Friedrich Daniel Ernst Schleiermacher
Friedrich Daniel Ernst Schleiermacher (1768–1834) perhaps cannot be ranked as one of the very greatest German philosophers of the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries (like Kant, Herder, Hegel, Marx, or Nietzsche). But he is certainly one of the best second-tier philosophers of the period (a period in which the second-tier was still extremely good). He was not only a philosopher, but also an eminent classical scholar and theologian. Much of his philosophical work was in the philosophy of religion, but from a modern philosophical point of view it is his hermeneutics (i.e., theory of interpretation) and his theory of translation that deserve the most attention. This article will attempt to provide a fairly broad overview of his philosophical thought. One thing that will emerge from this is that although he has important philosophical debts to many predecessors and contemporaries (including Spinoza, Kant, and Friedrich Schlegel), he was above all following in the philosophical footsteps of one predecessor in particular: Herder.
- 1. Life and Works
- 2. Philosophy of Language
- 3. Philosophy of Mind
- 4. Hermeneutics (i.e., Theory of Interpretation)
- 5. Historiography of Philosophy
- 6. Theory of Translation
- 7. Aesthetics
- 8. Dialectics
- 9. Ethics
- 10. Political and Social Philosophy
- 11. Philosophy of Religion
- Guide to the Literature
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Life and Works
Friedrich Daniel Ernst Schleiermacher (1768–1834) was born in Breslau as the son of a clergyman of the reformed church. His earlier education took place in institutions of the Moravian Brethren (Herrnhuter), a strict pietist sect. However, while there he also pursued broader humanistic interests. Largely as a result of skepticism about certain Christian doctrines taught there, he moved to the more liberal University of Halle in 1787. However, he continued in theology (with philosophy and classical philology as minor fields). He passed his theological examinations in Berlin in 1790. This was followed by a period as a private tutor, which ended in 1793, partly, it seems, due to friction caused by his sympathy with the French Revolution, to which his employer was opposed.
During the periods just mentioned he was heavily occupied with the study and criticism of Kant’s philosophy. This work culminated in several unpublished essays—On the Highest Good (1789), On What Gives Value to Life (1792–3), and On Freedom (1790–3)—which rejected Kant’s conception that the “highest good [summum bonum]” requires an apportioning of happiness to moral desert, and Kant’s connected doctrine of the “postulates” of an afterlife of the soul and God, while developing an anti-Kantian theory of the thoroughgoing causal determination of human action and of the compatibility of this with moral responsibility. In 1793–4 he wrote two essays about Spinoza: Spinozism and Brief Presentation of the Spinozistic System. A major catalyst for these essays was Jacobi’s work On the Doctrine of Spinoza, in Letters to Mr. Moses Mendelssohn (1785), which was highly critical of Spinozism. But they also show the influence of Herder’s work God: Some Conversations (1787), which championed a modified form of Spinozism. In his two essays Schleiermacher himself embraces a modified form of Spinoza’s monism similar in character to Herder’s (in particular, like Herder, he is inclined to substitute for Spinoza’s single substance the more active principle of a single fundamental force). He also attempts to defend this position by showing it to be reconcilable with central features of Kant’s theoretical philosophy (notably, Kant’s doctrine of things in themselves). This neo-Spinozistic position would subsequently be fundamental to Schleiermacher’s most important work in the philosophy of religion, On Religion: Speeches to Its Cultured Despisers (1799). However, in thus rejecting Jacobi’s anti-Spinozism, Schleiermacher seems also to have absorbed something from Jacobi that would be equally important for his future philosophy of religion: the idea (for which his pietist background no doubt made him receptive) that we enjoy a sort of immediate intuition or feeling of God.
During the period 1794–6 Schleiermacher served as a pastor in Landsberg. In 1796 he moved to Berlin, where he became chaplain to a hospital. In Berlin he met Friedrich and August Wilhelm Schlegel, as well as other romantics, became deeply engaged in the formation of the romantic movement, and collaborated with the Schlegel brothers on the short-lived but important literary journal Athenaeum (1798–1800). Among Schleiermacher’s contributions to this journal was the short proto-feminist piece Idea for a Catechism of Reason for Noble Ladies (1798). During the period 1797–9, he shared a house with Friedrich Schlegel. Encouraged by the romantic circle to write a statement of his religious views, in 1799 he published his most important and radical work in the philosophy of religion, On Religion: Speeches to Its Cultured Despisers (revised editions followed in 1806, 1821, the latter including significant “explanations”, and 1831). This work sought to save religion in the eyes of its cultured despisers (prominent among them some of the romantics, including Friedrich Schlegel) by, inter alia, arguing that human immortality and even God are inessential to religion; diagnosing and excusing current religion’s more off-putting features in terms of its corruption by worldly bourgeois culture and state-interference; and arguing that there are an endless multiplicity of valid forms of religion. The book won Schleiermacher a national reputation. In the same year (1799) he also published an essay on the situation of the Jews in Prussia, Letters on the Occasion of the Political-Theological Task and the Open Letter of Jewish Householders. In this work he rejected an expedient that had been proposed for ameliorating the situation of the Jews in Prussia of achieving their civil assimilation through baptism (which would, he argues, harm both Judaism and Christianity) and instead advocated full civil rights for Jews (on certain rather reasonable conditions). The same year also saw Schleiermacher’s composition of the interesting short essay Toward a Theory of Sociable Conduct, which is important as his first significant discussion of the art of conversation (an art that would later be central to his discipline of dialectics). Finally, 1799 also saw his publication of a highly critical review of Kant’s Anthropology. The review in particular took Kant to task for his dualistic philosophy of mind and his superficial, disparaging attitude toward women and other peoples.
