-time is built up as an
ideal entity, then with only mild caveats relationism works: the
‘relationally pure’ facts suffice to uniquely fix how the
material systems are embeddable (up to isomorphism) in the
‘Minkowski’ spacetime of STR. The modern variants of
Newton's bucket and globes arguments no longer stymie the relationist
because (for example) the spacetime interval relations among bits of
matter in Newton's bucket at rest are quite different from the
spacetime interval relations found among those same bits of matter
after the bucket is rotating. For example, the spacetime
*interval* relation between a bit of water near the side of the
bucket, at one time, and itself (say) a second later is
*smaller* than the interval relation between a center-bucket
bit of water and itself one second later (times referred to
inertial-frame clocks). The upshot is that, unlike the situation in
classical physics, a body at rest cannot have all the same spatial
relations among its parts as a similar body in rotation. We cannot put
a body or system into a state of rotation (or other acceleration)
without thereby changing the spacetime interval relations between the
various bits of matter at different moments of time. Rotation and
acceleration supervene on spacetime interval relations.

It is worth pausing to consider to what extent this victory for (some
form of) relationism satisfies the classical ‘strict’
relationism traditionally ascribed to Mach and Leibniz. The
spatiotemporal relations that save the day against the bucket and
globes are, so to speak, mixed spatial and temporal distances. They
are thus quite different from the spatial-distances-at-a-time
presupposed by classical relationists; moreover they do not correspond
to relative velocities (-at-a-time) either. Their oddity is forcefully
captured by noticing that if we choose appropriate bits of matter at
‘times’ eight minutes apart, I-now am at *zero*
distance from the surface of the sun (of eight minutes
‘past’, since it took 8 minutes for light from the sun to
reach me-now). So we are by no means dealing here with an innocuous,
‘natural’ translation of classical relationist quantities
into the STR setting. On the other hand, in light of the relativity of
simultaneity (see note [4]),
it can be argued that the absolute simultaneity presupposed by
classical relationists and absolutists alike was, in fact, something
that relationists should always have regarded with misgivings. From
this perspective, instantaneous relational configurations —
precisely what one starts with in the theories of Barbour and Bertotti
— would be the things that should be treated with suspicion.

If we now return to our questions about motions — about the
nature of velocities and accelerations — we find, as noted
above, that matters in the interval-relational interpretation of STR
are much the same as in Newtonian mechanics in Galilean
spacetime. There are no well-defined absolute velocities, but there
are indeed well-defined absolute accelerations and rotations. In fact,
the difference between an accelerating body (e.g., a rocket) and an
inertially moving body is codified directly in the cross-temporal
interval relations of the body with *itself*. So we are very
far from being able to conclude that all motion is relative motion of
a body with respect to *other* bodies. It is true that the
absolute motions are in 1–1 correlation with patterns of spacetime
interval relations, but it is not at all correct to say that they are,
for that reason, eliminable in favor of merely relative
motions. Rather we should simply say that no absolute acceleration can
fail to have an effect on the material body or bodies accelerated. But
this was already true in classical physics if matter is modeled
realistically: the cord connecting the globes does not merely tense,
but also stretches; and so does the bucket, even if imperceptibly,
i.e., the spatial relations change.

Maudlin does not claim this version of relationism to be victorious over an absolutist or substantivalist conception of Minkowski spacetime, when it comes time to make judgments about the theory's ontology. There may be more to vindicating relationism than merely establishing a 1–1 correlation between absolute motions and patterns of spatiotemporal relations.

### 9.2 The Relationist Roots of STR and GTR

The simple comparison made above between STR and Newtonian physics in
Galilean spacetime is somewhat deceptive. For one thing, Galilean
space*time* is a mathematical innovation posterior to
Einstein's 1905 theory; before then, Galilean spacetime had not been
conceived, and full acceptance of Newtonian mechanics implied
accepting absolute velocities and, arguably, absolute positions, just
as laid down in the *Scholium*. So Einstein's elimination of
absolute velocity was a genuine conceptual advance. Moreover, the
*Scholium* was not the only reason for supposing that there
existed a privileged reference frame of ‘rest’: the
working assumption of almost all physicists in the latter half of the
19th century was that, in order to understand the wave theory of
light, one had to postulate an aetherial medium filling all space,
wave-like disturbances in which constituted electromagnetic
radiation. It was assumed that the aether rest frame would be an
inertial reference frame; and physicists felt some temptation to
equate its frame with the absolute rest frame, though this was not
necessary. Regardless of this equation of the aether with absolute
space, it was assumed by all 19th century physicists that the
equations of electrodynamic theory would have to look different in a
reference frame moving with respect to the aether than they did in the
aether's rest frame (where they presumably take their canonical form,
i.e., Maxwell's equations and the Lorentz force law.) So while
theoreticians labored to find plausible transformation rules for the
electrodynamics of moving bodies, experimentalists tried to detect the
Earth's motion in the aether. Experiment and theory played
collaborative roles, with experimental results ruling out certain
theoretical moves and suggesting new ones, while theoretical advances
called for new experimental tests for their confirmation or — as
it happened — disconfirmation.

As is well known, attempts to detect the Earth's velocity in the
aether were unsuccessful. On the theory side, attempts to formulate the
transformation laws for electrodynamics in moving frames — in
such a way as to be compatible with experimental results — were
complicated and
inelegant.^{[5]}
A simplified way of seeing how Einstein swept away a host of problems
at a stroke is this: he proposed that the Galilean principle of
relativity holds for Maxwell's theory, not just for mechanics. The
canonical (‘rest-frame’) form of Maxwell's equations
should be their form in *any* inertial reference frame. Since
the Maxwell equations dictate the velocity *c* of
electromagnetic radiation (light), this entails that any inertial
observer, no matter how fast she is moving, will measure the velocity
of a light ray as *c* — no matter what the relative
velocity of its emitter. Einstein worked out logically the
consequences of this application of the special relativity principle,
and discovered that space and time must be rather different from how
Newton described them. STR undermined Newton's absolute time just as
decisively as it undermined his absolute space.

