Moral Disagreement

First published Wed Dec 8, 2021

Appeals to moral disagreement have figured in philosophical discussions since antiquity, especially regarding questions about the nature of morality. An example is provided by Sextus Empiricus, who in a famous passage concludes (in Richard Bett’s translation) that “there is nothing by nature good or bad” from the observation that “the same thing is thought bad by one person and good by another” (Against the Ethicists, 14). It is often dubious to characterize the thoughts of ancient philosophers by using distinctions and terminologies that have emerged much later. Still, it is tempting to take Sextus to offer an argument against the metaethical position known as “moral realism” and its central thesis that there are moral truths which are objective in the sense that they are independent of human practices and thinking.

Moral realism is the target also of many modern appeals to moral disagreement which are often made by philosophers who instead favor nihilist, relativist, constructivist, non-cognitivist or expressivist views. However, the phenomenon has been ascribed other dialectical roles as well. For example, it has also been invoked in support of realism. Metaethics is furthermore not the only domain in which moral disagreement has received attention. Another is political philosophy. An influential view which is known as “public reason” entails that a government’s use of coercive power is legitimate only if it can be justified to the citizens on the basis of principles that all could reasonably accept. That view provides a different context in which facts about moral disagreement are relevant (see Quong 2018 for an overview and discussion). Nevertheless, this entry is exclusively devoted to its metaethical significance.

Some of the topics metaethicists address concern the metaphysics and ontology of morality. Others concern its epistemology and its semantics (and metasemantics). Moral disagreement has been thought relevant to all those subfields, and the entry is organized in accordance with the divisions among them. However, one of the points the discussions below are meant to illustrate is that the topics are related and that the positions and arguments that have been put forward in one of the subfields might be relevant also to those in another.

1. The Nature of Moral Disagreement

There is little controversy about the existence of widespread disagreement over moral issues, both within and between societies and cultures. Often used examples are the debates about the morality of the death penalty, of euthanasia, of abortion, and of meat-eating. Examples of cultural differences include infanticide and geronticide and other more or less alien practices that historians and anthropologists have revealed. For example, Napoleon Chagnon’s account of the ways of the Yanomamö people in the Amazon basin is a popular source of illustrations (Chagnon 1997, but see also Tierney 2003 for a critical discussion). Some theorists assign special weight to disagreements among philosophers and professional ethicists who have engaged in systematic reflection about moral issues (e.g., Wong 1984, ch. 10 and Leiter 2014). What they have in mind are, among other disputes, those between utilitarians and Kantians about what makes an action morally right and those between egalitarians and libertarians about what justice requires. How deep the disagreement goes, however, and how it is best explained, are disputed questions. So is another topic which in a way precedes the others, namely, what it is, more specifically, to disagree morally.

1.1 Conflicts of Belief or Clashes of Conative Attitudes?

People disagree morally when they have opposing moral convictions. That much can be agreed by all theorists. What is debated is rather what it means for such convictions to be opposing. For example, moral realism entails cognitivism, and cognitivism is the view that moral sentences—the sentences we typically use to express our moral convictions—can be true and false and that the convictions themselves constitute beliefs that purport to represent aspects of reality. That element of their position allows realists to construe moral disagreements as conflicts of belief along the lines of disputes about (other) factual matters, i.e., as cases where persons give inconsistent verdicts on one and the same truth-evaluable claim or proposition. On that conception, if Jane thinks that meat-eating is morally wrong while Eric denies so then they have incompatible beliefs both of which cannot be true, just as when Jane believes while Eric denies that the Earth is older than four thousand years.

To construe moral disagreements in that way is not, however, an option for those non-cognitivists who deny that moral convictions are beliefs and think that to judge that meat-eating is wrong is instead to have a conative attitude towards meat-eating (such as an attitude of dislike or a desire). Theorists of that kind rather conceive of the opposition that a moral disagreement involves as a clash of such attitudes (see, e.g., Stevenson 1944; and Blackburn 1984, 168). What the clash more specifically is supposed to consist in depends on which version of non-cognitivism one is considering. If moral convictions are taken to be desires, for example, then a moral disagreement can be construed as a case where people have desires which are not jointly satisfiable and thus motivate different courses of action.[1]

1.2 Relativist Accounts

The fact that moral realists are cognitivists enables them to construe moral disagreements as conflicts of belief, but some cognitivists may also, just like non-cognitivists, need a conception which is different from the realist one. Moral realism is associated with the absolutist view that the truth conditions or contents of moral sentences and moral convictions remain constant across speakers. For example, the realist Richard Boyd insists that there is “a single objective property which we’re all talking about when we use the term ‘good’ in moral contexts” (1988, 312). However, there are also cognitivists who are relativists and think that the truth conditions of moral sentences vary, depending for example on the cultural or social groups which the speakers or believers belong to (see, e.g., Harman 1978 and Wong 1984).

A crude version of relativism is the simple type of subjectivism which holds that to state that an action is right or wrong is to report something about one’s own attitudes towards it. On such a view, if Jane states that meat-eating is wrong while Eric claims that it is permitted, then Jane expresses the belief that she disapproves of meat-eating while Eric expresses the belief that he does not disapprove of it. Since both those beliefs can be true, they are not incompatible. A common objection to subjectivism is that it therefore, implausibly, represents paradigm cases of moral disagreement as being merely apparent (Moore 1912, ch. 3), which illustrates how facts that have to do with moral disagreement can help a moral realist.

Similar objections can be raised against other forms of relativism, although it may be easier for some of them to construe cases of moral disagreement as conflicts of belief than for others. For example, on one type of relativist view, what a speaker claims by stating that an act is right is, roughly, that it is permitted by his or her moral standards. So, if the speaker’s claim is rejected by someone who shares those standards, then they do after all have incompatible beliefs (for this point, see Harman 1978; and López de Sa 2015). Disagreements between persons who do not share standards remain to be accounted for, however.

In response to such objections, relativists can dissociate themselves from the conception that a moral disagreement essentially involves a conflict of belief and instead adopt the non-cognitivist view which takes such disagreements to be clashes of conative attitudes. They may do so, for example, by assuming that the moral standards of a person consist in such attitudes (see, e.g., Wong 1984; Dreier 1999; Björnsson and Finlay 2010 and Marques 2014). That would enable them to describe the situation with Jane and Eric as a genuine moral dispute even if they concede that Jane’s and Eric’s statements about the morality of meat-eating can both be true. One might think that a relativist who chooses that path is left with little reason to remain a cognitivist. But there are further forms of relativism that allow for other options.