During the following several years Schleiermacher complemented On Religion with two substantial publications that were more ethical in orientation: the especially important Soliloquies (1800; second edition 1810) and the Outlines of a Critique of Previous Ethical Theory (1803). In 1800 he also defended his friend Friedrich Schlegel’s controversial and arguably pornographic novel Lucinde from the same year in his Confidential Letters Concerning Friedrich Schlegel’s Lucinde—a shared proto-feminism constituting a large part of his reason for sympathizing with Schlegel’s book. During the period 1799–1804 Schleiermacher developed with Schlegel the project of translating Plato’s dialogues. As time went on, however, Schlegel left this work to Schleiermacher, which contributed to increasingly difficult relations between the two men after 1800. Schleiermacher’s translations appeared during the period 1804–28 (though not quite all of the dialogues were translated in the end), and are still widely used and admired today.
While in Berlin Schleiermacher developed romantic attachments to two married women, Henriette Herz and Eleonore Grunow—the latter of which attachments led to scandal and unhappiness, eventually causing Schleiermacher to leave the city. He spent the years 1802–4 in Stolpe. By 1804 he was teaching at Halle University. During the period 1804–5 he began lecturing on ethics (as he would do again repeatedly until 1832). In 1805 he also began delivering his famous and important lectures on hermeneutics (which he repeated regularly until 1833). In 1806 he published the short book Christmas Eve, a literary work that explores the meaning of Christian love by depicting a German family’s celebration of Christmas Eve. This is in keeping with On Religion’s ideal that (Christian) religion should be family- rather than state-centered. In 1806–7 he left Halle as a result of the French occupation, and moved back to Berlin. From this time on he began actively promoting German resistance to the French occupation and the cause of German unity. In 1808 he published Occasional Thoughts on Universities in a German Spirit, together with an Appendix on One about to be Founded, a work written in connection with plans for founding a new university in Berlin (now known as the Humboldt University), to which Wilhelm von Humboldt likewise contributed theoretically soon afterwards as well as leading the project’s implementation. In 1808 Schleiermacher married a young widow, Henriette von Willich, with whom he had several children. In 1808–9 he became preacher at the Dreifaltigkeitskirche, in 1810 professor of theology at the University of Berlin, and by 1811 also a member of the Berlin Academy of Sciences.
After becoming a member of the Academy he often delivered addresses before it, among which several on ethics, one on translation from 1813, one on the philosophy of Socrates from 1815, and one on Leibniz’s idea of a universal language from 1831 are especially significant.
In 1811 he lectured on dialectics for the first time (as he would do again regularly until his death, at which time he was in the early stages of preparing a version for publication). In 1812 he began lecturing on the history of philosophy (as he would again repeatedly in subsequent years). In 1813 he delivered as an address, and then published as an essay, On the Different Methods of Translation—a very important work in translation theory deeply informed by his own experience as a translator. In 1813–14 he lectured on pedagogy, or the philosophy of education, for the first time (as he would do on two subsequent occasions: 1820–1 and 1826). In 1818 he lectured on psychology for the first time (as he would again repeatedly until 1833–4). In 1819 he lectured on aesthetics for the first time (as he subsequently did on two further occasions, the last of them in 1832–3). In the same year he also began lecturing on the life of Jesus (as he did again on four further occasions over the following twelve years)—thereby inaugurating an important genre of literature on this subject in the nineteenth century.
In 1821–2 he published his major work of systematic theology, The Christian Faith (revised edition 1830–1). In 1829 he published two open letters on this work (nominally addressed to his friend Lücke), in which he discusses it and central issues in the philosophy of religion and theology relating to it in a concise and lucid way.
Schleiermacher died in 1834. As can be seen even from this brief sketch of his life and works, a large proportion of his career was taken up with the philosophy of religion and theology. However, from the secular standpoint of modern philosophy it is probably his work in such areas as hermeneutics (i.e., the theory of interpretation) and the theory of translation that is most important. Accordingly, this article will begin with these more interesting areas of his thought, only turning to his philosophy of religion briefly at the end.
2. Philosophy of Language
Since the topics of language and human psychology are central to Schleiermacher’s hermeneutics and theory of translation, it is appropriate to begin with some discussion of his philosophies of language and mind. Schleiermacher nowhere presents his philosophy of language separately; instead, it is found scattered through such works as his lectures on psychology, dialectics, and hermeneutics. The following eight positions—all but the last of which are heavily indebted to Herder—are especially worth noting:
- In his lectures on psychology, Schleiermacher takes the following position on the question of the origin of language (virtually identical to Herder’s position in the Treatise on the Origin of Language ): The origin of language is not to be explained in terms of a divine source. Nor is it to be explained in terms of the primitive expression of feelings. Rather, the use of inner language is simply fundamental to human nature. It is the foundation of, and indeed identical with, thought. It is also the foundation of other distinctively human mental characteristics, in particular self-consciousness and a clear distinguishing of perception from feeling and desire.
