Emotions in the Christian Tradition

First published Wed Feb 1, 2006; substantive revision Wed Mar 10, 2021

This article discusses several interrelated questions that philosophers, theologians, and psychologists address about religious emotions. Do they have some essence? Is there one emotion-type that warrants the title “religious,” or are there many religious emotion-types? How do religious emotions differ from “ordinary” emotions? Is ‘emotion’ the right word for the experiences under consideration? Are religious emotions “cognitive” or “non-cognitive,” “rational” or “non-rational”? What good are they? What epistemic import, if any, have they? This article will focus on emotions in or purportedly in the Judeo-Christian tradition.

1. History of emotion in Christianity

1.1. Emotions in the New Testament

For theologians and Christian thinkers, the New Testament, read against the background of the Hebrew Bible, is in some sense authoritative. So it is the place to begin a discussion of emotions in the Christian tradition. The New Testament features, in varying degrees of prominence, a number of attitudinal phenomena that in modern parlance would be called emotions and the practices in which emotions are expressed: joy and rejoicing, gratitude and thanksgiving, remorse (grief) or regret and repentance, compassion, anger, fear, sorrow, envy, pride, shame, contempt, and others. Instances of these attitudinal phenomena vary in how theology-laden they are, and in this sense vary as to whether they count as “religious” emotions.

Perhaps the most prominent of these attitudinal phenomena is joy (chairein, chara, and to a much lesser extent agalliasthai, agalliasis). It is especially prominent in the writings of the apostle Paul, who includes joy in his list of the “fruit of the [Holy] Spirit” in Galatians 5:22–3. The idea seems to be that when joy is a fruit of the Spirit, it is about what God has done, God’s identity or attributes, or the believer’s relation to God. That is, the “content” of the joy is a theological belief. Strikingly, the object of joy sometimes includes suffering. For example, the Acts of the Apostles (chapter 5) reports that the apostles had been gaining a considerable following in Jerusalem and the high priest reacted by throwing them in prison. They escaped, and the next day they were back preaching and teaching. The authorities picked them up again and warned them to stop their public activities, but the apostles were defiant, saying that God had ordered them to do this. So they were flogged and again admonished to cease their activities. “As [the apostles] left the council, they rejoiced (chairontes) that they were considered worthy to suffer dishonor for the sake of the name [of Jesus]” (Acts 5:41; New Revised Standard Version; hereafter all New Testament quotations are from this translation. See also Romans 5:3 and Colossians 1:24). These instances of joy are thoroughly theological, for the believer’s joy is about his or her service to and identification with Jesus, the Son of God.

In the following passage, Paul rejoices about somebody else’s suffering, though not maliciously, but out of love for the sufferer. “Now I rejoice (chairō), not because you were grieved (elupēthēte), but because your grief (lupē) led to repentance (metanoian); for you felt a godly grief (elupēthēte gar kata theon), so that you were not harmed in any way by us. For godly grief (kata theon lupē) produces a repentance that leads to salvation and brings no regret (ametamelēton), but worldly grief (tou kosmou lupē) produces death. [For discussion of emotions belonging to the family of regret, remorse, and repentance, see Bash 2019).] For see what earnestness this godly grief has produced in you, what eagerness to clear yourselves, what indignation, what alarm, what longing, what zeal, what punishment! At every point you have proved yourselves guiltless in this matter” (II Corinthians 7:9–11). Here Paul the pastor rejoices over the Corinthians’ sorrow, not simply because of their emotional pain, but because of the character of their pain — that it was about something genuinely lamentable (some inappropriate attitude or action of theirs, considered in the light of God’s will). This grief was not a harm to the Corinthians, but an expression of their spiritual health and wellbeing. This sorrow is something to rejoice about, because it was a good thing for them and for the whole church. This might be an example of a joy that is a fruit of the Holy Spirit, a joy that betokens harmony of mind with the mind of God. So Paul’s joy, as well as the Corinthians’ grief, is heavily theology-laden: both emotions are situational construals that incorporate Christian beliefs.

Consider now an episode of joy that is attributed to a Christian in the New Testament, but which may be more mundane, or even “secular.” King Herod is persecuting the church and has the apostle Peter thrown in prison and kept under heavy guard. But, the night before Herod is planning to bring Peter out of prison and encourage something bad to happen to him, Peter escapes miraculously and goes to a house where members of the church are meeting and fervently praying for Peter. “When he knocked at the outer gate, a maid named Rhoda came to answer. On recognizing Peter’s voice, she was so overjoyed that (apo tēs charas), instead of opening the gate, she ran in and announced that Peter was standing at the gate” (Acts 12:13–14). How theology-laden is Rhoda’s joy? I think that will depend on the depth of Rhoda’s catechesis. In any case, it is probably shallower than Paul’s. It is possible that Rhoda is simply caught up in the church’s enthusiasm to get Peter back and is a beneficiary of emotional contagion. It is also possible that, given that she has just stepped out of a meeting heavy into prayer for Peter’s rescue, Rhoda is at the moment theologically primed to construe the situation in Christian terms. And it is also possible that Rhoda’s joy arises from a deep piety — a thorough-going personal integration of the Christian vision of God’s purposes — that she rejoices spontaneously out of these character-resources, and that her joy is specifically gratitude to God.

And last, consider a joy which, if theology-laden, is, according to the New Testament, laden with bad theology. Judas Iscariot has conceived the wish to betray Jesus to the hostile authorities. “[Judas] went away and conferred with the chief priests and officers of the temple police about how he might betray [Jesus] to them. They were greatly pleased (echarēsan) and agreed to give him money” (Luke 22:4–5). Perhaps the religious authorities, like some crazed terrorists, thought they were doing the will of God in getting Jesus judicially murdered. In that case, their joy was theology-laden and thus religious. But Mark’s Gospel (15:10) comments that Pilate knew that it was out of envy (phthonos) that the religious authorities wanted to be rid of Jesus. If this is right, then their joy at Judas’s offer was not religious at all, but motivated by a vicious secular defensiveness of their own power and glory.