Some of those are explored in the debate regarding so-called faultless disagreements (e.g., Kölbel 2003 and McFarlane 2014, ch. 6). On a view which is inspired by the more general position known as “assessor relativism”, the propositions that constitute the contents of moral beliefs are the same independently of who the believer is. But the truth-values of those contents nevertheless vary depending on the standards of those who assess them (e.g., Kölbel 2004; and Schafer 2012). That view allows its advocates to remain faithful to their relativist inclinations and still construe Jane’s and Eric’s dispute as concerning one and the same proposition which is affirmed by Jane and rejected by Eric. It also allows them to claim that, for any spectator of the case, at most one of Jane’s and Eric’s statements is true (since both cannot be true relative to the same standards). This leaves them with a conception of a moral disagreement which has at least some semblance to the realist one. (For further discussion and criticism of the pertinent account of disagreement, see Dreier 1999; and Francén 2010.)

The fact that different theorists thus ultimately employ different ideas about what a moral disagreement amounts to may make one suspect that they risk talking past each other when discussing further questions, such as how much disagreement there is and how it is to be explained. However, note that the disputes in question take place at a quite theoretical level and are consistent with significant overlap regarding what counts as a paradigm case of moral disagreement and about the types of behavior such disagreements typically manifest itself in. For example, both realists, non-cognitivists and others can agree that moral disagreements are typically accompanied with clashes of desires and that they are often causally rooted in conflicts of non-moral belief (for example regarding the consequences of the actions). That overlap helps to secure a shared subject matter for discussions about (e.g.) how much disagreement there is.

1.3 Radical Moral Disagreements

All moral disagreements are not created equal from a metaethical point of view, as some types are held to be more interesting than others. This has partly to do with the fact that philosophers who invoke moral disagreement in support of antirealist positions typically want to avoid committing themselves to similar positions about other areas where disagreement occurs, such as the empirical sciences. Overgeneralization worries of that kind are addressed in section 6. But a common response to them is to argue that there are crucial differences between disagreement over moral issues and that which occurs in the other areas.

On one such suggestion, many moral disagreements are particularly pervasive and hard to resolve. The disagreements which arise for example in the sciences can generally, it is held, be attributed to a lack of evidence, bias, limited reasoning skills or similar cognitive shortcomings and tend to go away when progress has been made in removing those obstacles. That situation, however, is contrasted with the one which is supposed to obtain in ethics, where many disagreements allegedly would survive such measures and persist even if none of its parties were affected by any factor which could plausibly be regarded as an epistemic shortcoming. That is, the idea is that disagreements would persist even in circumstances that are ideal in the sense that they are the most favorable circumstances that human inquirers can hope to achieve. This is why some theorists assign special weight to disagreements among philosophers, who presumably are the most likely candidates of being in such circumstances, given their training, familiarity with each other’s arguments, and the time they have spent on reflecting on the issues.

In what follows, a moral disagreement that would persist in ideal circumstances is called “radical”. The claim that much of the existing moral disagreement is radical is a premise in some arguments from moral disagreement, although different arguments explain its significance differently. It should be noted, however, that there are also arguments which invoke weaker assumptions about the nature of the existing disagreement and do not require that any of it is radical (as is illustrated below).

Realists tend to agree with antirealists that radical moral disagreements are the most troublesome (see, e.g., Parfit 2011, 546), but they question the grounds for postulating such disagreements. They might in that context use several complementary strategies. One, which may be especially applicable to intercultural differences, is to argue that some disagreements are in fact merely apparent. Thus, polygamy is judged acceptable in some societies but deemed unacceptable in others. If each of those judgments contains an implicit indexical element, given which it holds only for the society in which it is held, then they are not incompatible. Indeed, if the conditions that obtain in those societies are different, then the situation is consistent with assuming that certain more basic principles are accepted in all societies, from which the differing views about polygamy could be derived. (This possibility is noted by John Mackie, who however downplays its importance, see 1977, 37.)

Another strategy is to insist that many moral disagreements can after all be attributed to factors that are analogous to those that underlie scientific ones (e.g., Smith 1994, 155–161) or to related factors that are supposed to be especially pertinent to moral inquiry (for a rich account of both options, see Brink 1989, ch. 7). For example, it is often noted that moral disputes are frequently rooted in disagreement about non-moral facts (e.g., Boyd 1988, 213), such as when people have opposing views about the death penalty because of different beliefs about the effects of permitting it. Those cases do arguably not provide any particular problem for moral realism and can be seen as instances of disagreement which is due to a lack of evidence. A further distorting factor is self-interest, whose influence may make people resist plausible moral views just because those views represent them or the behavior they want to engage in as immoral. That mechanism may help to explain why there is more disagreement in ethics than in areas where self-interest is less of an issue (see Nagel 1986, 148; and Shafer-Landau 2006, 219 for this suggestion). Yet further examples are bias and prejudice, lack of imagination, and, as for example David Brink has stressed (1989, 197–210), an insufficient amount of systematic reflection. In specifically addressing the lack of convergence among ethicists, Derek Parfit has made the congenial suggestion that it is premature to draw antirealist conclusions from it, as secular moral reasoning has been pursued for a relatively short time (1984, 454). The suggestion is that fruitful moral inquiry has been constrained by religious influences in ways that do not promote truth-seeking, just as research about empirical issues was similarly hampered before the scientific revolution. According to Parfit, this means that it is not irrational to be hopeful about future convergence of the very same kind that occurs in the sciences (see also Wedgewood 2014 for a discussion of disagreement among philosophers). The list of available strategies could be extended, and the question, in the context of the assessment of some (but not all) arguments from moral disagreement, is what scope their application leaves for postulating any remaining ones.

2. Empirical Research on Moral Disagreement

The question about the extent to which the existing moral disagreement is radical is essentially an empirical one. Yet references in the philosophical discussion to the numerous studies by anthropologists, historians, psychologists and sociologists who have documented the disagreement are relatively sparse.[2] This may seem regrettable, and some have accordingly emphasized that philosophers should pay more attention to empirical research (see, e.g., Sturgeon 1994, 230 and Loeb 1998, 284). That is surely good advice, but the absence of references to the empirical literature is also to some extent understandable.

One reason for this is that much of the philosophical discussion focuses on the implications of the claim that much moral disagreement is radical, rather than on the truth of that claim. Another is that some arguments merely appeal to the possibility of radical moral disagreement and are consistent with thinking that all actual disputes involve some shortcoming. (See e.g., Tolhurst 1987, and Wright 1992 and 1996. See also the references to antirealists who use thought experiments of the type considered in section 5.)[3] That approach raises methodological questions of its own, of course, especially if one is not willing to extend one’s antirealism to all other domains. For then one must explain how one can establish that disagreements of the pertinent kind are possible in ethics but not in the other domains. The role empirical evidence might have in that context is a complex issue.

A further reason for the absence of references to empirical studies in the metaethical literature is that their relevance is often unclear, partly since the studies have typically not been guided by the rather specific concerns that philosophers reflect on (such as whether the disagreement is radical). However, that might be better seen as a reason to scrutinize those studies more carefully than to ignore them altogether. It may also be a reason for philosophers to take a more active role in the empirical research themselves and to find ways to collaborate with those who are trained in those areas.