- Language (and hence thought) is fundamentally social in nature. More precisely, while inner language is not dependent on a social stimulus (so that even in the absence of this children would develop their own languages), it does already involve a tendency or an implicit directedness toward social communication.
- Language and thought are not merely additions over and above other mental processes that human beings share with the animals. Rather, they are infused throughout, and lend a distinctive character to, all human mental processes. In particular, they structure human beings’ sensory images in distinctive ways.
The next five of the eight positions are especially important for Schleiermacher’s hermeneutics and theory of translation (to be discussed below):
- Schleiermacher already in early work postulated an identity of thought with linguistic expression. He often equates thought more specifically with inner language (e.g., he already does so in his 1812–13 lectures on ethics). His main motive behind such a refinement can be seen from the lectures on psychology, where he discusses cases in which thought occurs without arriving at any outward linguistic expression. It has been claimed by some of the secondary literature that he eventually gave up this whole position (e.g., by Heinz Kimmerle). He does seem to retreat from it somewhat, but in his psychology lectures of 1830 we still find him writing of “the activity of thought in its identity with language” (SW 3/6: 263).
- Schleiermacher adopts a view of meaning that equates it—not with such items, in principle independent of language, as the referents involved (Augustine), Platonic forms, or the subjective mental “ideas” that were favored by the British Empiricists and others, but instead—with word-usage, or rules for the use of words. For example, in the hermeneutics lectures he says that “the … meaning of a term is to be derived from the unity of the word-sphere and from the rules governing the presupposition of this unity” (HHM 50).
- In his psychology lectures, Schleiermacher argues that although thought and conceptualization are not reducible to the occurrence of sensuous images (since that would conflict with the position that the former require, or are indeed identical with, language), the latter are an essential foundation for the former. This position is also reflected in his strong attraction, in some of his later hermeneutics and dialectics lectures, to Kant’s theory of empirical schemata—according to which empirical concepts are grounded, or consist, in unconscious rules for the generation of sensuous images—and to turning this into an account of the nature of all concepts. (This prompts the question whether there do not also exist strictly a priori concepts, as Kant had held. In his psychology lectures Schleiermacher vacillates in his answer to this question: sometimes implying yes, but at other points instead implying—more consistently with the position just described—that it is merely the case that some concepts are more distantly abstracted from sensory images than others. The latter is his normal answer in the dialectics lectures as well.)
- Human beings exhibit, not only significant linguistic and conceptual-intellectual similarities, but also striking linguistic and conceptual-intellectual differences, especially between different historical periods and cultures, but even to some extent between individuals within a single period and culture. (In this connection, Schleiermacher argues, plausibly, that the phenomenon of the linguistic and conceptual-intellectual development of cultures over time is only explicable in terms of linguistic and conceptual-intellectual innovations performed by individuals, which get taken over by the broader culture, becoming part of its common stock.)
- Importantly, Schleiermacher develops a much more holistic conception of meaning than his predecessors had held (this is the one major respect in which his philosophy of language goes beyond Herder’s). At least three aspects of his semantic holism can be distinguished: (a) As can already be seen from a passage quoted earlier, he espouses a doctrine of “the unity of the word-sphere”. This doctrine in effect says that the various specific senses that a single word typically bears, and which will normally be distinguished by any good dictionary entry (e.g., the different senses of “impression” in “He made an impression in the clay”, “My impression is that he is reluctant”, and “He made a big impression at the party”), always in fact form a larger semantic unity to which they each essentially belong (so that any loss, addition, or alteration among them entails an alteration in each of them, albeit perhaps a subtle one). (b) He holds that the nature of any particular concept is partly defined by its relations to a “system of concepts”. In this connection, the dialectics lectures emphasize a concept’s relations as a species-concept to superordinate genus-concepts, relations as a genus-concept to subordinate species-concepts, and relations of contrast to coordinate concepts falling under the same genus-concepts. However, other types of conceptual relationships would no doubt be included here as well (e.g., those between “to work”, “worker”, and “a work”). (c) He holds that the distinctive nature of a language’s grammatical system (e.g., its system of declensions) is also partly constitutive of the character of the concepts expressed within it. (This last position was also developed at around the same period by Friedrich Schlegel, for whom it constituted one of the main rationales for a new discipline of “comparative grammar” that he introduced in his On the Language and Wisdom of the Indians . Shortly afterwards, it was taken over and used to similar effect by another of the founders of modern linguistics, Wilhelm von Humboldt.)
