Well-being is most commonly used in philosophy to describe what is non-instrumentally or ultimately good for a person. The question of what well-being consists in is of independent interest, but it is of great importance in moral philosophy, especially in the case of utilitarianism, according to which the only moral requirement is that well-being be maximized. Significant challenges to the very notion have been mounted, in particular by G.E. Moore and T.M. Scanlon. It has become standard to distinguish theories of well-being as either hedonist theories, desire theories, or objective list theories. According to the view known as welfarism, well-being is the only value. Also important in ethics is the question of how a person’s moral character and actions relate to their well-being.
- 1. The Concept
- 2. Moore’s Challenge
- 3. Scanlon’s Challenge
- 4. Theories of Well-being
- 5. Well-being and Morality
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Popular use of the term ‘well-being’ usually relates to health. A doctor’s surgery may run a ‘Women’s Well-being Clinic’, for example. Philosophical use is broader, but related, and amounts to the notion of how well a person’s life is going for that person. A person’s well-being is what is ‘good for’ them. Health, then, might be said to be a constituent of my well-being, but it is not plausibly taken to be all that matters for my well-being. One correlate term worth noting here is ‘self-interest’: my self-interest is what is in the interest of myself, and not others.
The philosophical use of the term also tends to encompass the ‘negative’ aspects of how a person’s life goes for them. So we may speak of the well-being of someone who is, and will remain in, the most terrible agony: their well-being is negative, and such that their life is worse for them than no life at all. The same is true of closely allied terms, such as ‘welfare’, which covers how a person is faring as a whole, whether well or badly, or ‘happiness’, which can be understood—as it sometimes was by the classical utilitarians from Jeremy Bentham onwards, for example—to be the balance between good and bad things in a person’s life. But note that philosophers also use such terms in the more standard ‘positive’ way, speaking of ‘ill-being’, ‘ill-faring’, or, of course, ‘unhappiness’ to capture the negative aspects of individuals’ lives. Most philosophical discussion has been of ‘goods’ rather than ‘bads’, but recently more interest has been shown in the latter (e.g. Kagan 2015; Bradford 2021).
‘Happiness’ is often used, in ordinary life, to refer to a short-lived state of a person, frequently a feeling of contentment: ‘You look happy today’; ‘I’m very happy for you’. Philosophically, its scope is more often wider, encompassing a whole life. And in philosophy it is possible to speak of the happiness of a person’s life, or of their happy life, even if that person was in fact usually pretty miserable. The point is that some good things in their life made it a happy one, even though they lacked contentment. But this usage is uncommon, and may cause confusion.
Over the last few decades, so-called ‘positive psychology’ has hugely increased the attention paid by psychologists and other scientists to the notion of ‘happiness’. Such happiness is usually understood in terms of contentment or ‘life-satisfaction’, and is measured by means such as self-reports or daily questionnaires. Is positive psychology about well-being? As yet, conceptual distinctions are not sufficiently clear within the discipline. But it is probably fair to say that many of those involved, as researchers or as subjects, are assuming that one’s life goes well to the extent that one is contented with it—that is, that some kind of hedonistic account of well-being is correct. Some positive psychologists, however, explicitly reject hedonistic theories in preference to Aristotelian or ‘eudaimonist’ accounts of well-being, which are a version of the ‘objective list’ theory of well-being discussed below. A leader in the field, Martin Seligman, for example, has suggested that, rather than happiness, positive psychology should concern itself with positive emotion, engagement, relationships, meaning and accomplishment (‘Perma’) (Seligman 2011).
When discussing the notion of what makes life good for the individual living that life, it is preferable to use the term ‘well-being’ instead of ‘happiness’. For we want at least to allow conceptual space for the possibility that, for example, the life of a plant may be ‘good for’ that plant. And speaking of the happiness of a plant would be stretching language too far. (An alternative here might be ‘flourishing’, though this might be taken to bias the analysis of human well-being in the direction of some kind of natural teleology.) In that respect, the Greek word commonly translated ‘happiness’ (eudaimonia) might be thought to be superior. But, in fact, eudaimonia seems to have been restricted not only to conscious beings, but to human beings: non-human animals cannot be eudaimon. This is because eudaimonia suggests that the gods, or fortune, have favoured one, and the idea that the gods could care about non-humans would not have occurred to most Greeks.
