W.E.B. Du Bois

First published Wed Sep 13, 2017

William Edward Burghardt Du Bois (1868–1963) believed that his life acquired its only deep significance through its participation in what he called “the Negro problem,” or, later, “the race problem.” Whether that is true or not, it is difficult to think of anyone, at any time, who examined the race problem in its many aspects more profoundly, extensively, and subtly than W.E.B. Du Bois. Du Bois was an activist and a journalist, a historian and a sociologist, a novelist, a critic, and a philosopher—but it is the race problem that unifies his work in these many domains.

Du Bois contributes to our specifically philosophical understanding of race and the race problem, because he treats these themes as objects of philosophical consideration—indeed, it is largely through an engagement with Du Bois’s work that many contemporary philosophers have come to appreciate race and race-related concerns as fruitful topics of philosophical reflection. Through his work in social philosophy, political philosophy, and the philosophy of art, Du Bois, for all intents and purposes, invented the field of philosophy and race, thereby unsettling and revising our views of the proper scope and aims of philosophical inquiry.

1. Du Bois’s Life and Major Publications

1868 Born, William Edward Burghardt Du Bois, Great Barrington, Massachusetts, February 23.
1884 Graduates from Great Barrington High School.
1885 Enters Fisk University, Nashville Tennessee, with sophomore standing.
1888 Receives BA from Fisk. Delivers commencement oration on Otto von Bismarck. Enters Harvard College as a junior.
1889–90 Takes philosophy courses with William James, George Santayana, and F.G. Peabody.
1890 Graduates from Harvard College with a BA, cum laude, in philosophy. Delivers commencement oration on Jefferson Davis.
1892 Awarded a grant from the Slater Fund to study at Friedrich Wilhelm University in Berlin, where he works closely with Gustav von Schmoller, leader of the younger German Historical School.
1893 Slater Fund Grant extended for one year.
1894 Denied further aid from the Slater fund. Unable to fulfill residency requirements for obtaining a doctoral degree from Friedrich Wilhelm University, returns to Great Barrington. Takes an appointment to teach Classics at Wilberforce University in Xenia, Ohio.
1895 Awarded a PhD in History from Harvard, he is the first black to receive a PhD from Harvard.
1896 Published his doctoral dissertation, The Suppression of the African Slave-Trade to the United States of America, 1638–1870, as the first volume of Harvard’s Historical Monograph Series. Hired by the University of Pennsylvania to conduct a sociological study of the black population of Philadelphia’s Seventh Ward.
1897 Joins fellow black intellectuals to found the American Negro Academy, an organization devoted to promoting black scholarly achievement. Appointed professor of history and economics at Atlanta University, where he begins to edit the Atlanta University Studies (1898–1914).
1899 Publishes The Philadelphia Negro.
1903 Publishes The Souls of Black Folk.
1909 Publishes John Brown, a biography.
1910 Appointed director of research and publications for the NAACP. Begins to edit The Crisis, an official publication of the NAACP.
1911 Publishes Quest of the Silver Fleece, his first novel.
1915 Publishes The Negro.
1919 Organizes first Pan-African Conference in Paris.
1920 Publishes Darkwater: Voices from within the Veil
1919 Attends the second, Pan-African Conference in London.
1924 Publishes The Gift of Black Folk: The Negroes in the Making of America.
1928 Publishes a second novel, Dark Princess: A Romance.
1934 Resigns as editor of The Crisis and from the NAACP. Appointed Editor-in-Chief of The Encyclopedia of the Negro.
1935 Publishes Black Reconstruction.
1939 Publishes Black Folk, Then and Now, a revision of The Negro.
1940 Publishes Dusk of Dawn, an autobiography. Founds and begins to edit Phylon, a quarterly journal examining issues of race and culture.
1944 Named the first black member of the National Institute of Arts and Letters. Publishes “My Evolving Program for Negro Freedom” in What the Negro Wants, ed. Rayford Logan.
1945 Attends the fifth Pan-African conference in Manchester, England. PublishesColor and Democracy: Colonies and Peace. In protest of conferences held in segregated hotels, resigns his membership in the American Association of University Professors.
1947 Edits and writes the introduction to “An Appeal to the World: A Statement on the Denial of Human Rights to Minorities in the Case of Citizens of Negro Descent in the United States of America and an Appeal to the United Nations for Redress.” Publishes The World and Africa.
1951 Indicted under the McCormick Act for being an “unregistered foreign agent.” Acquitted after a five-day trial.
1952 Publishes In Battle for Peace, an account of the trial.
1957 Publishes The Ordeal of Mansart, the first volume of the Black Flame trilogy of historical novels.
1959 Publishes Mansart Builds a School, the second volume of the Black Flame trilogy.
1961 Publishes Worlds of Color, the third volume of the Black Flame trilogy. Accepts Kwame Nkrumah’s invitation to move to Ghana.
1963 Becomes a citizen of Ghana. Dies in Accra, Ghana, August 27, on the eve of the March on Washington for Jobs and Freedom. Roy Wilkins announces Du Bois’s death at the March, remarking “that at the dawn of the twentieth century his was the voice that was calling you to gather here today in this cause. If you want to read something that applies to 1963 go back and get a volume The Souls of Black Folk by Du Bois, published in 1903.”
1968 Posthumous publication of The Autobiography of W.E.B. Du Bois.

2. Social Philosophy, The Negro Problem, and Race

Over the course of his career, Du Bois’s social philosophy comprised contributions to social ontology, social theory, the philosophy of the human and social sciences, and the diagnosis of social problems.[1] His analysis of the nature of a social problem and, specifically, his diagnosis of the Negro problem; his social constructionist accounts of race and racial differences; his ongoing reflection on the methods, purposes, and sometimes moral significance of social inquiry; and his elaboration of the claim that the concept of race, operating as a mechanism of power, structures relations of social domination, all played a critical role in what he ultimately came to call his “evolving program for Negro freedom” (1944, 31). The present section bears on Du Bois’s analysis of the Negro problem and his contributions to the philosophy of race. Section 3, below, focuses on his contributions to the philosophy of the social sciences.

2.1 What is the Negro Problem?

Du Bois considers the Negro Problem both objectively and subjectively—both from the standpoint of science and from the standpoint of lived experience.

2.1.1 The Negro Problem Objectively Considered

In “The Study of the Negro Problems” (1898), one of his earliest publications, Du Bois responded to then contemporary discussions of America’s “Negro problem” by conceptualizing the problem as an object of social scientific inquiry. Sociology studies social phenomena, and the social phenomena that interest Du Bois are the cluster of social problems affecting American Negroes (the Negro is not a problem, in his view, although problems affect the Negro [see Gordon, 2000]). In the perspective of sociology, the Negro problem just is a cluster of social problems (1898, 77–78).[2] But what is a social problem?[3]

Du Bois answers this question by defining a social problem as “the failure of an organized social group to realize its group ideals, through the inability to adapt a certain desired line of action to given conditions of life” (1898, 78). One example is the failure to enact the ideal of a luxurious home life due to prevailing marriage customs. Another is the failure to enact the ideal of economic and social development due to crime and lawlessness.

The historical evolution of the social problems that Du Bois identifies as Negro problems has been a “baffling adjustment of action and condition which is the essence of progress” (1898, 82).[4] Turning to the present, Du Bois characterizes the then current (circa 1898) Negro problems as so many failures to enact the ideal of incorporating the Negro masses into the group life of the American people. Du Bois attributes these failures to two causes: white racial prejudice towards Negroes and Negro cultural backwardness. Racial prejudice is the conviction “that people of Negro blood should not be admitted into the group life of the nation no matter what their condition may be” (1898, 82). Cultural backwardness is economic disadvantage, ignorance, and deficiency with regard to the art of organized social life. Each of these causes accounts for one of two distinct classes of Negro problems (1898, 82–3).[5]

Du Bois’s social ontology and causal explanation of Negro problems lay the basis for his research agenda. The study of the Negro as a social group focuses on Negro problems that have arisen independently of racial prejudice in the Negro’s social environment. In turn, the study of the Negro’s social environment considers Negro problems that have resulted from racial prejudice. Du Bois’s program for studying the Negro as a social group includes historical study, statistical investigation, anthropological measurement, and sociological interpretation.[6]

2.1.2 The Negro Problem Subjectively Considered

In Du Bois’s view, the Negro Problem is a subjectively lived and felt social condition, not only an object of social scientific inquiry. In “Strivings of the Negro People” (1897b) and The Souls of Black Folk (1903a), Du Bois adduces the concept of double-consciousness to characterize the subjectively lived and felt experience of the Negro problem. Ascribing double consciousness specifically to the Negro, Du Bois characterizes it as a “sense of always looking at oneself through the eyes of others, of measuring one’s soul by the tape of a world that looks on in amused contempt and pity” (1903a, 3). In Du Bois’s view, double-consciousness obtains when blacks see themselves through the pitying and contemptuous eyes of the racially prejudiced whites whose racial prejudice is one of the causes of the Negro problem.