### 9.3 From Special Relativity to General Relativity

Einstein's STR was the first clear and empirically successful physical
theory to overtly eliminate the concepts of absolute rest and absolute
velocity while recovering *most of* the successes of classical
mechanics and 19th century electrodynamics. It therefore deserves to
be considered the first highly successful theory to explicitly
relativize motion, albeit only partially. But STR only recovered most
of the successes of classical physics: crucially, it left out
gravity. And there was certainly reason to be concerned that Newtonian
gravity and STR would prove incompatible: classical gravity acted
instantaneously at a distance, while STR eliminated the privileged
absolute simultaneity that this instantaneous action presupposes.

Several ways of modifying Newtonian gravity to make it compatible with the spacetime structure of STR suggested themselves to physicists in the years 1905–1912, and a number of interesting Lorentz-covariant theories were proposed (set in the Minkowski spacetime of STR). Einstein rejected these efforts one and all, for violating either empirical facts or theoretical desiderata. But Einstein's chief reason for not pursuing the reconciliation of gravitation with STR's spacetime appears to have been his desire, beginning in 1907, to replace STR with a theory in which not only velocity could be considered merely relative, but also acceleration. That is to say, Einstein wanted if possible to completely eliminate all absolute quantities of motion from physics, thus realizing a theory that satisfies at least one kind of ‘strict’ relationism. (Regarding Einstein's rejection of Lorentz-covariant gravity theories, see Norton 1992; regarding Einstein's quest to fully relativize motion, see Hoefer 1994.)

Einstein began to see this complete relativization as possible in
1907, thanks to his discovery of the Equivalence Principle. Imagine we
are far out in space, in a rocket ship accelerating at a constant rate
*g* = 9.98 *m*/*s*^{2}. Things will feel
just like they do on the surface of the Earth; we will feel a clear
up-down direction, bodies will fall to the floor when released,
etc. Indeed, due to the well-known empirical fact that gravity affects
all bodies by imparting a force proportional to their matter (and
energy) content, independent of their internal constitution, we know
that any experiment performed on this rocket will give the same
results that the same experiment would give if performed on the
Earth. Now, Newtonian theory teaches us to consider the apparent
downward, gravity-like forces in the rocket ship as
‘pseudo-forces’ or ‘inertial forces’, and
insists that they are to be explained by the fact that the ship is
accelerating in absolute space. But Einstein asked whether there is
any way for the person in the rocket to regard him/herself as being
‘at rest’ rather than in absolute (accelerated)
motion? And the answer he gave is: Yes. The rocket traveler may
regard him/herself as being ‘at rest’ in a homogeneous and
uniform gravitational field. This will explain all the observational
facts just as well as the supposition that he/she is accelerating
relative to absolute space (or, absolutely accelerating in Minkowski
spacetime). But is it not clear that the latter is the truth, while
the former is a fiction? By no means; if there were a uniform
gravitational field filling all space, then it would affect all the
other bodies in the world — the Earth, the stars, etc, imparting
to them a downward acceleration away from the rocket; and that is
exactly what the traveler observes.

In 1907, Einstein published his first gravitation theory (Einstein
1907), treating the gravitational field as a scalar field that also
represented the (now variable and frame-dependent) speed of light.
Einstein viewed the theory as only a first step on the road to
eliminating absolute motion. In the 1907 theory, the theory's
equations take the same form in any inertial *or uniformly
accelerating* frame of reference. One might say that this theory
reduces the class of absolute motions, leaving only rotation and other
non-uniform accelerations as absolute. But, Einstein reasoned, if
uniform acceleration can be regarded as equivalent to being at rest in
a constant gravitational field, why should it not be possible also to
regard inertial effects from these other, non-uniform motions as
similarly equivalent to “being at rest in a (variable)
gravitational field”? Thus Einstein set himself the goal of
expanding the principle of equivalence to embrace all forms of
‘accelerated’ motion.

Einstein thought that the key to achieving this aim lay in further
expanding the range of reference frames in which the laws of physics
take their canonical form, to include frames adapted to any arbitrary
motions. More specifically, since the class of all continuous and
differentiable coordinate systems includes as a proper subclass the
coordinate systems adapted to any such frame of reference, if he could
achieve a theory of gravitation, electromagnetism and mechanics that
was *generally covariant* — its equations taking the same
form in any coordinate system from this general class — then the
complete relativity of motion would be achieved. If there are no
special frames of reference in which the laws take on a simpler
canonical form, there is no physical reason to consider any particular
state or states of motion as privileged, nor deviations from those as
representing ‘absolute motion’. (Here we are just laying
out Einstein's train of thought; later we will see reasons to question
the last step.) And in 1915, Einstein achieved his aim in the General
Theory of Relativity (GTR).

### 9.4 General Relativity and Relativity of Motion

There is one key element left out of this success story, however, and it is crucial to understanding why most physicists reject Einstein's claim to have eliminated absolute states of motion in GTR. Going back to our accelerating rocket, we accepted Einstein's claim that we could regard the ship as hovering at rest in a universe-filling gravitational field. But a gravitational field, we usually suppose, is generated by matter. How is this universe-filling field linked to generating matter? The answer may be supplied by Mach-heavy. Regarding the ‘accelerating’ rocket which we decide to regard as ‘at rest’ in a gravitational field, the Machian says: all those stars and galaxies, etc., jointly accelerating downward (relative to the rocket), ‘produce’ that gravitational field. The mathematical specifics of how this field is generated will have to be different from Newton's law of gravity, of course; but it should give essentially the same results when applied to low-mass, slow-moving problems such as the orbits of the planets, so as to capture the empirical successes of Newtonian gravity. Einstein thought, in 1916 at least, that the field equations of GTR are precisely this mathematical replacement for Newton's law of gravity, and that they fully satisfied the desiderata of Mach-heavy relationism. But it was not so. (See the entry on early philosophical interpretations of general relativity.)