Some important efforts along those lines have in fact been made. A prominent example is Richard Brandt’s study (1954) of the Hopi people, which revealed differences in basic moral attitudes between the Hopi and white Americans that could not, he thought, be explained with differences in non-moral beliefs. (See Moody-Adams 1997 for a critique, and Abarbanell and Hauser 2010 and Barrett et al. 2016 for two more recent examples.) An attempt to argue that there is empirical evidence for the existence of radical moral disagreement that has been widely discussed in recent years has been made by John Doris, Alexandra Plakias and Stephen Stich (Doris and Plakias 2008a; Doris and Plakias 2008b, and Doris and Stich 2007). They appeal to research conducted by the social psychologists Dov Cohen and Richard Nisbett (1996) about why certain types of violence among non-Hispanic whites are more common in the American South than in the North. Cohen and Nisbett attribute this difference to the existence in the South of a “culture of honor”, which permits harsh responses even to minor insults. As for why such a culture is more prevalent there, Cohen and Nisbett point to the fact that early European migrants to the United States settled in different regions. Many who went to the South were descendants of people whose morals had been forged in herding economies (in Scotland, for example), where a reputation for being prone to violent retaliation lessened the risk of having one’s cattle stolen.

Doris et al. argue that the difference Cohen and Nisbett have revealed is a plausible candidate of a disagreement which would persist under ideal conditions, as it is unreasonable to attribute it to unawareness of non-moral facts or to other obvious types of distorting factors. But they also acknowledge the tentativeness of their contention and that there are further options for those who want to explain away the difference (see, e.g., Doris et al. 2020). One is to pursue the aforementioned suggestion by Brink (see also Loeb 1998) to the effect that the failure to expose one’s moral beliefs to theoretical reflection is a shortcoming. The type of reflection he has in mind is associated with a reflective equilibrium-style method for moral inquiry, which prescribes the pursuit of coherence and systematicity. Arguably, the evidence presented by Cohen and Nisbett is not enough to confidently conclude that the disagreements would survive competent applications of that method. (See Fitzpatrick 2014. For further discussion, see Tersman 2006, ch. 2; Bloomfield 2008; and Fraser and Hauser 2010.)

The idea that an insufficient amount of reflection counts as a shortcoming may justify focusing especially on disagreements among philosophers, as Brian Leiter (2014) does. But a problem is that the available characterizations of the pertinent method of reflection are rather vague. It may therefore be hard to determine whether any individual has applied it competently or not. Moreover, how any such method is to be specified, and even if it is to be used at all, are controversial issues within philosophy. Something similar holds for other potential candidates of relevant shortcomings. For example, what about cases where our moral convictions are influenced by our emotions? It is common to view such influence as a distorting factor (e.g., Singer 2005 and Sayre-McCord 2015), but on some views in moral epistemology, and given the benign roles emotions sometimes play in cognitive processes, it may need to be qualified (see Le Doux 1996 and Nussbaum 2001 for two influential accounts of the epistemic significance of emotions). Before those and many related issues are settled, and thus before we have established a comprehensive list of clearly defined factors which count as shortcomings, all confident estimates of the extent to which the existing moral disagreement is radical may seem premature.

3. Metaphysical Arguments from Moral Disagreement

3.1 The Argument from Relativity

Much of the contemporary metaethical discussion about moral disagreement is inspired by John Mackie’s “argument from relativity”, which is offered in support of his nihilist metaphysical claim that there are no moral facts. Mackie’s argument is often interpreted as an inference to the best explanation. On that interpretation, the existence of widespread moral disagreement supports the thesis that there are no moral facts because it is implied by the best explanation of the disagreement. However, although that construal of Mackie’s argument is quite common (e.g., Brink 1989, 197; McGrath 2008, 90; Joyce 2010, 46 (but see also Joyce 2018); Vavova 2014, 304; and Clarke-Doane 2020, 148), it is also questionable.

Mackie’s brief presentation of his argument begins as follows:

The argument from relativity has as its premiss the well-known variation in moral codes from one society to another and from one period to another, and also the differences in moral beliefs between different groups and classes within a complex community (1977, 36).

He acknowledges that there is no direct step from the diversity to the conclusion that there are no moral facts and stresses that the disputes which occur in the sciences do not support analogous conclusions about them. To justify this mixed verdict, he stresses that, while “scientific disagreement results from speculative inferences or explanatory hypotheses based on inadequate evidence” (1977, 36), moral disagreement should be explained in a different way:

[T]he argument from relativity has some force simply because the actual variations in the moral codes are more readily explained by the hypothesis that they reflect ways of life than by the hypothesis that they express perceptions, most of them seriously inadequate and badly distorted, of objective values. (1977, 37)

What makes it questionable to construe Mackie’s argument as an inference to the best explanation is that his way-of-life explanation seems completely neutral as to the existence of moral facts. The account is illustrated by the claim that “people approve of monogamy because they participate in a monogamous life” rather than the other way round, and that view is surely consistent both with the existence and the non-existence of moral facts. It is accordingly hard to see how the alleged superiority of Mackie’s way of life-explanation of moral diversity confirms the idea that it is best explained by assuming that moral facts do not exist.

When exploring the possibility of an alternative reconstruction, it is helpful to distinguish between two claims:

  1. The best explanation of the variation in moral codes entails that there are no moral facts.
  2. The best explanation of the variation in moral codes does not entail that there are moral facts.

Given the neutrality of Mackie’s way of life-account relative to the existence of moral facts, the supposition that it offers a superior explanation of the variation does not imply (i). However, it does imply the weaker claim (ii), which is what Mackie notes by contrasting the way of life-account with “the hypothesis that [our moral convictions] express perceptions, most of them seriously inadequate and badly distorted, of objective values”. Can (ii) be used in a compelling objection to moral realism? One option is to try for an indirect one which targets the grounds for being a realist, rather than realism itself. (ii) does not entail that the variation is a direct reason to reject realism, but it does indicate that realism fails to obtain support from it. That is obviously an unsurprising result, but if the way-of-life hypothesis is incorporated in a broader theory, which provides the best explanation also of other aspects of moral discourse, then it may deprive realists of more important sources of support. For example, some moral realists (e.g., Sturgeon 1988, 229, Smith 1994, 188, and Huemer 2016) stress that although there is plenty of moral disagreement, there is also some amount of convergence. Issues that previously were intensely debated are currently less controversial (Smith mentions slavery, for example). The inspiration of these realists may be the arguments for scientific realism which invoke the (arguably more impressive) convergence that occurs there (see Devitt 1984 for a discussion). However, if a theory which incorporates the way-of-life hypothesis and at the same time remains non-committal about moral facts were to provide a better explanation not only of the divergence but also of the convergence among moral judgments, then arguments for moral realism of that kind would fail. If the broader theory were in addition to explain why we form moral convictions in the first place, then it would provide significant support for the core claim of Gilbert Harman’s much discussed argument against moral realism, according to which we should not posit moral facts, as they are not needed in the best explanation of anything observable. (See Harman 1977 and Sturgeon 1988 for a realist response.)