The concept of double-consciousness is the most extensively discussed concept in the humanities and social sciences secondary literature on Du Bois, and it has received substantial attention from philosophers. The present, brief discussion of the concept is intended simply to situate it within the larger context of Du Bois’s social philosophy. For a more detailed account of Du Bois’s understanding of double consciousness and a survey of contemporary philosophical disputes about the content and significance of the concept, see the entry on double consciousness.

2.2 What is a Negro? What is a Race? What is Whiteness?

In “The Study of the Negro Problems,” Du Bois predicates his analysis of Negro problems on his analysis of social problems as such; in another early essay, “The Conservation of Races” (1897a), he similarly predicates his answer to the question, “What is a Negro?” on an answer to a more fundamental question, “What is a race?” Du Bois turns to the human sciences to say what a race is, but also to account for the existence of spiritually distinct races. Du Bois’s historical-sociological definition of race overlaps his historical-sociological explanation of the existence of spiritually distinct races. To put the point more precisely, and in an idiom that is familiar to contemporary philosophers, Du Bois holds that the same sorts of historical and social factors construct race both constitutively and causally.[7]

We begin by analyzing Du Bois’s explanation of the distinctiveness of distinct races. We then turn to his definition of race, which he introduces to counter the objection that, because spiritually distinct races cannot be identified as races from the perspective of the natural sciences, they cannot be identified as races at all. After considering contemporary philosophers’ ongoing debates about Du Bois’s definition of race in “Conservation,” we turn to Du Bois’s later treatments of race and the notion of whiteness in Dusk of Dawn (1940), Black Reconstruction (1935), and “The Souls of White Folk” (in Darkwater (1920)).

2.2.1 Explaining Race

In explaining and defining race, Du Bois participates in a turn-of-the-century conversation in German philosophy about the subjects and methods that distinguish the human from the natural sciences—that is, the Geisteswissenschaften from the Naturwissenschaften. Responding to Auguste Comte’s and J.S. Mill’s efforts to reform the human sciences on the model of the natural sciences, German scholars addressed a variety of questions as to the human sciences’ cognitive aims, possible methodological autonomy, and dependence on psychology. When Du Bois arrived in Berlin in 1892, the conversation was well underway and had already benefitted from the significant contributions of Wilhelm Dilthey and Wilhelm Wundt several years earlier. During the 1890s there were further contributions, in particular the writings of Georg Simmel, Wilhelm Windelband, and Heinrich Rickert. Although Du Bois initially presented “The Conservation of Races” as an address to the American Negro Academy, the essay was a significant addition to the German debate, for it marks Du Bois’s turn from the Naturwissenschaften to the Geisteswissenschaften to explain the differences between races and to conceptualize racial identities.[8]

Although Du Bois’s essay acknowledges, as the “final word of science, so far,” that physical differences distinguish “at least two, perhaps three, great families of human beings—the whites and Negroes, possibly the yellow race” (1897a, 52), it more importantly maintains that that there exist eight, spiritually distinct races. It also maintains that each spiritually distinct race, as such, is causally constructed by historical and social factors, for it asserts that each spiritually distinct race causally owes its spiritual distinctiveness (its peculiar message, which dictates its particular historical role) to such factors—specifically, to the common histories, laws, religions, habits of thought, and conscious strivings that have caused it to be the cohesive, spiritually distinct race it is (1897, 54–56).

Du Bois also holds that the spiritual distinctiveness of a socio-historical race cannot be explained in terms of physical, biological facts. Like Wilhelm Dilthey, whose Introduction to the Human Sciences (1883) had appeared a decade before Du Bois heard him lecture in Berlin, he expressly questions the possibility of causal explanations that reduce spiritual facts and differences to biological facts and differences.[9] Thus, Du Bois rejects the physio-biological reductionism characteristic of nineteenth century racial science: the thesis that physical racial differences causally explain the spiritual and cultural differences between racial groups. Spiritual differences have historical and social causes (law, religion, and so on), which Du Bois takes to be causally independent of biological racial facts (1897a, 54–55).[10]

2.2.2 Defining Race

Having sketched a preliminary account of the “subtle forces” that have causally divided human beings into spiritually distinct races, Du Bois writes that, while these races “perhaps transcend scientific definition, nevertheless, [they] are clearly defined to the eye of the Historian and Sociologist” (1897a, 53).

That spiritually distinct groups may not be readily identified as races if one adopts the perspective of the natural sciences does not entail that they cannot be identified as races at all. Reminiscent of Dilthey, again, Du Bois holds that the natural sciences and the human sciences have distinct subject matters (physical facts, on the one hand, spiritual facts on the other), and suggests that the former, because they conceptualize human beings exclusively in physical terms, cannot conceptualize them in terms of social and historical facts, and thus cannot conceptualize them in terms of the social and historical facts that define spiritually distinct groups as races (Du Bois’s reason for claiming that social and historical facts “transcend scientific definition”). If, however, one adopts the perspective of the human sciences; if, in other words, one adopts the conceptual “eyes” of the historian and the sociologist, then one sees these social and historical facts standing “clearly defined” to one’s point of view. From this point of view, Du Bois proposes, it is possible to identify spiritually distinct races as races,[11] and thus to state a definition of race—or, in other words, to specify the historical and social factors that constitute a group of human beings as a race.

What, then, is race? It is a vast family of human beings, generally of common blood and language, always of common history, traditions and impulses, who are both voluntarily and involuntarily striving together for the accomplishment of certain more or less vividly conceived ideals of life (1897a, 53).

Here, Du Bois’s distinguishes between the factors that generally (usually) characterize a race and the factors that must always characterize a race; that is, the factors that constitute a group of people as a race. Du Bois’s definition proposes that a group of human beings counts as a spiritually distinct race if, and only if, the members of the group have a common history, common traditions and impulses, and common (voluntary and involuntary) strivings; counting as members of a spiritually distinct race does not require a common blood or a common language, however, although the members of a spiritually distinct race may indeed speak the same language or have the same blood coursing through their veins (see Lott, 1992–93; Gooding-Williams, 1996 and 2009; and Sundstrom, 2003). Du Bois’s definition asserts that each spiritually distinct race is, as such, constitutively constructed by the historical and social factors the definition specifies as making a race a race.

It has not escaped notice that the list of historical and social factors that Du Bois identifies as causally constructing (as explaining) the existence and cohesiveness of spiritually distinct races—common histories, laws, religions, habits of thought, and conscious strivings—echoes the list of factors he identifies as constitutively constructing (as defining) a group of human beings as a spiritually distinct race—common history, traditions, impulses, and strivings (see Gooding-Williams, 2009, 51). To be sure, the lists are not identical. Still, we can reasonably assume that Du Bois means them to capture the same content, supposing that the traditions and impulses indicated in the second list include legal and religious traditions as well as persistent habits of thought. Du Bois holds not only that historical and social factors constitutively and causally construct spiritually distinct races, but, likewise, that the same kinds of historical and social factors constitutively and causally construct spiritually distinct races.

What, then, is a Negro? To be a Negro, Du Bois replies, is 1) to be a member of one of three biologically distinct races, and 2) to be a member of one of eight constitutively and causally constructed spiritually distinct races. The Negro is spiritually distinguished from other spiritually distinct races by its distinctive message, the content of which, Du Bois argues, is not yet fully articulated (1897, 55–56).

2.2.3 Debating Du Bois’s Explanation and Definition of Race

Contemporary philosophers have devoted considerable attention to Du Bois’s explanation and definition of race in “The Conservation of Races;” indeed, they have given more attention to Du Bois’s definition than to his treatment of any other philosophical issue. Nearly all that attention can be traced to Kwame Anthony Appiah’s engagement with Du Bois in “The Uncompleted Argument: Du Bois and the Illusion of Race” (Appiah, 1985), an expanded version of which Appiah published as the second chapter (“Illusions of Race”) of In My Father’s House (Appiah, 1992).

Appiah’s critique of Du Bois (see Appiah, 1985 and Appiah, 1992[12]) argues for three, key claims: 1) that Du Bois’s definition of race fails to state criteria that serve to individuate his eight, spiritually distinct races; 2) that, notwithstanding Du Bois’s intention to conceptualize race in socio-historical terms, the criteria he in fact uses to individuate spiritually distinct races comprise a physical, biological component—specifically, the idea of a common ancestry; and 3) that, notwithstanding his ongoing, post-“Conservation” efforts to substitute “a sociohistorical conception of race for the biological one,” the logic of his argument “leads naturally to the final repudiation of race as a term of difference” (Appiah, 1985, 34–35). Appiah endorses this conclusion, stating that “[t]he truth is that there are no races,” and that “the notion [of race] that Du Bois required, and that underlies the most hateful racisms of the modern era, refers to nothing in the world at all” (Appiah, 1992, 45).

For the most part, philosophical criticism of Appiah’s reading of Du Bois has targeted his analysis of Du Bois’s definition and his antirealism about race. In an early response to Appiah, Lucius Outlaw (1996, 28) argues that Du Bois’s definition of race is the articulation of a cluster concept, and not, as Appiah presumes, the statement of a set of conditions individually necessary and jointly sufficient to constitute a group of people as a race.[13] In addition, Outlaw (1996, 21–22, 28) defends, and attributes to Du Bois, a version of racial realism, according to which biological ancestry and physical characteristics play a role in defining race.

