First published Wed Dec 9, 2009; substantive revision Thu Apr 9, 2015

To desire is to be in a particular state of mind. It is a state of mind familiar to everyone who has ever wanted to drink water or desired to know what has happened to an old friend, but its familiarity does not make it easy to give a theory of desire. Controversy immediately breaks out when asking whether wanting water and desiring knowledge are, at bottom, the same state of mind as others that seem somewhat similar: wishing never to have been born, preferring mangoes to peaches, craving gin, having world conquest as one's goal, having a purpose in sneaking out to the shed, or being inclined to provoke just for the sake of provocation. These varied states of mind have all been grouped together under the heading of ‘pro attitudes’, but whether the pro attitudes are fundamentally one mental state or many is disputed.

In spite of the disputes, it is nonetheless possible to get a fix on desire itself. Desiring is a state of mind that is commonly associated with a number of different effects: a person with a desire tends to act in certain ways, feel in certain ways, and think in certain ways. If Nora desires tea, for example, then Nora will typically make herself a cup of tea; if she does not get herself some tea right away she will nonetheless typically feel the urge to do so; she will find the thought of tea pleasant and will find her current lack of tea unpleasant; she will find her thoughts repeatedly turning to the idea of tea; she will judge that tea seems like a good idea; and so on. These various effects have been the focus of efforts to develop theories that are theories of desire.

Understanding desires requires at least two things: first, to have a theory of desire itself, and second, to have some familiarity with the varieties of desires that there are. Once acquired, an understanding of desire can illuminate a number of controversies surrounding desire.

1. Theories of Desire

There is a simple, conservative theory of desire according to which having a desire is a matter of having dispositions to act. According to this theory, dispositions to act are the only essential feature of desires; the tendencies a person has to feel certain ways or think in certain ways when she has a desire are interesting but inessential tendencies. If Nora desires tea, this is because she is disposed to get herself some tea, and her dispositions to feel good about tea, think positively about getting tea, or to keep having her thoughts turn toward getting tea are merely associated effects of her desire. The simple, conservative theory has a number of competitors, each emphasizing something different from, or in addition to, dispositions to action.

In spite of the variety of theoretical options, the simple, conservative theory of desire—the action-based theory—is the most widely-held theory, making it the appropriate place to begin any discussion.

1.1 Action-Based Theories of Desire

Consider a desire for a yellow mango. “The primitive sign of wanting,” Anscombe writes, “is trying to get” (Anscombe 2000). Taking this thought to heart, one might hold that if Janet tries to get a yellow mango, then a yellow mango is what Janet desires. But Janet can desire a yellow mango even when she is not trying to get one (she might be struck by a craving while all out of mangoes, and not be willing to go shopping at that moment). So there is reason to want something more elaborate as a theory of desire. To deal with Janet, it might seem simplest to hold that desires dispose us to action, without always bringing it about that we act. Although Janet is not trying to get a mango, she is disposed to get one—and would, were it only more convenient to do so. This leads to a simple, action-based theory of desire.

For an organism to desire p is for the organism to be disposed to act so as to bring about p.

This sort of theory has been criticized for being insufficiently restrictive, because it appears to attribute desires to organisms on the basis of mere behavioral tics. For instance, if a woman has a tendency to stutter, then it follows from the theory above that she has a desire to stutter—simply because she is disposed to act so as to stutter. For such reasons, it is common to prefer a more sophisticated version of an action-based theory of desire.

For an organism to desire p is for the organism to be disposed to take whatever actions it believes are likely to bring about p.

According to this theory, for Janet to desire to have a yellow mango is just for her to be disposed to go to the fridge, or the store, or to ask her friend, or to do whatever else she believes likely to get her a yellow mango. She need not actually do any of these things, for she might desire to do something else even more, or might be asleep, or drugged, or otherwise prevented from doing the things she is disposed to do, but she must be (at least to some extent) disposed to do them all else being equal. Likewise, for John to desire that Janet love him is for John to be disposed to take whatever actions he believes are likely to make it the case that Janet loves him. And so on, for the various desires that people and other organisms are capable of having. Michael Smith has very clearly articulated this sort of theory of desire in a number of works (Smith 1987; 1994).

Like their less sophisticated counterparts, more sophisticated action-based theories of desire have been criticized for being insufficiently restrictive. Dennis Stampe points out that a person who believes that serving just so will cause him to double fault in tennis might thereby become disposed to serve just so and double fault (being nervous seems to have this effect quite often), but this would not show that such a person desires to double fault (Stampe 1986). And a number of philosophers have suggested that desires are only one psychological state able to initiate action, so that it is a mistake to identify desires with psychological states disposing us to actions. Some of these philosophers have focused on the negative point, that what might be called ‘true desires’ do not exhaust the possible motivational states (Davis 1986; Marks 1986). Others have focused on a positive alternative to desire as a motivating state, and these latter have tended to focus on the idea that a judgment of what is good (or obligatory) is at least one further psychological state that can lead to action, independently of antecedent desire. In both the case of desire and of belief in the good, being in such a state is being disposed to take whatever actions are believed likely to bring about what is desired or what is judged good. But according to these philosophers, desires and judgments of goodness are very different things. Hence action-based theories of desire fail to make an important distinction (e.g., McDowell 1978; Scanlon 1998).

An important variant of action-based theories of desire holds that desires are mental states that have the function of producing actions, rather than mental states that merely dispose agents to act. On these theories, a desire might or might not dispose an actor to satisfy the desire, but causing that result is the job or purpose of the desire (the biological function of the desire), or bringing about the satisfaction of the desire is how the action-production systems do their jobs or fulfill their purposes (Millikan 1984; Papineau 1987). While these variations do well with Stampe-type objections (because it is not the purpose of a belief that one is going to double fault to cause a double fault), they nonetheless would seem to be subject to objections by those who think that beliefs in the good can also perform their functions by moving one to act.