In GTR, spacetime is locally very much like flat Minkowski
spacetime. There is no absolute velocity locally, but there are clear
local standards of accelerated vs non-accelerated motion, i.e., local
inertial frames. In these ‘freely falling’ frames bodies
obey the usual rules for non-gravitational physics familiar from STR,
albeit only approximately. But overall spacetime is curved, and local
inertial frames may tip, bend and twist as we move from one region to
another. The structure of curved spacetime is encoded in the metric
field tensor **g _{ab}**, with the curvature
encoding gravity at the same time: gravitational forces are so to
speak ‘built into’ the metric field, geometrized
away. Since the spacetime structure encodes gravity and inertia, and
in a Mach-heavy theory these phenomena should be completely determined
by the relational distribution of matter (and relative motions),
Einstein wished to see the metric as entirely determined by the
distribution of matter and energy. But what the GTR field equations
entail is, in general, only a partial-determination relation.

We cannot go into the mathematical details necessary for a full
discussion of the successes and failures of Mach-heavy in the GTR
context. But one can see why the Machian interpretation Einstein hoped
he could give to the curved spacetimes of his theory fails to be
plausible, by considering a few simple ‘worlds’ permitted
by GTR. In the first place, for our hovering rocket ship, if we are to
attribute the gravity field it feels to matter, there has got to
*be* all this other matter in the universe. But if we regard
the rocket as a mere ‘test body’ (not itself substantially
affecting the gravity present or absent in the universe), then we can
note that according to GTR, if we remove all the stars, galaxies,
planets etc. from the world, the gravitational field does not
disappear. On the contrary, it stays basically the same locally, and
globally it takes the form of empty Minkowski spacetime, precisely the
quasi-absolute structure Einstein was hoping to eliminate. Solutions
of the GTR field equations for arbitrary realistic configurations of
matter (e.g., a rocket ship ejecting a stream of particles to push
itself forward) are hard to come by, and in fact a realistic two-body
exact solution has yet to be discovered. But numerical methods can be
applied for many purposes, and physicists do not doubt that something
like our accelerating rocket — in otherwise empty space —
is possible according to the
theory.^{[6]}
We see clearly, then, that GTR fails to satisfy Einstein's own
understanding of Mach's Principle, according to which, in the absence
of matter, space itself should not be able to exist. A second example:
GTR allows us to model a single *rotating* object in an
otherwise empty universe (e.g., a neutron star). Relationism of the
Machian variety says that such rotation is impossible, since it can
only be understood as rotation relative to some sort of absolute
space. In the case of GTR, this is basically right: the rotation is
best understood as rotation relative to a ‘background’
spacetime that is identical to the Minkowski spacetime of STR, only
‘curved’ by the presence of matter in the region of the
star.

On the other hand, there is one charge of failure-to-relativize-motion
sometimes leveled at GTR that is unfair. It is sometimes asserted
that the simple fact that the metric field (or the connection it
determines) distinguishes, at every location, motions that are
‘absolutely’ accelerated and/or ‘absolutely
rotating’ from those that are not, by itself entails that GTR
fails to embody a folk-Leibniz style general relativity of motion
(e.g. Earman (1989), ch. 5). We think this is incorrect, and leads to
unfairly harsh judgments about confusion on Einstein's part. The local
inertial structure encoded in the metric would not be
‘absolute’ in any meaningful sense, if that structure were
in some clear sense fully determined by the relationally specified
matter-energy distribution. Einstein was not *simply confused*
when he named his gravity theory. (Just what is to be understood by
“the relationally specified matter-energy distribution” is
a further, thorny issue, which we cannot enter into here.)

GTR does not fulfill all the goals of Mach-heavy, at least as understood by Einstein, and he recognized this fact by 1918 (Einstein 1918). And yet … GTR comes tantalizingly close to achieving those goals, in certain striking ways. For one thing, GTR does predict Mach-heavy effects, known as ‘frame-dragging’: if we could model Mach's thick-walled bucket in GTR, it seems clear that it would pull the water slightly outward, and give it a slight tendency to begin rotating in the same sense as the bucket (even if the big bucket's walls were not actually touching the water. While GTR does permit us to model a lone rotating object, if we model the object as a shell of mass (instead of a solid sphere) and let the size of the shell increase (to model the ‘sphere of the fixed stars’ we see around us), then as Brill & Cohen (1966) showed, the frame-dragging becomes complete inside the shell. In other words: our original Minkowski background structure effectively disappears, and inertia becomes wholly determined by the shell of matter, just as Mach posited was the case. This complete determination of inertia by the global matter distribution appears to be a feature of other models, including the Friedman-Robertson-Walker-Lemâitre Big Bang models that best match observations of our universe.

Finally, it is important to recognize that GTR is generally covariant in a very special sense: unlike all other prior theories (and unlike many subsequent quantum theories), it postulates no fixed ‘prior’ or ‘background’ spacetime structure. As mathematicians and physicists realized early on, other theories, e.g., Newtonian mechanics and STR, can be put into a generally covariant form. But when this is done, there are inevitably mathematical objects postulated as part of the formalism, whose role is to represent absolute elements of spacetime structure. What is unique about GTR is that it was the first, and is still the only ‘core’ physical theory, to have no such absolute elements in its covariant equations. The spacetime structure in GTR, represented by the metric field (which determines the connection), is at least partly ‘shaped’ by the distribution of matter and energy. And in certain models of the theory, such as the Big Bang cosmological models, some authors have claimed that the local standards of inertial motion — the local ‘gravitational field’ of Einstein's equivalence principle — are entirely fixed by the matter distribution throughout space and time, just as Mach-heavy requires (see, for example, Wheeler and Cuifollini 1995).