Joy is a paradigmatic emotion in the New Testament, and the New Testament is the originary document of Christianity. A thorough treatment of emotions in the New Testament would take several other emotion-types into consideration, and go much deeper into joy than we have done here. But this brief treatment of joy should serve our purposes in this article.

1.2 Passions, affections, and emotions

Is ‘emotion’ the right term for the experiences under consideration? In Thomas Dixon’s well-known study (2003) of the history of the concept of emotion, he argues that the term ‘emotion’ was coined in the early 19th century, by psychologists impressed with physics, as a secular replacement for the morally, religiously, and metaphysically freighted distinction between ‘passion’ and ‘affection.’ In the older Christian psychology (which still had distinguished representatives in the late 19th century), the phenomena that we call emotions were called passions and affections, these two categories being distinguished from one another. Aquinas is a paradigm thinker in this psychology of “emotions.” Passions (passiones) are feeling-responses such as humans share with animals, responses to bodily and sensory occurrences (e.g. sense perceptions of danger, of food, of sexual opportunity). They are marked by visceral commotion and are associated with moral temptation or turpitude. Affections (affectiones), by contrast, are generated not in the sensory appetite, but in the will or intellectual appetite, a psychological capacity peculiar to human beings. Human beings share affectiones not with the animals, but with higher beings such as angels and God. Passions, however, are not always sinful, and a passion can be transformed into an affection if the person feeling it endorses it by an act of the will or intellectual appetite. Dixon argues that ‘emotion’ was coined by physiological psychologists Thomas Brown, Herbert Spencer, and Alexander Bain. It was later adopted by William James (1884), though his work on religious experience (1901–02) was more phenomenological and less focused on physical causation. In “What Is An Emotion” (1884) James famously proposed that an emotion is just an awareness of a bodily perturbation that is directly produced by objects (for example, a large bear advancing toward you on a lonely path). In psychology even today ‘emotion’ tends to have this physicalist connotation and is less discriminating than the earlier vocabulary of passions and affections, with its openness to spiritual “emotions.” Rather than call the briefly sketched biblical responses of joy and so forth emotions, would it not be more discriminating and less confusing to follow the earlier Christian vocabulary and call them affections? If gratitude can succeed, as religious people think it can, in being to God, and if Paul’s joy can be about the moral status of the Corinthians’ remorse, then they seem clearly not to be simple responses to physical or sensory stimuli. Indeed, most human emotions fail to qualify as emotions in the original historical sense of the word. The kind that does plausibly qualify — “the startle response” (see Robinson 1995) — is only controversially an emotion in our ordinary sense of the word. Our ordinary sense is very far from its historical origin as Dixon has traced it. Dixon is right that ‘emotion’ blurs the distinction that ‘passion’ and ‘affection’ once embodied. But arguably that distinction is well lost. Fears marked by strong physiological commotion can be evoked by objects inaccessible to animals without an intellect, for example, a fall in the stock market. And it seems to take more than the mere sensory “stimulus” of a large bear coming toward me on a lonely path to arouse fear. For example, I may recognize her as my pet, and her rapid advance as her enthusiasm in greeting me. Nor is the moral dividing line between passions and affections valid. Passions may be morally beautiful (for example, a woman’s erotically tinged joy upon seeing her husband after an absence) and affections despicable (the cool cruel joy of humiliating a colleague as you dismantle his pet argument). The very indifference of the concept of emotion to whether the object is simple or intellectually complex, sensory or not, whether accompanied or not by bodily perturbations, and whether it merits moral evaluation or not, seems to recommend it in preference to the older vocabulary. Gratitude, contrition, compassion, joy, hope, and all the other religious emotions fit quite commodiously in the category of emotion.

2. Essentialism in the conception of religious emotions

Essentialism in the conception of religious emotions is the view that there is some universal religious emotion — an emotion or emotion-like affection that is the single universal essence of all religious experiences, and the feature that makes them properly religious.

In the first section of this article, we have assumed diversity among the types of emotion that might be called “religious.” Joy, compassion, remorse, and so forth, are different emotion types. The unity we find among them, in contradistinction from “secular” emotions, is their theological reference or “content.” Insofar as they are distinctively Christian, they all draw on Christian doctrine. Yet they pick from that body of doctrine different bits and deploy them to different purposes. The terms in which the believer construes the object of compassion will differ from the terms in which, when she feels gratitude to God, she construes herself, a benefit, and God. Indeed, what differentiates one emotion type from another seems to be the terms of the construal.

Friedrich Schleiermacher (1768–1834) was a Christian theologian, but he sought to understand the essence of religion in general, of which Christianity was presumably an instance. He held that the essence of religion is piety and that piety consists in the feeling of absolute dependence. What is the feeling of absolute dependence, and how is it related to more specific religious emotions?

Feeling is “immediate” self-consciousness as contrasted with “that consciousness of self which is more like an objective consciousness, being a representation of oneself, and thus mediated by self-contemplation” (The Christian Faith, §3.2). For Schleiermacher ‘immediate’ contrasts with ‘analytic’; he seems to have in mind something like what people mean when they say that feelings are ‘non-cognitive’: that they precede and cannot be captured in articulate thought. Joy, he says, is a genuine state of feeling, but self-approval “belong[s] to the objective consciousness of self” (ibid.). One might feel joy without knowing why, but presumably self-approval requires that one have reasons; thus the former is immediate, the latter analytic.

Schleiermacher says that at a certain stage of cultural and individual development all human beings have two feelings (states of self-consciousness) with respect to the world: the feeling of freedom and the feeling of dependence. The feeling of freedom corresponds to Activity, and is the feeling of being effective with respect to changes in the world. This will include not only bringing about physical changes (say, digging a hole in the earth) but also perceiving things (perceiving is a sort of activity with respect to the thing perceived) and thinking about them. By contrast, the feeling of dependence corresponds to Receptivity and is the feeling of being acted upon by things in the world (say, being affected by the food one eats or helped by fellow human beings). Vis-à-vis the world and the things in the world, people always have a mixture of the feeling of freedom and the feeling of dependence. One never has a feeling of absolute (unqualified, schlechthinig) freedom with respect to anything, for no matter how active one is with respect to it, there will always be an element of receptivity or dependence on it or some aspect of it or something closely associated with it.