To overcome these latter objections, the action-based theorist may follow any of a number of lines of argument. The action-based theorist may argue that mere beliefs in goodness cannot move agents to act, given an independently motivated theory of belief in general (a position open to many philosophers of mind with complementary theories of belief and desire). Or he may argue that there is an incoherence in the principles by which one should revise a belief in goodness and by which one should revise one's dispositions to act (see the discussion of Lewis below in section 1.3), so that there is something incoherent in the idea of a belief in goodness that also moves one to act. Or, in a more concessive spirit, he may allow that the action-based theory of desire should be supplemented with other elements (dispositions to pleasure, for instance) not characteristic of beliefs in goodness.

One further difficulty for action-based theories of desire comes from apparent desires for things that action is ill-suited to bring about (evidence, that is, that the action-based theory of desire is excessively restrictive). For example, suppose it is possible for me to desire that pi be a rational number, or to desire that I had never been born, or to desire that a committee decide in my favor regardless of what I do (Schroeder 2004). These are desires that do not seem to exist in virtue of facts about dispositions to action, even facts about what actions I would perform if I were so foolish as to believe that I could fulfill my desires by actions. In response, the action-based theorist may hold that these attitudes are not true desires at all but only related conative attitudes: wishes, perhaps. A different line of response might be to hold that, even for such desires, dispositions to act still exist, even if they are unlikely to be acted upon in moderately reasonable people (Wall 2009).

1.2 Pleasure-Based Theories of Desire

As just suggested, philosophers who complain that an action-based theory of desire fails to distinguish judgments of goodness from desire sometimes suggest that pleasure is the key to this distinction. According to these philosophers, a person moved by a desire always enjoys what is desired, or eagerly anticipates the desire's satisfaction, whereas a person moved only by a judgment of goodness does not share these feelings (Schueler 1995; Vadas 1984; see also Davis 1986). Insofar as this seems right, there is reason to try out a theory of desire according to which dispositions to pleasure (and displeasure) are all there is to desire. Perhaps desires only contingently move us to action, but necessarily give rise to certain feelings. A simple version of this theory holds:

For an organism to desire p is for the organism to be disposed to take pleasure in it seeming that p and displeasure in it seeming that not-p.

In addition to considerations in moral psychology, there are also reasons to prefer a pleasure-based theory of desire that stem from the philosophy of mind. Galen Strawson defends a pleasure-based theory on two grounds: first, Strawson holds that being a desire for anything (or being a belief about anything or otherwise exhibiting intentionality) requires consciousness, and pleasure and displeasure are the states of consciousness most closely linked to desire. And second, Strawson holds that it is conceivable that there be creatures who would lack dispositions to act but who would have dispositions to feelings of pleasure and displeasure, and that these creatures would seem to have desires for the things that would please them. These creatures might include actual human beings suffering from neurological injuries removing their dispositions to act, and they might include purely imaginary beings never born with capacities to act, just capacities to feel (Strawson 1994).

Carolyn Morillo has also defended a pleasure-based theory of desire, though on quite different grounds. Beginning on conceptual grounds, Morillo argues that desires are ontologically independent of action, because they are non-trivial explainers of action. And then on empirical (specifically, neuroscientific) grounds, Morillo argues that episodes of pleasure are identical to certain neural events (the release of dopamine by what is known as the ‘reward system’), and these same neural events are the causal origin (in conjunction with belief) of action. Thus, episodes of pleasure play the role of desires, and so desires are episodes of pleasure (Morillo 1990).

A difficulty for pleasure-based theories of desire is that pleasure has seemed to some to have a causal or representational relationship to desire. According to these philosophers, net satisfaction of desire, or net increase in satisfaction of desire, is the standard cause of pleasure, and the pleasure caused perhaps represents this change in desire satisfaction. If such views are correct, then it seems desires must be ontologically distinct from pleasure in the way that causes are distinct from their effects, or objects of representation from their representations (Davis 1982; Schroeder 2004).

1.3 Good-Based Theories of Desire

While some philosophers hold that desires need to be strongly separated from judgments of goodness, other philosophers think that they need to be more closely linked. It was perhaps the view of Socrates that to want something is simply to think it good, and it is simple enough to formulate a theory of desire on this basis.

For an organism to desire p is for it to believe p is good.

Recommending such a theory is the intuition, shared by many, that we are motivated to do what we judge good just because we judge it good (and the intuition that, if I am motivated to do something, I desire to do it). If I judge it good to go to a meeting of the PTA, then that suffices to motivate me to go to the meeting, it would seem, and thus (perhaps) to desire it.

David Lewis has mounted a challenge to such theories of desire on the basis of results from decision theory (Lewis 1988; 1996). Lewis considers the thesis, Desire As Belief, that a rational individual is motivated to make true a proposition p to the extent that she believes p to be good, and shows that within a familiar decision-theoretic framework inconsistencies result. In Lewis's argument, the result follows because of the differences between rational belief revision and rational desire (or motivation) revision within the decision-theoretic framework. In response to Lewis, a number of philosophers have sought to defend the general idea that desires are beliefs in goodness (or are entailed by such beliefs in rational individuals) by defending different specific formulations of the thesis within decision theory (e.g., Price 1989; Byrne and Hájek 1997). There have also been efforts to show that formal decision theory might not be formalizing the right things to draw conclusions about desire and goodness (e.g., Broome 1991).

In a less formal mode, Dennis Stampe and Graham Oddie have independently advanced very similar good-based theories of desire according to which desires are a kind of high-level perceptual state: a perception of goodness.

For an organism to desire p is for p to appear good to the organism.