Absolutists and relationists are thus left in a frustrating and
perplexing quandary by GTR. Considering its anti-Machian models, we
are inclined to say that motions such as rotation and acceleration
remain absolute, or nearly-totally-absolute, according to the
theory. On the other hand, considering its most Mach-friendly models,
which include all the models taken to be good candidates for
representing the actual universe, we may be inclined to say: motion
*in our world* is entirely relative; the inertial effects
normally used to argue for absolute motion are all understandable as
effects of rotations and accelerations relative to the cosmic matter,
just as Mach hoped. But even if we agree that motions in our world are
in fact all relative in this sense, this does not automatically settle
the traditional relationist/absolutist debate, much less the
relationist/substantivalist debate. Many philosophers (including, we
suspect, Nerlich 1994 and Earman 1989) would be happy to acknowledge
the Mach-friendly status of our spacetime, and argue nevertheless that
we should understand that spacetime as a real thing, more like a
substance than a mere ideal construct of the mind as Leibniz
insisted. Some, though not all, attempts to convert GTR into a quantum
theory would accord spacetime this same sort of substantiality that
other quantum fields possess.

## 10. The ‘Dynamical’ Approach

Since 2000 a new approach to the issue of the nature of space-time
structures has emerged, in the works of Robert Disalle, and especially
Oliver Pooley and Harvey Brown. The latter's ‘dynamical
approach’ asserts that the space-time structure of our world is
what it is *because of the dynamical laws of nature and their
symmetries*. That is, the dynamical laws are (at least, relative to
space-time) fundamental, and space-time structure is derivative.
Correspondingly, the dynamical approach (DA) rejects the view that
puts the explanatory arrow in the opposite direction, i.e., the claim
that the dynamical laws are how they are, in part, because they are
constrained to “fit” the independently real structure of
(substantival or absolute, in some sense(s) at least) space-time.

### 10.1 The Dynamical Approach in General

There is a tight relationship between the geometrical symmetries of
a spacetime and the (spatiotemporal) symmetries of a theory that
describes the physics of matter (in a broad sense, including fields)
in it. (Theories such as GTR, in which spacetime has its own dynamics
are more complicated, and will be discussed later.) Each is a set of
transformations, with a rule of composition: formally a
‘group’. (For instance, the group of rotations in the
plane has a distinct element for every angle in the range 0–360
degrees; the composition of two rotations is of course the single
rotation through the sum of their angles.) There are good reasons to
hold that the symmetry groups of theory and spacetime must
agree. First, since the theory describes matter, and hence (arguably)
what is measurable, any theoretical symmetries not reflected in the
postulated spacetime structure indicate unmeasurable geometry: for
instance, if an absolute present were postulated in relativistic
physics. While in the other direction, if there were extra spacetime
symmetries not beyond those found in the dynamics, then *per
impossible* one could measure nonexistent geometric quantities:
for instance, a theory that depends on absolute velocities cannot be
formulated in Galilean spacetime.. (Earman 1989, Chapter 3 is a good
discussion.)

A given geometry for spacetime thus formally constrains the allowable theories to those with the just the right symmetries — not too many, and not too few. It was an assumption of many substantivalists that this constraint was not merely formal, but ontological: that the geometry (hence the manifold itself) is more fundamental than the laws, or that geometry offers a ‘real’ explanation of the form of the laws. (For instance, such a line of thought is implicit in Earman 1989, 125.) However, that the symmetries should agree does not specify any direction of dependence, and it could be reversed, so that the geometric symmetries are ontologically determined by those of the laws of the theory — hence the geometry itself is an expression of the dynamics of matter. In the words of Brown and Pooley (2006) (making these points about STR): “… space-time's Minkowskian structure cannot be taken to explain the Lorentz covariance of the dynamical laws. From our perspective … the direction of explanation goes the other way around. It is the Lorentz covariance of the laws that underwrites the fact that the geometry of space-time is Minkowskian.”

In its denial of the independence or fundamentality of space-time
structure, DA is in the relationist tradition. On the other hand,
*prima facie* DA offers no direct account of what sorts of
spatio-temporal (or other, e.g. causal) relations are to be taken as
primitive and unproblematic, so it is not immediately clear how it
relates to the tradition. However, further explication of the approach
quickly leads to clarification of the relationist commitments of the
theory, for can one in fact state dynamical laws, or understand them
as “holding” or “governing”, without
*presupposing* [facts about] space-time structure?

Take Newton's three laws plus the law of gravity as a test case for DA. The gravity law gives the gravitational force between any two bits of matter, as a function of their distance and the direction from one body to the other. At least the distances of all things from each other, at a moment of time, is presupposed. So far this sounds unproblematic; instantaneous distances are the meat and potatoes of relationism, and presupposing their existence would be be no threat to the DA. But when we turn to Newton's First and Second Laws, things look more problematic. The First Law asserts that bodies not acted upon by an external force will move with constant velocity; similarly for the Second Law and acceleration. The laws seem to presuppose that these are meaningful terms, but in spacetime terms their meaning is given in by geometric structures: for instance, constant velocity in Galilean spacetime means having a straight spacetime trajectory. And the problem is not restricted to Newtonian physics; the same point can be made regarding theories that presuppose the Minkowski background space-time structure, e.g., the quantum field theories of the Standard Model.

The advocate of DA will take laws such as Newton's as not
*presupposing* background space-time, but rather entailing that things
behave ‘*as if*’ they were embedded in such a background.
While there's nothing intrinsically problematic about as-if
claims, it can't be left as a mere flat-footed assertion. If
things are *not* in fact embedded in a space-time, then the DA advocate
should tell us what elements of physical theory do in fact represent
real things (and their properties/relations), and how their behavior
can be understood as giving rise to the appearance of a background
space-time. The DA advocate is thus drawn into engaging in a defense
of some sort of relationism. Moreover, the DA advocate has to explain
the sense in which dynamical laws that apparently presuppose
spatio-temporal structures can be *true* of a world that lacks such
structures intrinsically and ‘has’ them only in a
derivative, as-if sense.