The same is true of dependence, as far as the relation to things in the world is concerned. You are never purely or absolutely dependent on things in the world. If, for example, you were completely paralyzed but still conscious, you would be very dependent, but presumably could still focus your attention or this or that thing on which you were dependent, and to that extent would engage in free activity and have the corresponding feeling. It is another matter, however, if your thought ventures beyond the world. If you think, not of anything in the world, but of the world as a whole (including yourself as part of the world) and then think what is beyond that, then the feeling you have with respect to that absolute Beyond is absolute “dependence,” in the sense of being conscious of having no power with respect to it, being utterly unable to affect it (even by perceiving or thinking it). On this account, the object of the feeling of absolute dependence is what is utterly beyond the world or universe, regarded as everything that exists, and it is the feeling of your own impotence with respect to that “object.”

Our natural cognitive equipment suffices to bring about the feeling of absolute dependence. It requires only the idea that existing things have causes and the idea of all existing things taken together. From this we get the idea of God as the cause of all that is. But then we think, if God exists, then God is part of all that is, and the urge for a causal explanation recurs: where did God come from? Theists put a stop to this line of thought by declaring that God has necessary existence, and so God, unlike everything else, doesn’t need to be caused. But the very question has projected the mind beyond the whole of what exists, to the radical other side of being, and that other side is not only absolutely uninflenceable, it is not even thinkable. And so the feeling generated by this thought is the feeling of absolute dependence.

How is the feeling of absolute dependence related to episodes of the particular religious emotion-types, such as joy, gratitude, hope, contrition, compassion, and sorrow? The short answer is that for Schleiermacher the feeling of absolute dependence is the essentially religious element in these emotions (see ibid., §5.4–5). Without that element, no emotion would be religious. The feeling of absolute dependence is, in itself, not about events taking place in the world; it is about what is beyond everything that exists, so its “object” is completely unchanging. The particular religious emotions, by contrast, are responses, some pleasant and some unpleasant, to changes in the finite or sensible self-consciousness. Gratitude, for example, is a response to a particular kind of situation in which the subject is the recipient of some benefit; contrition is a response to a situation in which the subject has committed some fault; and so forth. In a more traditional theology, the difference between gratitude to a kind neighbor for a benefit and religious gratitude would be that in the latter case the subject is grateful to God for the benefit. The subject would causally attribute the benefit to God. Similarly, the difference between feeling guilty for having lied to one’s neighbor and religious contrition would be that the subject would think of his fault as having offended God. Something like this idea is behind Schleiermacher’s claim that the feeling of absolute dependence is the religious element in every religious emotion. However, he certainly does not think of the Beyond as actually supplying worldly benefits to people, or as being actually offended when they perform nasty actions. This would bring the Beyond smack into the world and thus destroy the feeling of absolute dependence. Schleiermacher does not give a careful account of the relation between the feeling of absolute dependence and the particular emotions, but just says that the feeling “unites with a sensibly determined self-consciousness, and thus becomes an emotion (Erregung)…” (ibid., §5.5). I offer the following as a possible clarification, using the example of gratitude: some impressive good befalls me, and I recognize it as such. This recognition is an empirically ascertainable consciousness of myself, thus a “sensibly determined self-consciousness.” Then, in conjunction with this sensibly determined consciousness of being “moved” with gratitude, I have the feeling of absolute dependence; and thus my ordinary gratitude becomes religious, or in traditional terms I am moved with gratitude to God.

One might think that mood would be a better category than emotion for interpreting Schleiermacher’s comments about the feeling (Gefühl) of absolute dependence. (On the differences between emotion and mood, see Beedie, Terry, and Lane, 2005.) Feeling is a broader category than emotion. Both moods and emotions can be felt, and the diffuseness of the feeling of absolute dependence might be thought to warrant this change of category. Furthermore, we might see in this change an opportunity to explain better the relation between the feeling of absolute dependence and the particular religious emotions. Moods, it seems, predispose emotions: if you’re irritable, you’re more likely to get angry upon being insulted; if you’re cheerful, you’re more likely to feel joy upon being told good news; and so forth. And this, we might think, is due to the fact that the particular emotions not only are predisposed by moods, but themselves embody moods: joy is cheerful, sorrow is depressed, anger is irritable, and so forth. Similarly, if you’re feeling absolutely dependent, you’re more likely to feel religiously contrite, joyful, grateful, and so forth, and each of these particular emotion types embodies the feeling of absolute dependence. This is perhaps a useful suggestion, inasmuch as Schleiermacher takes the feeling of absolute dependence to be implicit in all religious emotions. One objection to assimilating the feeling of absolute dependence to mood would be that intentionality seems to be a feature of emotions that distinguishes them from moods, and Schleiermacher clearly specifies the intentionality of the feeling of absolute dependence.

The feeling of absolute dependence, conceived as Schleiermacher conceives it, presents him with several problems that he does not seem to resolve. 1) Despite his claim that the feeling is “immediate” in the sense of non-cognitive, we have just given a quite cognitive account of the feeling. It seems to depend on a particular way of thinking about the world and what is beyond the world. Both world and agent need to be thought of in terms of effect and receptivity to effect; and then the Beyond needs to be conceived in analogy and contrast with this aspect of the world, in its relation to the agent (subject of the feeling). A person who did not engage in this process of thought, at least covertly or subconsciously, would never get to the feeling of absolute dependence as Schleiermacher describes it. 2) Schleiermacher is a Christian theologian and thinks he has given an account of the most basic experience of God. But any God who existed would be part of the “world” on Schleiermacher’s conception and thus could not be the object of the feeling of absolute dependence. Furthermore, the God of Christian tradition is not utterly incapable of being affected by human beings. God responds to states of the world with actions and emotions, and hears and answers prayer. 3) Absolutizing the dependency relationship in the way that Schleiermacher does seems to evacuate ‘dependency’ of its usual meaning. The “other” towards which one feels absolutely “dependent” in Schleiermacher’s conception must be predicateless to protect it against any influence (in particular, epistemic contact) from the side of the world; but that move eliminates any positive sense in which we depend on it. Absolute dependence in the object comes to equal absolute incapability of being affected, and the feeling of absolute dependence amounts to a feeling of complete lack of effective agency vis-à-vis the other — that is, it becomes a purely negative conception. So the feeling of absolute dependence might better be called the feeling of absolute impotence.