It is occasionally claimed that certain ancient ethical theories, such as Aristotle’s, result in the collapse of the very notion of well-being. On Aristotle’s view, if you are my friend, then my well-being is closely bound up with yours. It might be tempting, then, to say that ‘your’ well-being is ‘part’ of mine, in which case the distinction between what is good for me and what is good for others has broken down. But this temptation should be resisted. Your well-being concerns how well your life goes for you, and we can allow that my well-being depends on yours without introducing the confusing notion that my well-being is constituted by yours. There are signs in Aristotelian thought of an expansion of the subject or owner of well-being. A friend is ‘another self’, so that what benefits my friend benefits me. But this should be taken either as a metaphorical expression of the dependence claim, or as an identity claim which does not threaten the notion of well-being: if you really are the same person as I am, then of course what is good for you will be what is good for me, since there is no longer any metaphysically significant distinction between you and me.
Well-being is a kind of value, sometimes called ‘prudential value’, to be distinguished from, for example, aesthetic value or moral value. What marks it out is the notion of ‘good for’. The serenity of a Vermeer painting, for instance, is a kind of goodness, but it is not ‘good for’ the painting. It may be good for us to contemplate such serenity, but contemplating serenity is not the same as the serenity itself. Likewise, my giving money to a development charity may have moral value, that is, be morally good. And the effects of my donation may be good for others. But it remains an open question whether my being morally good is good for me; and, if it is, its being good for me is still conceptually distinct from its being morally good. A great deal of attention has been paid in philosophy to the issue of moral ‘normativity’, less so to that of prudential normativity (recent exceptions are Dorsey 2021; Fletcher 2021).
The most common view of well-being is ‘invariabilism’, according to which there is a single account of well-being for all individuals for whom life can go well or badly (Lin 2018). Some have argued, however, that we should develop a variabilist view, according to which, for example, there might be one theory of well-being for adults and another for children (see Skelton 2015). According to Benatar (2006), existence for any individual with well-being is always of overall negative value. On well-being and death, see Bradley (2006).
There is something mysterious about the notion of ‘good for’. Consider a possible world that contains only a single item: a stunning Vermeer painting. Leave aside any doubts you might have about whether paintings can be good in a world without viewers, and accept for the sake of argument that this painting has aesthetic value in that world. It seems intuitively plausible to claim that the value of this world is constituted solely by the aesthetic value of the painting. But now consider a world which contains one individual living a life that is good for them. How are we to describe the relationship between the value of this world, and the value of the life lived in it for the individual? Are we to say that the world has a value at all? How can it, if the only value it contains is ‘good for’ as opposed to just ‘good’? And yet we surely do want to say that this world is better (‘more good’) than some other empty world. Well, should we say that the world is good, and is so because of the good it contains ‘for’ the individual? This fails to capture the idea that there is in fact nothing of value in this world except what is good for the individual.
Thoughts such as these led G.E. Moore to object to the very idea of ‘good for’ (Moore 1903, pp. 98–9). Moore argued that the idea of ‘my own good’, which he saw as equivalent to what is ‘good for me’, makes no sense. When I speak of, say, pleasure as what is good for me, he claimed, I can mean only either that the pleasure I get is good, or that my getting it is good. Nothing is added by saying that the pleasure constitutes my good, or is good for me.
But the distinctions I drew between different categories of value above show that Moore’s analysis of the claim that my own good consists in pleasure is too narrow. Indeed Moore’s argument rests on the very assumption that it seeks to prove: that only the notion of ‘good’ is necessary to make all the evaluative judgements we might wish to make. The claim that it is good that I get pleasure is, logically speaking, equivalent to the claim that the world containing the single Vermeer is good. It is, so to speak, ‘impersonal’, and leaves out of account the special feature of the value of well-being: that it is good for individuals.