It's worth stressing that while DA opposes fundamental absolute quantities, it is potentially neutral on the question of manifold substantivalism (indeed, this topic barely appears in Brown 2005). That is, one could develop a view in which the manifold is as ‘real’as matter, but in which it does not have its geometric (as opposed to topological, say) properties intrinsically — they are possessed in virtue of the laws. As it turns out, that is not the approach that advocates of DA have tended to take. (Norton's (2008) criticizes the substantivalist version of DA).

One obvious way to address the question is to appeal to Huggett's (2006) regularity relationism discussed above: see Huggett (2009) and Pooley (2013). The idea is to consider the dynamical laws as regularities that systematize and describe the patterns of events concerning an underlying ontology/ideology that involves or presupposes only very limited spatiotemporal features. To illustrate how this approach might go, consider Pooley's proposal that the dynamical approach to special-relativistic theories might postulate only R4 topological spatiotemporal structure, which could be (for example) attributed to a massive scalar field.

Suppose we are given a full 4-D field description of such a field, in
terms of some arbitrary coordinate system. This would describe a
simple ‘Humean mosaic‘ for a world with just a scalar field as
content. Now, smooth coordinate changes applied to such a description
will generate distinct mathematical representations of that Humean
mosaic, given using distinct coordinatizations of the field-stuff.
It might happen that, among all such representations, there is a
subclass of coordinate systems which are such that (i) when the
scalar field is described using a member of the class, it turns out
that its values at spacetime points satisfy some simple/elegant
mathematical equation; and moreover, (ii) the members of the class are
related by a nicely specifiable symmetry group. If this is so, then
the simple/elegant equation can be taken as expressing a dynamical
law for the world of this mosaic, and the symmetry group of the law
can be seen as capturing the *derivative*, not intrinsic, space-time
structure of the world. If the symmetry group is the Poincaré group,
for example, then the field behaves ‘as if’ it were embedded in a
spacetime with Minkowski geometry. But all this means is that the
dynamics is empirically equivalent to a theory with intrinsic
Minkowski geometry. From the point of view of DA, such a theory is
merely an interesting, and perhaps useful, representation of the real
facts: and it's a mistake to take every feature of a representation to
correspond to something in reality.

Forthright investigation of DA as a variant of regularity relationism has only just begun, but extending the treatment from scalar fields to more complex vector-, tensor- and spinor-fields may present a problem. It's true that vector and tensors can be defined in terms of coordinates and scalar fields, and one could imagine telling a formal story about these along the lines sketched for the scalar field: the equations governing them take an especially simple — and Lorentz invariant — form in certain coordinates. But it is not clear that such mathematical fields can be taken to properly represent physical fields without a metric: for instance, as Earman (1989, 106) points out, such quantities as the energy density cannot be defined without a metric. However, a large part of the appeal of the DA is that it classes intangible, mathematical structures — geometry — as mere representation, and tangible things — matter (including fields) and its properties — as real. If formal — pre-metrical — fields don't represent the concrete objects found in the world, then it is hard to see why the DA is an advance on taking geometry as a literal structure of the world. In other words, an account is owed of how a tensor, say, represents the electromagnetic field without a metric.

### 10.2 Specific claims from the Dynamical Approach camp – (i): Special Relativity

The dynamical approach has only recently been much discussed as a general doctrine about space-time. In Brown (2005) and earlier works, it is better known via a set of distinctive and specific claims made in the context of special relativistic physics and General Relativity. This subsection and the next will briefly analyze some of those claims.

The most striking and controversial claim made by DA advocates
Brown & Pooley concerns the special relativistic phenomena of
length contraction and time dilation and how one should best
understand them to be explained. A common view among realists about
spacetime is that these phenomena are explained by the fact that
moving rods and clocks exist *in* a spacetime with (locally) Minkowski
structure. It is because both we (and our measuring devices), and the
moving rod, are living in such a spacetime, that we measure the
fast-moving rod to be contracted in length. By contrast, the DA
claims that rods and clocks behave as they do because of the dynamical
laws. The fact that those laws are Lorentz-covariant (i.e., have as
their symmetries the Poincaré group of transformations) is sufficient
to guarantee that rods and clocks will behave in the ways predicted in
special relativity theory; the laws explain both those phenomena, *and*
the fact that spacetime “has” Minkowski structure. (Important
discussions of these issues can also be found in Janssen, 2009, and
Frisch, 2011.)

But the claim that an explanation starting from the Lorentz
covariance of the laws is the *best* or “right” sort of explanation can
be challenged, in at least two ways.

First, there is an alternative view of length contraction and time
dilation in special relativity, according to which the best
explanation is *no* explanation, because they are not
“real” phenomena, in the relevant sense, at all. On this
view such ‘kinematical’ effects are to be thought of as
something more like perspective-based illusions. What is real are the
quantities that are ‘intrinsic’ or
‘invariant’, i.e., the same no matter what reference frame
or coordinate system is chosen to describe things. “Proper
length” and “proper time” (length as measured when
at rest, and time as measured by a co-moving clock respectively) are
intrinsic/real features of bodies and processes, and correspond to the
(frame-invariant) space-time interval between certain well defined
space-time points. But length-as-measured-by-a-moving-observer, which
is essentially a frame- or coordinate-dependent quantity that varies
depending on the state of motion of the observer, is not an invariant
or intrinsic quantity, and therefore does not require
a *physical* explanation at
all.^{[7]}
Brown (2005) rejects this view, as do many
other philosophers of physics (in part due to issues mentioned in the
note just above), but many others still defend it.