According to these theorists, perceptions of goodness are not like perceptions of cold or white light, but more like perceptions of something as looking like Mikhail Gorbachev—i.e., complex, high-level perceptual states that are nonetheless distinct from belief states. Stampe and Oddie are both careful to hold that the appearance of goodness is something quite distinct from the judgment or belief that something is good (and thus, though this is not their main concern, they evade Lewis's formal arguments). On Stampe's view, this distinctness is best demonstrated by the fact that it is consistent to claim to believe that something is good while it does not seem good (i.e., is not wanted), but it is not consistent to claim to desire something while it does not seem good (i.e., is not wanted). In a related vein, Oddie argues that, while it is not incoherent to believe that one course of action is the best while not desiring to take it, there is a tension in such a state of affairs, and this tension is best explained as resulting from the fact that desires represent their contents as good (Stampe 1987; Oddie 2005).

One other interesting variant of the position is defended by T.M. Scanlon (1998). According to Scanlon, motivating desires are judgments of, not what is good, but what we have reason to do. (Scanlon also holds that there are non–motivating desires that direct attention; these sorts of desires are discussed in the next section.)

Good-based theories of desire are motivated by considerations so different from action-based theories of desire (or pleasure-based theories) that it is very rare to see advocates of the one attack the other, with the exception of Lewis's very technical work and the literature following from it. As a result, difficulties for good-based theories of desire have not been richly explored in the philosophical literature. One puzzle for such theories might be to explain the relationship of desires to non-human animals. On the one hand, it would seem that rats desire to get away from cats, desire to be around other rats, and the like. On the other hand, it would seem that rats do not represent anything as good (they would both seem to lack the concept of goodness and to lack a perceptual-style representation of goodness that would be well poised to generate such a concept). But if rats can desire without representing the good, then why would people be different? The options available for solving such puzzles have not yet been fully explored.

1.4 Attention-Based Theories of Desire

Another evaluatively loaded theory of desire has been proposed by T.M. Scanlon. Dubbed a theory of desire in the ‘directed-attention’ sense, this theory links desires to reasons, rather than goodness. But the theory does so through its characterization of how desire plays its most important role, which is its role in directing the attention of the subject who desires.

For an organism to desire p is for the thought of p to keep occurring to the organism in a favorable light, so that its attention is directed insistently toward considerations that present themselves as counting in favor of p.

Since, on Scanlon's view, reasons are considerations that count in favor of propositions, it follows from this theory that a desire p exists if one's attention is directed insistently toward apparent reasons to have it be the case that p. This is where the evaluative element enters the theory (Scanlon 1998).

Technically, Scanlon does not present a complete attention-based theory of desire, but only an attention-based sufficient condition for the existence of a desire. Perhaps this is because Scanlon sees his theory as best suited to characterizing desires that are playing an active role at the moment—occurrent desires—but not as giving a good characterization of desires not having that role—standing desires (see below). A theory of standing desires that follows Scanlon's lead might look something like the following.

For an organism to desire p is for it to be disposed to keep having its attention drawn to reasons to have p, or to reasons to avoid not-p.

Like good-based theories of desire, Scanlon's attention-based theory of desire has not yet been engaged at length by proponents of more conservative theories of desire, and it remains to be seen what objections more conservative theorists might raise. One puzzle for the theory might come from its focus on one limited form of attention. According to the theory, desire's characteristic effect is to direct attention toward reasons to fulfill the desire. But desire has notable effects on other forms of attention, too: if Katie desires that Ohio State win a football game, then her desire will direct her attention to information about the game, will direct her attention to opportunities to gain information about the game, will direct her attention to people discussing the game, and so on. These ways in which attention can be directed seem, pre-theoretically, just as important to the nature of desire as the ways that are of interest to the attention-based theory of desire.

1.5 Learning-Based Theories of Desire

All of the theories considered so far have treated desire as a suitable topic for a priori investigation, with one exception. Morillo's methodology treats desires as a natural kind: the natural kind that is responsible for a familiar effect—action—one associates with desire. This general methodology is shared by another philosopher, Timothy Schroeder. But Schroeder sees the neuroscientific evidence as supporting a different conclusion from Morillo's. Schroeder agrees with Morillo that there is a single neurological structure that is the unique common cause of the various phenomena associated with desire (at least, with action, pleasure, and some aspects of thought and attention), and agrees that this structure is the dopamine-releasing reward system. However, he argues that the activity of this neurological structure does not realize pleasure. (Pleasure is said to be one of its effects.) Rather, the output of this neurological structure realizes a form of unconscious learning known as contingency-based learning or reward-based learning. Schroeder thus concludes that desires are this natural kind: reward-based learning mechanisms. Desires have all of their familiar effects on action, feelings, and thought only contingently (compare Morillo 1990 to Schroeder 2004; compare both to the related view in Butler 1992).

For an organism to desire p is for it to use representations of p to drive reward-based learning.

Schroeder's version of a reward-based theory of desire is a development of a theory advanced by Fred Dretske (Dretske 1988, chapter 5). Dretske advances the view that desires in fact determine what states of affairs will drive reward-based learning, but does not go so far as to offer a complete theory of desire on this basis.

The dispute between Schroeder and Morillo over how to interpret the neural structure that is the unique common cause of phenomena such as action and pleasure highlights one way in which scientific research can become important to philosophical theories of desire. The dopamine-releasing reward system is said by Schroeder to be a cause of pleasure, but by Morillo to be the neural realization of pleasure (when active). Evidence that the reward system realizes pleasure comes principally from the fact that its activity coincides with pleasure (reviewed in Berridge 2003), and from the fact that stimulating the reward system (via drugs or electrodes) is known to cause pleasure (classics of this literature are reviewed in Stellar and Stellar 1985). But this evidence is also compatible with the theory that the reward system is one normal cause of pleasure. Evidence for this latter view has come in the form of evidence that some pleasure-causing drugs work independently of the reward system (reviewed in Berridge 2003), in the form of evidence that rats deprived of their reward systems can still experience gustatory pleasure (Berridge and Robinson 1998), and in the form of reasonable candidates for neural realizers of pleasure that are located causally “downstream” from the reward system (reviewed in Berridge 2003 in support of one candidate structure; a different candidate is defended in Schroeder 2004).