One way to respond both to Moore’s challenge, and to the puzzles above, is to try, when appropriate, to do without the notion of ‘good’ (see Kraut 2011) and make do with ‘good for’, alongside the separate and non-evaluative notion of reasons for action. Thus, the world containing the single individual with a life worth living, might be said to contain nothing good per se, but a life that is good for that individual. And this fact may give us a reason to bring about such a world, given the opportunity.
Moore’s book was published in Cambridge, England, at the beginning of the twentieth century. At the end of the same century, a book was published in Cambridge, Mass., which also posed some serious challenges to the notion of well-being: What Do We Owe to Each Other?, by T.M. Scanlon.
Moore’s ultimate aim in criticizing the idea of ‘goodness for’ was to attack egoism. Likewise, Scanlon has an ulterior motive in objecting to the notion of well-being—to attack so-called ‘teleological’ or end-based theories of ethics, in particular, utilitarianism, which in its standard form requires us to maximize well-being. But in both cases the critiques stand independently.
One immediately odd aspect of Scanlon’s position that ‘well-being’ is an otiose notion in ethics is that he himself seems to have a view on what well-being is. It involves, he believes, among other things, success in one’s rational aims, and personal relations. But Scanlon claims that his view is not a ‘theory of well-being’, since a theory must explain what unifies these different elements, and how they are to be compared. And, he adds, no such theory is ever likely to be available, since such matters depend so much on context.
Scanlon does, however, implicitly make a claim about what unites these values: they are all constituents of well-being, as opposed to other kinds of value, such as aesthetic or moral. Nor is it clear why Scanlon’s view of well-being could not be developed so as to assist in making real-life choices between different values in one’s own life.
Scanlon suggests that we often make claims about what is good in our lives without referring to the notion of well-being, and indeed that it would often be odd to do so. For example, I might say, ‘I listen to Alison Krauss’s music because I enjoy it’, and that will be sufficient. I do not need to go on to say, ‘And enjoyment adds to my well-being’.
But this latter claim sounds peculiar only because we already know that enjoyment makes a person’s life better for them. And in some circumstances such a claim would anyway not be odd: consider an argument with someone who claims that aesthetic experience is worthless, or with an ascetic. Further, people do use the notion of well-being in practical thinking. For example, if I am given the opportunity to achieve something significant, which will involve considerable discomfort over several years, I may consider whether, from the point of view of my own well-being, the project is worth pursuing.
Scanlon argues also that the notion of well-being, if it is to be philosophically acceptable, ought to provide a ‘sphere of compensation’—a context in which it makes sense to say, for example, that I am losing one good in my life for the sake of gain over my life as a whole. And, he claims, there is no such sphere. For Scanlon, giving up present comfort for the sake of future health ‘feels like a sacrifice’.
But this does not chime with my own experience. When I donate blood, this feels to me like a sacrifice, albeit a minor one. But when I visit the dentist, it feels to me just as if I am weighing present pains against potential future pains. And we can weigh different components of well-being against one another. Consider a case in which you are offered a job which is highly paid but many miles away from your friends and family.
Scanlon denies that we need an account of well-being to understand benevolence, since we do not have a general duty of benevolence, but merely duties to benefit others in specific ways, such as to relieve their pain. But, from the philosophical perspective, it may be quite useful to use the heading of ‘benevolence’ in order to group such duties. And, again, comparisons may be important: if I have several pro tanto duties of benevolence, not all of which can be fulfilled, I shall have to weigh the various benefits I can provide against one another. And here the notion of well-being will again come into play.
Further, if morality includes so-called ‘imperfect’ duties to benefit others, that is, duties that allow the agent some discretion as to when and how to assist, the lack of any overarching conception of well-being is likely to make the fulfillment of such duties problematic.