Let's set this no-explanation-needed view aside and consider the spacetime realist perspective mentioned above.

Brown rejects the notion, which can be glimpsed in some passages by
advocates of substantival spacetime, that spacetime's structure
should be thought of as *causing* fast-moving bodies to shrink in
length, etc. But geometric realists need not claim that the
explanatory relation between spacetime structure and length
contraction is causal; on this view, it is more naturally viewed as
*logical*. That is to say: in a Minkowski spacetime, if one
has “rigid rods” and “clocks”, and uses these
in the standard ways to measure the “length” of a (rigid)
moving body in the direction of its motion, it is a simple
mathematical or geometrical fact that the moving body will be measured
as having its length contracted in accord with the Lorentz-Fitzgerald
formula. In many relativity texts students learn how to derive these
effects geometrically on Minkowski spacetime diagrams. Nothing about
the dynamics governing these bodies is assumed, other than that the
dynamics does indeed allow for the existence of such
“clocks” and “rigid rods”.

Pooley (2013) writes: “The substantivalist should agree that
a complex material rod does not conform to the axioms of some geometry
simply because that is the substantival geometry in which it is
immersed; the rod would not do what it does were the laws governing
its microphysical parts different in key respects.” In one
important sense, the substantivalist can insist that the rod *does* and
*must* conform to the axioms of Minkowski geometry simply because it
lives in Minkowski spacetime. If an object exists in a space or
spacetime of *X-geometry*, no physical laws, or forces, can force the
relations of its parts to violate the axioms of X-geometry. In another
sense, however, Pooley is clearly right. If the laws were very
different, there might be no rigid bodies with constant intrinsic
(rest-) length. Different laws or exotic forces might
“cause” objects to do all sorts of strange things (shrink
or expand, in any time-variable way you like); with just the right
dynamical laws, it might be possible in a Minkowski world to have
“rods” and “clocks” that operate in ways that
appear to reveal the world as having Newtonian (or spherical, or
…) spacetime structure.

The substantivalist can respond that in such a case, those rods
would not measure space-like interval, and those clocks would not
measure time-like interval, i.e., would not measure the true distances
in a spacetime with Minkowski metric structure. Those rods and clocks
would still *conform* to Minkowski geometry; logically speaking, they
have no choice. They would just not *transparently reveal* it.

It is unclear whether this response amounts to much of a victory for the substantivalist. In a world where the rods and clocks (and, let us grant, all other phenomena) seem to reveal (say) a Newtonian spacetime geometry, what is the status of the putative “real” Minkowski geometry lurking underneath? Would it even deserve to be called the “true” spacetime geometry? The problem can be put this way: why do the symmetries of the dynamics have to respect the geometry of spacetime? There is no comparable question for the DA proponent, since for her the geometry simply represents whatever symmetries there are. This sort of question arises also in the case of General Relativity, as we will now see.

### 10.3 Specific claims from the Dynamical Approach Camp – (ii): General Relativity

General Relativity theory is, at first blush, very congenial to the core idea of the dynamical approach. The DA insists that the structure of space and time is not something existing in its own right, independently of the laws of nature that happen to hold in the world. In General Relativity (GR) there is no fixed, prior or “background” spacetime structure that could be seen as independent of the dynamical laws; on the contrary, spacetime structure is explicitly constrained by, arguably directly determined by, the dynamical laws, i.e., Einstein's field equations (EFE).

On the other hand, in GR one cannot see the structure of spacetime as merely a reflection of the symmetry properties of the dynamical laws, as the DA claims we should do in the case of theories with fixed background geometries. The symmetries of EFE are usually considered to be the general general covariance group of continuously differentiable transformations, which would seem to correspond to no spacetime structure at all (or at most, topological structure with no metrical properties). If there is a sense in which the DA slogan that laws come first, spacetime structure second is to make sense — over and above the sense noted just above — it will have to be different than how this plays out in earlier theories.

Brown (2005) offers just such a different way of understanding the
spirit of the DA in GR. He claims (i) that the
metric * g* should be thought of as, in the
first instance, just a

*physical field*, akin in principle to the electromagnetic field; and (ii) it does not have the significance of representing the metrical structure of space and time

*a priori*, but instead “earns” that significance because the laws governing other matter fields happen to involve

*in such a way that they behave as if they constituted, e.g., rods and clocks, in a geometry described by*

**g***. For Brown this is the content of the ‘weak equivalence principle’. In this way Brown maintains that, in GR as before, it is dynamics (how things actually move) that is explanatorily prior, and spacetime structure (*

**g***having the role of representing spacetime geometry) that is posterior.*

**g**Both of these claims are controversial. (i) is by no means the
standard view in physics presentations of GR, and is somewhat in
tension with standard presentations that
treat * g* as representing straightforwardly
the geometry of spacetime, and sharply distinguish it from fields
representing the material “contents” of spacetime. More
importantly, (ii) is in tension with the history
of

*'s introduction into physics by Einstein in 1913–1915, as well as with standard textbook presentations of*

**g***and its role in GR.*

**g**In support of claim (ii) Brown (2005, ch. 9) discusses a recent
alternative gravity theory, Bekenstein's TeVeS theory, which actually
has two * g*-like tensors; one plays the purely
mathematical role of the metric, e.g. serving to raise and lower
indices on other tensor fields and determining the mathematical
derivative operator, while the other is the “apparent”
metric structure of spacetime, corresponding to what moving rods and
clocks survey. For Brown, the TeVeS theory makes vivid the conceptual
difference between the purely mathematical role of “metric
tensor” and the role of codifying observable geometry; they
happen to coincide in GR, but this is in a sense a contingent fact,
not something guaranteed

*a priori*by GR's mathematical apparatus.