As was mentioned earlier, with the sole exception of this final feature (semantic holism), Schleiermacher’s entire philosophy of language is heavily indebted to Herder. However, while refining Herder’s philosophy of language with this final feature, it also weakens it in other respects. For example, whereas Herder’s version of doctrine (4) normally restricted itself to a claim that thought is essentially dependent on and bounded by language, Schleiermacher’s version asserts the outright identity of thought with language, or with inner language. But such a strong version of the doctrine is philosophically problematic—vulnerable to counterexamples in which thought occurs without any corresponding (inner) language use, and vice versa. Again, as we noted, in later works Schleiermacher tends to add to the Herderian doctrine (5) a thesis that concepts are empirical schemata à la Kant (see (6)). This is likely to seem problematic at first sight because of its inclusion of sensory images in meaning. But that is arguably not so: Herder had already included them in a way as well; contrary to first appearances, doing so need not conflict with a suitably interpreted doctrine that meanings are word-usages; and the currently popular attack on such “psychologism” in modern philosophy of language influenced by Frege and Wittgenstein, which is likely to make such a position seem suspect, may well itself be misguided. What is problematic about Schleiermacher’s thesis is rather that Kant’s theory of empirical schemata had implied that there is a sharp distinction between meanings, conceived as something purely psychological, and word-usages, so that Schleiermacher’s unmodified reintroduction of the theory implies the same, and hence conflicts with doctrine (5), the doctrine that meaning is word-usage. Finally, whereas for Herder doctrine (7) was merely an empirically established rule of thumb and admitted of exceptions, Schleiermacher in his lectures on ethics and dialectics attempts to give a sort of a priori proof of linguistic and conceptual-intellectual diversity even at the level of individuals as a universal fact—a proof that is dubious in its very a priori status, in its specific details, and in its extremely counterintuitive implication (often explicitly asserted by Schleiermacher) that, strictly speaking, no one can ever understand another person.
3. Philosophy of Mind
Schleiermacher’s philosophy of mind is found mainly in his lectures on psychology. It is too extensive to present in detail here. But the following four central principles—all of which have their roots in Herder, and especially in Herder’s main work on the philosophy of mind, On the Cognition and Sensation of the Human Soul (1778)—are especially striking and important:
- Schleiermacher argues for a strong dependence of the soul (or mind) on the body, and indeed for their identity. However, he resists reductionism in either direction, arguing that both what he calls “spiritualism” (i.e., the reduction of the body to the mind) and “materialism” (i.e., the reduction of the mind to the body) are errors. He refers to the sort of non-reductive unity of mind and body that he instead champions as “life”.
- Schleiermacher also identifies the soul (or mind) with “force”. Thus already in On Freedom (1790–3) he writes that the soul is “a force or a composite of forces”.
- Schleiermacher also argues strongly for the unity of the soul (or mind) within itself: the soul is not composed of separate faculties (e.g., sensation, understanding, imagination, reason, desire). He himself often works with a twofold distinction between what he refers to as the mind’s “organic” (i.e., sensory) and “intellectual” functions, but he holds these too to be at bottom identical.
- Schleiermacher argues that human minds, while they certainly share similarities, are also deeply different from each other—not only across social groups such as peoples and genders, but also at the level of individuals who belong to the same groups. He holds that the deep distinctiveness of individual minds periodically exercises an important influence on the development of society at large—both in the political-ethical sphere (where he calls the individuals who play such a role “heroes”) and in the sphere of thought and art (where he calls them “geniuses”). He argues that the distinctiveness of individual minds cannot be explained by any process of calculation (in particular, that it is a mistake to suppose that all human minds begin the same and only come to differ due to the impact of different causal influences on their development, which might in principle be calculated). It can, however, be understood by means of “divination” (concerning which more anon).
Finally, one feature of Schleiermacher’s philosophy of mind that distinguishes it from Herder’s, and from other German predecessors’, is also worth noting: Schleiermacher says relatively little about unconscious mental processes, and when he does mention them often seems skeptical about them. For example, he argues that thought cannot be unconscious, and that so-called “obscure representations” are in fact merely sensuous images that do not involve thoughts.
4. Hermeneutics (i.e., Theory of Interpretation)
Some of Schleiermacher’s most important philosophical work concerns the theories of interpretation (“hermeneutics”) and translation. Friedrich Schlegel was an immediate influence on his thought here. Their ideas on these subjects began to take shape in the late 1790s, when they lived together in the same house in Berlin for a time. Many of their ideas are shared, and it is often unclear which of the two men was the (more) original source of a given idea. But since Schlegel’s surviving treatments are much less detailed and systematic than Schleiermacher’s, the latter inevitably take on prime importance.
Schleiermacher’s theories of interpretation and translation rest squarely on three of the Herder-inspired doctrines in the philosophy of language that were described above: (4) thought is essentially dependent on and bounded by, or even identical with, language; (5) meaning is word-usage; and (7) there are deep linguistic and conceptual-intellectual differences between people. Doctrine (7) poses a severe challenge to both interpretation and translation, and it is the main task of Schleiermacher’s theories to cope with just this challenge. Schleiermacher’s most original doctrine in the philosophy of language, doctrine (8) (semantic holism), is also highly relevant in this connection, for, as Schleiermacher recognizes, semantic holism greatly exacerbates the challenge to interpretation and translation that is posed by (7).
Schleiermacher lectured on hermeneutics frequently between 1805 and 1833. The following are his main principles:
(a) Hermeneutics is strictly the theory of understanding linguistic communication—as contrasted, not equated, with explicating, applying, or translating it.
(b) Hermeneutics should be a universal discipline—i.e., one that applies equally to all subjects areas (such as the Bible, law, and literature), to oral as well as to written language, to modern texts as well as to ancient ones, to works in one’s own language as well as to works in foreign languages, and so forth.
(c) In particular, the interpretation of sacred texts such as the Bible is included within it—this may not rely on special principles, such as divine inspiration (either of the author or of the interpreter).
(d) Interpretation is a much more difficult task than is generally realized: contrary to a common misconception that “understanding occurs as a matter of course”, in fact “misunderstanding occurs as a matter of course, and so understanding must be willed and sought at every point” (HHM 109–110; HC 21–22). (This position derives from Schleiermacher’s version of principle (7): deep linguistic and conceptual-intellectual diversity.)