3.2 Disagreement and Inaccessibility

Of course, the role such a reconstruction of Mackie’s argument assigns to moral disagreement is exceedingly limited, so it hardly accounts for the attention that moral disagreement has received in the debate about moral realism. Can the argument be reconstructed in a more direct way? As several commentators have pointed out, what might be needed is an epistemic premise (e.g., Bennigson 1996; Loeb 1998; Tersman 2006, ch. 3, Enoch 2009; and Locke 2017). The question is what the existence of moral facts predicts about existing moral disagreement, and the problem is that it is hard to see how it generates any such predictions on its own. Further assumptions are needed, and one candidate is the idea that the facts, if they exist, are accessible to us in the sense that we can in favorable epistemic circumstances acquire knowledge of them. David Wiggins has formulated the idea as follows: “If X is true, then X will under favourable circumstances command convergence” (1987, 147). Given such a claim, one could then argue that moral realism predicts less disagreement (in the relevant circumstances) than that which actually exists. This would be a direct reason to reject it.

This alternative construal of the argument leaves realists with the option of denying that the moral facts they posit are accessible. However, that is a move realists are typically not inclined to make. A persuasive argument to the effect that moral realists are committed to viewing moral facts as inaccessible would rather be seen as an embarrassment, as it would leave them, to use Russ Shafer-Landau’s phrase, with “a logically coherent position that contains about zero appeal”. (2012, 1). Indeed, some realists even make the claim that moral facts are epistemically accessible a part of their definition of the position (Boyd 1988, 182). A more common response is therefore to try to find ways to reconcile the existing disagreement both with the existence and with the accessibility of moral facts.

The prospects of such a response depend on what the accessibility is taken to entail. There may be little reason for realists to go beyond the relatively modest claim that we can attain knowledge of some moral facts in favorable circumstances. Given such a weak interpretation of “accessible”, realists may employ all the strategies outlined in section 1.3 to argue that most of the existing disagreement occurs between persons who are not in ideal circumstances which would render it irrelevant in the present context. After all, the fact that people have failed to reach agreement (which entails, on a realist view, that some have failed to obtain knowledge) in conditions that are not favorable need not show that they would fail also in circumstances that are. As for the remaining disagreement, such as that between philosophers, realists could point out that it primarily concerns highly general and theoretical facts whose accessibility they can consistently remain agnostic about, for example due to underdetermination concerns.

In addition, realists may in fact concede that some contested moral issues do not allow for objectively correct answers and thus grant some amount of indeterminacy in the moral realm. The idea is that they may do so and still insist that other moral questions have such answers, by attributing the indeterminacy to vagueness which in turn may be the result of the applicability of incommensurable values or requirements (see, e.g., Brink 1989, 202; Sturgeon 1994, 95; and Shafer-Landau 1994 and 1995). That proposal has received some attention (e.g., Constantinescu 2012 and 2014) and deserves further examination. However, a potential concern with it is that the set of moral issues which may most plausibly be taken to involve vagueness might not overlap so well with the set of issues over which there is the fiercest disagreement among competent inquirers (for this point, see Loeb 1998, 290; Tersman 2006, 133; and Schroeter and Schroeter 2013, 7–8). Wouldn’t such inquirers be likely to spot the indeterminacy and abstain from forming any (conflicting) beliefs about those issues? If so, then the appeal to vagueness provides just limited help to realists in accommodating the most likely candidates for qualifying as radical moral disagreements.

4. Epistemological Arguments from Moral Disagreement

The argument to the effect that moral disagreement generates problems for moral realists by committing them to the inaccessibility of moral facts is ultimately of an epistemological nature. It is thus congenial with the more general idea that disagreement sometimes raises skeptical worries by suggesting that our grounds for the contested beliefs are inadequate and that they thus fail to be adequately justified or amount to knowledge. And although that idea applies to other areas as well, it is often taken to have a special relevance to ethics, given the extent of the disagreement that occurs there.

The skeptical conclusions that moral disagreement has been taken to warrant vary in strength, both modally and in terms of scope. The claim that moral facts are inaccessible is modally strong in that it goes beyond saying just that we actually lack moral knowledge or justified moral beliefs. But moral disagreement has been invoked in defense of modally weaker claims as well. Note that the fact that a form of skepticism is weak in the modal sense and just pertains to our actual situation does not mean that it cannot be a part of an argument against moral realism. At least, that is so as long as it is sufficiently broad in scope. For example, if it were shown that we are in fact unjustified in thinking of any moral claim that it is a truth, then that would arguably diminish our justification for thinking that there are such truths in the first place (see further Tersman 2019). However, if a skeptical conclusion is weak not only in the modal sense but also in the scope sense, so that it applies only to a limited subset of our moral beliefs, then it is less likely to have a role to play in a forceful challenge against moral realism (or other positions that seek to leave room for moral knowledge).[4] Still, the contention that moral disagreement has such implications is interesting in its own right.

The focus below is on arguments which seek to cast doubt on the existence of moral knowledge, even granted that there are moral truths. An alternative approach is to first argue that the disagreement directly excludes the existence of moral truths and then to simply derive the thesis that there is no moral knowledge from that conclusion (given that knowledge presupposes truth). That alternative strategy will be set aside in this section. Thus, since the arguments are supposed to support skeptical conclusions independently of any rejection of moral truths, they need to establish that our moral beliefs violate some other precondition of knowledge, such as, most commonly, justification.

Any argument to that effect raises general questions about what it takes for a belief to constitute knowledge or to be justified. Nevertheless, those who put forward skeptical arguments from moral disagreement do not always invoke any such general view. The reason might be that they believe that the skeptical conclusions follow on just about any of the most promising theories that have emerged in epistemology, which obviously would make the arguments less vulnerable (see e.g., Tolhurst 1987 for this suggestion). However, others do explicitly state some general view of knowledge or justification on which they rely.

4.1 Moral Peer Disagreement

One example of an argument which invokes a specific view is developed by Sarah McGrath (2008). The view in question entails that your belief about some topic does not amount to knowledge if it is “denied by another person of whom it is true that: you have no more reason to think that he or she is in error than you are”. Armed with this principle, McGrath offers an argument to the effect that many of our moral beliefs do not constitute knowledge. What she in particular has in mind are those beliefs that concern issues “that tend to be hotly contested in the applied ethics literature as well as in the broader culture” (92–93), such as the ones about the death penalty and meat-eating. (Derek Parfit considers a challenge which he articulates similarly. See 2011, 546.)