But it is unclear that Brown is justified in drawing lessons about
the metric * g* of General Relativity from
TeVeS, which is, after all, a quite different theory from GR. In that
theory the two roles of

*are separated by design; though the consistency of the theory overall, and its ability to adequately model its intended target systems in the real world must be established by calculations and arguments, what element of the theory represents what physical aspect of reality is specified in the original presentation of the theory — in the ordinary-language text surrounding the equations, in effect. The same can be said of GR. In GR, Einstein made clear from the start that*

**g***both serves as the mathematical/geometric metric of spacetime, and also determines the metrical and inertial (affine) structure surveyed by light rays and moving bodies. In GR also, the consistency of the theory overall and its ability to model its intended target systems had to be established by calculation and argument, but the geometric significance of*

**g***in GR was in fact a postulate or stipulation built into the theory from the start. Without the assumption of that geometric significance, the Einstein tensor*

**g***would not have a clear geometric meaning, and the stress-energy tensor*

**G***would not have a clear physical meaning;*

**T***is used in the definition of both.*

**g**qua metricThus, while GR is consonant with the broad-stroke desiderata of the DA, in that spacetime structure is definitely not independent of the dynamical laws, i.e., the EFE, Brown's more specific claims about the status of the spacetime metric in GR are open to dispute.

## 11. Conclusion

This article has been concerned with tracing the history and
philosophy of ‘absolute’ and ‘relative’
theories of space and motion. Along the way we have been at pains to
introduce some clear terminology for various different concepts (e.g.,
‘true’ motion, ‘substantivalism’,
‘absolute space’), but what we have not really done is say
what *the* difference between absolute and relative space and
motion is: just what is at stake? Recently Rynasiewicz (2000) has
argued that there simply are no constant issues running through the
history that we have discussed here; that there is no stable meaning
for either ‘absolute motion’ or ‘relative
motion’ (or ‘substantival space’ vs
‘relational space’). While we agree to a certain extent,
we think that nevertheless there are a series of issues that have
motivated thinkers again and again; indeed, those that we identified
in the introduction. (One quick remark: Rynasiewicz is probably right
that the issues cannot be expressed in formally precise terms, but
that does not mean that there are no looser philosophical affinities
that shed useful light on the history.)

Our discussion has revealed several different issues, of which we will highlight three as components of the ‘absolute-relative debate’. (i) There is the question of whether all motions and all possible descriptions of motions are equal, or whether some are ‘real’ — what we have called, in Seventeenth Century parlance, ‘true’. There is a natural temptation for those who hold that there is ‘nothing but the relative positions and motions between bodies’ (and more so for their readers) to add ‘and all such motions are equal’, thus denying the existence of true motion. However, arguably — perhaps surprisingly — no one we have discussed has unreservedly held this view (at least not consistently): Descartes considered motion ‘properly speaking’ to be privileged, Leibniz introduced ‘active force’ to ground motion (arguably in his mechanics as well as metaphysically), and Mach's view seems to be that the distribution of matter in the universe determines a preferred standard of inertial motion. (Again, in general relativity, there is a distinction between inertial and accelerated motion.)

That is, relationists can allow true motions if they offer an analysis
of them in terms of the relations between bodies. Given this logical
point, and given the historical ways thinkers have understood
themselves, it seems unhelpful to characterize the issues in (i) as
constituting an absolute-relative debate, hence our use of the term
‘true’ instead of ‘absolute’. So we are led to
the second question: (ii) is true motion definable in terms of
relations or not? (Of course the answer depends on what kind of
definitions will count, and absent an explicit definition —
Descartes' proper motion for example — the issue is often taken
to be that of whether true motions supervene on relations, something
Newton's globes are often supposed to refute.) It seems reasonable to
call this the issue of whether *motion* is absolute or
relative. Descartes and Mach are relationists about motion in this
sense, while Newton is an absolutist. Leibniz is also an absolutist
about motion in his metaphysics, and if our reading is correct, also
about the interpretation of motion in the laws of collision. This
classification of Leibniz's views runs contrary to his customary
identification as relationist-in-chief, but we will clarify his
relationist credentials below. Finally, we have discussed (ii) in the
context of relativity, first examining Maudlin's proposal that the
embedding of a relationally-specified system in Minkowski spacetime is
in general unique once all the spacetime interval-distance relations
are given. This proposal may or may not be held to satisfy the
relational-definability question of (ii), but in any case it cannot be
carried over to the context of general relativity theory. In the case
of GTR we linked relational motion to the satisfaction of Mach's
Principle, just as Einstein did in the early years of the theory.
Despite some promising features displayed by GTR, and certain of its
models, we saw that Mach's Principle is not fully satisfied in GTR as
a whole. We also noted that in the absence of absolute simultaneity,
it becomes an open question what relations are to be permitted in the
definition (or supervience base) — spacetime interval relations?
Instantaneous spatial distances and velocities on a 3-d hypersurface?
(Barbour has argued that GTR is fully Machian, using a 3-d
relational-configuration approach. See Barbour, Foster and Murchadha
2002. This work has recently attracted interest as a potential basis
for formulating a quantum theory of gravity: Barbour 2012.)

The final issue is that of (iii) whether absolute motion is motion with respect to substantival space or not. Of course this is how Newton understood acceleration — as acceleration relative to absolute space. More recent Newtonians share this view, although motion for them is with respect to substantival Galilean spacetime (or rather, since they know Newtonian mechanics is false, they hold that this is the best interpretation of that theory). Leibniz denied that motion was relative to space itself, since he denied the reality of space; for him true motion was the possession of active force. So despite his ‘absolutism’ (our adjective not his) about motion he was simultaneously a relationist about space: ‘space is merely relative’. Following Leibniz's lead we can call this debate the question of whether space is absolute or relative. The drawback of this name is that it suggests a separation between motion and space, which exists in Leibniz's views, but which is otherwise problematic; still, no better description presents itself.