How, then, is interpretation to be accomplished?
(e) It is essential to distinguish clearly between the question of the meaning of a text or discourse and the question of its truth. Assuming that a text or discourse must be true will often lead to serious misinterpretation.
(f) Before the interpretation proper of a text or discourse can even begin, the interpreter must acquire a good knowledge of its historical context. (The suggestion found in some of the secondary literature that Schleiermacher thinks that historical context is irrelevant to interpretation is absurd.)
(g) Interpretation proper always has two sides: one linguistic, the other psychological. Linguistic interpretation’s task (which rests on principle (5)) consists in inferring from evidence that consists in particular actual uses of words to the rules that are governing them, i.e., to their usages and thus to their meanings; psychological interpretation instead focuses on an author’s psychology. Linguistic interpretation is mainly concerned with what is common or shared in a language; psychological interpretation mainly with what is distinctive to a particular author.
(h) Schleiermacher implies several reasons why an interpreter needs to complement linguistic interpretation with psychological in this way. First, he sees such a need as arising from the deep linguistic and conceptual-intellectual distinctiveness of individuals. This distinctiveness at the level of individuals leads to the problem for linguistic interpretation that the actual uses of words that are available to serve as evidence from which to infer an author’s exact usage or meaning will usually be relatively few in number and poor in contextual variety—a problem which an appeal to authorial psychology is supposed to help solve by providing additional clues. Second, an appeal to the author’s psychology is also required in order to resolve ambiguities at the level of linguistic meaning that arise in particular contexts (i.e., even after the range of meanings available to the author for the word(s) in question is known). Third, in order fully to understand a linguistic act one needs to know not only its linguistic meaning but also what more recent philosophers have called its “illocutionary force” or intention. For example, if I encounter a stranger by a frozen lake who says to me, “The ice is thin over there”, in order fully to understand his utterance I need to know not only its linguistic meaning (which in this case is clear) but also whether it is being made as a factual observation, a threat, a joke, or whatnot. (Schleiermacher himself places most emphasis on the first of these three considerations. However, if, as Schleiermacher does, one wants to argue that interpretation needs to invoke psychology generally, and if, as I hinted earlier, linguistic and conceptual-intellectual distinctiveness is not in fact the pervasive phenomenon that Schleiermacher usually takes it to be, then it is arguably the latter two considerations that should be considered the more fundamental ones.)
(i) Interpretation also requires two different methods: a “comparative” method (i.e., a method of plain induction), which Schleiermacher sees as predominating on the linguistic side of interpretation, where it takes the interpreter from the particular uses of a word to the rule for use that governs them all; and a “divinatory” method (i.e., a method of tentative, fallible hypothesis based on but also going well beyond the empirical evidence available; the etymology to keep in mind here is not so much Latin divinus, which would point toward prophecy, but rather French deviner, to guess or conjecture), which he sees as predominating on the psychological side of interpretation. (The widespread notion in the secondary literature that “divination” is for Schleiermacher a process of psychological self-projection into texts contains a grain of truth, in that he does think that interpretation requires some measure of psychological common ground between interpreter and interpretee, but is basically mistaken.)
(j) Ideal interpretation is of its nature a holistic activity (this principle in part rests on but also goes well beyond Schleiermacher’s semantic holism). In particular, any given piece of text needs to be interpreted in light of the whole text to which it belongs, and both need to be interpreted in light of the broader language in which they are written, their larger historical context, a broader pre-existing genre, the author’s whole corpus, and the author’s overall psychology. Such holism introduces a pervasive circularity into interpretation, for, ultimately, interpreting these broader items in its turn depends on interpreting such pieces of text. Schleiermacher does not see this circle as vicious, however. Why not? His solution is not that all of these tasks should be accomplished simultaneously—for that would far exceed human capacities. Rather, it essentially lies in the (very plausible) thought that understanding is not an all-or-nothing matter but instead something that comes in degrees, so that it is possible to make progress toward full understanding in a piecemeal way. For example, concerning the relation between a piece of text and the whole text to which it belongs, Schleiermacher recommends that we first read through and interpret as best we can each of the parts of the text in turn in order thereby to arrive at an approximate overall interpretation of the text, and that we then apply this approximate overall interpretation in order to refine our initial interpretations of each of the particular parts, which in turn gives us an improved overall interpretation, which can then be re-applied toward still further refinement of the interpretations of the parts, and so on indefinitely.
Schleiermacher’s debts to Herder in this theory of interpretation extend well beyond the framework-principles (4), (5), and (7) mentioned earlier. Indeed, Schleiermacher’s theory as it has just been described is almost identical to Herder’s. Some of the common ground here is admittedly due to the fact that they were both influenced by the same predecessors, especially J.A. Ernesti. But Schleiermacher’s theory owes exclusively to Herder the two central moves (often wrongly thought to have been original with Schleiermacher) of supplementing “linguistic” with “psychological” interpretation and of identifying “divination” as the predominant method of the latter. (Herder had already made these two moves, especially in On Thomas Abbt’s Writings  and On the Cognition and Sensation of the Human Soul .) Schleiermacher’s theory as it has just been described in essence merely draws together and systematizes ideas that already lay scattered through a number of Herder’s works.
