Notes to Moral Disagreement

1. The supposition that non-cognitivists deny the realist conception of a moral disagreement needs to be qualified. This has to do with the emergence of quasi-realist versions of non-cognitivism whose advocates try to accommodate realist-seeming aspects of moral discourse by invoking a “minimalist” account of truth (see Blackburn 1984 and 1993; and Gibbard 2003). On (some) such accounts, to call a sentence true is just to affirm it and not, in Crispin Wright’s words, “to ascribe a property of intrinsic metaphysical gravitas” (1996, 5). That view enables quasi-realists to concede that moral sentences are after all truth-apt. They may also concede that the attitudes moral sentences express are beliefs, given the further claim that all it takes for an attitude to be a belief is for it to be expressible with a truth-apt sentence. A concern is that such a move risks collapsing the distinction between non-cognitivism and cognitivism. But quasi-realists have stressed that their position remains a distinct one by denying that moral beliefs are apt for “robust” truth and that they have “representational truth conditions thought of realistically” (Blackburn 1993, 185, see further van Roojen 2018, sect. 5.2). It also does not exclude that they may continue to hold that the conflict that a moral disagreement represents is ultimately best understood as a clash of plans, desires, or similar attitudes. Note also that there are, in addition to quasi-realist versions of non-cognitivism, hybrid theories which combine both non-cognitivist and cognitivist elements. See, e.g., Eriksson 2015 for a discussion of the notion of a moral disagreement such theories leave room for.

2. The set of potentially relevant empirical studies which have addressed moral disagreement is vast but somewhat hard to delimit. A complicating factor is that empirical researchers do not always use terminologies that correspond to those employed in philosophical contexts. The works mentioned below represent only a fragment of the pertinent literature. Two early anthropological and sociological works that are often mentioned in this context are Westermarck 1906 and Sumner 1908. The database “World Values Survey,” which was established in 1981, is rich source of knowledge about which moral beliefs are held in more than one hundred countries and how they change over time. The pooling data which it contains has given rise to several important publications, including Inglehart and Weizel 2005, Baker 2005, and Inglehart 2015. The data is also used in attempts to explain what underlies changes in moral beliefs, for example in Eriksson and Strimling 2015 and Strimling et al. 2019; see also Bloom 2010 for further references. Some of the current research about affective polarization for instance by political scientists is also relevant, such as Evans 2003 and Ahler 2014. In anthropology, there has been a revived interest in descriptive ethics since the turn of the millennium. Some of the ideas that have sparked this development and some examples of the growing literature can be found in Barker 2007, Brown and Milgram 2009, Lambek 2010, Bender and Taves 2012 and Cassaniti and Hickman 2014.

3. Tolhurst’s argument is addressed in section 4. Wright argues in 1992 and 1996 that moral realism is unacceptable unless it is a priori that that every moral disagreement (except those that can be attributed to vagueness) involves a cognitive shortcoming. From the assumption that this condition—which Wright labels “Cognitive Command”—is violated, he concludes that our moral convictions are not the products of “a seriously representational mode of function” (1992, 94). That is a position which may best be classified as non-cognitivist. For discussions, see Tersman 2006, ch. 4 and McGrath 2010.

4. It is important to bear in mind that moral realism is not the only position that may be criticized on the basis of concerns, stemming from disagreement, about its ability to accommodate the existence of moral knowledge. For example, moral constructivism is often assumed to fare better in that respect, but see Tropman 2014 for a critical discussion.

5. It might perhaps be argued that for example relativists are not vulnerable to the argument, as they could insist that the possibility of genuine moral disagreement between speakers who are similar in all epistemically relevant respects is ruled out by the fact that the moral sentences which they give different verdicts upon have different truth conditions in their respective idiolects.

Copyright © 2021 by
Folke Tersman <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free