Notes to W.E.B. Du Bois

1. See Jaeggi and Celikates (2017) for the idea that social philosophy comprises social ontology, social theory, the philosophy of the social sciences, and the diagnosis of social problems.

2. The neglect of DuBois’s contributions to sociology and, indeed, to the founding of sociology as an academic discipline by the mainstream, “white,” sociological establishment is beyond the scope of the present entry, but has been insightfully discussed at length by Green and Driver (1976), Rabaka (2010), and Morris (2015).

3. See Gooding-Williams (2009, 58–65) and Appiah (2014, 29–37) for discussion of the parallels between Du Bois’s analysis of the Negro problem and the treatment of “the social question” in the writings of Du Bois’s German mentor, Gustav Schmoller (for Schmoller’s racist views regarding “the Negro” and other “lower races, ” which Du Bois doubtlessly rejected, see Zimmerman (2010, 109–111)). In a related vein, Karen Fields has identified parallels between Du Bois’s and Durkheim’s intellectual itineraries. Specifically noting that Du Bois’s and Durkheim’s “common historical context…was a time when ‘the Negro problem’ in America and ‘the Jewish Question’ in France imposed themselves on the lives of talented individuals,” Fields imagines an 1899 conversation between the two thinkers “about the agendas each had for the properly sociological posing of social problems” (see Fields and Fields, 2012, 235, 248).

4. For critical analysis of Du Bois’s historical-explanatory account of the history of the Negro problems, see Outlaw (2000).

5. See Gooding-Williams (2009, chapter 5) for a critical appraisal Du Bois’s analysis of Negro problems in the perspective of Frederick Douglass’s analysis of the same. See Chandler (2014, chapter 1) for the argument that Du Bois’s discussion of Negro problems should be regarded not simply as pertaining to a distinct object of sociological inquiry, but as a lens for rethinking a range of philosophical issues. Chandler’s argument takes it’s bearing from Du Bois’s discussion of Negro problems in the concluding chapter of The Philadelphia Negro (1899).

6. Gooding-Williams (2009, 277n.140), Rabaka (2010, 334), and Bright (2017, 5) maintain that “The Study of the Negro Problems” can be read as articulating the methodological framework shaping Du Bois’s monumental study of the Philadelphia Seventh Ward, The Philadelphia Negro (1899).

7. See Haslanger (2012), chapter 3 and Mallon (2014) for the distinction between saying that something is socially constructed causally and saying that it is socially constructed constitutively. The present discussion follows Haslanger’s account of the distinction, which (roughly) distinguishes between saying that social factors play a significant role in causing something to be the sort of thing it is and saying that social factors play an indispensable role in defining what it is to be that sort of thing.

8. This brief account of the late nineteenth century German debate about the Geisteswissenschaften relies on Anderson (2003) and Edwards (2006). See Bernasconi (2009) for discussion of “Conservation” in the context of Du Bois’s address to The American Negro Academy.

9. See Gooding-Williams (2009, 47–49) for a more detailed analysis of the affinities between Du Bois’s and Dilthey’s accounts of the Geisteswissenschaften. See Appiah (2014, 78-82) for the thought that Du Bois evocation of the lived experience of being black in The Souls of Black Folk owes something to Dilthey’s treatment of the distinction between Erklären (explanation) and Verstehen (understanding), and to Dilthey’s understanding of Verstehen as a sort of empathy. See Chandler (2014, 34–35) for a discussion of the importance of the concept of Verstehen to the general trajectory of Du Bois’ thinking. Although Du Bois never mentions the concept of Verstehen in “The Conservation of Races” (1897), he seems to invoke it in “The Study of the Negro Problems” (1898) when he describes the object of “sociological interpretation” as “the expression of Negro life” and the manifestation of “a distinct social mind” (92). See 3.3 above for an account of Du Bois’s defense of the thesis that social scientists’ use of Verstehen can be morally significant.

10. For a more detailed discussion of Du Bois’s rejection of the reductionism characteristic of the nineteenth century racial sciences, see Gooding-Williams, 1996, 47–48 and Gooding-Williams, 2009, 45–52.

11. In Robert Bernasconi’s felicitous formulation, “historians and sociologists were capable of recognizing race when they saw it” (emphasis mine). See Bernasconi, 2009, 521.

12. Here, we consider only Appiah, 1985 and Appiah, 1992. Appiah’s 2014 reading and criticism of Du Bois is driven by concerns different from the preoccupations that animated his earlier efforts. Whereas Appiah, 1985 and 1992, presents himself as completing Du Bois’s argument for repudiating race as a term of difference, Appiah, 2014, presents himself as completing Du Bois’s account of the Negro race as composed of people who share a socially made identity. In addition, Appiah, 2014, explicitly distances himself, “at least in emphasis,” from his 1985 interpretation of “The Conservation of Races” (2014, 200, n.7).

13. For criticism of Outlaw’s claim that Du Bois advances a cluster concept of race, see Gooding-Williams, 1996, 44–45, Gooding-Williams, 2009, 42–44, and Gray 2013, 475 (Gray himself defends a normative interpretation of Du Bois’s criteria for races). See also, in this connection, Glasgow, 2010.

14. Several philosophers have taken issue with Taylor’s response to Appiah. See, e.g., Gooding-Williams, 2009, 270–271n.79; Glasgow, 2010, 327–331; and Jeffers, 2013, 413–414. For Taylor’s response to Glasgow, see Taylor, 2014, passim.

15. Here, we follow Taylor (2013).

16. In a related and similarly historicist vein, Tommy Curry has made a case for interpreting “Conservation” in the perspective of 19th century “Black ethnological challenges to white pseudo-science” (Curry, 2014, 17).