Of all the theories of desire considered here, learning-based theories of desire have the least a priori credibility: no one comes to grasp the idea of a desire through being taught about reward-based learning. A learning-based theory of desire is committed to holding that a desire can exist in a creature that cannot, by its nature, move or feel; so long as it can represent and learn in a certain way (and so long as these capacities are appropriately related), that suffices for a creature to have a desire. A priori, this is likely to seem outlandish. Our ideas about desire tell us that desires are all about actions and feelings, after all. The fact that the learning-based theory of desire holds that an organism could desire sunny days without feeling good about sunny days, without feeling bad about cloudy days, without being motivated to do whatever might help bring about a sunny day or even being moved to jump for joy when it turns sunny—this can be hard to swallow. The plausibility of learning-based theories thus requires either a rejection of a priori constraints on theories of desire, or acceptance of the idea that it is a priori that desires are best theorized as a natural kind that might, in principle, lack the features we most commonly associate with it (for versions of these criticisms, see, e.g., Bratman 1990; Brook 2006; Latham 2006).

1.6. Holistic (Functionalist and Interpretationist) Theories of Desire

So far, only single-feature theories of desire have been considered. But there are also a number of theories of desire that refuse to privilege any one feature. Instead, these theories make central theoretical appeal to the total package of features associated with desire. To have a desire, according to such holistic theories, is a matter of having enough (often a somewhat vague constraint) of some set of desire-like features.

A list of desire-like features for a holistic theory is rarely provided in full, but certain desire-like features are commonly mentioned and can be expected to play a role in most holistic theories. These are the features just considered as candidates for the essential feature of desires.

  1. A creature typically desires p if and only if it is disposed to take whatever actions it believes are likely to bring about p.
  2. A creature typically desires p if and only if it is disposed to take pleasure in it seeming that p, and to take displeasure in it seeming that not-p.
  3. A creature typically desires p if and only if it is disposed to believe that p is good.
  4. A creature typically desires p if and only if it is disposed to attend to reasons to have p.

Additional features that might well play a role in a holistic theory include any platitudinous observation about desires. A few follow, though platitudes about desire are so numerous that the list could be quite a bit longer than it is.

  1. Creatures tend to desire what is good.
  2. Creatures tend to desire what they need to survive and reproduce.
  3. Creatures normally desire pleasure and do not desire (better: are averse to) pain.
  4. Creatures that desire p tend to have their attention captured by information that bears on whether or not p.

Holistic theories of desire come in two main forms: functionalist and interpretationist. In the functionalist form, a desire is an internal state-type that plays enough of the causal roles suggested by (1)–(8) etc. (e.g., Lewis 1972). In the interpretationist form, desires are not treated as internal state-types found in a causal network. Rather, desires are treated as states of the whole organism, states that exist in virtue of the organism's displaying enough of the sorts of behaviors suggested by (1)–(8) etc. to be legitimately interpreted (in accordance with general principles of interpretation, such as a requirement to interpret creatures as means-end consistent) as having desires (e.g., Davidson 1980).

Also worth noting here is work on caring by Agnieszka Jaworska. Jaworska does not take herself to be developing a theory of desire, and indeed appears to hold something like an action-based theory of desire. Rather, she takes herself to be developing a theory of what it is to care about someone or something. However, the theory which she develops looks much the way a holistic theory of desire would look. To care about someone, on Jaworska's view, is to be motivated to act for that person's welfare (for its own sake), be disposed to feel good at the prospect of the person doing well and bad at the prospect of the person doing poorly, to tend to attend to features of the person's welfare, to have emotions in keeping with this general package—fear when the person's welfare is in peril, relief when all works out for the best, and so on. Thus, while this is not Jaworska's intention, one can read her as offering a holistic theory of desire focused on a subclass of desires: those that can be said to constitute caring about something or someone (Jaworska 2007a; 2007b; 1999).

2. Varieties of Desires

With a theory of desire in hand one can go on to consider a number of varieties of desire. Even if desires form a large unified group of mental states, there is certainly room for there to be sub-types of desire, and a number have been discussed.

2.1 Desires for Objects and Desires for States of Affairs

According to most theories, desires are always desires for conceivable states of affairs. A desire for tea is a desire for a certain state of affairs one has in mind: that one drink some tea. A desire for a new pair of skates is likewise a desire for another state of affairs: that one own a new pair of skates. And so on. This idea is also expressed with phrases such as ‘desires are attitudes toward propositions’ or ‘desires have propositional content’. Treating desires in this way makes it easy to see how there could be logical relations between the contents of beliefs, desires, and intentions.

A competing way of thinking about desires holds that some or all desires are desires for objects, not states of affairs. A desire for tea is simply for tea, not for any state of affairs involving the tea. This competing way of thinking has the advantage that it takes seriously the way we ordinarily talk about desires and think about them. It is far more natural to say that I desire tea than to say that I desire that I have some tea, and perhaps this naturalness is indicative of something deep about the nature of desire. Furthermore, it might well seem that non-human animals have desires without being able to grasp the propositions a grip on which we so readily attribute to human beings (Thagard 2006).

A response, though, is that the natural phrasing conceals some of the complexity inherent in desire, and that the non-human animals who have desires have structure to their cognitive capacities that is expressed by talking about propositional content. If Nora desires tea, there is a fact of the matter about which of the following four states of affairs is one in which her desire is satisfied:

  1. Nora possesses but does not drink a cup of tea in the near future.
  2. Nora possesses but does not drink a cup of tea someday.
  3. Nora drinks a cup of tea in the near future.
  4. Nora drinks a cup of tea someday.

If it is (3) that would satisfy Nora's desire, then there seems much gained and little lost in saying that Nora's desire is for a state of affairs: that she drink a cup of tea in the near future. And likewise, if an owl desires a vole it seems that there is a fact of the matter about which of the counterpart states of affairs it is that would satisfy the owl's desire (and the counterpart to (3) seems most likely).