A prominent representative of the essentialist thinking about religious emotion of which Schleiermacher seems to be the originator is Rudolf Otto in The Idea of the Holy (published 1923). The feeling basic to religion is that of the numinous, of the mysterium tremendum et fascinans (roughly, “the mysterious presence of the wholly other that inspires awe and devotion”). “There is no religion in which it does not live as the real innermost core, and without it no religion would be worthy of the name” (p. 6). This feeling is not in itself ethical; it is not, for example, the feeling of being in the presence of a moral judge or command-giver. Thus religion is not just a kind of ethics, as Kant tended to think. The numinous feeling is “a unique original feeling-response, which can be in itself ethically neutral and claims consideration in its own right” (ibid.). The feeling bears some resemblance to, but also differs from, a sense of dread, of horror, of the uncanny, the eerie, the weird; it also corresponds to a kind of “wrath” of the divine, a divine demeanor that has about it something incalculable and arbitrary, a kind of unpredictable majestic overpowering fearsomeness. However, one can have a feeling of the mysterium that is not fear-like; a feeling not of tremor, but of stupor. “Stupor is plainly a different thing from tremor; it signifies blank wonder, an astonishment that strikes us dumb, amazement absolute” (p. 26).

Otto does not attempt to give us a straightforward grammar of the numinous feeling, and says in fact that this cannot be done. Instead, he approaches it by comparing it with other experiences and trying out various terms that might approach to it in meaning, without exactly getting it; then the idea is that the reader will find the feeling among his own experiences, and thus be informed. Otto chides Schleiermacher for making the feeling of absolute dependence a mode of self-consciousness and for leaving the non-subjective object of the feeling uncharacterized (p. 10). Contrary to Schleiermacher, Otto says the concept of causation is absent from the most basic feeling. “The point from which speculation starts is not a ‘consciousness of absolute dependence’ — of myself as a result and effect of a divine cause — for that would in point of fact lead to insistence upon the reality of the self [which on Otto’s construction virtually disappears in the confrontation with the mysterium tremendum]; it starts from a consciousness of the absolute superiority or supremacy of a power other than myself, and it is only as it falls back upon ontological terms to achieve its end — terms generally borrowed from natural science — that that element of the tremendum, originally apprehended as ‘plenitude of power’, becomes transmuted into ‘plenitude of being’” (p. 21).

We can see two tendencies in Otto’s thought: his striving to make the numinous feeling sui generis, to protect it from encroachments of other spheres such as ethics and science; and his striving to make it do justice to the variety of the emotions that actually occur in religious life. These tendencies are hard to combine in a consistent account, especially if the supposed encroachments of the “other spheres” are actually native to the religion whose emotions are being examined. For example, Christianity is a religion whose theology is an ethics, an ethics of justice, truthfulness, compassion for the poor and suffering, and of mutual love in the community. In the ideal case, the emotions that are generated from thinking, caring, and acting by the standards of Christian theology are emotions that express ethical character.

Commenting on the kind of essentialism about religious experience that Schleiermacher and Otto represent, William James says:

Consider … the ‘religious sentiment’ which we see referred to in so many books, as if it were a single sort of mental entity. In the psychologies and in the philosophies of religion, we find the authors attempting to specify just what entity it is. One man allies it to the feeling of dependence; one makes it a derivative from fear; others connect it with the sexual life; others still identify it with the feeling of the infinite; and so on. Such different ways of conceiving it ought of themselves to arouse doubt as to whether it possibly can be one specific thing; and the moment we are willing to treat the term ‘religious sentiment’ as a collective name for the many sentiments which religious objects may arouse in alternation, we see that it probably contains nothing whatever of a psychologically specific nature. There is religious fear, religious love, religious joy, and so forth. But religious love is only man’s natural emotion of love directed to a religious object; religious fear is only the ordinary fear of commerce, so to speak, the common quaking of the human breast, in so far as the notion of divine retribution may arouse it; religious awe is the same organic thrill which we feel in a forest at twilight, or in a mountain gorge; only this time it comes over us at the thought of our supernatural relations; and similarly of all the various sentiments which may be called into play in the lives of religious persons. As concrete states of mind, made up of a feeling plus a specific sort of object, religious emotions of course are psychic entities distinguishable from other concrete emotions; but there is no ground of assuming a simply abstract ‘religious emotion’ to exist as a distinct elementary mental affection by itself, present in every religious experience without exception (The Varieties of Religious Experience, Lecture II, p. 46).

James here assimilates religious emotions to emotions more generally, and eschews the project of trying to identify some particular emotion-type to which every instance of religious emotion belongs and which makes it religious. But a few pages later (p. 49) he “arbitrarily” for purposes of his exposition says that religion is the feelings, acts, and experiences of individuals when they apprehend themselves to be in the presence of the divine. Supposing that diversity among conceptions of the divine will engender diversity among emotional experiences of the divine, and the diversity among types of emotions will reflect differences in ways experiences of the divine bear on the diverse situations of life, the Jamesian picture seems compatible with our brief exposition of emotions in the New Testament at the beginning of this article.

A question can be raised whether the famous Jamesian theory of emotions, referred to in this quotation, is the best account for understanding religious emotions. That theory holds that the emotion itself is a “quaking of the human breast” or an “organic thrill,” where such physiological perturbations are caused (aroused) by “objects.” The cause of the quaking may be a bear approaching on the forest path, or it may be the thought of divine retribution. The quaking is religious just in case it is caused by a divine object — or at least a thought thereof.

3. Some Christian emotions

Christianity is the religion with which Otto and Schleiermacher are most deeply concerned. Christian theology ascribes to God a variety of attributes, both attributed qualities and attributed actions. These attributes determine the type-identities of the believer’s diverse emotions by providing, in turn, the various considerations to which the emotions are diverse responses. Let us look at some examples.