McGrath’s principle is congenial with the position known as “conciliationism” in the peer disagreement debate, although that position is more often stated in terms of justified or rational belief than knowledge (see Frances 2019 for an overview of the positions and arguments the debate revolves around). An interlocutor is your peer, roughly, if he or she is just as well equipped as you are (for example, in terms of evidence and reasoning skills) when it comes to figuring out the truth about topics of the kind the contested belief concerns. According to conciliationism, if one learns that one’s beliefs are opposed by a peer, then one should drop the beliefs or at least reduce one’s confidence in them. Conciliationism thus offers a way to argue that moral disagreement sometimes has the type of significance assigned to it by moral skeptics (see Rowland 2020 for an extensive discussion of the strategy).

Conciliationism has been met with criticism from theorists who instead favor “steadfastness” in the face of peer disagreement. And the fact that conciliationism is thus a contested doctrine also raises the self-defeat worry that it can be turned against itself as it may then seem to call for its own abandonment. But an advantage of conciliationism in the present context is that it allows moral skeptics to derive skeptical conclusions from moral disagreement without having to assume that the parties are in ideal circumstances. After all, two persons could be in equally favorable epistemic situations even if their situations could be improved. At the same time, however, the conclusions a skeptic may, via conciliationism, hope to derive from such disagreements are correspondingly modest. They seem at best to entail that the parties currently lack justified beliefs or knowledge and do not rule out that knowledge is in principle attainable. As Richard Feldman puts it, the skepticism we get from conciliationism is “a kind of contingent real-world skepticism” which does not address, for example, “whether it is possible for us to know about the existence and nature of things in the external world” (2006, 217).

The type of skepticism which follows from conciliationism is likely to be limited in the scope sense as well. The reason is that, besides the disputes about the death penalty, abortion, and so on, there are also issues over which disagreement is rare, such as, to use a couple of examples which are often mentioned in this context (e.g., in Vavova 2014), whether pain is bad and whether parents have a responsibility to take care of their children. A global moral skeptic might try to counter that point by noting that those claims are also opposed by some people, namely error theorists such as Mackie, who reject all (positive) moral claims as being incorrect in one fell sweep. But even if that group includes some very capable thinkers, they are vastly outnumbered by others, including philosophers who appear no less competent. As McGrath suggests, the fact that the error theorists thus are outliers might in itself be seen as a reason for not regarding them as peers, in spite of their philosophical capabilities (2008, 95). (For a different argument to the effect that conciliationism yields at most a very restricted form of skepticism, see Vavova 2014.)

4.2 Disagreement and Safety

Is there a plausible way to accommodate the fact that there is near-universal agreement about some moral claims while still maintaining that moral disagreement supports global moral skepticism? One option is to argue that the disagreement can play a more indirect role (see, e.g., Enoch 2009). The idea could be that it is not the disagreement itself which makes our moral beliefs unjustified, but rather some underlying factor which the disagreement is a symptom of (and which might obtain also when the symptom is absent). One may imagine, for example, that even if just some moral claims attract disagreement, the best explanation of the diversity of moral views is nevertheless a theory about the causal background of moral beliefs which holds generally. If that theory in turn suggests that the beliefs are caused in a way that undermines their justification, it allows us to see how the disagreement can support global moral skepticism, even granted that some moral claims do not generate controversy. In this type of argument, the relevance of the disagreement is somewhat reduced (though not entirely obliterated) compared to that assigned to it by conciliationism, as disagreement merely plays the role of being evidence that the more fundamental skepticism-generating condition obtains.

According to one suggestion along those lines, what moral disagreements reveal is that the abilities or methods we use to form our moral beliefs are not sufficiently reliable or truth-tracking. They may fail to be so, for example, by being such that, even if the beliefs we have formed by using those methods are in fact true, we could easily have ended up with false ones. If we could not easily have been mistaken (by using the same methods that we used to form our actual beliefs), then our beliefs are sometimes said to be “safe”. Some theorists take safety to be a necessary condition of knowledge (see, e.g., Pritchard 2005 and Williamson 2000). If it could be shown that existing moral disagreements indicate that our moral beliefs are not safe, then this offers a way forward for moral skeptics (for this idea, see e.g., Mogensen 2016; Hirvela 2017; Risberg and Tersman 2019; and Clarke-Doane 2020, 148).

How is moral disagreement supposed to show that our moral beliefs are unsafe? Consider a person a whose beliefs about a set of contested moral topics are true. The beliefs are safe only if a, by using the same methods, could not easily have formed beliefs that contradict her actual ones in circumstances where the moral facts remain the same. Now, what disagreement about a’s beliefs entails is that some people have in fact formed beliefs that contradict a’s actual ones in circumstances where (we are supposing) the moral facts remain the same. So, if (some of) those persons have used the same methods as a and if the existence of those persons accordingly indicates that a could easily have formed those beliefs as well by using those methods (on the ground, perhaps, that they have grown up in similar social or cultural circumstances and have been exposed to similar types of education), then it also indicates that a’s beliefs are unsafe.

This is just a sketch of an argument, of course, and it faces serious challenges. One is to clarify the notion of a “method”, which is required in order to make sense of the claim that different people use the same methods to arrive at incompatible moral beliefs. Another problem is to explain in more precise terms what it means to say that it could “easily” have happened that someone had formed an opposing belief. It is a tricky task to provide precise definitions of those notions which both render the view that safety is required for knowledge plausible and vindicate the role assigned to disagreement by the indicated argument.

4.3 Merely Possible Disagreement

An alternative way to try to accommodate the fact that there is near-universal agreement about some moral claims, while still pursuing a global form of moral skepticism, is to argue that the mere possibility of certain types of disagreement is enough to secure skeptical conclusions. That approach has been tried by William Tolhurst (1987, but see also Schiffer 2002, 288).

Tolhurst presents an argument whose conclusion is that no moral beliefs are ever justified, if those beliefs are understood “on the realist model” (610). Its premises include two epistemic principles which together imply that if a person’s belief that P is justified, then it is not possible for there to be another person who is similar in all epistemically relevant respects and who believes not-P. A further premise is that, for every person a and every moral claim M which is accepted by a, it is indeed possible for there to be another person who shares a’s non-moral beliefs, is equally good at reasoning and is (therefore) similar in all relevant respects, and yet believes the negation of M. Given that further premise, it follows that no moral belief is justified. As indicated, Tolhurst takes this argument to be conditional on a realist understanding of moral beliefs. However, the premises make no mention of that assumption, and Tolhurst does not elaborate on how it would help a non-skeptic to adopt an alternative account.[5]

Is the argument compelling? Tolhurst suggests that the best option for those who want to resist it is to postulate “the existence of a special ability to ascertain […] moral truth” (614, see Wright 1992, 152–156, for a related suggestion). For that would allow one to hold that there are relevant respects in which we may differ from our possible opponents, besides those concerning our non-moral beliefs and (general) reasoning skills. In the ensuing discussion, Tolhurst notes that, by postulating a special ability, realists would “incur a significant theoretical debt” (621), but he holds open whether they can make good on it.