Other critics of Appiah’s reading of Du Bois have been less inclined than Outlaw to defend or to attribute to Du Bois a definition of race involving biological characteristics; rather they have tended to argue that, Appiah’s arguments to the contrary, Du Bois succeeded in advancing a plausible, non-biological, socio-historical definition of race. Paul Taylor (2000), for example, takes issue with Appiah’s claim that Du Bois’s appeal to “common history” as a criterion of individuation is circular, arguing that Appiah misconstrues Du Bois’s understanding of what it means for two individuals to have a history in common.[14] Ronald Sundstrom (2003) also defends Du Bois’s socio-historical definition, arguing that, on a metaphysical pluralist reading, it can do the work of individuation that Appiah says it cannot do. For Taylor and Sundstrom, Du Bois was a racial realist who cogently defended the thesis that race is a social kind.

More recently, Chike Jeffers and Robert Bernasconi have productively re-oriented the philosophical discussion of “Conservation” away from debates stemming from Appiah’s interpretation of the essay.[15] On Bernasconi’s account, these debates have tended to anachronism, and so tended to overlook the context-specific intentions animating Du Bois’s essay. In Jeffers’s view, the Appiah-inspired debates have missed a key distinction shaping Du Bois’s social constructionism.

According to Bernasconi, recent philosophical discussions of Du Bois’s explanation and definition of race “have tended to distort its meaning by imposing an alien question on it” (2009, 519). Rather than read “The Conservation of Races” in light of contemporary arguments about racial eliminativism (about whether, in Appiah’s words, race should be repudiated as a term of difference) and the proper referent of the concept of race, Bernasconi places Du Bois’s essay in its immediate political and historical setting. Specifically, he emphasizes Du Bois’s engagements with the thought of Edward Wilmot Blyden, Alexander Crummell and Frederick Douglass and argues that the intended point of the essay was “to give hope to blacks at a time when scientists were questioning their future on the basis of suspicions about the impact of race mixing on their capacity to survive the struggle for existence” (2009, 536).[16] With Bernasconi’s intervention, debate about Du Bois’s 1897 essay has turned to the metaphilosophical question of the relative value of anachronistic (presentist) and antiquarian (historicist) approaches to the study of the history of African American philosophy (see, e.g., Taylor, 2013 and Gooding-Williams, 2017).

According to Jeffers (2013), the Appiah-inspired discussion of Du Bois has ignored the distinction Du Bois draws between political and cultural versions of the thesis that race is constitutively constructed.[17] The political version of the thesis, which Du Bois rejects, Jeffers argues, holds that “‘racialized subordination’…constitutes its [race’s] very existence” (2013, 413).[18] The cultural version, which Du Bois endorses, Jeffers argues, holds that the cultural factors mentioned in Du Bois’s definition (traditions, ideals of life, and so on) constitutively construct races as “distinct cultures” (2013, 411). Jeffers describes the cultural version of socio-historical constructionism that he attributes to Du Bois as Du Bois’s “cultural theory of race.”[19]

Jeffers advances criticisms of Du Bois’s definition of race and, unlike most other philosopher commentators, of his causal explanation of the existence of spiritually and culturally distinct races. Regarding the latter, he questions the reliability of Du Bois’s general, historical account of the genesis of the social factors to which Du Bois attributes the existence of these races (Jeffers, 2013, 417). Regarding the former, he adduces an important conceptual point: namely, that Du Bois neglects to justify the assumption that the historical and social facts that define and distinguish the spiritually distinct groups that the historian and the sociologist identify as races should be thought to constitute (constitutively to construct) those groups as races. Perhaps they serve simply to constitute them as cultural entities, or, as Du Bois himself sometimes writes, as nations (Jeffers, 2013, 416). Absent that assumption, neither the historian nor the sociologist is entitled to identify the clearly defined, spiritually distinct groups he or she observes as races. And, absent that assumption, Du Bois is hardly entitled to present the definition that he bases on what the historian and the sociologist observe as answering the question, “What, then, is a race?”[20]

Notwithstanding his criticisms of Du Bois, Jeffers, following Outlaw (1996), endorses and defends Du Bois’s “strong commitment to the preservation and cultivation of black cultural difference” (Jeffers, 2013, 419).[21] Jeffers has also shown that Du Bois maintains that commitment throughout his intellectual career (Jeffers, 2017).

2.2.4 Rethinking Race

Philosophers interested in Du Bois’s thinking about race in writings he essayed after the publication of “The Conservation of Races” have tended to focus on Dusk of Dawn (1940). In this connection, both Paul Taylor (2000, 2004a, 2004b, and 2014) and Robert Gooding-Williams (2014) have elaborated detailed accounts of the notion of race that Du Bois sketches in the book he subtitled “An Essay Toward an Autobiography of a Race Concept.” In a related vein, Joel Olson (2004), Shannon Sullivan (2006), and Terrance Macmullen (2009) have examined Du Bois’s conceptualization of whiteness, giving particular attention to Dusk of Dawn but also to Du Bois’s earlier works. Olson reads Dusk of Dawn as advancing an argument Du Bois initiates in Black Reconstruction (1935). Sullivan and Macmullen read it as advancing an argument Du Bois initiates in “The Souls of White Folk” (see Darkwater (1920)). Riding Jim Crow in Georgia

In chapter 6 of Dusk of Dawn, entitled “The White World,” Du Bois imagines a dialogue between himself and a fictional interlocutor, Roger Van Dieman. Near the conclusion of the exchange, Du Bois says that “[r]ace is a cultural, sometimes an historical fact,” to which Van Dieman responds “But what is this group [the black race] and how do you differentiate it” (1940, 77). Du Bois rejoins his interlocutor, remarking that he recognizes “it [the black race] quite easily and with full legal sanction; the black man is a person who must ride Jim Crow in Georgia” (1940, 77).

Here, Du Bois seems to reject biological concepts of race, and while he asserts that race is a cultural and sometimes an historical fact, his reference to the Jim Crow car suggests that he is no longer conceptualizing the Negro or any race as a group united by a distinct spiritual message. But if the cultural and sometimes historical fact of race is neither a biological nor a spiritual fact, what sort of fact is it?

On Taylor’s account, Du Bois means to answer this question by proposing that race is an institutional fact. Following John Searle (1995), Taylor understands institutional facts, like marriage and money, to be ontologically subjective and epistemologically objective (2000, 110; 2004a, 109; 2004b, 91). Realizing that “collective intentionality can bring certain facts into being” (2000, 110), Taylor’s Du Bois, like Searle, understood race to be constitutively constituted by human mental states (2004, 109).[22] Du Bois, Genealogy, Race

Gooding-Williams interprets Dusk of Dawn as defending a genealogical concept of race. Taking Du Bois’s subtitle as indicative of his larger philosophical aims, he argues that Du Bois’s essay toward the autobiography of a race concept is a mode of conceptual analysis that historicizes the concept of race. Due to the affinity of Du Bois’s philosophical strategy to Friedrich Nietzsche’s approach to the analysis of concepts, Gooding-Williams describes that strategy as “genealogical.”

Nietzsche thought that making sense of the concept of punishment must be a matter of unpacking the dense, synthesis of meanings (purposes, functions) that, over time, have been willfully interpreted into and forcibly imposed on specific procedures for inflicting harm (Nietzsche, 1998, 50–54). More generally, he understood that conceptual analysis can take the form of genealogy—that is, of historical inquiry that separates the distinct meanings that have been joined together and even conflated through episode after episode of reinterpreting one and the same, more or less stable set of phenomena (procedures, complexes of habits, feeling, ways of perceiving, and so forth).[23] In sum, Nietzsche held that historically formed concepts, like our notion of punishment, “are like ropes held together by the intertwining of strands, rather than by a single strand running through the whole thing” (Clark, 1994, 22). To analyze such concepts, he argued, “is not to find necessary and sufficient conditions for their use but to disentangle the various strands that have become so tightly woven together by the process of historical development that they seem inseparable” (Clark, 1994, 22)

On Gooding-Williams’s account, Du Bois 1) treats differences in the color of men as the more or less stable set of phenomena undergirding the concept of race, and 2) characterizes the concept of race as an intricate web of manifold and often conflicting interpretations of those differences formed over the course of his lifetime. Autobiography, a narrative form of historical inquiry, is the vehicle through which Du Bois genealogically analyzes that web of interpretations, for to reconstruct the story of his life is, in his view, to disentangle these interpretations, one from the other, in order to show that and how they have been exemplified in his life (Gooding-Williams, 2014, 166–167).[24]

Thus, Du Bois worries that what he has called a “race concept” is not, strictly speaking, a concept, for he sees that it is not the sort of concept that can be defined by specifying a set of non-contradictory and hence logically coherent conditions for its proper application. Contradiction can inhabit the race concept, because Du Bois, like Nietzsche, allows that historically formed concepts may comprise discordant interpretations of the meaning of one and the same set of phenomena. The race concept is “illogical,” but is not for that reason without the efficacy characteristic of “forces,” “facts,” and “tendencies” (Du Bois, 1940, 67). Indeed, the efficacy of the concept is such that, internal inconsistencies notwithstanding, it has dominated Du Bois’s life. Du Bois’s exemplification of the race concept is his subjection to it. Reminiscent, again, of Nietzsche, he holds that historically formed concepts can function as mechanisms of power and control (Gooding-Williams, 2014, 167).[25] The Power and Moral Psychology of Whiteness

According to Joel Olson (2004), Du Bois’s understanding of whiteness belongs to the political theory of race he begins to sketch in Black Reconstruction. Specifically, Du Bois conceptualizes whiteness as a privileged position of social standing that has 1) afforded white workers a public and psychological wage compensating them for their low economic wages; and 2) formed the basis of a cross-class, political alliance uniting white workers and capitalists against black workers (black slaves included). More generally, he maintains that whiteness has historically functioned as a mechanism of power for recruiting white workers to police and reinforce the economic exploitation of black workers. On Olson’s account, Du Bois explains the “splendid failure” of Reconstruction and the genesis of the American racial order through his analysis of the cross-class political alliance of white workers and capitalists (Olson, 16, 30).