There are some significant exceptions to this rule of continuity, however—respects in which Schleiermacher’s theory deviates from Herder’s. But it is precisely here that Schleiermacher’s theory tends to become more philosophically problematic.
To begin with two deviations that are not problematic, but rather advantageous: First, as was previously mentioned, Schleiermacher exacerbates the challenge to interpretation that principle (7) already poses by introducing principle (8), semantic holism. Second, Schleiermacher’s theory explicitly introduces principle (b), the ideal of the universality of hermeneutics. This principle is very much in the spirit of Herder’s theory, but it does go beyond its letter. (There were, however, some clearer precedents for it—for example, in van der Hardt, Chladenius, Pfeiffer, Grosch, and Meier.)
Turning now to deviations that are problematic, we already noted several examples of such problematic deviations concerning the exact force of the three principles in the philosophy of language that underpin Schleiermacher’s theory of interpretation, principles (4), (5), and (7). But the following are further examples. Whereas Herder rightly emphasizes the vital importance in interpretation of correctly identifying a work’s genre, and also the great difficulty of doing so in many cases, especially due to the constant changes in genres that take place and the consequent pervasive temptation falsely to assimilate unfamiliar genres to more familiar ones, Schleiermacher pays relatively little attention to this subject. Again, unlike Herder, Schleiermacher, especially in his later work, more closely specifies psychological interpretation as a process of identifying, and tracing the necessary development of, a single authorial “seminal decision [Keimentschluß]” that lies behind a work and unfolds itself as the work in a necessary fashion. However, this seems an unhelpful move, for how many works are actually composed, and hence properly interpretable, in such a way? Again, whereas Herder includes not only an author’s linguistic behavior but also his non-linguistic behavior among the evidence that is relevant to psychological interpretation, Schleiermacher normally insists on a restriction to the former. But this too seems misguided; for example, the Marquis de Sade’s recorded acts of cruelty seem no less potentially relevant to establishing the (as we now put it) sadistic side of his psychological make-up, and hence to interpreting his texts accurately, than his cruel statements. Again, unlike Herder, Schleiermacher regards the central role of “divination”, or hypothesis, in interpretation as a ground for sharply distinguishing interpretation from natural science, and hence for classifying it as an art rather than a science. However, he should arguably instead have regarded it as a ground for considering interpretation and natural science similar. (His mistake here was caused by a false assumption that natural science works by a method of plain induction—i.e., roughly: this first a is F, this second a is F, this third a is F, … therefore all as are F—rather than by hypothesis.)
Schleiermacher’s theory also tends to play down, obscure, or miss certain important points concerning interpretation that Friedrich Schlegel had already made. Schlegel’s treatment of hermeneutic matters—in texts such as his Philosophy of Philology (1797) and the Athenaeum Fragments (1798–1800)—largely resembles Schleiermacher’s. But it also includes the following three points which are either less bold, obscured, or altogether missing in Schleiermacher: (i) Schlegel notes that texts (at least superior ones) often express unconscious meanings: “Every excellent work … aims at more than it knows” (On Goethe’s Meister  [PJ 2:177]). Schleiermacher sometimes implies a similar-looking view, most famously in his doctrine that the interpreter should aim to understand an author better than he understood himself, but Schlegel’s version of such a position is more radical, envisaging indeed an “infinite depth” of meaning that is largely unknown to the author himself. (ii) Schlegel emphasizes that a work often expresses important meanings, not explicitly in any of its parts, but rather through the way in which these are put together to form a whole. This is a very important point. Schleiermacher perhaps in a way makes it as well, but if so, then only as incorporated into and obscured by his more dubious doctrine of the “seminal decision”. (iii) Unlike Schleiermacher, Schlegel emphasizes that works typically contain confusions that the interpreter needs to identify and which the interpreter also needs to explain when they occur:
It is not enough that one understand the actual sense of a confused work better than the author understood it. One must also oneself be able to know, characterize, and even construe the confusion even down to its very principles. (KFSA 18:63)
This is another very important point.
Despite these significant but limited shortcomings in the details of Schleiermacher’s hermeneutics, his pupil August Boeckh, an eminent classical philologist, subsequently gave a broadly faithful and even more systematic re-articulation of Schleiermacher’s hermeneutics in lectures that were eventually published as his Encyclopedia and Methodology of the Philological Sciences (delivered as lectures 1809–66; published posthumously 1877), and through the combined influence of Schleiermacher’s and Boeckh’s treatments it achieved something very much like the status of the official hermeneutical methodology of nineteenth-century classical and biblical scholarship.
5. Historiography of Philosophy
Schleiermacher applied his scrupulous hermeneutic method fruitfully to several areas of scholarship that centrally require interpretation. One example of this is the series of lectures on the life of Jesus that he delivered between 1819 and 1833. Another—for philosophers perhaps more significant—example is his work as a historiographer of philosophy. For further discussion, see the supplementary document Schleiermacher’s Historiography of Philosophy.
6. Theory of Translation
As was already mentioned, Schleiermacher also develops his theory of translation on the foundation of the Herder-influenced principles in the philosophy of language (4), (5), and (7), together with (8), his own semantic holism, which exacerbates the challenge to translation already posed by (7).