3.1 Gratitude

We may begin with the emotion that is perhaps closest to Schleiermacher’s feeling of absolute dependence, that of gratitude. The grateful person willingly, even gladly, acknowledges his indebtedness to — dependency on — a benefactor. The central sentence from the General Thanksgiving in the Book of Common Prayer is,

We bless thee for our creation, preservation, and all the blessings of this life; but above all, for thine inestimable love in the redemption of the world by our Lord Jesus Christ; for the means of grace, and for the hope of glory (p. 19).

The attributes of God that especially come into play in the emotion of gratitude are God’s creation and providence for our present life and God’s work of redeeming us from sin in the life, death, and resurrection of Jesus Christ. It is true that in this standard Christian gratitude the believer does not feel “absolutely dependent” in Schleiermacher’s peculiar sense of that phrase; as we have seen, the feeling of absolute dependence does not allow for God to have any positive attributes. But the believer certainly does feel very dependent on God in the ordinary sense of ‘dependent.’ She construes her own existence as having not been, had God not willed and worked it. In so feeling, the believer attributes causality to God as the creator, preserver, and redeemer of the believer’s life; and this concept of causality is not “borrowed from natural science,” as Otto suggests, but antedates natural science by several millennia. It is a concept of causation that is embedded in the Jewish-Christian tradition. (Notice that gratitude, as a construal of what God has done for us, also has the Schleiermacherian property of self-consciousness.) The thought of these attributes of God and of God’s relation to the grateful party seems to be more than a Jamesian trigger or stimulus of some physiological perturbation in the body of the believer. It seems better to think of it as a consideration that “speaks” to the believer’s concerns about the good things in her life and about the attitude of God toward the believer that those blessings express. No mention is made of physiological perturbation, nor does the “feeling” of such figure prominently in the typical believer’s experience. The thought seems to be internal to the emotional experience in a way that thought cannot be internal to a physiological sensation.

3.2 Contrition

Next, consider contrition. Again, we can get a good idea of the qualities and actions that this emotion attributes to God by considering a prayer from the Book of Common Prayer (in this emotion, much of what the believer attributes she attributes to herself; however, attributes of God, such as God’s holiness and status as judge, and God’s redeeming action, are essential posits of the believer’s construal):

Almighty God, Father of our Lord Jesus Christ, Maker of all things, Judge of all men; we acknowledge and bewail our manifold sins and wickedness, which we, from time to time, most grievously have committed, by thought, word, and deed, against thy Divine Majesty, provoking most justly thy wrath and indignation against us. We do earnestly repent, and are heartily sorry for these our misdoings; the remembrance of them is grievous unto us; the burden of them is intolerable. Have mercy upon us, have mercy upon us, most merciful Father; For thy Son our Lord Jesus Christ’s sake, forgive us all that is past… (p. 73).

This emotion again fits very well Schleiermacher’s characterization of religious emotion as a “self-consciousness,” but it is at the same time, as Otto suggests, a consciousness of a God who has definite, positive features. Salient in the consciousness of the contrite person are her misdoings and her sullied moral status before the divine judge. Contrary to Otto’s isolation of religious experience from ethics, in contrition God is thought of as an eminently moral figure. But if we take this prayer as canonical for the emotion, then both the notion of God as creator (opening sentence) and Otto’s privileged attribute of the divine majesty are also in the believer’s construal of God, though they seem to be less salient than the attribute of moral judge. Another attribute that is very much in the content of Christian contrition is God’s mercy. Thus a serenity and honesty about the grievousness and intolerable burden of sin are characteristic of contrition that are not characteristic of a plain feeling of guilt. The contrite believer feels herself, in her sin, to be welcomed and embraced by a loving and forgiving God, a merciful Father.

3.3 Compassion

The following prayer was composed by Mother Teresa of Calcutta for daily use in her Home for the Dying:

Dearest Lord, may I see you today and every day in the person of your sick, and while nursing them, minister to you.

Though you hide yourself behind the unattractive disguise of the irritable, the exacting, the unreasonable, may I still recognize you, and say:

“Jesus, my patient, how sweet it is to serve you.”

Lord, give me this seeing faith, then my work will never be monotonous. I will ever find joy in humoring the fancies and gratifying the wishes of all poor sufferers.

O beloved sick, how doubly dear you are to me, when you personify Christ; and what a privilege is mine to be allowed to tend you.

Sweetest Lord, make me appreciative of the dignity of my high vocation, and its many responsibilities. Never permit me to disgrace it by giving way to coldness, unkindness, or impatience.

And O God, while you are Jesus, my patient, deign also to be to me a patient Jesus, bearing with my faults, looking only to my intention, which is to love and serve you in the person of each of your sick.

Lord, increase my faith, bless my efforts and work, now and for evermore. Amen.

Note the prevalence in this prayer of “cognitive” metaphors in the description (prescription) of the moral emotion of compassion: ‘see,’ ‘recognize,’ ‘appreciate.’ In compassion the primary focus is on the sufferer — someone who is in trouble and in need of help. But as Mother Teresa expresses the emotion in this prayer, it is very much a religious emotion because of the way in which the sufferer is seen. She sees Christ in the sufferer, and in doing so takes herself to be seeing something true about the sufferer, a truth that risks being obscured by the outward repulsiveness, both sensory and behavioral, of many of those to whom she ministered.

The religious character and distinctiveness of Christian compassion can be brought out by comparing it with an emotion that we might call tragic compassion, since it is central to the ethos and teaching of the Greek tragedians. Aristotle neatly summarizes the grammar of this compassion:

Let compassion then be a kind of pain excited by the sight of evil, deadly or painful, which befalls one who does not deserve it, an evil which one might expect to come upon oneself or one of one’s friends, and when it seems near. For it is evident that one who is likely to feel pity must be such as to think that he, or one of his friends, is liable to suffer some evil… (The Art of Rhetoric 1385b).

Aristotle analyses tragic compassion as involving three propositions, so to speak: (1) the sufferer’s suffering is serious; (2) the sufferer does not deserve his suffering; 3) the sufferer’s suffering is of a kind that could well touch me [the subject of the emotion] too (Martha Nussbaum devotes Part II of her Upheavals of Thought to this emotion-type). We might say that compassion is a construal of the situation — the sufferer, his suffering, the etiology of the suffering, and the emotional subject’s own condition compared with that of the sufferer — in terms of these three formal propositions.