In Dusk of Dawn, Du Bois further develops his understanding of whiteness by interpreting racial oppression as, in Olson’s words, “a political problem of dark and white worlds arrayed against each other, with the white world determined to subordinate the dark one” (Olson, 22). Placing the conceptual opposition between white and dark (or non-white) worlds at the center of his analysis, Du Bois especially emphasizes the role whiteness plays in legitimizing the “domination of white Europe over black Africa and yellow Asia” (Du Bois, 1940, 48; see, also, Du Bois, 1940, 85–87; and Olson 26, 155, fn.60).

“The Souls of White Folk” can be read as Du Bois’s central contribution to the moral psychology of white supremacy; that is, as his account of the affective, motivational, and cognitive dispositions that constitute white supremacism as a morally vicious character trait—including, e.g., the dispositions passionately to hate black folk; to slander and murder black folk; and to believe that white folk are inherently better than black folk.[26] In “The White World” chapter of Dusk of Dawn, Du Bois complicates this earlier psychological portrait of the white supremacist, stressing the deeply ingrained persistence of her or his racist behavior. Du Bois argues, for example, that “the present attitude and action of the white world…is a matter of conditioned reflexes; of long followed habits, customs and folkways; of subconscious trains of reasoning and unconscious nervous reflexes” (Du Bois, 1940, 87). Productively building on Du Bois’s moral psychology, Shannon Sullivan (2006) and Terrance Macmullen (2009) have recently brought Du Bois into conversation with John Dewey to develop pragmatist, habit-centered accounts of the workings of white privilege.

3. The Science of Human Action and Social Reform

In “A Program for a Sociological Society” (ca. 1897), an early essay belonging to the same period as “The Study of the Negro Problems” and “The Conservation of Races,” Du Bois places the emergence of the science of sociology in historical perspective. Prior to the industrial revolution, he argues, there was but one science that studied the phenomenon of human action: namely, political economy. Political economy focused on the production, distribution, and exchange of goods under stable social conditions, but gave no attention to the intensification of problems of crime, disease, poverty, prostitution, and ignorance that came with “the new concentration of industrys [sic], crowded into centers of population.” Sociology addresses these problems, demanding a “wider inquiry into the causes and scope of human action.” More generally, “[s]ociology is…the name given to that vast field of inquiry into human action as manifested in modern organized life.”

But what is the point of sociological inquiry—that is, of a sociological science of human action? Du Bois distinguishes between the immediate and the mediate aims of scientific inquiry; that is, between the aims of science itself and the uses of scientific results by “merchants, physicians, men of letters, and philanthropists”—indeed, by “all men” (Du Bois 1897, 89; see also Du Bois, ca.1897, 1–10). For Du Bois, the immediate aim of science is knowledge; the mediate aims may vary, but social reform is the mediate aim upon which Du Bois focuses throughout his career (see Green and Driver, 312–313; Lewis, 1993, 225–26; Reed, 47; and, especially, Bright, 5–7). But how can scientific knowledge advance social reform? Du Bois sketches at least three distinct answers to this question, each of which corresponds to a different conception of the object of social scientific knowledge.[27] Knowledge of social laws and regularities can help the reformer to settle on effective plans of action; knowledge of the scope and limits of chance can help her to hedge her bets—that is, to guard against the possibility that her plans of action will fail; finally, knowledge of moral facts can help the reformer to caution her fellow citizens against the disaster and sorrow that await them should they persist in an immoral course of action.

3.1 Social Laws and Regularities

In an early statement (Du Bois, ca. 1897), Du Bois maintains that the organization of modern society is a function of social laws and regularities that sociology identifies through detailed, statistical research that “generalizes[s]” a “mass of facts,” showing how various social phenomena, including, e.g., the “degree of poverty, the prevalence of suicide, [and] the extent and kinds of crime,” tend “to a certain rhythm and regularity which we call the social group” (ca. 1897, 4). Knowledge of these social rhythms, regularities and, sometimes, laws (sociology studies “human action which by its regularity gives evidence of the presence of laws”) is the “first step” in modern social reform (ca. 1897, 3, 8). Such knowledge can contribute to social reform, Du Bois’s examples suggest, for it enables the reformer to explain causally the conditions she wishes to transform and rationally to chart plans to alter those conditions: e.g., the death rate of children in the slums, the treatment of prisoners, and pauperism (ca. 1897, 9–11).[28] Such knowledge, presumably, empowers Du Bois in his capacity as a social reformer to explain the existence of the Negro problem and rationally to identify means to eradicate the Negro problem (see 2.1 above and 4.1.1 below).

3.2 The Scope and Limits of Chance

In “Sociology Hesitant” (ca. 1905), perhaps his most theoretically rich contribution to the philosophy of the human sciences, Du Bois takes issue with Comte’s and Spencer’s collectivist holism[29]—the thesis that society is a concrete whole (for Du Bois, a “mystical whole”) formed of discrete units—and he again defends the view that society comprises the “deeds of men,” as well as the “law, rule, and rythm” [sic] governing those deeds (ca. 1905, 274). For Du Bois, sociology is the science of human action, not the science of society as such, or the science of society as a whole.

Why, Du Bois asks, did Comte “hesitate so strangely” before the prospect of treating human action as the proper object of sociological inquiry? The answer, Du Bois claims, is the “Great Assumption…that in the deeds of men there lies along with rhythm and rule…something incalculable”—an assumption in light of which the prospect of launching a science that “would discover and formulate the exact laws of human action…seemed to be and was preposterous” (ca. 1905, 274). Comte wavered before what Du Bois calls “Paradox:” on one hand, “The evident rhythm of human action;” on the other, “The evident incalculability of human action” (ca. 1905, 275). Where Comte wavers, however, Du Bois sallies forth, writing “[w]hy not…flatly face the Paradox? frankly state the Hypothesis of Law and the Assumption of Chance and seek to determine by study and measurement the limits of each” (ca. 1905, 276).

Human conduct is subject to the “primary” rhythms of physical law, as well as to the “secondary” rhythms of social regularities; social regularities exhibit “nearly” the same uniformity as physical law, and they are also “liable to stoppage and change” (ca. 1905, 278). Aspiring to unite the Geisteswissenschaften and the Naturwissenschaften—“the science of man and physical science”—Du Bois characterizes sociology as “assuming the data of physics and studying within these that realm where determinate force is acted on by human wills, by indeterminate force” (ca. 1905, 277–278).

Physical laws and social regularities alike limit the scope of chance, which is to say that they limit the scope of “indeterminate” force, or “undetermined” choice, or, as Du Bois likewise puts the point, of “free” and “inexplicable” will (ca. 1905, 276–278). In presupposing chance, sociology presupposes free will. Sociology’s attempt to measure chance and free will is its attempt to measure the degree to which physical and social regularities limit and constrain the range of choice and action that is “undetermined by and independent of actions gone before”(ca. 1905, 278).

Some forty years after Du Bois wrote “Sociology Hesitant,” he appears to allude to the earlier, then unpublished essay; indeed, he reflects at length on the argument of the essay, suggesting that it marked the beginning of a shift in his “whole attitude towards the social sciences” (1944, 56):

Then, too, for what Law was I searching? In accord with what unchangeable scientific law was the world of interracial discord around me working? I fell back upon my Royce and James and deserted Schmoller and Weber. I saw the action of physical law in the actions of men; but I saw more than that: I saw rhythms and tendencies; coincidence and probabilities; and I saw that, which for want of another word, I must in accord with strict tenets of Science, call Chance. I went forward to build a sociology, which I conceived as the attempt to measure the element of Chance in human conduct. This was the Jamesian pragmatism, applied not simply to ethics, but to all human action, beyond what seemed to me, increasingly, the distinct limits of physical law.