On one view, human beings always act in pursuit of what they think will give them the greatest balance of pleasure over pain. This is ‘psychological hedonism’, and will not be my concern here. Rather, I intend to discuss ‘evaluative hedonism’ or ‘prudential hedonism’, according to which well-being consists in the greatest balance of pleasure over pain.
This view was first, and perhaps most famously, expressed by Socrates and Protagoras in the Platonic dialogue, Protagoras (Plato 1976 [C4 BCE], 351b–c). Jeremy Bentham, one of the most well-known of the more recent hedonists, begins his Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation thus: ‘Nature has placed mankind under the governance of two sovereign masters, pain and pleasure. It is for them alone to point out what we ought to do’.
In answer to the question, ‘What does well-being consist in?’, then, the hedonist will answer, ‘The greatest balance of pleasure over pain’. We might call this substantive hedonism. A complete hedonist position will involve also explanatory hedonism, which consists in an answer to the following question: ‘What makes pleasure good, and pain bad?’, that answer being, ‘The pleasantness of pleasure, and the painfulness of pain’. Consider a substantive hedonist who believed that what makes pleasure good for us is that it fulfills our nature. This theorist is not an explanatory hedonist.
Hedonism—as is demonstrated by its ancient roots—has long seemed an obviously plausible view. Well-being, what is good for me, might be thought to be naturally linked to what seems good to me, and pleasure does, to most people, seem good. And how could anything else benefit me except in so far as I enjoy it?
The simplest form of hedonism is Bentham’s, according to which the more pleasantness one can pack into one’s life, the better it will be, and the more painfulness one encounters, the worse it will be. How do we measure the value of the two experiences? The two central aspects of the respective experiences, according to Bentham, are their duration, and their intensity.
Bentham tended to think of pleasure and pain as a kind of sensation, as the notion of intensity might suggest. One problem with this kind of hedonism, it has often been claimed, is that there does not appear to be a single common strand of pleasantness running through all the different experiences people enjoy, such as eating hamburgers, reading Shakespeare, or playing water polo. Rather, it seems, there are certain experiences we want to continue, and we might be prepared to call these—for philosophical purposes—pleasures (even though some of them, such as diving in a very deep and narrow cave, for example, would not normally be described as pleasurable).
Hedonism could survive this objection merely by incorporating whatever view of pleasure was thought to be plausible. A more serious objection is to the evaluative stance of hedonism itself. Thomas Carlyle, for example, described the hedonistic component of utilitarianism as the ‘philosophy of swine’, the point being that simple hedonism places all pleasures on a par, whether they be the lowest animal pleasures of sex or the highest of aesthetic appreciation. One might make this point with a thought experiment. Imagine that you are given the choice of living a very fulfilling human life, or that of a barely sentient oyster, which experiences some very low-level pleasure. Imagine also that the life of the oyster can be as long as you like, whereas the human life will be of eighty years only. If Bentham were right, there would have to be a length of oyster life such that you would choose it in preference to the human. And yet many say that they would choose the human life in preference to an oyster life of any length.
Now this is not a knockdown argument against simple hedonism. Indeed some people are ready to accept that at some length or other the oyster life becomes preferable. But there is an alternative to simple hedonism, outlined famously by J.S. Mill, using his distinction (itself influenced by Plato’s discussion of pleasure at the end of his Republic (Plato 1992 [C4 BCE], 582d-583a)) between ‘higher’ and ‘lower’ pleasures (1863 , ch. 2). Mill added a third property to the two determinants of value identified by Bentham, duration and intensity. To distinguish it from these two ‘quantitative’ properties, Mill called his third property ‘quality’. The claim is that some pleasures, by their very nature, are more valuable than others. For example, the pleasure of reading Shakespeare, by its very nature, is more valuable than any amount of basic animal pleasure. And we can see this, Mill suggests, if we note that those who have experienced both types, and are ‘competent judges’, will make their choices on this basis.