Perhaps the most obvious difference between tragic compassion and Mother Teresa’s is the fact that the latter involves the proposition the sufferer is a type (brother, sister, beloved) of Christ. This has the implication that Christian compassion is not primarily a “kind of pain.” It is uncomfortable certainly, and the subject of this compassion is moved to alleviate the suffering as she can; but it is also a joy, and the work is “sweet,” and the poor sufferers are “doubly dear” — dear on their own account and on Christ’s. Mother Teresa expresses an almost erotic enthusiasm for the people she serves, and it is because she loves Christ above all. The prayer exudes not just compassion, but also gratitude and devotion, and the compassion derives its character in part from these other emotions, which in turn have their character because of the belief-system in which Mother Teresa lives.

An equally significant departure from the grammar of tragic compassion is the denial of the necessity of proposition 2) the sufferer does not deserve his suffering. This denial comes out in one of the paradigm texts for Christian compassion, the Parable of the Prodigal Son in Luke 15.11–32. The younger of two sons asks his father for his share of the inheritance ahead of time, and the son takes the money and goes abroad where he “squander[s] his property in loose living” (vs. 13). When the money is depleted a famine descends on his country of residence, and he is destitute. He gets a job feeding pigs, and is miserable and hungry. He has the bright idea of returning to his father in the role of a common laborer on the home farm.

And he arose and came to his father. But while he was yet at a distance, his father saw him and had compassion (esplanchnisthē), and ran and embraced him and kissed him. And the son said to him, “Father, I have sinned against heaven and before you; I am no longer worthy to be called your son; treat me as one of your hired servants.” But the father said to his servants, “Bring quickly the best robe, and put it on him; and put a ring on his hand, and shoes on his feet; and bring the fatted calf and kill it, and let us eat and make merry; for this my son was dead, and is alive again; he was lost, and is found.” And they began to make merry (vss 20–24).

The father can hardly be ignorant of the proposition my son deserves this suffering that he has brought on himself; and the son himself dins the proposition into his father’s head. But the father’s compassion is unaffected by the knowledge. The father in the parable is of course God, whose nature as gracious and forgiving is indicated in the parable. So Mother Teresa, unlike the characters in the Greek tragedies, is not interested in the question whether the sufferer brought his woes on himself through his choices. It is this gracious and forgiving God whose Son Mother Teresa sees and loves in each of her poor sufferers.

As to the third proposition, the Christian would no doubt generally acknowledge it, but it seems to figure differently in Christian than in tragic compassion. It does not seem to be a major consideration in Mother Teresa’s compassion that the same thing might happen to her as has happened to her poor sufferers. The difference turns on the phrase “might happen.” It is part of Mother Teresa’s spiritual discipline — her self-cultivation in the Christian emotions — that she deliberately puts herself, as much as practicable, in the position of those she ministers to. Early in her ministry she had to be persuaded to provide herself and her fellow nuns a bit more food than the average Calcutta street person consumed, so as to maintain her health well enough to continue her ministry. In this aspiration to identify with sufferers she imitates Christ, who lowered himself to the status of a servant and died the death of a criminal, out of compassion for humanity. In the nervous “it might happen to me too” of tragic compassion there is an aloofness from the sufferer and his suffering that is absent in the most paradigmatic exemplars of Christian compassion.

Christian compassion, like contrition and gratitude, does have an element faintly reminiscent of Schleiermacher’s feeling of absolute dependence. And again, it comes from the gratitude that is in the near vicinity of compassion. Unlike the subject of tragic compassion, the subject of Christian compassion construes herself as having been first the object of God’s compassion. One might say that Mother Teresa’s compassion towards poor sufferers springs from her gratitude to Christ for his compassion towards her and all humankind. But the reminiscence is only faint. Gratitude is not what Schleiermacher calls the feeling of absolute dependence. Indeed, the feeling of absolute dependence does not seem to be the essence of any of the Christian emotions. Rudolf Otto’s stress on fear (tremor) or blank wonder (stupor) also seems not to express the essence of Christian compassion. Christian doctrine does teach that God is fearsome and wonderful, but other attributes of God are much more to the fore in the emotion of compassion: God’s fatherly nurturing tenderness and forgiveness, his long-suffering love. William James’s critique of the essentialist tendency in the religious philosophy of the emotions seems on target: God has a variety of attributes, and these are reflected in a variety of emotion-types, none of which has any more claim than the others to constitute the essence of religious emotion. The diverse emotion types have in common that their grammar makes reference to God, but the attributes of God that they cite vary with the emotion types.

Otto states that the response to the mysterium tremendum is not necessarily moral and explains this by saying that the emotion does not necessarily posit God as a moral judge or law-giver. But compassion does seem to be necessarily moral, though it is true that the idea of God as judge or law-giver is not particularly in the picture. The moral attribute of God that is quite directly posited by the emotion is that of mercy or compassion. The sufferer is construed as one with whom Christ has identified and for whom Christ has suffered. The other two emotions that we have looked at are also essentially moral: contrition is a construal of oneself as morally at fault and spoiled, and here the idea of God as judge is involved; and gratitude, as a construal of oneself as indebted for a gift, has reference to a kind of justice (though it is clearly not standard retributive justice [see Roberts 2004]).