My work assumed from now on a certain tingling challenge of risk; what the “Captain of Industry” of that day was experiencing in “kick,” from money changing, railway consolidation and corporation floating, I was, in what appeared to me on a large scale, essaying in the relations of men of daily life (1944, 57–58).[30]

Du Bois’s references to Weber, Schmoller, Royce, James, and Jamesian pragmatism tie his earlier critique of Comte to an engagement with what James dubbed “the dilemma of determinism” (James, 1884). Weber was methodologically agnostic with regard to the dispute between metaphysical determinists and indeterminists, arguing that neither position entailed consequences bearing on the research practices of the historical and cultural sciences, and taking Schmoller to task for his profession of faith in metaphysical determinism (see Weber, 1905a, 197–196, 278; Ringer, 1997, 57–58, 91). Thus, Du Bois breaks with both his German teachers in insisting that chance—again, incalculable actions (and choices) undetermined by and independent of actions gone before—exists in the world and in explicitly endorsing “the assumption of chance” as a principle of sociological method.[31] Du Bois’s contention that the individual is free to the extent that her choices escape explanation in terms of physical and social laws and regularities echoes Royce’s argument that, because “the individual as such is never the mere result of law,” no causal explanation can “predetermine” what she “uniquely wills” (Royce, 1899, 467–468). Du Bois misleads, however, when he retrospectively suggests that the argument of “Sociology Hesitant” aligned him with James.

To be sure, Du Bois’s language and analysis owes a debt to James’s “The Dilemma of Determinism” (1884) and, in particular, to James’s conceptualization of the will’s independence (its ability to choose courses of action not fixed “by parts of the universe already laid down” (1884, 150)) in terms of the concept of chance—a debt Du Bois acknowledges when he describes his view as “Jamesian pragmatism.” James explains the ethical implications of his indeterminism when he takes issue with Schopenhauer, “who enforces his determinism by the argument that with a given fixed character only one reaction is possible under given circumstances” (1879, 13). Schopenhauer forgets, James argues, that “in these critical ethical moments, what consciously seems to be in question is the very complexion of the character” (1879, 13). As a sociologist, Du Bois’s purports to have applied Jamesian pragmatism beyond the sphere of ethics, to “all human action,” but it is precisely here that he breaks with James; for notwithstanding his defense of indeterminism, James is skeptical of the possibility of measuring the degree to which the will is free (James, 1890, 572). In addition, James insists that the science of psychology must methodologically reject the assumption of chance. Psychology “abstracts from free-will without necessarily denying its existence” (James, 1892, 457).[32]

Du Bois was no less interested in determining (again, “by study and measurement”) the limits of law than he was in determining the limits of chance. Law, he believed, marked the limit of chance, and chance, he believed, marked the limit of law. Knowledge of social laws and regularities can contribute to social reform by enabling the social reformer causally to explain social problems and rationally to chart plans to solve those problems. Knowledge of the element of chance—or, more exactly, of the scope and limits of chance in organized, modern social life—can contribute to social reform by enabling the reformer to gauge the extent to which implementing his ideas would entail experimenting with (“essaying”) plans of action that, due to the play of chance, carry a significant risk of failure—plans that he could not confidently endorse, despite his knowledge of the social laws and regularities shaping modern social life. Just as knowledge of the scope and limits of chance could provide the “Captain of Industry” who speculates in currency and trades in floated, corporate stock a reason to modify his investment decisions, so too could it provide the reformer a reason to modify his plans of action and similarly to meet the “tingling challenge of risk.”[33]

3.3 Historical Inquiry and Moral Knowledge

In “The Propaganda of History,” the final chapter of Black Reconstruction (1935), Du Bois maintains that “scientific” historiography—that is, historiography that “set[s] down” the record of “human action” with “accuracy and faithfulness of detail”—can serve the ends of social reform; it can be used, he writes, “as a measuring rod and guidepost for the future of nations” (Du Bois, 1935, 584). Du Bois’s argument for this claim proceeds through a defense of four theses: 1) that the study of history, so far as it belongs to the science of human action, cannot model itself exclusively on the natural sciences; 2) that accuracy in chronicling and explaining human action requires that the historian rely on the method of interpretive understanding—what Max Weber called Verstehen; 3) that, contra Weber, accurate, empirically sound historiography reports moral knowledge; and 4) that the knowledge of morality and moral responsibility yielded by the scientific study of human history (by accurate historiography) can contribute to social reform, for the philosopher and the prophet can use that knowledge to guide mankind in the solution of social problems (1935, 591).

Du Bois criticizes histories that discuss slavery with moral “impartially,” depicting America as helpless and the south as blameless, while explaining the difference in development, North and South, as “a sort of working out of cosmic social and economic law” (1935, 585). An example of this sort of history is Charles and Mary Beard’s The Rise of American Civilization, which treats the clash between north and south as if it were a clash between winds and waters. In the Beard’s “sweeping mechanistic interpretation” of history, Du Bois writes, “there is no room for the real plot of the story, for the clear mistake and guilt of rebuilding a new slavery of the working class in the midst of a fateful experiment in democracy; for the triumph of sheer moral courage and sacrifice in the abolition crusade; and for the hurt and struggle of degraded black millions in their fight for freedom and their attempt to enter democracy. Can all this be omitted and half suppressed in a treatise that calls itself scientific?” (1935, 585).

At issue here, again, as in “The Conservation of Races” and “Sociology Hesitant,” is the relation between the human sciences and the natural sciences. For the Du Bois of Black Reconstruction, historians who model their inquiry exclusively on the natural sciences (historians like the Beards) seek to identify the causal uniformities (“cosmic” laws) governing human events, which events they conceptualize by analogy to the behavior of the winds, waters and other forces of nature. The problem here, Du Bois believes, is not with the effort to identify the causal uniformities governing human events. Rather it is with the tendency in that effort to neglect the human meaning of human events, and thus to treat those events as inhuman, natural forces that lend themselves to a purely “mechanistic” explanation—by which Du Bois means explanation in terms that make no reference to the meanings that the human subjects who participate in those events attach to them.

If history is to be a science of human action and not to pretend to be a science of nature, then, Du Bois believes, it must take account of the subjective meanings of actions and events. Du Bois implies that the historian cannot truly tell the story of “the mightiest effort of the mightiest century” (the struggle of enslaved blacks to achieve democracy) without taking account of the “psychology” of the agents whose actions sustained that effort—for to take psychology into account is to take subjective meaning into account (1935, 586). More generally, Du Bois insists that the historian of slavery ask: “Just what did [slavery] mean to the owner and the owned”(1935, 585).

To understand slavery, knowing what it meant to the owned is no less important than knowing what it meant to the owners. In demanding that the historian of slavery attend to the slaves’ stories about slavery in order to know what slavery meant to the slaves, Du Bois presupposes the fundamental, methodological tenet that the historian’s primary charge is what Max Weber called Verstehen, or “interpretive understanding,” not mechanical explanation. According to Weber, the sciences of human action, including history and sociology, “speak of ‘action’ insofar as the acting individual attaches subjective meaning to his behavior—be it overt or covert” (1922, 38, 41). One of the aims of Verstehen, he argues, is rationally to make sense of the motivation prompting an action by placing that action “in an intelligible and more inclusive context of meaning”—as when, for example, we interpret a woodchopper’s chopping of wood as an act undertaken to secure a wage; or, alternatively, to provide a supply of firewood for the woodchopper’s use (1922, 42).

Du Bois stresses the importance of interpretive understanding because he is committed to the view that moral judgment is a critical component of historiography. Thus, while Du Bois methodologically aligns himself with Weber in stressing the importance of interpretive understanding to the scientific study of history, he methodologically rejects Weber’s claim that “concern on the part of history to judge of historical actions as responsible before the conscience of history…would suspend its character as empirical science” (Weber, 1905b, 123).[34]

Unlike Weber, Du Bois is a moral realist who believes that historical inquiry can afford us knowledge of moral facts—knowledge, that is, of the proper distribution of moral responsibility and of the extent to which actions are right or wrong. But to obtain that knowledge, historians must understand human action in terms of subjective meanings, for they require some such understanding of human action to render intelligible their application of the vocabulary of moral evaluation—for Du Bois, a vocabulary that includes the language of “guilt,” of “moral courage and sacrifice,” and of “the degraded black millions.” Du Bois argues that a necessary condition of the possibility of acquiring knowledge of moral facts through the historian’s practice of the science of human action is a Verstehen-centered approach to that practice—or, more exactly, an approach that explains human actions in terms of subjects’ motives. Du Bois sketches a similar line of argument, five years later, in Dusk of Dawn (1940, 70).

For Du Bois, the function of the historian, “posing” as a scientist of human action, is “to make clear the facts…to know, as far as possible…the things that actually happened in the world” without regard to her personal desires and wishes (1935, 591). But the function of the philosopher and the prophet, he argues, is “to interpret these facts” —that is, to consider them in the perspective of our desire to guide mankind to undertake the social reforms needed to address social problems (1935, 591).

A prophet, a Jeremiah, for example, might well adduce facts of moral wrongdoing and guilt to alert his fellow citizens that their actions risk God’s wrath. And a philosopher, a philosopher of history, for example, might adduce those facts in order to instruct them as to the meaning, writ large, of the plot that the historian has chronicled—precisely as Du Bois instructs his fellow citizens that the story of slavery and reconstruction he has chronicled (in his capacity as an historian) exhibits “the clear mistake and guilt” that characterizes the “plot” of Aristotelian tragedy (1935, 585, 595). In both cases, the point would be the same: namely, to use moral knowledge to warn one’s fellow citizens of the fateful consequences (God’s wrath, tragedy) that await them lest they refuse to heed the lessons of the past and change—reform—their ways.