A long-standing objection to Mill’s move here has been to claim that his position can no longer be described as hedonism proper (or what I have called ‘explanatory hedonism’). If higher pleasures are higher because of their nature, that aspect of their nature cannot be pleasantness, since that could be determined by duration and intensity alone. And Mill anyway speaks of properties such as ‘nobility’ as adding to the value of a pleasure. Now it has to be admitted that Mill is sailing close to the wind here. But there is logical space for a hedonist position which allows properties such as nobility to determine pleasantness, and insists that only pleasantness determines value. But one might well wonder how nobility could affect pleasantness, and why Mill did not just come out with the idea that nobility is itself a good-making property.
Above I noted the plausibility of the claim that nothing can benefit me if I don’t enjoy it. Some non-hedonists have denied this, while accepting the so-called ‘experience requirement’ on well-being. They suggest that what matters is valuable consciousness, and consciousness can be valuable for non-hedonic reasons (see Kriegel 2019). But there is a yet more weighty objection both to hedonism and to the view that well-being consists only in conscious states: the so-called ‘experience machine’. Imagine that I have a machine that I could plug you into for the rest of your life. This machine would give you experiences of whatever kind you thought most valuable or enjoyable—writing a great novel, bringing about world peace, attending an early Rolling Stones’ gig. You would not know you were on the machine, and there is no worry about its breaking down or whatever. Would you plug in? Would it be wise, from the point of your own well-being, to do so? Robert Nozick thinks it would be a big mistake to plug in: ‘We want to do certain things … we want to be a certain way … plugging into an experience machine limits us to a man-made reality’ (Nozick 1974, p. 43).
One can make the machine sound more palatable, by allowing that genuine choices can be made on it, that those plugged in have access to a common ‘virtual world’ shared by other machine-users, a world in which ‘ordinary’ communication is possible, and so on. But this will not be enough for many anti-hedonists. A further line of response begins from so-called ‘externalism’ in the philosophy of mind, according to which the content of mental states is determined by facts external to the experiencer of those states. Thus, the experience of really writing a great novel is quite different from that of apparently writing a great novel, even though ‘from the inside’ they may be indistinguishable. But this is once again sailing close to the wind. If the world can affect the very content of my experience without my being in a position to be aware of it, why should it not directly affect the value of my experience?
The strongest tack for hedonists to take is to accept the apparent force of the experience machine objection, but to insist that it rests on ‘common sense’ intuitions, the place in our lives of which may itself be justified by hedonism. This is to adopt a strategy similar to that developed by ‘two-level utilitarians’ in response to alleged counter-examples based on common-sense morality. The hedonist will point out the so-called ‘paradox of hedonism’, that pleasure is most effectively pursued indirectly. If I consciously try to maximize my own pleasure, I will be unable to immerse myself in those activities, such as reading or playing games, which do give pleasure. And if we believe that those activities are valuable independently of the pleasure we gain from engaging in them, then we shall probably gain more pleasure overall.
These kinds of stand-off in moral philosophy are unfortunate, but should not be brushed aside (for a balanced discussion of the experience machine, see Lin 2016). They raise questions concerning the epistemology of ethics, and the source and epistemic status of our deepest ethical beliefs, which we are further from answering than many would like to think. Certainly the current trend of quickly dismissing hedonism on the basis of a quick run-through of the experience machine objection is not methodologically sound.
The experience machine is one motivation for the adoption of a desire theory (for a good introduction to the view, see Heathwood 2016; 2019). When you are on the machine, many of your central desires are likely to remain unfilled. Take your desire to write a great novel. You may believe that this is what you are doing, but in fact it is just a hallucination. And what you want, the argument goes, is to write a great novel, not the experience of writing a great novel.
Historically, however, the reason for the current dominance of desire theories lies in the emergence of welfare economics. Pleasure and pain are inside people’s heads, and also hard to measure—especially when we have to start weighing different people’s experiences against one another. So economists began to see people’s well-being as consisting in the satisfaction of preferences or desires, the content of which could be revealed by the choices of their possessors. This made possible the ranking of preferences, the development of ‘utility functions’ for individuals, and methods for assessing the value of preference-satisfaction (using, for example, money as a standard).