Even if it is accepted that desires are for conceivable states of affairs, there are other complications remaining. Some have pointed to the difficulties of specifying exactly what is desired: even if Nora wants to now drink a cup of tea, she might protest that she hasn't received what she wants if it turns out that the tea is very stale, or laced with arsenic, or brought by a robber, or … (e.g., Lycan 2012). Others have pointed to the difficulties generated by conditional desires, such as the desire to have beer later if one is not too tired (e.g., McDaniel and Bradley 2008).

2.2 Intrinsic, Instrumental, and Realizer Desires

Some desires are for states of affairs that are wanted for themselves: these are intrinsic desires. It is generally agreed that pleasure is desired for its own sake, and it is plausible that many people also desire the welfare of their children, the success of their favorite sports teams, and the end of injustice, and desire them all intrinsically. To desire something intrinsically is not to desire it exclusively for its own sake, but to desire it at least partially for its own sake: my father desires my welfare in part for my own sake, but no doubt he also desires it in part because he would have trouble sleeping were I doing poorly, and he does not want to lose sleep.

That is to say, my father desires my welfare both intrinsically and instrumentally: as a means to an end. Normally, however, one calls a desire ‘instrumental’ when one means it is merely instrumental: when one means that the end is desired merely as a means to some other end, and not at all for its own sake (instrumental desires are also sometimes called ‘extrinsic’).

An interesting case of instrumental desires might be many of the so-called ‘second-order desires’ that have been discussed in the wake of Harry Frankfurt's work. According to Frankfurt, it is the power to form desires about their own desires, i.e., second-order desires, that makes us persons, makes us beings capable of having cares, loves, and free will (e.g., Frankfurt 1971; 1999). Second-order desires are desires regarding one's first-order desires, and first-order desires are desires for ordinary (non-conative) things such as snacks or the trouncing of the New York Yankees. Thus, a desire to yell at a drunken reveler who disturbs my sleep is a first-order desire, while a desire that I not act on my desire to yell at the drunken reveler is a second-order desire. If one considers whether such a second-order desire is intrinsic or instrumental, the most reasonable conclusion is typically that the desire is instrumental: I desire not to act on my desire to yell because I desire to not have rocks thrown at my window, and I see not acting on my desire to yell as a means to not having rocks thrown at my window. (Note that David Lewis' discussion of the role of second-order desires in valuing requires that they be intrinsic desires. This raises an interesting question: how often would a second-order desire be truly intrinsic? See Lewis 1989.)

In the above scenario, I might also intrinsically desire to be civil and tolerant, and see not acting on my desire to yell as a way to be civil and tolerant. But in this case, the relation between my intrinsic desire and my desire not to act on my desire to yell is not quite an instrumental relation. Refraining from acting on my desire to yell is not a means for achieving the end of civil and tolerant behavior. Rather, it is an instance of civil and tolerant behavior. In such situations, it is said that my desire not to act on my desire to yell is a realizer desire: a desire for an end that would count as one possible realization of an intrinsic desire. This sort of desire gets some discussion in, e.g., Arpaly and Schroeder (2014) and Schmidtz (1994).

2.3 Stronger and Weaker Desires

It is generally held that desires come on a continuum of strength: desires can be stronger or weaker. The strength of a desire is typically said to be constituted by the desire's causal power regarding the control of action: for one desire to be stronger than another is for the agent to be disposed to act upon it, rather than the second desire, in a situation in which (a) all else is equal, and (b) the agent believes that each desire is satisfiable by a distinct action, and (c) the agent believes that the desires are not jointly satisfiable. This way of characterizing desire strength is obviously most suited to an action-based theory of desire. But for each theory of desire there is a corresponding theory of desire strength available. Desire strength could be determined by the amount of pleasure or displeasure apparent satisfaction of the desire would bring, or by the degree to which a state of affairs seems good, or by the degree to which one's attention is drawn to the reasons to bring some state of affairs about, or by the amount of reward-based learning apparent satisfaction of the desire would cause, or by some average of all of these.

Most theorists have little more to say about desire strength than what appears above. An exception is found in the work of decision theorists: within decision theory, preference is given a formal characterization, and through this formal characterization, various results can be proven. A foundational result about desire strength is that, if a minimally rational person has set of pairwise preferences (for A over B, for C over D, and so on), these pairwise preferences can be used to determine the strengths of preferences. That is, from a large set of basic facts about what is preferred to what, facts about how much each thing must be preferred to the other can be derived (e.g., von Neumann and Morgenstern 1944).

One puzzle for most theories of desire strength is that desires seem to vary in their power to manifest the typical signs of strength even when it would seem that there is no variation in how much their ends are wanted. Think of a standard intrinsic desire: a desire for the welfare of a child. My disposition to act so as to benefit Cecilia might well be stronger when I am in a good mood than when I am feeling low, it might well be stronger when I am wide awake than when I am very sleepy, might well be stronger when the change in welfare will happen right now rather than in a month, and so on. These changes in disposition seem unlikely to mark changes in how much I desire Cecelia's welfare, however. Rather, they would seem to mark changes in how effectively my desire is poised to influence my actions. Similarly, the idea of certain harms to Cecelia's welfare will make me feel terrible (the idea of her being bitten by a dog, say) while others will make me feel less terrible (the idea of her getting chicken pox, say), even while my estimation of the harm to her welfare might make the two scenarios quite similar. Again, this would seem to indicate some idiosyncrasy in how effectively my desire is poised to influence my feelings, rather than indicating a difference in strength of desire (in this case, getting chicken pox seems like an expected ordeal of childhood, and that seems to blunt my felt response). And likewise for appearances of goodness and dispositions to pay attention.

An advantage shared by learning-based theories and holistic theories of desire is that they are, in a natural way, able to hold that the strength of a desire can be a constant even while the effect of the desire on action, feelings, or thoughts seems disproportionate to the desire's strength. In the case of learning-based theories of desire, so long as there is a merely causal relation between the learning signal and the ordinary signs of desire strength, there is no contradiction in holding that a strong desire has effects like those of a weak desire, or vice versa. In the case of holistic theories, so long as desire strength is not reduced to strength of a single phenomenon, there is no contradiction in holding that a strong desire has one or a few effects like those of a weak desire, or vice versa. It is when theories reduce desires to a single observable core phenomenon that apparently meaningless fluctuations in that phenomenon pose a problem.