4. Political Philosophy

Du Bois’s political philosophy belongs to the Afro-modern tradition of political thought, an impressively rich body of non-ideal political theory that is bound together by certain thematic preoccupations—e.g., the political and social organization of white supremacy, the nature and effects of racial ideology, and the possibilities of black emancipation— and that includes the writings of Ottabah Cugoano, David Walker, Edward Blyden, Martin Delany, Frederick Douglass, and Alexander Crummell (Gooding-Williams, 2009). Du Bois’s most famous book, The Souls of Black Folk (1903a), is his earliest contribution to that tradition. Du Bois’s subsequent contributions to political philosophy and political theory appear in several different places and have been variously taken up by contemporary scholars.

4.1 Early Du Bois: The Period of The Souls of Black Folk

Souls is Du Bois’s still influential answer to the question, “What kind of politics should African Americans conduct to counter white supremacy?” Historically rooted in the segregationist era of Jim Crow, Souls authority has reached well beyond its origins, so much so that its compelling ideas and arguments continue to be taken up by contemporary theorists of black politics.

4.1.1 Uplift and Political Expressivism

In Souls, Du Bois contends that a politics fit to respond to the American, Jim Crow version of racial apartheid must satisfy two conditions. The first relates to Du Bois’s description of African Americans as “masses:” to wit, to his characterization of African Americans as an aggregate of uncultured, pre-modern slaves or former slaves. The second relates to his description of African Americans as a “folk:” that is, to his characterization of African Americans as a group united by a collectively shared ethos, or spirit.

For Du Bois, a politics suitable to counter Jim Crow had to uplift the black masses—to assimilate them to the constitutive norms of modernity—and to heed the ethos of the black folk. In short, it had to be a politics that embraced and promoted the core values of modern life while expressing the spiritual identity of the folk. Du Bois envisions black elites—the so-called “talented tenth” (1903b)—as deploying a politics of expressive modernization to uplift the black masses. Elite control of black politics can be authoritative and effective, he argues, only if it expresses a collective spirit that unites black people.

The young Du Bois’s political philosophy rests on the social philosophy he outlines in “The Conservation of Races” and “The Study of Negro Problems.” In arguing that talented tenth elites could enjoy political legitimacy and efficacy only if their actions expressed a distinctive message that spiritually distinguished the Negro from other spiritually distinct races and that united all African Americans, he presupposes his earlier answer to the question, “What is a Negro?” In arguing that talented tenth elites needed to attack racial prejudice and cultural backwardness alike in order to uplift and modernize the black masses, he presupposes his earlier, causal analysis of Negro problems (Gooding-Williams, 2009, chapter 1).

4.1.2 The Du Bois-Washington Debate

Du Bois’s extended critique of Booker T. Washington’s political thought (see Souls, chapter 3) likewise presupposes his earlier, causal analysis of Negro problems. Du Bois’s argument immediately drew attention, for when Du Bois published Souls Washington had securely established himself “as an educational statesman, the primary spokesman of black America, and the leader of a large network of disciples—the ‘Tuskegee Machine’—who edited newspapers, owned businesses, and directed schools modeled on Tuskegee”(Blight and Gooding-Williams, 1997, 16).

Washington held that if blacks endeavored to help themselves—to discipline their bodies, to cultivate entrepreneurial virtues (e.g. thrift, spirit of industry, and economy), and to acquire the knowledge of a trade—they would thrive in the capitalist market and, due to their business success, bring an end to Jim Crow and win the franchise. In short, he believed that black self-help efforts were sufficient to engender business success, and that business success was sufficient to persuade whites to extend to blacks the civil and political rights they required for incorporation into the mainstream of American society (Washington, 1901).[35]

Contra Washington, Du Bois argued that self-help efforts, while necessary for black social progress, were not sufficient. Assuming that both racial prejudice and cultural backwardness cause Negro problems, Du Bois claims that a self-help politics that attends to the backwardness of the Negro group itself without attacking racial prejudice is doomed to fail. Washington had argued that there was no need to attack prejudice for the present, because self-help efforts that contended with entrepreneurial-economic backwardness (for Du Bois, a form of cultural backwardness) would suffice to defeat it. Du Bois rejects this argument on the grounds that the persistent, prejudice-sustained denial of rights to blacks undermines their self-help efforts and prospects for business success. Washington’s program amounts to a partial, one-sided attack on the Negro problems. In Du Bois’s view, black uplift and social progress required that black political elites attack both prongs of the Negro problem—racial prejudice no less than backwardness. It also required institutions of higher learning to train these elites. Thus, Du Bois takes Washington to task for promoting an educational philosophy that emphasized vocational education at the expense of higher, liberal arts education (Du Bois, 1903a, chapter 3).

4.1.3 Political Leadership and Double-Consciousness

In Souls, Du Bois sketches a biographical portrait of his mentor, Alexander Crummell, and a fictional portrait of a tragic hero, John Jones, to show how double-consciousness can compromise black elite political leadership.[36] Specifically, Du Bois represents double-consciousness as a form of alienation that estranges black elites from their followers, thereby eroding their ability to promote ends expressing the collectively shared spirit of the black folk and undermining their legitimacy and efficacy as leaders (Du Bois, 1903a, chapters 1, 12–13; Gooding-Williams, 2009, chapter 3).

4.1.4 The Post-Jim Crow Inheritance of the Early Du Bois

The early Du Bois’s defense of a black elite-led politics of expressive modernization has exerted considerable influence on post-Jim Crow political philosophical appraisals of black American politics. Indeed, it is all but impossible to grasp the point of those appraisals without taking account of their engagements, both explicit and implicit, with key elements of Du Bois’s early political thought. For extended discussion of the issues central to the post-Jim Crow inheritance of Du Bois’s early political thought, see, especially, Reed, 1999 and Gooding-Williams, 2009, chapter 6.

4.2 Du Bois’s Political Thought After The Souls of Black Folk

As Lawrie Balfour has argued, Du Bois wrote “prolifically” on a broad array of topics, so that his writings can usefully be read as an extended series of essayistic, experimental efforts to address the various issues that engaged him (2011, 17–18). The reception of Du Bois by contemporary political theorists attests to the extraordinary, topical scope of his political thought, especially as it evolved after the publication of Souls.

4.2.1 Du Bois’s Elitism

In several post-Souls writings, Du Bois returns to the theme of black political leadership. In Dusk of Dawn, for example, he reaffirms his belief that “the Talented Tenth” should determine “the present field and demand for racial action and the method by which the masses may be guided along this line” (1940, 159). And several years later, after critically reflecting on his earlier thinking about group leadership, he proposes a “new idea for a Talented Tenth” (1948, 168). Whether or not Du Bois ultimately rejected his earlier conception of elite black leadership (Du Bois, 1903b) is an issue of scholarly dispute. Joy James holds that Du Bois eventually repudiates the idea of a black intelligentsia vanguard (James, 1997). Cornel West contends that Du Bois’s later revisions of his concept of the talented tenth were “piecemeal” (West, 1996, 71). Adolph Reed, by way of a meticulous reading of Du Bois’s later writings and speeches, argues that Du Bois advanced an elite-centered notion of black politics throughout his intellectual and activist career (Reed, 1997). Tommie Shelby and Paul Taylor provide especially nuanced reconstructions of Du Bois’s evolving understanding of black political leadership (Shelby, 2007, chapter 2; Taylor, 2010, 907–910.).

4.2.2 Marx, Du Bois, and Black Radicalism

An important and still underappreciated strand of Du Bois’s post-Souls political thought is his engagement with Marxist social and political theory. A key text, here, is Black Reconstruction (1935), Du Bois’s monumental critique of the Dunning School’s interpretation of Reconstruction.[37] Like Joel Olson (2004; see above), Cedric Robinson (1983) and Anthony Bogues (2003) have argued that Black Reconstruction should be read as historical and political theory, not simply as revisionist historiography. On Robinson’s reading, Du Bois developed “a theory of history, which by its emphasis on mass action was both a critique of the ideologies of American socialist movements and a revision of Marx’s theory of revolution and class struggle” (Robinson, 277). Bogues agrees that Du Bois breaks with Marx and Marxist orthodoxy, and adds that, like other black radical theorists, Du Bois reorients the radical critique of modernity away from “issues of political obligation, sovereign self and citizenship…to questions of domination, oppression, and politics as a practice of freedom” (Bogues, 93). Building on Du Bois and on Robinson’s engagement with Du Bois, the historian, Walter Johnson (2016) has more recently argued that the history of slavery and racial capitalism provides a standpoint from which “to rethink our idea of justice” (Johnson, 29).

4.2.3 Feminist Theory and Du Bois

Feminist theorists’ appraisals of Du Bois’s political thought have been mixed, ranging from criticisms of his masculinist failure to regard black women as intellectuals and race leaders (e.g. Carby, 1998 and James, 1997) to praise for his advocacy of women’s equality and his contributions to our understanding of the oppression of black women (e.g., James, 1997 and Griffin, 2000).