The simplest version of a desire theory one might call the present desire theory, according to which someone is made better off to the extent that their current desires are fulfilled. This theory does succeed in avoiding the experience machine objection. But it has serious problems of its own. Consider the case of the angry adolescent. This boy’s mother tells him he cannot attend a certain nightclub, so the boy holds a gun to his own head, wanting to pull the trigger and retaliate against his mother. Recall that the scope of theories of well-being should be the whole of a life. It is implausible that the boy will make his life go as well as possible by pulling the trigger. We might perhaps interpret the simple desire theory as a theory of well-being-at-at-a-particular-time. But even then it seems unsatisfactory. From whatever perspective, the boy would be better off if he put the gun down.
We should move, then, to a comprehensive desire theory, according to which what matters to a person’s well-being is the overall level of desire-satisfaction in their life as a whole. A summative version of this theory suggests, straightforwardly enough, that the more desire-fulfilment in a life the better. But it runs into Derek Parfit’s case of addiction (1984, p. 497). Imagine that you can start taking a highly addictive drug, which will cause a very strong desire in you for the drug every morning. Taking the drug will give you no pleasure; but not taking it will cause you quite severe suffering. There will be no problem with the availability of the drug, and it will cost you nothing. But what reason do you have to take it?
A global version of the comprehensive theory ranks desires, so that desires about the shape and content of one’s life as a whole are given some priority. So, if I prefer not to become a drug addict, that will explain why it is better for me not to take Parfit’s drug. But now consider the case of the orphan monk. This young man began training to be a monk at the earliest age, and has lived a very sheltered life. He is now offered three choices: he can remain as a monk, or become either a cook or a gardener outside the monastery, at a grange. He has no conception of the latter alternatives, so chooses to remain a monk. But surely it might be possible that his life would be better for him were he to live outside?
So we now have to move to an informed desire version of the comprehensive theory (Sobel 1994). According to the informed desire account, the best life is the one I would desire if I were fully informed about all the (non-evaluative) facts. But now consider a case suggested by John Rawls: the grass-counter. Imagine a brilliant Harvard mathematician, fully informed about the options available to her, who develops an overriding desire to count the blades of grass on the lawns of Harvard. Like the experience machine, this case is another example of philosophical ‘bedrock’. Some will believe that, if she really is informed, and not suffering from some neurosis, then the life of grass-counting will be the best for her.
Note that on the informed desire view the subject must actually have the desires in question for well-being to accrue to her. If it were true of me that, were I fully informed I would desire some object which at present I have no desire for, giving me that object now would not benefit me. Any theory which claimed that it would amounts to an objective list theory with a desire-based epistemology.
All these problem cases for desire theories appear to be symptoms of a more general difficulty. Recall again the distinction between substantive and formal theories of well-being. The former state the constituents of well-being (such as pleasure), while the latter state what makes these things good for people (pleasantness, for example). Substantively, a desire theorist and a hedonist may agree on what makes life good for people: pleasurable experiences. But formally they will differ: the hedonist will refer to pleasantness as the good-maker, while the desire theorist must refer to desire-satisfaction. (It is worth pointing out here that if one characterizes pleasure as an experience the subject wants to continue, the distinction between hedonism and desire theories becomes quite hard to pin down.)
The idea that desire-satisfaction is a ‘good-making property’ is somewhat odd. As Aristotle says (Metaphysics, 1072a, tr. Ross): ‘desire is consequent on opinion rather than opinion on desire’. In other words, we desire things, such as writing a great novel, because we think those things are independently good; we do not think they are good because they will satisfy our desire for them.