Tolhurst thus ultimately reaches the verdict that his argument is inconclusive, and there are additional ways to question it besides that which invokes the idea of a special cognitive ability. For example, his two principles can be challenged with reference to the “permissivist” view that the same set of evidence can license different doxastic attitudes toward a proposition (see, e.g., White 2005 about permissivism). However, Tolhurst also makes some remarks about how to move forward which are of general interest. The upshot of those remarks is that the argument he developed should be assessed from a holistic perspective. The legitimacy of invoking a specifically moral cognitive ability depends, he thinks, on “whether a realist theory which includes [that] hypothesis can, as a whole, explain moral [and non-moral] phenomena more effectively than its antirealist rivals” (621). This is an important observation in view of that arguments from moral disagreement are often assessed under the assumption that they are expected to establish their skeptical or antirealist conclusions all by themselves and are dismissed if it is found that they fail to do so. What the holistic approach suggests, however, is that, even if they fail in that sense, it is still conceivable that they might contribute to a successful combined challenge, by joining forces with other skeptical or antirealist arguments, such as the evolutionary debunking ones. (The evolutionary debunking strategy is described and discussed in FitzPatrick 2021. For an attempt to combine it with arguments from disagreement, see Tersman 2017, but see also Klenk 2018 for a critique.)

5. Moral Disagreement and the Semantics (and Metasemantics) of Moral Language

The previous sections address potential epistemological and metaphysical implications of moral disagreement. However, it is also thought to be relevant to the fields of moral semantics and moral metasemantics (which focus on questions about the meanings and functions of moral sentences and about the nature and contents of moral convictions). Moral disagreements manifest themselves in disputes over sentences that involve terms such as “good” and “right” and in differences regarding when and on what basis those terms are to be applied. Since such patterns of language use belong to the phenomena semantical and metasemantical theories seek to account for, the disagreement has been taken to have relevance also in those areas.

Much of that discussion focuses on a certain challenge against moral realism, according to which it generates implausible implications about when people are in a genuine moral disagreement. Realism is supposed to have those implications because of its commitment to cognitivism and absolutism, and the challenge is accordingly offered of in support of non-cognitivist or relativist views. However, the implications do not follow from cognitivism or absolutism alone, but only given certain metasemantical assumptions about how the truth conditions of moral sentences and the contents of moral beliefs are determined. So, an important question is if there are plausible assumptions of that kind with which realists can combine their theory to avoid the implications.

5.1 Disagreement and Charity

An early contribution to the debate was made by Richard Hare (1952, esp. 146–149, but see also Stevenson 1963, and Blackburn 1984 and 1993, ch. 11). He imagined a scenario with two facts which he assumed could co-exist. The first is the fact that different sets of speakers systematically apply “good” to different persons and actions and on the basis of different criteria of application with little overlap. The second is the fact that they all use “good” as, in Hare’s phrase, a “general adjective of commendation”. According to Hare, the first fact implies that there is no single property which “good” is used to refer to by all speakers in the scenario. That is, supposing that the term is used to refer at all, the fact suggests that it refers to different properties for different speakers. This in turn means that their disputes about how to apply “good” need not reflect any conflicts of belief, as the belief that an item has one property is compatible with its lacking some other property (provided that the properties are appropriately distinct). Hare’s point, however, was that, in virtue of the second fact, it would still be plausible to interpret those speakers as being in in a genuine moral dispute when arguing about whether to apply “good” or not. Hare took this conclusion to suggest that moral disagreements are best seen as clashes of commands rather than as conflicts of belief and provided the argument in support of his non-cognitivist view that the (“primary”) function of moral terms and sentences is to express such commands.

A common realist response to the argument is to question whether the differences in language use which are assumed in Hare’s scenario really do rule out co-reference. Whether it does is a metasemantical question. On a metasemantical view which potentially vindicates Hare’s contention, we interpret the referential terms of a speaker correctly only if we assign referents “charitably”. An assignment is charitable in the relevant sense if, given the assignment, most or many of the speaker’s ascriptions of the terms come out true (e.g., Davidson 1973; and Lewis 1983). On that view, it does indeed seem hard to reconcile co-reference with a lack of convergence or agreement regarding how a term of the pertinent kind is to be applied. However, the charity-based approach is challenged by other metasemantical positions, including those which take the reference of at least some terms to be determined in ways that allow for more error. By invoking such a position, a realist could potentially deny Hare’s conclusion that the speakers in his scenario use “good” to refer (if at all) to different properties.

5.2 New Wave Moral Realism

That strategy has been pursued by Richard Boyd in defense of his naturalist form of moral realism, which is sometimes referred to as “new wave moral realism” (Boyd 1988, but see also Brink 1989). Boyd appeals to a causal theory of reference. His version of that approach is complex and differs in significant ways from more familiar versions (such as those offered in Putnam 1972 and Kripke 1980). But the main idea is that moral terms refer to the properties that “causally regulate” our uses of those terms, including our dispositions to apply them in particular cases. Such regulation presupposes that there are mechanisms which causally connect (instantiations of) the properties with the uses. Boyd insists that those mechanisms must ensure some tendency to apply the term reliably to actions, persons or states of affairs which have the properties in question, to secure a degree of epistemic access to them. However, he also stresses that this constraint does not preclude serious errors. Our use of “good” can be relevantly regulated by a certain property even if we are ignorant of it and even if our ignorance results in many affirmations which are false (given that the term refers to the property in question). Differences in our use of moral terms and sentences of the kind that Hare highlighted are therefore consistent with co-reference and accordingly also with thinking that there is a shared (factual) subject matter over which the people in his scenario express conflicting beliefs by using the pertinent terms and sentences.

However, although mere differences in application do not undermine co-reference on Boyd’s account, other factors do. That is the point of departure of a criticism which Terrence Horgan and Mark Timmons have developed in a series of influential papers (first set out in Horgan and Timmons 1991 and 1992), in which they argue that Boyd’s causal approach also commits realists to implications of the type Hare pointed to.