Feminist theorists’ commentary on Du Bois’s political thought has tended to concentrate on chapter 7 of Darkwater (1920), “The Damnation of Women.” Women are damned, Du Bois proposes, for “only at the sacrifice of intelligence and the chance to do their best work can the majority of women bear children” (1920, 78–79). While Farah Griffin interprets “Damnation” in the perspective of a still persistent “politics of protection” that threatens the autonomy of black women, arguing that Du Bois recognized the limits of that politics (2000, 34–36), Lawrie Balfour reads the essay as contributing to a “feminist theory of citizenship” (2011, 99–100). Taking issue with Balfour, Shatema Threadcraft argues that “Damnation” reprises and elaborates Souls’ masculinist treatment of manliness as an appropriate norm of citizenship (2017, 92–94).

Considering Du Bois in light of black feminist and more general forms of contemporary intersectionality theory (which considers intersections between race, gender and class), Ange-Marie Hancock examines Souls, Darkwater, and Dusk of Dawn to identify insights in Du Bois’s thinking that link “his political theory with that of today’s intersectionality theorists” (2005, 82). It would be anachronistic to describe Du Bois as an intersectionality theorist, Hancock admits, but she still claims that Du Bois anticipates recent intersectionality theory in arguing “that more than one category of difference should be attacked simultaneously, and, more importantly, that the structures of society operate such that these categories mutually reinforce social stratification for its least empowered inhabitants” (2005, 79).

4.2.4 Democratic Theory and Du Bois

How did Du Bois conceptualize democracy?

Du Bois mentions democracy just once in Souls, where he states that the “soul of democracy and the safeguard of modern society” is “[h]onest and earnest criticism from those whose interests are most nearly touched,—criticism of writers by readers, of government by those governed, of leaders by those led” (1903a, 23). Du Bois defines democracy in terms of criticism when he attacks Booker T. Washington for “hushing criticism” (1903a, 23). In exploring the implications of Du Bois’s statement for the picture of black politics he defends in Souls, Gooding-Williams raises a question as to whether elite leadership of backwards, black masses not competent to criticize their leaders could both satisfy Du Bois’s definition of democracy and successfully promote an uplift agenda (Gooding-Williams, 2009, chapters 1 and 4.)

Du Bois’s most thoroughgoing contribution to democratic theory is chapter 6 of Darkwater, “Of The Ruling of Men.” In that essay, Du Bois engages familiar, Tocquevillian worries about the tyranny of the majority; envisions democratic decision making in deliberative democratic terms; and defends not only a broadly inclusive form of political democracy, but the idea that modern industry should be subject to democratic decision making—in essence, the idea of democratic socialism. His argument for inclusiveness, for extending the right of democratic participation to women and blacks, for example, is essentially epistemic: “only the sufferer knows his suffering and…no state can be strong which excludes from its expressed wisdom the knowledge possessed by mothers, wives, and daughters…The same arguments apply to other excluded groups” (1920, 69; see, also, Bright, 2017, 14–15).

In Black Reconstruction, no less than in “Of the Ruling of Men,” Du Bois characterizes democracy in economic as well as political terms; that is, as the legitimate transfer of political and economic power from the ruling classes to the working masses. Cornel West interprets Black Reconstruction as promoting a Deweyan notion of creative democracy (West, 1988). Gooding-Williams (1991) disputes that interpretation, arguing that it obscures the connotations of class struggle that attach to Du Bois’s account of black workers’ efforts to reconstruct democracy. In Color and Democracy, which Du Bois published just more than a decade after Black Reconstruction, he writes that “[m]ore important than political democracy is industrial democracy; that is, the voice which the actual worker, whether his work be manual or mental, has in the organization and conduct of industry” (1946, 300).[38]

The ongoing importance of Du Bois’s contributions to democratic theory has been well established by the recent work of Lawrie Balfour and Tommie Shelby.

In her essays on Darkwater, Dusk of Dawn, and other writings, for example, Balfour subtly brings Du Bois’s political thought into conversation with the work of contemporary political theorists. To reorient democratic theory in dark times, Balfour argues, we would do well to think politically with Du Bois. To that end, she examines the political-theoretical ramifications of Du Bois’s literary choices; his use of history to highlight the implication of America’s slave past in its post-Civil Rights present; his depiction of African American lives as exemplary representatives of democratic possibility; and his globally expansive political imagination, which, Balfour argues, reveals the racial politics of recent defenses of cosmopolitanism and civic nationalism (Balfour, 2010, 2011).[39]

In Shelby’s view, Du Bois took African-Americans to be the bearers of a world-historical mission to perfect the ideals of American democracy. Du Bois endorsed black political solidarity, Shelby argues, as a temporary and, possibly, long-term strategy for establishing a multiracial, culturally pluralist American polity that embodied those ideals. Shelby follows Du Bois in maintaining that black political solidarity in the pursuit of a racial justice that is consonant with American democratic and liberal ideals requires a motivational foundation that unites self-interest, moral principle, and racial identification (Shelby, 2007, 6–7, 67, 87).

4.2.5 Freud, Du Bois, and the Long Siege

In chapter 1 of Dusk of Dawn, Du Bois describes his thought regarding the causes of the oppression of the darker races as evolving through three stages—roughly, from thinking that racial oppression was caused by ignorance; to thinking that it was caused by ignorance and ill-will; to thinking that it was caused by ignorance and ill-will and a conjunction of economic motives and unconscious, irrational acts and reactions. Corresponding to each stage, Du Bois tells us, was an increasingly complex account of the political strategies the darker races require to upend racial oppression. Where ignorance is the problem, science and education is needed to fight racial injustice; where ill-will is the issue, the black world must fight for its freedom, relying on truth, boycott, propaganda and mob frenzy as instruments of sudden and immediate assault. Where, finally, economic interest and/or unconscious, irrational motive sustain racial oppression, “not sudden assault but long siege was indicated; careful planning and subtle campaign with the education of growing generations and propaganda” (1940, 2–3).

Prior to 1940, some consideration of each of these causes of oppression and related strategies of resistance is evident in Du Bois’s writings. Still, Dusk of Dawn is remarkable for the prominence it gives to the role of unconscious and irrational psychological forces in accounting for the existence and perpetuation of racial oppression. Du Bois attributes this new emphasis to the “new psychology” of the “Freudian era.” His “study of psychology under William James” had prepared him for the Freudian turn, he remarks, and its “meaning and implications…had begun slowly to penetrate his thought” (1940, 148).

Contemporary political theorists have, for the most part, tended to ignore Du Bois’s Freud-inspired account of racial oppression. An exception is Shannon Sullivan, for whom Du Bois suggests “a powerful psychoanalytic-pragmatist model for surveying the unconscious operations of white domination” (Sullivan, 2006, 23). A second exception is Ella Myers, who has begun to build on Du Bois’s arguments to reflect on the visceral and affective registers of antiblack racism (Myers, 2017).[40] Robert Gooding-Williams (2011) has adapted Du Bois’s idea of a “long siege” against racial oppression—against what Du Bois also calls “the strongholds of color caste”—to a critical analysis of some recent discussions of racial politics (1940, 148).

5. Philosophy of Art

Paul Taylor has persuasively sketched a general framework for understanding Du Bois’s philosophy of art. According to Taylor, Du Bois endorses an expressivist picture of the world, the key to which “is a determination to think of things as determinate but provisional expressions of an evolving world.” On this view, “the world unfolds into new forms the way a seed unfolds into a tree…by clarifying, over time, what was inchoate and implicit: by actualizing in history what formerly existed only in potentia.” Considering Du Bois in the perspective of Marx’s and Dewey’s revisions of Hegel’s expressivism, Taylor’s Du Bois envisions ethical life as a work-in-progress—that is, as an ongoing project of holistic self-cultivation, of individuals artistically forming themselves by creatively responding to the histories, languages, and economic structures that constrain them (Taylor, 2016, 91–93).

5.1 High Art and Low Art

Du Bois’s articulation of his commitment to the ideal of holistic self-cultivation is perhaps most explicit when, in amplifying his criticism of Booker T. Washington, he defends the importance of liberal arts education (Gooding-Williams, 2009, 133–139). Explicitly echoing Matthew Arnold, Du Bois advocated liberal arts education as a means to self-cultivation or, as he sometimes writes, self-development, through “getting to know…the best that has been said and thought in the world” (Arnold, 1869, 5). Self-development through the acquisition of culture is the purpose of the education elites require to uplift the masses. The Negro college, Du Bois writes, “must develop men…Above our modern socialism, and out of the worship of the mass, must persist that higher individualism which centres of culture protect; there must come a loftier respect for the sovereign human souls that seeks to know itself and the world about it; that seeks a freedom for expansion and self-development” (1903a, 52).

For the Du Bois of Souls, the art that sovereign souls appreciate is high art—or, in other words, art that shares with the sovereign souls that appreciate it the property of holistic self-development. In “The Sorrow Songs,” the final chapter of Souls, Du Bois represents the group spirit that unites black Americans as clarifying its distinctive message through the medium of the folk song. Considered in historical perspective, the musically embodied spirit of the black folk, as it actualizes itself through time, in folk song after folk song, acquires a spiritually comprehensive breadth that overcomes racial prejudice and provincialism. To these songs, which manifest a developing folk spirit and that constitute an evolving tradition of black musical art, Du Bois contrasts a “mass” of spiritually inert minstrel songs, gospel hymns and coon songs (1903a, 124). In essence, he argues that, no less than Wagner’s operas, which he admired, the spiritually-inspired black folk song belongs to the canon of high art from which the low arts of the minstrel song and the like are excluded.