17. Though Jeffers never uses the phrase “constitutively constructed,” it seems to me that the concept of constitutive construction (see n7 above) aptly captures his thinking. For a similarly attentive discussion of the “political” conception of race evident in “The Conservation of Races,” see Fisher, 2014, 175–176.

18. Jeffers mentions the work of Sally Haslanger and Charles Mills as providing recent examples of political constitutive constructionism (what Jeffers calls “the political theory of race”). See Haslanger, 2012, chapters 3 and 7; see Mills, 1997, 67.

19. Jeffers notes that Bernard Boxill (1992) has also attributed a cultural theory of race to Du Bois.

20. Glasgow (see Jeffers et. al., 2013) raises related questions in his exchange with Jeffers about the cultural theory of race.

21. For extended discussion of Jeffers’s defense of this commitment, see Jeffers et. al., 2013.

22. For criticism of Taylor’s defense of Du Bois’s “Jim Crow car” conceptualization of race, see Glasgow, 2010. For Taylor’s response to Glasgow, see Taylor, 2014. For brief criticism of the plausibility of construing race as a Searlean institutional fact see Haslanger, 2012, chapter 10, n5. On Appiah’s brief but suggestive account (2016, 113, 140, and 157–158), Du Bois’s reference to “riding Jim Crow” gestures in the direction of the thesis that “Negro” names a nominal, socially constructed, and normatively shaped identity—a thesis that Appiah defends, that Appiah believes Du Bois’s work encourages, and that Appiah believes Du Bois himself never “fully” endorsed.

23. Here, the reading follows Geuss, 1994.

24. In his discussion of Dusk of Dawn, Chandler (2014, chapter 2) gives an insightful account of Du Bois’s treatment of the relation between concept and exemplification that has significant affinities to the account presented here, and that Chandler likewise connects to Nietzsche’s and Foucault’s notions of genealogy. Chandler (2014, 223) also takes Foucault to task for omitting Du Bois from his genealogy of genealogy.

25. Considering that, from the 1930s onward, Du Bois often writes in a neo-Marxist register, he may well have understood his genealogical account of race, and especially the thesis that historically formed concepts can function as mechanisms of power and control, as a contribution to theoretical debates about the nature of ideology in the Marxist tradition. Thanks to Tommie Shelby for pointing this out to me.

26. On one interpretation, Du Bois’s approach to the moral psychology of white supremacy accords with Peter Brian Barry’s view that “moral vices are best understood as complicated multitrack dispositions that dispose their agents to perform certain actions in certain circumstances for certain constitutive reasons with certain constitutive feelings, and so forth” (Barry, 2013, 57).

27. In framing the discussion of Du Bois’s understanding of the aims sociological inquiry, we follow Bright’s analysis (see Bright, 2017), which raises several important issues that are not addressed here—e.g., whether Du Bois distinguishes between true belief and knowledge and whether his account of the immediate aim of science should be interpreted in normative-psychological terms or as making a claim about a constitutive goal of science qua science.

28. The rationality involved here is “instrumental” or “technocratic” rationality. For a critical appraisal of this still persistent approach to the solution of race-relate social problems, see Shelby, 2016, 2–3.

29. The phrase “collectivist holism” is borrowed from Descombes, 2014. For the related suggestion that the argument of “Sociology Hesitant” involves a defense of methodological individualism, see Bright, 2017. For an argument that the early Du Bois defends a version of holism, see Gooding-Williams, 2009, 139–142.

30. For a strikingly similar recollection, see the 1958 letter that Du Bois penned to Herbert Aptheker on the occasion of having just finished reading Aptheker’s History and Reality. The relevant part of the letter is quoted in by Curry, 2014, 24, n.2.

31. Ronald Judy (2000, 33–34) interprets Du Bois’s reference to the assumption of chance as a Charles Sanders Pierce-echoing metaphysical claim, not as a statement of methodological principle. For a brief summary of the role of chance in Pierce’s metaphysics, see Hacking, 1990, 214–215.

32. The discussion here of James’s approach to the philosophical debate about free will and determinism is indebted to Viney, 1986.

33. For a different account of the significance of Du Bois’s discussion of a science of chance, and of the relation of that discussion to James’s and Royce’s impact on Du Bois’s thinking, see Appiah, 2014, 144–147.

34. Bright (2017,4) maintains that, as early as “Sociology Hesitant,” Du Bois held “that social scientists can, through their work, empirically discover or confirm moral facts.”

35. See Gooding-Williams, 1987, for a more detailed reconstruction of Washington’s argument.

36. For a discussion of Crummell’s philosophical thought, see Thompson, 2014.

37. For a brief overview of the Dunning School’s account of Reconstruction, and of the place of Black Reconstruction in the history of revisionist interpretations of that account, see the “Preface” to Foner, 1988. Du Bois’s engagement with Marxist social and political thought is evident in several essays he wrote before he published Black Reconstruction. For a brief overview, see Shelby, 2007, 80–81.

38. For an extended line of argument, in the same vein, see Du Bois, The World and Africa, 161–163.

39. In this connection, it is worth noting that Appiah defends the view that Du Bois was a cosmopolitan nationalist (see Appiah, 2014, chapter 2).

40. Although Du Bois scholars have largely neglected Du Bois’s use of Freud, they have not been indisposed to interpret Du Bois through a Freudian, psychoanalytic lens. Currently the best and most extensive effort in this vein is Eugene Victor Wolfenstein, 2007.

41. For a different view, see Harris, 2004.

Copyright © 2017 by
Robert Gooding-Williams <>

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