The argument is illustrated by the “Moral Twin Earth” thought experiment. Moral Twin Earth is a planet whose inhabitants speak a language which is similar to ours in that it includes the moral terms “good”, “right”, “wrong” and so on. Moreover, the social and psychological roles those terms play in their communities overlap with those they play in our communities. We may imagine, for example, that they figure in similar ways in their deliberations and discussions about how to act, and that the inhabitants are, like us, in general motivated to act and avoid acting in ways they classify as “right” and “wrong”, respectively. A further stipulation—a crucial one in this context—is that the inhabitants’ uses of the pertinent terms are causally regulated by different properties than those that regulate our uses of them. Thus, their use of “right” is regulated by the property actions have by satisfying certain deontological requirements, while ours is regulated by the consequentialist property actions have when maximizing happiness. Given that stipulation, “right” does not, on Boyd’s account, refer to the same property for us and for them. So, again, the disputes we might have with them about how to apply “right” need not reflect any conflicts of belief. What Horgan and Timmons suggest, however, in a way which mirrors Hare’s argumentation, is that it would still be plausible to construe our disputes with them regarding how to apply it as genuine moral disagreements, in virtue of the overlap in social and psychological roles (for a different critique of Boyd’s approach, see Schroeter and Schroeter 2013).

5.3 Further Developments and Responses

The Moral Twin Earth thought experiment has led philosophers to explore other metasemantical options, besides Boyd’s causal theory, which realists may use to argue that they can accommodate the pertinent intuitions about when people are in a genuine moral disagreement. These options include conceptual role semantics (Wedgwood 2001) and David Lewis’ views on “reference magnetism” (van Roojen 2006; Dunaway and McPherson 2016; Williams 2016; see Eklund 2017 for further discussion). The general problem that those alternative suggestions are intended to solve can be indicated as follows. Horgan’s and Timmons’ argument suggests that the fact that a speaker’s use of “right” is regulated by a certain property is of limited relevance to the plausibility of viewing us as being in a genuine disagreement when discussing its application. What matters are instead the considerations pertaining to the social and psychological roles the term plays in the speaker’s community and in his or her deliberations. To accommodate the intuitions the moral twin earth thought experiment evokes (and to handle new scenarios that antirealists might come up with), what realists seem to need is thus an account to the effect that those very considerations are enough to secure co-reference. That is, the account must entail that the features that tempt us to interpret the speaker as being in a genuine moral disagreement with us are the same as, or at least reliably correlated with, the features on which co-reference is taken to supervene.

The difficulties of developing an account which fits that bill are elevated by the fact that there are further requirements it arguably must meet. One such additional requirement is that the account must be plausibly applicable also to other domains besides morality (see Schroeter and Schroeter 2013 and Dunaway and McPherson 2016 for discussions of the relevant constraints). To design an account of reference which entails that there is co-reference in exactly the cases where we intuitively think that people disagree in scenarios such as the Moral Twin Earth one may not be such a difficult task. But the idea behind the additional requirement is that this would be ad hoc if the account were only applicable to moral terms (or to normative terms in general). Note in this context that Boyd takes his account to apply not only to moral terms but to natural kind terms quite generally (which is the type he thinks that “good” and “right” are instances of), including “water” and “gold”. If one were to drop that “generality constraint”, allowing for a metasemantic view that applies just to moral or other normative terms, then the task for the realist would be simpler.

Is there a way to justify such a move? In this connection, one might wonder if it would help the moral realist to be a non-naturalist about the nature of moral properties, i.e., to hold that they are not reducible to natural properties and (on some characterizations of the theory) to assume that they are sui generis and causally inert. That is an issue which has not been in the foreground in the debate following the Horgan’s and Timmons’ contributions, as they specifically target Boyd’s (and Brink’s) naturalist form of realism.

Whether non-naturalism really is less vulnerable to the challenge is not clear, however. On the one hand, the assumption that moral properties are sui generis may help realists to defend the exceptionalist view that the reference of moral terms is determined in a special way (at least along with terms in other domains that deal with non-natural properties). On the other hand, explaining how our moral terms have come to refer to such properties may be extra difficult, especially given the further assumption that they are causally inert (the issue is discussed in Suikkanen 2017). It should also be noted that the soundness of at least the charity-based versions of the challenge seems unaffected by what view one takes on the nature of moral properties. On those versions, systematic differences regarding the application of moral terms threaten to undermine co-reference regardless of whether the candidate properties to which those terms refer are taken to be non-natural or not.

The responses that so far have been discussed are aimed to show that realists are not in fact committed to the allegedly implausible implications (viz., that certain moral disputes are merely apparent) to which antirealists seek to tie them. Another type of response is to bite the bullet, to insist that the pertinent implications are after all acceptable, and to explain away their counter-intuitiveness in a way which is consistent with realism.

On one such suggestion, the parties of some disputes about how to apply “right” or “good” do indeed use the terms to refer to different properties. But what they really disagree about is which property the terms should be used to refer to, in some non-moral sense of “should” (see, e.g., Merli 2002 and Plunkett and Sundell 2013). Presumably, however, this suggestion helps the realist only if that other, background dispute can in turn be construed as a conflict of belief. So, if the challenge could be extended to cover the “should” which is relevant in that context as well, which it seems hard to rule out, nothing much is accomplished (see Tersman 2006, 100 and Dunaway and McPherson 2016, 661, for this point).

A different option is to concede that the appearance in the relevant cases of a genuine dispute is best explained in terms of clashes of conative attitudes, and to stress that this explanation is not incompatible with realism. After all, realists can consistently agree that moral convictions are usually accompanied with such attitudes (see Jackson and Pettit 1998 for this point). By making that response, realists in effect give up trying to account for the cases by using assumptions that form a part of their theory. For even if the assumption that the cases involve clashing attitudes is not inconsistent with realism it is also not entailed by it. A potential problem with that type of response is raised by the natural view that the justification of a theory about moral semantics (such as the form of cognitivism which forms a component of realism) depends at least in part on its ability to explain how people behave or relate to disputes about how to apply moral terms. The relevant facts include the willingness of such disputants to see themselves as standing in genuine opposition to each other. Thus, if, in some cases, that fact is best explained by assumptions that are external to that theory, then some bits of the relevant evidence fail to support it. That is a potential disadvantage of the pertinent response, although there may obviously be other sets of evidence which make up for the (alleged) loss (see further Tersman 2006, ch. 5 and Björnsson 2012).

6. Over-Generalization and Self-Defeat Worries

Widespread disagreement occurs not only in ethics but in just about any domain, including the sciences. A longstanding worry about skeptical or antirealist arguments from moral disagreement has therefore been that they generate analogous conclusions about those other domains as well (e.g., Brink 1989 and Huemer 2005). More recently, the debate has come to focus not only on the empirical sciences but also on areas such as mathematics (Clarke-Doane 2020) and other philosophical areas besides ethics, including epistemology, metaphysics and metaethics itself (e.g., Shafer-Landau 2006; Cuneo 2007).

According to the idea which underlies the concern, the skeptical or antirealist arguments from disagreement that apply to ethics and the versions that apply to the other domains are equally compelling. The suggestion that this kind of parity obtains is in turn offered as an objection to the arguments, as it is supposed to show that they “over-generalize” and lead to “too much” skepticism or antirealism. Why too much? That is, why cannot those who favor the arguments just embrace their alleged wider implications as yet being, though perhaps surprising and unintended, perfectly acceptable? Two answers to that question can be discerned. (The distinction between the answers is noted in Tersman 2010 and in Pöltzler 2020.)