The threefold distinction I am using between different theories of well-being has become standard in contemporary ethics (Parfit 1984: app. I). There are problems with it, however, as with many classifications, since it can blind one to other ways of characterizing views (see Kagan 1992; Hurka 2019). Objective list theories are usually understood as theories which list items constituting well-being that consist neither merely in pleasurable experience nor in desire-satisfaction. Such items might include, for example, knowledge or friendship. But it is worth remembering, for example, that hedonism might be seen as one kind of ‘list’ theory, and all list theories might then be opposed to desire theories as a whole.
What should go on the list (Moore 2000)? It is important that every good should be included. As Aristotle put it: ‘We take what is self-sufficient to be that which on its own makes life worthy of choice and lacking in nothing. We think happiness to be such, and indeed the thing most of all worth choosing, not counted as just one thing among others’ (Nicomachean Ethics, 1197b, tr. Crisp). In other words, if you claim that well-being consists only in friendship and pleasure, I can show your list to be unsatisfactory if I can demonstrate that knowledge is also something that makes people better off.
What is the ‘good-maker’, according to objective list theorists? This depends on the theory. One, influenced by Aristotle and recently developed by Thomas Hurka (1993; see Bradford 2017), is perfectionism, according to which what makes things constituents of well-being is their perfecting human nature. (On the history of modern perfectionism, see Brink 2019.) If it is part of human nature to acquire knowledge, for example, then a perfectionist should claim that knowledge is a constituent of well-being. But there is nothing to prevent an objective list theorist’s claiming that all that the items on her list have in common is that each, in its own way, advances well-being.
How do we decide what goes on the list? All we can work on is the deliverance of reflective judgement—intuition, if you like. But one should not conclude from this that objective list theorists are, because they are intuitionist, less satisfactory than the other two theories. For those theories too can be based only on reflective judgement. Nor should one think that intuitionism rules out argument. Argument is one way to bring people to see the truth. Further, we should remember that intuitions can be mistaken. Indeed, as suggested above, this is the strongest line of defence available to hedonists: to attempt to undermine the evidential weight of many of our natural beliefs about what is good for people.
One common objection to objective list theories is that they are élitist, since they appear to be claiming that certain things are good for people, even if those people will not enjoy them, and do not even want them. One strategy here might be to adopt a ‘hybrid’ account, according to which certain goods do benefit people independently of pleasure and desire-satisfaction, but only when they do in fact bring pleasure and/or satisfy desires. Another would be to bite the bullet, and point out that a theory could be both élitist and true.
It is also worth pointing out that objective list theories need not involve any kind of objectionable authoritarianism or perfectionism. First, one might wish to include autonomy on one’s list, claiming that the informed and reflective living of one’s own life for oneself itself constitutes a good. Second, and perhaps more significantly, one might note that any theory of well-being in itself has no direct moral implications. There is nothing logically to prevent one’s holding a highly élitist conception of well-being alongside a strict liberal view that forbade paternalistic interference of any kind with a person’s own life (indeed, on some interpretations, J.S. Mill’s position is close to this).
One not implausible view, if desire theories are indeed mistaken in their reversal of the relation between desire and what is good, is that the debate is really between hedonism and objective list theories. And, as suggested above, what is most at stake here is the issue of the epistemic adequacy of our beliefs about well-being. The best way to resolve this matter would consist, in large part at least, in returning once again to the experience machine objection, and seeking to discover whether that objection really stands.
Well-being obviously plays a central role in any moral theory. A theory which said that it just does not matter would be given no credence at all. Indeed, it is very tempting to think that well-being, in some ultimate sense, is all that can matter morally. Consider, for example, Joseph Raz’s ‘humanistic principle’: ‘the explanation and justification of the goodness or badness of anything derives ultimately from its contribution, actual or possible, to human life and its quality’ (Raz 1986, p. 194). If we expand this principle to cover non-human well-being, it might be read as claiming that, ultimately speaking, the justificatory force of any moral reason rests on well-being. This view is welfarism.