2.4 Occurrent and Standing Desires

If Nora desires tea, then her desire is likely to be manifest: Nora is likely to be aware of her desire, and her desire is likely to generate its characteristic effects so long as Nora continues to desire tea. On the other hand, if Ben desires a new pair of skates, then his desire is not likely to be manifest all the time. A new pair of skates is something Ben might well desire for two or three months before getting a new pair, and it is unlikely that his desire will be manifesting itself for that entire time. More likely, Ben's desire will lie quietly “in the back of his mind” most of the time, and occasionally generate thoughts, feelings, and actions of the familiar sorts.

Standing desires are desires one has that are not playing any role in one's psyche at the moment. Occurrent desires, on the other hand, are desires that are playing some role in one's psyche at the moment. Notice here that occurrent desires need not be in control of one's actions: my desire to laze in bed is occurrent even while I am getting up and making breakfast, for my desire is leading me to think longingly of bed, and is perhaps acting upon my mechanisms of action production in a way that would lead me back to bed if only I did not also desire to get some things done. Desires of which one is not aware, but which are current causes of one's behavior, are also occurrent on this way of thinking about things: a desire for a new inkstand might cause one to move clumsily so as to destroy one's current inkstand without affecting one's thoughts or feelings, and if so it would be occurrent at the moment of clumsiness.

Some philosophers hold that only occurrent desires are real desires. So-called standing desires are really just dispositions to generate desires, on this way of thinking. One difficulty for this position is that standing desires seem to be good components of causal explanations of various mental processes. For instance: why does the new tin of tea on the counter of her boyfriend's kitchen catch Nora's attention? It might be that it caught her attention because she has a standing desire to know about the tea that is available to her, and the tin in her boyfriend's kitchen is relevant to this desire. Why is Nora delighted to see the tin? Because she has a standing desire to try new kinds of tea, and she has just seen that the tin contains a new kind of tea. And so on. The ground of the disposition to generate occurrent desires can do for these sorts of explanations, but it is truer to ordinary thinking about the mind to say that this ground just is a desire—a standing desire—than to say that it is anything else.

Some philosophers hold that all occurrent desires are elements of one's conscious life. Just as I have a capacity to see red that is not exercised until seeing red is an element of my consciousness, so too I have a capacity to desire that my French be fluent, and this capacity is not exercised until desiring that my French be fluent is an element of my consciousness. Notice that the thesis is not just that desires are only sometimes objects of one's conscious life. That is, the thesis is not merely that I am only sometimes conscious of my desires in the same way that I am only sometimes conscious of my toes. Rather, the thesis in question is that there is a qualitative character to desire, a qualitative character that can be an element, feature, or aspect of one's consciousness. Any philosopher holding that desires are constituted by pleasures or seemings might well take this position (e.g., Oddie 2005; Stampe 1987; Strawson 1994). Against it the argument has been made that the direction of fit of desire is incompatible with the direction of fit of elements of consciousness, on the grounds that desires (roughly) say how things should be while consciousness (roughly) says how things are (Hulse, Read, and Schroeder 2004).

3. Controversies Surrounding Desire

Because desires feature prominently in theories of mind, action, free will, and morality (and more!), desires are enmeshed in far too many controversies to enumerate them all here. Nonetheless, some controversies surrounding desires are worthy of special attention, either because they are controversies surrounding key features of desire (the first three that follow) or because they are controversies that illustrate the larger role of desires in philosophical theorizing, especially ethical theorizing (the second three).

3.1 The Direction of Fit of Desires

Since Anscombe, desires are said to have a “direction of fit,” and one that is the opposite to the “direction of fit” of beliefs. One modest way of putting the point is this: beliefs are like declarative sentences, which are satisfied (made true) by whether the world as it is conforms to them, but desires are like imperative sentences, which are satisfied (fulfilled) by changes in the world bringing the world into conformity with them. What exactly this analogy amounts to, literally, is controversial. Is it perhaps that one's beliefs ought to conform to the world, whereas the world ought to conform to one's desires (Gregory 2012)? Is it perhaps that the world tends to cause satisfied beliefs (true beliefs), while desires tend to cause there to be a desire-satisfying (desire-fulfilling) world? This is still an area in which it is difficult to know just how to evaluate the proposals on offer, and there is little sign of a consensus emerging in the foreseeable future (see, e.g., Anscombe 2000; Schueler 1991; Smith 1994; Zangwill 1998).

Another and related puzzle is over whether there might be states of mind with both desire-like and belief-like directions of fit. These states of mind, sometimes called ‘besires’, are said to be of particular interest to ethicists interested in the possibility of belief-like attitudes motivating action all on their own (see, e.g., Smith 1994 chapter 4; Zangwill 2008).

3.2 The Origins of Desires

There is relatively little mystery about the generation of instrumental and realizer desires. These desires are generated by (conscious or unconscious) reasoning processes, in which one reasons one's way to the conclusion that if only it were the case that p that would make it more likely that q or would be a realization of q. If it so happens that one already intrinsically desires that q, then this reasoning process will automatically and unconsciously generate an instrumental or realizer desire that p, at least in rational beings. (The strength of the new desire, in a rational individual, and all else being equal, increases with the strength of the intrinsic desire that q and the apparent usefulness of bringing it about that p toward bringing it about that q.) Or at least, this picture is a relatively uncontroversial one among philosophers who treat instrumental and realizer desires as components in a causal network that might be investigated by science. Philosophers who approach the mind as a field for interpretation are more likely to hold a non-mechanistic version of this story according to which a person should be interpreted as instrumentally or realizationally desiring p when we already interpret her as intrinsically desiring q and we already interpret her as believing that p would make q more likely.