On the first answer, the parity undermines the skeptical or antirealist arguments because there are independent reasons for rejecting the conclusions they yield when applied to the other areas (it is assumed here that those reasons do not in turn undermine the parity claim). This would arguably cast doubts on the arguments. For if they yield incorrect conclusions in those contexts, why think that they do a better job in the case of ethics? In other words, the idea is that the parity provides resources for a reductio ad absurdum of sorts of the arguments.

Which are the independent reasons that may back up such a challenge? One option is to appeal to the sheer counter-intuitiveness of the wider implications. Thus, Shafer-Landau writes:

If intractable disagreement […] is enough to warrant an antirealist diagnosis of an area, then the whole of philosophy must be demoted. That simply is implausible: there really is (or isn’t) such a thing as probabilistic causation, numbers without spatio-temporal location, actions that are both free and determined, etc. (2006, 220).

Others raise more specific objections of this kind. For example, Frank Jackson (1999) targets arguments for moral non-cognitivism and claims that they, when appropriately adjusted, provide equal support for non-cognitivism about theoretical rationality (i.e., judgments about when beliefs are rational). The latter view is in turn criticized on the ground that it commits one, via certain (contestable) assumptions about the nature of beliefs, to think “that there are no believers and no beliefs” (423). The absurdity of that implication is taken by Jackson to refute non-cognitivism about theoretical rationality. But he also takes it to undermine the arguments that are used in its support, and therefore also the versions of those arguments which apply to ethics (even if no similarly absurd implication can be directly derived from moral non-cognitivism).

How can advocates of arguments from moral disagreement respond to such challenges? The prospects depend partly on which other domain(s) ethics is compared with. A connection of the pertinent sort with some domains may result in less pressing problems than a connection with others. For example, the jury is arguably still out regarding antirealism about mathematics, as such positions do have able defenders (e.g., Field 1989). So, if an overgeneralization challenge depends on the implausibility of those positions, there is some room for advocates of the arguments to resist the objection.

The second answer to why the alleged parity between ethics and other domains undermines arguments from disagreement may generate a more decisive objection, however. On that answer, the parity makes the arguments self-defeating and the position of their advocates incoherent.

That type of challenge can in turn take different forms. A straightforward way to argue that an argument is self-defeating is to show that its advocates are committed to claims that are outright inconsistent with it (i.e., either with its conclusion or with its premises). Consider for example an argument which is aimed at establishing the error-theoretical thesis that all moral claims are false. If that argument can be extended to metaethics, so that it commits its advocates to thinking that all metaethical claims are false as well (including the error theory), then they have obviously ended up in an awkward place.

Another type of self-defeat or incoherence is epistemic, as contrasted with the “strict” type just indicated. An argument is epistemically self-defeating, we may say, if we by affirming it commit ourselves to thinking that at least one of its elements is unjustified (rather than false). That is the type of incoherence that Derek Parfit has tried to saddle moral non-cognitivists with by stressing (like Jackson) that they are committed to non-cognitivism about theoretical rationality as well. Parfit takes the latter view to imply that “to call a thing rational is not to state a matter of fact” (2011, 409). And the problem for the moral non-cognitivist which he discerns is that “[i]f there could not be truths about what it is rational to believe […] it could not be rational to believe anything”, including moral non-cognitivism.

Parfit makes a problematic move by deriving the normative claim that it is not rational to believe in non-cognitivism from a metanormative thesis about what it is to state such a claim. But it is easy enough to come up with other examples of epistemic self-defeat. Thus, consider an argument aimed at establishing global moral skepticism. Any such argument must invoke some epistemological principle via which the skeptical conclusion can be derived. So, if the argument applies just as well (mutatis mutandis) to epistemology and shows that we lack justified beliefs in that area as well, then it commits its advocates to thinking that one of its premises is not justified. This type of incoherence is presumably less worrying than the first one, as it neither rules out the validity of the argument nor the truth of its premises. But it is clearly sufficiently worrying to raise concerns about the target argument’s dialectical significance (see Sampson 2019 for discussion).

The above discussion illustrates that an argument’s vulnerability to an overgeneralization challenge depends on which other domain(s) the challenge focuses on, as well as on the conclusion of the argument (whether it pursues a local or global form of moral skepticism, for example). However, it also depends on how the argument reaches its conclusion and on which further premises it involves besides the one that postulates disagreement.

The last point is important. The most straightforward way to respond to an overgeneralization objection is to insist that there are after all crucial differences between the disagreement that occurs in ethics and that which occur in the other areas. This is what Mackie did by suggesting that scientific disagreements, unlike moral ones, result from speculative inferences or inadequate evidence. Whether the disagreements are different in such ways is an empirical issue which is hard to resolve. However, the fact that any argument from moral disagreement involves further premises besides that which posits disagreement leaves their advocates with other options when trying to challenge the relevant parity claim. That is, it potentially allows them to concede that there is “just as much” or “just as deep” disagreement in ethics and the other areas and still consistently argue that the disagreement that occurs in those areas license different conclusions about their status.

Take for example the semantical arguments which were considered in the previous section. They rely on the idea that it is counter-intuitive to construe certain disputes over the application of moral terms as being merely apparent. In analogous disputes in epistemology, such as those between internalists and externalists about when to classify beliefs as “justified”, such a diagnosis may be more acceptable. At least, that is the upshot of a suggestion by William Alston, who indicates that it helps explain the lack of convergence in epistemology (see Alston 2005a, esp. ch. 1; Alston 2005b, 137; and Tersman 2010).

Additional options are generated by the above-mentioned idea that although appeals to moral disagreement are not capable of establishing any skeptical or antirealist conclusions on their own, they may do so when combined with other strategies, such as the evolutionary debunking ones. Such a combined strategy might be more promising in the moral case than, say, in the epistemological case. A crucial assumption in evolutionary debunking arguments is that an evolutionary explanation of our moral convictions does not support their reliability (although it may be consistent with it). Whether that is so in the case of our epistemic convictions is a separate issue and may call for a different answer, which potentially leaves room for a different assessment of a combined argument which is applied in that context (see further Tersman 2010).

The availability of these ways to respond to overgeneralization objections adds to the difficulties of reaching a conclusive assessment of them and thus also to the difficulty of assessing the arguments that provide their target themselves. It thereby confirms a more general observation, namely, that while each of the skeptical or antirealist arguments surveyed above involves problematic elements, quick and impatient dismissals of appeals to moral disagreement are often similarly dubious. That may be frustrating but is also unsurprising. The discussion about the metaethical significance of moral disagreement raises intricate and philosophically central issues about knowledge, justification, how reference is determined, and so on. This helps to explain why progress is slower than one might desire but also why the phenomenon commands continued attention from philosophers.


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