Act-utilitarians, who believe that the right action is that which maximizes well-being overall, may attempt to use the intuitive plausibility of welfarism to support their position, arguing that any deviation from the maximization of well-being must be grounded on something distinct from well-being, such as equality or rights. But those defending equality may argue that egalitarians are concerned to give priority to those who are worse off, and that we do see here a link with concern for well-being. Likewise, those concerned with rights may note that we have rights to certain goods, such as freedom, or to the absence of ‘bads’, such as suffering (in the case of the right not to be tortured, for example). In other words, the interpretation of welfarism is itself a matter of dispute. But, however it is understood, it does seem that welfarism poses a problem for those who believe that morality can require actions which benefit no one, and harm some, such as, for example, punishments intended to give individuals what they deserve.
Ancient ethics was, in a sense, more concerned with well-being than a good deal of modern ethics, the central question for many ancient moral philosophers being, ‘Which life is best for one?’. The rationality of egoism—the view that my strongest reason is always to advance my own well-being—was largely assumed. This posed a problem. Morality is naturally thought to concern the interests of others. So if egoism is correct, what reason do I have to be moral?
One obvious strategy to adopt in defence of morality is to claim that a person’s well-being is in some sense constituted by their virtue, or the exercise of virtue, and this strategy was adopted in subtly different ways by the three greatest ancient philosophers, Socrates, Plato, and Aristotle (for a modern defence of the view, see Bloomfield (2014)). At one point in his writings, Plato appears to allow for the rationality of moral self-sacrifice: the philosophers in his famous ‘cave’ analogy in the Republic (519–20) are required by morality to desist from contemplation of the sun outside the cave, and to descend once again into the cave to govern their fellow citizens. In the voluminous works of Aristotle, however, there is no recommendation of sacrifice. Aristotle believed that he could defend the virtuous choice as always being in the interest of the individual. Note, however, that he need not be described as an egoist in a strong sense—as someone who believes that our only reasons for action are grounded in our own well-being. For him, virtue both tends to advance the good of others, and (at least when acted on) advances our own good. So Aristotle might well have allowed that the well-being of others grounds reasons for me to act. But these reasons will never come into conflict with reasons grounded in my own individual well-being.
His primary argument is the notorious and perfectionist ‘function argument’, according to which the good for some being is to be identified through attention to its ‘function’ or characteristic activity. The characteristic activity of human beings is to exercise reason, and the good will lie in exercising reason well—that is, in accordance with the virtues. This argument, which is stated by Aristotle very briefly and relies on assumptions from elsewhere in his philosophy and indeed that of Plato, appears to conflate the two ideas of what is good for a person, and what is morally good. I may agree that a ‘good’ example of humanity will be virtuous, but deny that this person is doing what is best for them. Rather, I may insist, reason requires one to advance one’s own good, and this good consists in, for example, pleasure, power, or honour. But much of Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics is taken up with portraits of the life of the virtuous and the vicious, which supply independent support for the claim that well-being is constituted by virtue. In particular, it is worth noting the emphasis placed by Aristotle on the value to a person of ‘nobility’ (to kalon), a quasi-aesthetic value which those sensitive to such qualities might not implausibly see as a constituent of well-being of more worth than any other. In this respect, the good of virtue is, in the Kantian sense, ‘unconditional’. Yet, for Aristotle, virtue or the ‘good will’ is not only morally good, but good for the individual.
Fletcher (2016a) is an excellent introduction to the philosophy of well-being; for a very clear overview, see Hooker (2015). Some significant recent works are Griffin (1986) and Finnis (2011), which present different objective lists; Goldman (2018), which develops a view of well-being as consisting in the fulfillment of rational desire, Sobel 2016, which defends a broadly subjective view of well-being; Feldman (2004) and Crisp (2006), which defend hedonism; Sumner (1996), which rejects many current options and advocates a theory of well-being based on the idea of ‘life-satisfaction’; Kraut (2007), which develops a broadly Aristotelian account; and Haybron (2008), Tiberius (2008), and Alexandrova (2017) which address issues that arise in contemporary psychological research on happiness. A collection of extremely useful essays is Fletcher (2016b). See also Nussbaum and Sen (1993).
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