The generation of intrinsic desires is a matter of much more controversy and interest. The psychological hedonist holds that there is only one intrinsic desire—for pleasure—and this desire is innate (e.g., Pollock 2006). Philosophers who believe that we have a rich collection of intrinsic desires, including desires for the welfare of those we love and the success of those sports teams we support, are left with more difficult questions, however. Perhaps some of our desires are innate (for pleasure, for gentle touches and hugs, for adequate nutrition and hydration…) but many of our intrinsic desires clearly are not. If Ben intrinsically desires success for the Columbus Blue Jackets, this is certainly not a result of the innate structure of his mind.

Some have proposed that it is possible to acquire new intrinsic desires by reasoning. According to Michael Smith, if one believes that, were one rational, one would desire that p, then this will tend to generate an intrinsic desire that p. Thus, if I believe that, were I rational, I would want to give money to the Third World, then this will tend to generate an intrinsic desire in me to give money to the Third World (Smith 1994). There is a difficulty here in evaluating Smith's idea. It certainly seems as though thinking about what I would—were I only perfectly rational—want to do is the sort of thing that can generate a new desire in me. But it is less clear that the desire generated is intrinsic as opposed to a realizer desire (a realizer for the desire to do what is rational, or perhaps moral). Phenomenologically, it seems difficult to distinguish the two, and so it is not easy to evaluate Smith's theory. These difficulties have not prevented philosophers from trying, however (e.g., Dreier 2000).

An interesting consequence of Smith's proposal is that it makes it rational to have certain intrinsic desires, and irrational to lack other intrinsic desires, depending on what one believes to be true. This is a departure from a view of desires stemming at least from David Hume, according to which beliefs have no business dictating what we should desire intrinsically. (At most, beliefs can dictate what we should desire as a means or realizer to what we desire intrinsically, according to this line of thought.) But it aligns Smith with those who take it to be part of the business of reasoning to set “final ends” (e.g., Richardson 1997).

Another proposal regarding the generation of intrinsic desires leaves rationality out of the picture entirely. According to this proposal, new intrinsic desires are acquired by associating new states of affairs with ones that already satisfy existing intrinsic desires, according to the principles of reward-based learning. So, if a young child intrinsically desires a dry bottom and a full stomach, and is aware that its mother's presence tends to help with these things, then the young child will naturally desire its mother's presence instrumentally. But whether the child is aware of the instrumental relationship or not, if the mother's presence often presages the satisfaction of the child's intrinsic desires for a dry bottom and full stomach, then the learning processes generated by desire satisfaction will also tend to cause the young child to acquire an intrinsic desire for the presence of its mother (Schroeder 2004).

3.3 Preferences and Desires

Talk of preference, rather than desire, tends to dominate the literature of decision theory. The decision theorist sees human beings as making choices between options, and these choices express preferences among the options. If the human being is rational, her preferences are consistent and allow one to determine the expected utility of any given choice for her. The expected utility of an action, in turn, is the pleasure (or relief from suffering) it can be expected to bring, according to one (mostly older) approach, or is the degree to which the agent would (ideally) be inclined to choose it, according to the other (more modern) approach to utility (see, e.g., Skyrms 1990 for a discussion).

If utility is treated as pleasure, then decision theory is compatible with any theory of desire that holds pleasure to be the only thing desired. If utility is treated as choice-worthiness, then decision theory is compatible with any theory of desire at all (except perhaps for theories that hold desires are beliefs in goodness, as discussed in section 1.3). So the focus on preferences does not, on its own, generate conflict between decision theory and theories of desire.

Conflict can arise, however, when one asks whether desires or preferences are more fundamental; John Pollock has recently brought attention to this dispute (Pollock 2006). Decision theorists have tended to treat pairwise preferences as basic: the basic attitude is that of preferring A to B (e.g., von Neumann and Morgenstern 1944). Most other theorists of desire have treated desires as basic: the basic attitude is that of desiring A. If desires are basic, and desires have strengths, then it is easy enough to determine preferences from them: if I desire that my father be healthy to a high degree, and I desire that I do my laundry to a low degree, then it follows that I prefer my father's health to doing the laundry, all else being equal. But if preferences are basic, then deriving something like desires from them becomes an interesting task (discussed briefly above, in Section 2.3).

The simplest reason to suppose that preferences are basic is that they are readily introspected and acted upon, whereas desires with specific strengths are not. I can tell that I prefer securing my father's health to doing the laundry, and I know which I would choose if it came to a choice. But can I introspect the degree to which I prefer my father's health over clean laundry? Perhaps not. And if I cannot, perhaps this is because I have introspective access to the most basic psychological facts only, and these are facts about simple pairwise preferences. As von Neumann and Morgenstern write, “every measurement—or rather every claim of measurability—must ultimately be based on some immediate sensation, which possibly cannot and certainly need not be analyzed any further. In the case of utility the immediate sensation of preference—of one object or aggregate of objects as against another—provides this basis” (1944, 16).

One reason to suppose that preferences are not basic is that it appears, within standard decision theory, that a very large number of basic pairwise preferences are required in order to settle facts about how much one prefers A to B for arbitrary objects A and B. That is, the facts about degrees of desire can only be generated from more basic facts about pairwise preferences given a truly enormous number of basic facts about pairwise preferences. Pollock (2006) argues that the number of such facts is on the order of a billion billions at the very least, just to encode the same facts about desire and preference that could readily be generated from just three hundred basic facts about desires. From the assumption that the basic psychological facts must be physically realized in the brain, Pollock concludes that it is psychologically realistic to believe in basic desires, not basic pairwise preferences.