Schleiermacher was himself a masterful translator, whose German translations of Plato are still widely used and admired today, about two hundred years after they were done. So his views on translation carry a certain prima facie authority. He explains his theory of translation mainly in the brilliant essay On the Different Methods of Translation (1813). The following are some of his main points:
(a) Translation usually faces the problem of a conceptual gulf between the source language and the target language (as the latter currently exists). (This is an application of principle (7).)
(b) This situation makes translation an extremely difficult task, posing a major obstacle to the attainment of translation’s traditional primary goal, that of faithfully reproducing the original meaning in the target language. In this connection, Schleiermacher in particular notes the following problem (which might be dubbed the paradox of paraphrase): If, faced with the task of translating an alien concept, a translator attempts to reproduce its intension by reproducing its extension with the aid of an elaborate paraphrase in his own language, he will generally find that as he gets closer to the original extension he undermines the original intension in other ways. For instance, faced with Homer’s color word chlôros, a word that Homer sometimes applies to things that we would classify as green (e.g., healthy foliage) but at other times to things that we would classify as yellow (e.g., honey), a translator might attempt to reproduce the extension correctly by translating the word as “green or yellow”. But in doing so he would be sacrificing the original intension in other ways—for Homer did not have either the concept green or the concept yellow (only the concept chlôros), and in addition for Homer chlôros was not a disjunctive concept.
(c) Schleiermacher also identifies a number of further challenges that commonly exacerbate the difficulty of translation. For example, he notes that in the case of poetry it is necessary to reproduce not only the semantic but also the musical aspects of the original, such as meter and rhyme—and this not merely as a desideratum over and above the main task of reproducing meaning, but also as an essential part of that task, because in poetry such musical features serve as essential vehicles for the precise expression of meaning. And he argues that in addition to reproducing meaning a translation should attempt to convey to its readership where an author was being conceptually conventional and where conceptually original—for example, by using older vocabulary from the target language in the former cases and relative neologisms from it in the latter. But he also notes that in both of these connections the added requirement or desideratum involved will frequently stand in tension with that of finding the closest semantic fit—since, for example, it will turn out that the word that would best reproduce a rhyme or best reflect a concept’s vintage is not the one that is closest in meaning to the word in the original.
(d) Because of this great difficulty, the translator needs to possess real interpretive expertise, and to be an “artist”, if he is to cope with the task of translation at all adequately.
(e) The conceptual gulf that poses the central challenge here might in principle be tackled in one of two broad ways: either by bringing the author’s linguistic-conceptual world closer to that of the reader of the translation or vice versa. The former approach had been championed, among others, by Luther in his classic Letter on Translation (1530) and had been practiced by him in his translation of the Bible (he called it Verdeutschung, “Germanizing”). However, Schleiermacher finds it unacceptable, mainly because it inevitably distorts the author’s concepts and thoughts. Schleiermacher therefore champions the alternative approach of bringing the reader toward the linguistic-conceptual world of the author as the only acceptable one.
But how can this possibly be accomplished?
(f) According to Schleiermacher, the key to a solution lies in the plasticity of language. Because of this plasticity, even if the usages of words, and hence the concepts, expressed by the target language as it currently exists are incommensurable with the author’s, it is still possible for a translator to
bend the language of the translation as far possible toward that of the original in order to communicate as far as possible an impression of the system of concepts developed in it. (DM 25)
(This solution presupposes principle (5) in the philosophy of language.) For instance, the translator faced with the task of translating Homer’s word chlôros would select the closest counterpart in the target language, say “green”, but then modify its usage over the course of the translation so that it is applied not only to things that are green (e.g., healthy foliage) but also to things that are yellow (e.g., honey).
(g) This approach entails a strong preference for translating any given word in the original in a uniform way throughout the translation rather than switching between two or more different ways of translating it in different contexts.
(h) This approach also makes for translations that are considerably less easy to read than those that can be achieved by the alternative approach (Verdeutschung). However, this is an acceptable price to pay given that the only alternative is a failure to convey the author’s meaning at all accurately. Moreover, the offending peculiarities have a positive value in that they constantly remind the reader of the conceptual unfamiliarity of the material that is being translated and of the “bending” approach that is being employed.
(i) In order to work at all effectively, though, this approach requires that large amounts of relevant material be translated, so that the reader of the translation becomes habituated to it and acquires enough examples of a particular word’s unfamiliar use in enough different contexts to enable him to infer the unfamiliar rule for use that is involved.
(j) Even this optimal approach to translation has severe limitations, however. In particular, it will often be impossible to reproduce the holistic aspects of meaning—the several related usages of a given word, the systems of related words/concepts, and the distinctive grammar of the language. And since these holistic features are internal to a word’s meaning, this will entail a shortfall in the communication of its meaning by the translation. Reading a translation therefore inevitably remains only a poor second best to reading the original, and the translator should think of his task as one of striving to approximate an infinite, never fully realizable, ideal.
(k) Translation is still amply justified, though—not only for the obvious reason that it is necessary in order to make works available to people who want to read them but are not in the fortunate position of knowing the original languages, but also for the less obvious reason that through its “bending” approach it effects a conceptual enrichment of their language (and through its reproduction of musical features a musical enrichment).
(l) Nor (Schleiermacher adds in answer to a worry that Herder had expressed) need we fear that this enrichment will deprive our language of its authentic character. For in cases where a real conflict with that character arises, the enrichments in question will soon wither from the language.