Others who are absolutists about motion but relationists about space include Sklar (1974) and van Fraassen (1985); Sklar introduced a primitive quantity of acceleration, not supervenient on motions relative to anything at all, while van Fraassen let the laws themselves pick out the inertial frames. It is of course arguable whether any of these three proposals are successful; (even) stripped of Leibniz's Aristotelian packaging, can absolute quantities of motion ‘stand on their own feet’? And under what understanding of laws can they ground a standard of inertial motion? Huggett (2006) defends a similar position of absolutism about motion, but relationism about space; he argues — in the case of Newtonian physics — that fundamentally there is nothing to space but relations between bodies, but that absolute motions supervene — not on the relations at any one time — but on the entire history of relations.

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*Time, Space and Philosophy*, New York: Routledge. - Roberts, J. T., 2003, “Leibniz on Force and Absolute
Motion,”
*Philosophy of Science*, 70: 553–573. - Rynasiewicz, R., 1995, “By their Properties, Causes, and
Effects: Newton's Scholium on Time, Space, Place, and Motion —
I. The Text,”
*Studies in History and Philosophy of Science*, 26: 133–153. - Sklar, L., 1974,
*Space, Time and Spacetime*, Berkeley: University of California Press. - Stein, H., 1977, “Some Philosophical Prehistory of General
Relativity,” in
*Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science 8: Foundations of Space-Time Theories:*, J. Earman, C. Glymour and J. Stachel (eds.), Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press. - –––, 1967, “Newtonian Space-Time,”
*Texas Quarterly*, 10: 174–200. - Wheeler, J.A. and Ciufolini, I., 1995,
*Gravitation and Inertia*, Princeton, N.J.: Princeton U. Press.

### Notable Philosophical Discussions of the Absolute-Relative Debates

- Barbour, J. B., 1982, “Relational Concepts of Space and
Time,”
*British Journal for the Philosophy of Science*, 33: 251–274. - Belot, G., 2000, “Geometry and Motion,”
*British Journal for the Philosophy of Science*, 51: 561–595. - Butterfield, J., 1984, “Relationism and Possible
Worlds,”
*British Journal for the Philosophy of Science*, 35: 101–112. - Callender, C., 2002, “Philosophy of Space-Time
Physics,” in
*The Blackwell Guide to the Philosophy of Science*, P. Machamer (ed.), Cambridge: Blackwell, pp. 173–198. - Carrier, M., 1992, “Kant's Relational Theory of Absolute
Space,”
*Kant Studien*, 83: 399–416. - Dieks, D., 2001, “Space-Time Relationism in Newtonian and
Relativistic Physics,”
*International Studies in the Philosophy of Science*, 15: 5–17. - Disalle, R., 1995, “Spacetime Theory as Physical
Geometry,”
*Erkenntnis*, 42: 317–337. - Earman, J., 1986, “Why Space is Not a Substance (at Least
Not to First Degree),”
*Pacific Philosophical Quarterly*, 67: 225–244. - –––, 1970, “Who's Afraid of Absolute
Space?,”
*Australasian Journal of Philosophy*, 48: 287–319. - Earman, J. and J. Norton, 1987, “What Price Spacetime
Substantivalism: The Hole Story,”
*British Journal for the Philosophy of Science*, 38: 515–525. - Hoefer, C., 2000, “Kant's Hands and Earman's Pions:
Chirality Arguments for Substantival Space,”
*International Studies in the Philosophy of Science*, 14: 237–256. - –––, 1998, “Absolute Versus Relational
Spacetime: For Better Or Worse, the Debate Goes on,”
*British Journal for the Philosophy of Science*, 49: 451–467. - –––, 1996, “The Metaphysics of Space-Time
Substantialism,”
*Journal of Philosophy*, 93: 5–27. - Huggett, N., 2000, “Reflections on Parity
Nonconservation,”
*Philosophy of Science*, 67: 219–241. - Le Poidevin, R., 2004, “Space, Supervenience and
Substantivalism,”
*Analysis*, 64: 191–198. - Malament, D., 1985, “Discussion: A Modest Remark about
Reichenbach, Rotation, and General Relativity,”
*Philosophy of Science*, 52: 615–620. - Maudlin, T., 1993, “Buckets of Water and Waves of Space: Why
Space-Time is Probably a Substance,”
*Philosophy of Science*, 60: 183–203. - –––, 1990, “Substances and Space-Time:
What Aristotle would have Said to Einstein,”
*Studies in History and Philosophy of Science*, 21(4): 531–561. - Mundy, B., 1992, “Space-Time and Isomorphism,”
*Proceedings of the Biennial Meetings of the Philosophy of Science Association*, 1: 515–527. - –––, 1983, “Relational Theories of
Euclidean Space and Minkowski Space-Time,”
*Philosophy of Science*, 50: 205–226. - Nerlich, G., 2003, “Space-Time Substantivalism,” in
*The Oxford Handbook of Metaphysics*, M. J. Loux (ed.), Oxford: Oxford Univ Press, 281–314. - –––, 1996, “What Spacetime
Explains,”
*Philosophical Quarterly*, 46: 127–131. - –––, 1994,
*What Spacetime Explains: Metaphysical Essays on Space and Time*, New York: Cambridge University Press. - –––, 1973, “Hands, Knees, and Absolute
Space,”
*Journal of Philosophy*, 70: 337–351. - Rynasiewicz, R., 2000, “On the Distinction between Absolute
and Relative Motion,”
*Philosophy of Science*, 67: 70–93. - –––, 1996, “Absolute Versus Relational
Space-Time: An Outmoded Debate?,”
*Journal of Philosophy*, 93: 279–306. - Teller, P., 1991, “Substance, Relations, and Arguments about
the Nature of Space-Time,”
*Philosophical Review*, 363–397. - Torretti, R., 2000, “Spacetime Models for the World,”
*Studies in History and Philosophy of Modern Physics*(Part B), 31(2): 171–186.

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