4. Are religious emotions “cognitive”?

Both Schleiermacher and Otto hold that the most basic religious emotions are unsusceptible of propositional definition. Yet both theologians specify, in propositions, the object of the religious emotion in question. Our accounts of gratitude, contrition, and compassion have likewise treated the emotions as having a propositional structure, one deriving from the teachings of the Christian tradition. Let us think for a moment about the sense in which these emotions are and are not propositional. The Christian emotions are given their distinctive character by their doctrinal content: The three cited prayers expressive of the distinctively Christian emotions all trade on propositional beliefs of the kind that the Christian community routinely teaches its members in catechesis. The situation of the emotional subject is then seen (felt) in terms of the teaching; for example, the sufferer on whom the subject has compassion is seen as one for whom Christ died; the object of gratitude is seen as a gift from the hand of God; and so forth. The particular character of each religious emotion-type would be impossible apart from this doctrinal content. This is the sense in which the Christian emotions are propositional. But still, the emotions themselves escape reduction to their propositional content because emotions are a sort of concern-based impression or perception or construal of the situation in these terms. Emotions transcend propositionality in the same way that any actual perception (e.g. visual perception) does. A Rembrandt painting can be truly characterized in many propositions, and in individual cases some of the propositions may need to be made explicit as a condition for seeing some things that are in the painting. But no amount of discourse or discursive thought about the content of the painting is a substitute for seeing the painting. This immediate acquaintance with the canvas is analogous to the actual having of the emotion (religious or otherwise). (For more on the view of emotions taken here, see Roberts 2013, chapters 3–5; for an excellent discussion of the relationship between religious feelings and religious doctrines, see Wynn, 2004, especially chapter 5. For more, and more extended, accounts of particular religious emotions, see Roberts 2007.) So religious emotions are no less propositional than other standard adult human emotions; and like the other emotions, they cannot be reduced to their propositional content.

When James says that the religious emotions are just like all other emotions in being “made up of a feeling plus a specific sort of object,” the specific sort of object is just the situational object specified in propositional terms such as the examples in this article have illustrated. But the peculiarity of the Jamesian theory comes in the reference to “a feeling.” The feeling he refers to (1884) is a bodily sensation, which he takes to be the element that makes the mental state into an emotion, and is a “quaking of the human breast,” an “organic thrill,” or the like. This account of affect seems to many to fail to capture the meaning that the object has for the subject – meaning that is conveyed through the emotion. Schleiermacher, with his talk of feeling dependent, and Otto, with his talk of awesome mystery, are closer to capturing the kind of affect in question. A sensation of quaking or a contraction of the gut are not the same kind of thing as the sense that the sufferer before one is a brother for whom Christ died, or that one’s sins are an intolerable burden. There may indeed be organic thrill or quaking, but if so, such sensations are incorporated into a perception of personal meaning wrought by the subject’s caring about the object.

Jesse Prinz (2004) tries to introduce correct intentionality into the Jamesian idea that emotional experience is awareness of a gut reaction by making the gut reaction indicate the instantiation of a “core relational theme”. The notion of a core relational theme, which originates with Richard S. Lazarus (1993), is the idea of a way that benefit or harm is mediated to the emotional subject from the environment. Lazarus gives a list of 15 core relational themes (see 1993 p. 122), among which are a demeaning offense against me and mine (anger), facing uncertain, existential threat (anxiety), and having failed to live up to an ego-ideal (shame). Such themes seem to be types of events or states of affairs that impinge on some concern of the subject. Prinz envisions the sequence that characterizes an emotion episode as follows: An eliciting event triggers a thought (say, Aaron tells me that my real father is not the man I have taken him all my life to be, but the Fuller brush man who used to visit the house; which triggers a characteristic reaction in my gut; which triggers my perception of the reaction in my gut; which I read as indicating a core relational theme, namely, a demeaning offense against me and mine; which triggers my socking Aaron in the jaw. But why would the identification of my father with the Fuller brush man trigger that reaction in my gut (which is characteristic of anger), unless I already heard it as a demeaning offense against me and mine? Prinz’s construction seems to misplace the gut reaction in the emotional process. The gut reaction seems, rather, to presuppose some emotional awareness of the core relational theme, which gives rise to the gut reaction (for discussion, see Roberts 2013, 73–75).

Mark Wynn (2013, 27–33) points out that in James’s discussion of religious emotion, it is not the gut reaction that is primarily felt, but a sensory awareness of “the world” under a certain description. In other words, religious feelings are instances of what Peter Goldie (2000) calls “feeling-towards”. And in still other words, the James of The Varieties of Religious Experience isn’t a Jamesian in the standard sense. As Wynn points out, it doesn’t follow from religious emotions’ not being primarily gut reactions that gut reactions are not involved in their phenomenology; but their involvement would be in the nature of a feedback loop or integrated non-focal awareness. I would also add that, while gut sensations are frequently included in the phenomenology of emotions, they may not be necessary or universal. James himself, in a postscript to his 1884 article, cites the case of a 15-year-old shoemaker’s apprentice who, being entirely without bodily sensations (though otherwise aware of the world around him), nevertheless exhibited shame, grief, fear, and anger, as his situation warranted. In acknowledgment of the possibility of emotions without bodily sensations, the Jamesian neuroscientist Antonio Damasio (1994) posits the existence of an “as-if” bodily feedback loop in the brain to provide for the “somatic markers” required, on the theory, by emotions.

5. The importance of religious emotions

The foregoing helps us to answer the question about the importance of religious emotions. Aristotle points out that the character virtues are dispositions of the appetitive (desiring, caring) part of the soul as shaped by logos (see Nicomachean Ethics, Book One, Chapter 13). The three Christian emotions used as examples in this article are episodes that arise out of dispositions of caring shaped by beliefs (each of the emotion-types gives its name to a Christian virtue). The episodes are important, from the viewpoint of the Christian tradition, because they express a character that is attuned to the way things are: to our nature as creatures, to God’s nature as God, to the relations we bear to the goods and evils of life. In an article titled “Why Christianity Works: An Emotion-Focused Phenomenological Account,” Christian Smith appeals to the character of religious emotions in explaining the tenacity of Christianity in the face of various secularizing influences.

As dispositions of caring, the virtues of gratitude, contrition, and compassion have the value of motivating appropriate actions: acts of that special gracious justice that is an appropriate response to gifts and their givers, acts of self-correction and atonement for wrongs committed, and acts of helping those who suffer. As dispositions of perception, these virtues have the value of putting their possessor in direct perceptual acquaintance with moral aspects of reality: her indebtedness for gifts, the evil of her actions and the forgiveness of God, and the distress of her fellows and the relation of that distress to the life of Christ. And the emotions themselves are the episodes in which these motives and perceptions are particularized to the concrete circumstances of daily life.