Complicating matters is empirical research suggesting that our preferences are subject to such powerful contextual influences that it is better to talk about the construction of coherent preferences than about their derivation from underlying desires (see, e.g., the papers in Lichtenstein and Slovic 2006). For example, in a classic study, it was found that offering subjects a free choice between one of two bets (of almost identical expected value—around $4—but with different maximum payoffs and different maximum penalties) led to subjects revealing a preference for one of the two bets. Offering the same subjects a chance to bid on each bet revealed that subjects were often willing to pay more to play the other of the two bets, apparently showing that subjects preferred the other of the two bets when bidding but not when choosing freely (Lichtenstein and Slovic 1971). Thus, something as minimal as the difference between choosing and bidding can shift preferences between two near-equivalent bets, or so it would seem, calling into question the very existence of a stable fact about preference independent of the way a choice is framed. If this is the best way to look at things, then perhaps it will turn out that a small number of preferences are basic, and that there just are no facts about the degree to which something is desired overall by a person.

3.4 Reasons and Desires

Turning to meta-ethics, a vibrant debate exists over the relation of desires to reasons to act. According to one tradition, typically called ‘Humean’ or ‘Neo-Humean’, the existence of reasons to act depends on the existence of desires possessed by the agent who would act. Thus, my reason to drink hot chocolate depends on my desires, and likewise my reason to help a stranger depends on my desires, according to the Humean.

Some have taken Humeanism to claim that reasons are identical to the having of desires (so that my reason to drink hot chocolate is the fact that I desire to drink hot chocolate) while others have taken Humeanism to claim that reasons are (typically) non-desire states of affairs that are reasons in virtue of their relations to desires (so that my reason to drink hot chocolate is that it tastes a certain way, but that it tastes a certain way is only a reason to drink hot chocolate because I desire to experience such tastes). Though related, these two positions have substantially different implications, as Mark Schroeder has argued (Schroeder 2007).

Humeans have defended their position in several ways, but contemporary debate has focused in large part on an argument developed by Bernard Williams. Williams argues that only Humeanism can explain the relation between reasons and motivation: if one has a reason to act, then one can act for that reason, Williams holds. But this is only guaranteed if having a reason to act involves having a desire. Hence reasons to act depend on the existence of desires (Williams 1981). Taking a somewhat different approach, Mark Schroeder argues that, when properly formulated, Humeanism simply fits best with our range of intuitions about what reasons there are to act and the ways in which these reasons are or are not contingent on facts about our psychologies (Schroeder 2007).

Attacks on the Humean position have often been motivated by moral considerations: one does not need to have any desires whatsoever (not desires properly so-called, at any rate) in order to have a reason to do what is moral, according to some anti-Humeans, and so this particular reason to act, at least, is not in any way dependent upon desires (e.g., Schueler 1995). A more fundamental attack has been launched by Christine Korsgaard, who argues that, if it is true that there is a reason to act on one's desires, then this is a fundamental evaluative fact—and so there is no reason to be skeptical about parallel fundamental evaluative facts that entail there are reasons independent of one's desires (Korsgaard 1997).

3.5 Well-being and Desires

Within normative ethics there is some interest in the notion of a person's happiness, welfare, or well-being, especially within consequentialist approaches to morality holding that a moral action is one that maximizes well-being. One approach to well-being holds that a person's well-being stems from the satisfaction of her desires.

A central feature of desire-based theories of well-being is that they take actual states of affairs to be what is important to a person's well-being, rather than the person's perceptions of actuality. Thus, if I desire that I win an Olympic gold medal, then I am only well off in this respect if I win the medal: if I get tricked into believing that I have won the medal when I have not, then my well-being has not been increased in the relevant respect. This might be an advantage for desire-based theories of well-being (mere trickery seems unlikely to increase my actual well-being) or it might be a disadvantage (what I do not know cannot hurt me, can it?). Discussion of this point is ongoing (e.g., Sumner 1996).

A challenge for desire-based theories of well-being is that we would seem to have some desires the satisfaction of which would not, ultimately, contribute to our well-being in any obvious sense. Desires stemming from ignorance, from neurosis, or the like might be of this sort. Brandt (1979) develops a well known response to these sorts of concerns, arguing that the desires the satisfaction of which would contribute to one's well-being are those that would survive a process of “cognitive psychotherapy.”

Desire-based theories of well-being have been challenged both by those who find them insufficiently attentive to the individual's state of mind, especially to the pleasure enjoyed by the individual (e.g., Feldman 2004), and by those who find them excessively attentive to the individual's state of mind, to the exclusion of what is essential to human flourishing (e.g., Nussbaum 2000, chapter 1).

3.6 Praiseworthiness and Desires

Within moral psychology, desire features prominently in a debate over the conditions for moral praiseworthiness and blameworthiness.

According to a familiar Kantian doctrine, a person is only praiseworthy for doing the right thing if the person acts only from the motive of duty, and not from an “inclination” (a desire) to do the right thing (Kant 1964). Thus, if the right thing to do is to support microlending in Africa, and I do so, then I am praiseworthy only if I have acted out of my intellectual grasp of the fact that supporting microlending is my duty. If have acted out of a desire to feel good about myself, or even a desire to be kind or to work for justice, then I am not praiseworthy for doing the right thing. The thesis has also been defended by contemporary Kantians (e.g., Herman 1993, chapter 1).

Opposing the familiar Kantian doctrine is work by Nomy Arpaly, who argues that praiseworthiness in fact requires acting on certain desires—namely, desires for what is in fact good (Arpaly 2002; see also Arpaly and Schroeder 2014). In Arpaly's view, acting rightly from a sense of duty is compatible with acting rightly in a way that is not praiseworthy at all, if one's view of duty is sufficiently mistaken that one ends up doing the right thing only by accident. Thus, if the right thing to do is to support microlending in Africa, and I do so, then I am praiseworthy according to Arpaly only if I have acted out of a desire to be kind (if that is the content of morality) or a desire to do what is just (if that is the content of morality).

Between the contrasting views of Kant and Arpaly are the views of a number of virtue ethicists, Aristotle (perhaps) among them, who hold that a desire to do what is right and knowledge of the right are both required for an otherwise appropriate act to be praiseworthy (e.g., Aristotle 1999, Hursthouse 1999).


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