On this view, Du Bois’s early political expressivism is of a piece with his broadly expressivist philosophy of art, for it asserts that, to be legitimate and effective, black political leaders must take their bearing not from the uninspired mass of popular song that the masses might enjoy, but from the spirit and spiritual message embodied in the black folk song (Gooding-Williams, 2009, 139–147).

5.2 Art, Beauty, and Propaganda

Du Bois’s essay, “Criteria of Negro Art” (1925), is his most important contribution to the philosophy of art. The essay is Du Bois’s clearest statement of his disagreement with the philosopher and Dean of the Harlem Renaissance, Alain Locke, about the relation between art and propaganda. Against Locke’s view that genius and talent “must choose art and put aside propaganda,” Du Bois held “that all art is propaganda and ever must be” (Locke, 1928, par. 1; Du Bois, 1926, par. 29). At issue in Du Bois’s “great debate” with Locke is the role of the arts “in creating respect for a people suffering from humiliation and self-loathing” (Harris, 15).

Du Bois claims that artists rely on beauty to communicate truth and goodness (in all its aspects of justice, honor, and right)—in the first case to promote universal understanding, and in the second to gain sympathy and human interest. The “apostle of Beauty,” he writes, “thus becomes the apostle of truth and right not by choice but by inner and outer compulsion. Free he is, but his freedom is ever bounded by Truth and Justice” (par. 28).

Considering these claims in the perspective of Du Bois’s expressivism, Taylor plausibly interprets Du Bois as arguing that, because artists “are dialectically enmeshed in wider webs of meaning concerning the true and the just, and must create themselves as individuals by working out their orientation to these networks,” all art is propaganda. On this account, no work of art can reasonably claim to derive its content from “a distinct and inviolate domain of aesthetic value,” for all art derives its content from a public domain of ethico-political value to which the artist must creatively respond. The artist is at once outwardly and inwardly compelled by the webs of meaning that encumber her, for while these webs of meaning impose themselves from “without,” the artist suffers them as parameters constituting her “within” as a subject. The freedom that the apostle of truth and right can claim in relation to these parameters is akin to self-legislation—it is the freedom she enjoys in creatively responding to them, in working out her relationship to them and, in effect, making them her own (Taylor, 2016, 96–99).

By exercising her freedom, finally, by creating beautiful works of art that promote the ends of sympathy and universal understanding, the artist may undertake to widen the ethical and cognitive horizons of her intended addressees, and thus to expand their capacity for judgment. In writing a book like Souls, for example, Du Bois undertook to widen his white counterparts’ capacities to sympathize with and evaluate the suffering in the souls of black Americans (Rogers, 2012, 193–198).

What is the nature of beauty such that it can achieve these ends through the communication of truth and goodness? Du Bois never states a clear answer to this question.[41] But he offers clues to an answer in “Of Beauty and Death,” chapter 9 of Darkwater. In that essay, his most sustained reflection on the nature of beauty, Du Bois contrasts beauty to “ugliness and hate and ill…with all their contradiction and illogic;” beauty, he writes, “is fulfillment. It satisfies. It is always new and strange. It is the reasonable thing” (1920, 120). Perhaps Du Bois’s point is an expressivist one: that beauty satisfies by clarifying our ideas of truth (at once consistent and reasonable) and goodness (the opposite of hate and ill); that is, by embodying those ideas in novel and unsettling works of art.

6. Intellectual History, History of Philosophy, and Du Bois

We conclude this entry by noting that an ongoing feature of scholarly debate about Du Bois is sometimes contentious disagreement as to his proper place in intellectual history and/or the history of philosophy. A brief survey of the variety of interpretive orientations that usefully have been brought to bear in appraising Du Bois as a philosopher, or as a thinker, suggests that, in studying his writings, we might do well to heed Nietzsche’s suggestion that the multiplication of perspectives can often enhance our knowledge of the subject matter under consideration (Nietzsche, 1887, 85).

The relevant categories tend to be geographic, racial, thematic, or some combination of the three. Du Bois’s philosophical books and essays have been read as contributions to American thought (Zamir, 1995) and to American political thought (Reed, 1997). More narrowly and more broadly, they have been read as statements of Afro-American exceptionalist thought (West, 1982); as key constituents of the black nationalist tradition (Moses, 1978); as important additions to the black natural law tradition (Lloyd, 2016); as a part of the history of African American prophetic political critique (Marshall, 2011); and as critical contributions to Africana and Afro-Modern thought (Gordon, 2008; Gooding-Williams, 2009). Intending to correct the tendency evident in these works to position Du Bois as an American, black American, Africana, and/or Afro-modern thinker, Appiah (2014) has highlighted the late 19th century, German intellectual milieu that shaped Du Bois’s thinking. Contra Appiah, Tommy Curry (2014) has argued that we lose sight of the philosophical substance of Du Bois’s thought if, like Appiah, we scant the influence of other African American writers on his thinking.

Among critics wishing to situate Du Bois within a well-defined, western philosophical tradition, the main tendencies have been to characterize Du Bois either as a pragmatist (see West, 1989, Taylor, 2004b, and Kahn, 2009) or as an Hegelian of sorts. Much of the literature following this second line of interpretation has considered Du Bois’s writings, and especially Souls, in the perspective of Hegel’s Phenomenology of Spirit (see, e.g., Gooding-Williams, 1987 and 1991; Zamir, 1995; and, most recently, Shaw, 2013). In this connection, Paul Taylor (2004b) has persuasively argued that we need not choose between an Hegelian Du Bois and a pragmatist Du Bois. More recently, Nahum Chandler has proposed to read Du Bois neither as an Hegelian, nor as a pragmatist, but in parallel to several of his European contemporaries, including Husserl, Weber, Durkheim, Boas and Freud (Chandler, 2014).

To be sure, it would be false to claim that all of the above-mentioned interpretive perspectives have yielded genuine insight and illumination. But more have than have not, a fact that primarily attests to the range, depth, and fecundity of Du Bois’s philosophical thought.


Books by Du Bois

   1896 The Suppression of the African Slave Trade to the United States of America: 1638–1870, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007.
1899 The Philadelphia Negro, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007.
1903a The Souls of Black Folk, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007.
1909 John Brown, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007.
1911 The Quest of the Silver Fleece, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007.
1915 The Negro, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007.
1920 Darkwater, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007.
1924 The Gift of Black Folk, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007.
1928 The Dark Princess, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007.
1930 Africa, Its Geography, People, and Products and Africa—Its Place in Modern History, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007.
1935 Black Reconstruction in America, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007.
1939 Black Folk Then and Now, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007.
1940 Dusk of Dawn, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007.
1946 The World and Africa (1946) and Color and Democracy (1946), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007.
1952 In Battle for Peace, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007.
1957 The Ordeal of Mansart, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007.
1959 Mansart Builds a School, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007.
1961 Worlds of Color, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007.
1968 The Autobiography of W.E.B. Du Bois, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007.

Other works by Du Bois referred to in the text

1897a “The Conservation of Races” in Nahum Dimitri Chandler (ed.), The Problem of the Color Line At the Turn of the Twentieth Century: The Essential Early Essays, New York: Fordham University Press, 2015, pp. 51–65. Reprint of “The Conservation of Races,” Washington, D.C.: American Negro Academy, 1897.
1897b “Strivings of the Negro People,” in Nahum Dimitri Chandler (ed.), The Problem of the Color Line At the Turn of the Twentieth Century: The Essential Early Essays, New York: Fordham University Press, 2015, pp. 67–75. Reprint of “Strivings of the Negro People,” The Atlantic Monthly 80, no. 478 (August 1897): 194–198
Ca. 1897 “A Program for a Sociological Society”, a speech given at Atlanta University to the First Sociological Club. [Available Online]
1898 “The Study of the Negro Problems” in Nahum Dimitri Chandler (ed.), The Problem of the Color Line At the Turn of the Twentieth Century: The Essential Early Essays, New York: Fordham University Press, 2015, pp. 77–98. Reprint of “The Study of the Negro Problems,” Annals of the American Academy of Political and Social Science 11, no.1 (January 1898): 1–23.
1903b “The Talented Tenth” in Nahum Dimitri Chandler (ed.), The Problem of the Color Line At the Turn of the Twentieth Century: The Essential Early Essays, New York: Fordham University Press, 2015.
Ca. 1905 “Sociology Hesitant” in Nahum Dimitri Chandler (ed.), The Problem of the Color Line At the Turn of the Twentieth Century: The Essential Early Essays, New York: Fordham University Press, 2015.
1926 “Criteria of Negro Art,” The Crisis, Vol. 32, October 1926: 290–297, http://www.webdubois.org/dbCriteriaNArt.html
1944 “My Evolving Program for Negro Freedom” in Rayford W. Logan (ed.), What the Negro Wants, Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 2012, reprint edition, pp. 31–70.
1948 “The Talented Tenth Memorial Address,” in Henry Louis Gates, Jr. and Cornel West, The Future of the Race, New York: Knopf, 1996, pp.159–177.

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