So one epistemic value of Christian emotions is that of bringing the subject into perceptual acquaintance with truths as the religious tradition conceives them. Another potential epistemic value is that of providing evidence for those purported truths. The more concretely one treats the religious emotions — moving in the direction of James and away from Schleiermacher and Otto, as this article has done — the less evidential value the religious emotions have. The reason is that the perceptions are so shaped by the propositions that they might be called upon to provide evidence for, that the “evidence” is undercut by circularity.

So the value that the particular religious emotion-types have for adherents of any particular religious tradition is very great. They are a sine qua non for genuine adherence to the tradition, and the degree to which they are actual in the life of any adherent is an index of the depth with which that adherent represents his or her tradition and is a successful human specimen by its lights. No wonder, then, that one strand of philosophical reflection about religious emotions, differing even more from the Schleiermacher-Otto and James axes than these differ from each other, is self-consciously criteriological or regulative. Clarificatory reflection about religious emotions serves a purpose of buffering the tradition against the demoralizing corrosions of the spirit of the age. One thinks of the work of Jonathan Edwards and Søren Kierkegaard. (See the entry on Søren Kierkegaard.)

6. Criteriological work on religious emotions

In a book that Kierkegaard didn’t publish but rewrote many times (On Authority and Revelation), he reflected about the case of a Hegelian pastor, a certain Adolph Peter Adler, who claimed to have had a revelation from Jesus Christ. By comparison with most of his contemporaries in the Danish Lutheran Church, Adler was a man of strong religious passion / feeling, and Kierkegaard respected him for that. But he also noted that Adler’s religious emotion was entirely generic, having no just claim to be especially Christian. Adler’s emotion was not Christian emotion because it did not show the distinctive conceptual marks.

…it was Magister Adler’s advantage that he was deeply moved, shaken in his inmost being…. But to be thus profoundly moved is a very indefinite expression for something so concrete as Christian awakening or conversion … emotion (Grebethed) which is Christian is checked by the definition of concepts … to express oneself Christianly there is required, besides the more universal language of the heart, also skill and schooling in the definition of Christian concepts, while at the same time…the emotion is of a specific, qualitative sort, the Christian emotion (pp. 163, 164).

Kierkegaard goes on to point out that using the distinctively Christian terms is no guarantee that the emotions themselves will display the Christian conceptual structure, because such terms as ‘sin,’ ‘redemption,’ ‘forgiveness,’ and ‘Holy Spirit,’ have “become in a volatilized sense the conversational language of the whole of Europe” (p. 166). In other words, the terms are used in a different sense from the one they have in original Christianity, because they have been dissociated from Christian thought and practice.

A major aim of Kierkegaard’s writings as a philosopher (or “dialectician” as he usually describes himself) is to offer analyses of emotion concepts (which are at the same time virtue concepts) that can function in a regulative or criteriological way. That is, they specify the conceptual shape of these emotions when they are authentically Christian. The analyses are written in a richly literary way (for besides being a “dialectician,” Kierkegaard is, as he says, a “poet”), and this is important for Kierkegaard’s regulative purpose, since he aims not just to inform people about the logic of religious emotions, but to move them to see the world in their terms and to take action in their terms. Examples of such emotion-regulative discourse are the following: Works of Love about the virtue of love; “The Expectancy of Faith”, “Patience in Expectancy”, and “The Expectancy of an Eternal Salvation”, all about the virtue of hope and found in Eighteen Upbuilding Discourses; “Every Good and Every Perfect Gift Is from Above” and “One Who Prays Aright Struggles in Prayer and Is Victorious — in That God Is Victorious” about the virtue of gratitude and also in Eighteen Upbuilding Discourses; “On the Occasion of a Confession: Purity of Heart Is to Will One Thing” about contrition and found in Upbuilding Discourses in Various Spirits; and the discourses in Part Three of the same book, which are all about joy. These are just a few of many examples of religious emotion-regulative thought in Kierkegaard’s writings.

Another well-known author whose work on religious emotions is regulative is Jonathan Edwards. In A Treatise Concerning Religious Affections, Edwards aims to correct both a passionless Christianity and a revivalist “enthusiasm” that confuses emotional intensity with the work of the Holy Spirit. Edwards begins by discussing the nature and importance of emotions in the Christian life, and then turns to a systematic treatment of twenty-four supposed “signs” or criteria for the genuineness of religious emotions. The first twelve signs turn out not to be genuine criteria: They do not rule out the emotion’s being a work of the Spirit, but neither are they specific marks of it. Thus, for example, a person’s emotions in a revival meeting might be extremely intense (sign 1), or attended by great bodily perturbations (sign 2), or might dispose the subject to talk volubly about religion (sign 3), but these marks show nothing one way or the other about the Christian character of the affection.

Edwards then turns to the twelve signs that do indicate the gracious work of the Spirit in the believer’s life. Sign 5 is that one’s emotions involve an immediate conviction that the great things of the gospel are true, and sign 6, “evangelical humiliation,” is a strong disinclination to judge oneself better than others or to believe that one’s spiritual attainments entitle one to some claim on God. Sign 12 is Christian practice: affections that dissipate themselves in excitement and feelings without leading to Christian action are bogus; genuine spiritual affections motivate characteristic Christian action. Sign 7 is that such action is persistent: genuine spiritual affections signal a lasting change of character. Edwards endorses the signs not as criteria by which to discern how well one’s neighbor measures up in the kingdom of God, but as criteria to be used in self-examination and self-discipline.

Kierkegaard and Edwards agree that religious emotions are diverse, that they embody religious teachings, that they are important epistemic and ethical indicators of character, and that in consequence there are conceptual criteria for their rightness that can and should be carefully clarified.

7. Conclusion

James seems to be right in claiming that there is no emotion type that is distinctive of religion as such. Religious emotions come in the usual types — contrition, gratitude, joy, fear, anxiety, anger, and so forth — and what makes them distinctive of one religion or another is their shaping by the teachings of the religion about God or the transcendent. Emotions are important to adherents of a religion because, like the actions that they sometimes motivate, they are expressions of the moral and spiritual life enjoined by the religion. They constitute an important part of the substance of the religious life. For this reason, teachers of the religion, as guardians and regulators of the life in question, sometimes formulate criteria of genuineness of religious emotions.


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