Here again (as in the case of interpretation), not only the framework principles (4), (5), and (7), but most of these ideas about translation come from Herder. In particular, Schleiermacher’s central strategy of “bending” the target language in order to cope with conceptual incommensurability, and his point that it is also important to convey the musical aspects of an original (poetic) text in order to convey its meaning accurately, both do so. (Relevant Herderian sources here are the Fragments on Recent German Literature [1767–8] and the Popular Songs [Volkslieder] [1774 and 1778/9].)
However, unlike Schleiermacher’s theory of interpretation, which, as was mentioned earlier, often worsens Herder’s, this theory of translation tends to refine Herder’s in some modest but significant ways. Among the ideas just adumbrated, examples of this occur in (b), where Schleiermacher’s paradox of paraphrase is largely novel; (c), where his ideal of making clear in a translation at which points the author was being conceptually conventional and at which points conceptually original is novel in comparison with Herder; (h), where his idea that the oddities that result from the “bending” approach are not only an acceptable price to pay but can actually serve a positive function is novel; (i), which is a novel point; (j), where the point that semantic holism imposes principled limitations on the successfulness of translations is novel; and (l), which plausibly contradicts Herder.
Schleiermacher tended to be quite self-deprecating about his sensitivity to and knowledge of art, and hence about his aptitude for aesthetics (e.g., in On Religion and the Soliloquies, where he is clearly rather in awe of the greater talent and expertise in this area that such romantic friends as the Schlegel brothers enjoyed), and accordingly tended to shy away from discussing the subject in detail in his earlier work. However, he did eventually bring himself to confront the subject systematically, namely, in his lectures on aesthetics (first delivered in 1819, and then again in 1825 and 1832–3).
Part of his motivation behind this eventual confrontation with the subject—and part of the reason why it remains interesting today—derives from the fact that the phenomenon of art, and in particular the phenomenon of non-linguistic art (e.g., painting, sculpture, and music), prompts a certain theoretical question that is of fundamental importance, not only for the philosophy of art itself, but also for hermeneutics, or the theory of interpretation, and for the philosophy of language that underlies it: Do non-linguistic arts such as painting, sculpture, and music express meanings and thoughts, and if so how? This question is obviously important for the philosophy of art. But it is also important for hermeneutics, or the theory of interpretation, because it carries in its train such further questions as whether the theory of interpretation ought not to treat additional forms of expression besides the linguistic ones that Schleiermacher’s own hermeneutics treats, what the appropriate methods of interpretation might be in such additional cases, and how such additional cases and their interpretive methods might relate to linguistic ones. Moreover, the question mentioned is also important for the philosophy of language that underpins Schleiermacher’s theory of interpretation, as embodied in principles (4) and (5). For a positive answer to this question might threaten those two principles, or at least show that they need major revision.
In his last cycle of aesthetics lectures (1832–3) Schleiermacher initially pursued a very simple strategy for dealing with these issues concerning non-linguistic art. However, he soon realized that the strategy in question was untenable, and abandoned it for a more promising but also more ambiguous position.
His whole train of thought there closely followed one that Herder had already pursued in the Critical Forests (1769), so it may be useful to begin with a brief sketch of the latter. By the time of writing the Critical Forests Herder was already committed to his own versions of principles (4) and (5). Accordingly, in reaction to the phenomenon of the non-linguistic arts the book initially set out to argue for a theory of their nature that would preserve consistency with those principles, and it did so in a very straightforward way, denying the non-linguistic arts any the ability to express thoughts or meanings autonomously of language by denying them any ability to express thoughts or meanings at all: whereas poetry has a sense, a soul, a force, music is a mere succession of objects in time, and sculpture and painting are merely spatial; whereas poetry not only depends on the senses but also relates to the imagination, music, sculpture, and painting belong solely to the senses (to hearing, feeling, and vision, respectively); whereas poetry uses voluntary and conventional signs, music, sculpture, and painting employ only natural ones. However, as Herder proceeded with his book he came to realize that this simplistic solution was untenable: in the third part of the book he stumbled upon the awkward case of ancient coins, which, though normally non-linguistic, clearly do nonetheless often express meanings and thoughts in pictorial ways. This realization did not lead him to abandon his versions of principles (4) and (5), however. Instead, it brought him to a more refined account of the non-linguistic arts which was still consistent with those principles: the non-linguistic arts do sometimes express meanings and thoughts, but the meanings and thoughts in question are ones that are parasitic on a prior linguistic expression or expressibility of them by the artist. In the fourth part of the book (which was not published until the middle of the nineteenth century, and was hence unknown to Schleiermacher) Herder already extended this solution from coins to painting; and in subsequent works he extended it to sculpture and music as well.
Schleiermacher’s aesthetics lectures follow a strikingly similar course. He at first sets out to develop a version of the theory that Herder had initially developed in the Critical Forests, correlating the several non-linguistic arts with the different senses as Herder’s theory had done (his only significant revision here consists in modifying Herder’s correlation of sculpture with the sense of touch to include vision as well as touch). Like Herder’s initial theory, Schleiermacher’s is largely motivated by his prior commitment to principles (4) and (5), which, again like Herder’s initial theory, it seeks to vindicate in a naive way: non-linguistic arts, such as music and sculpture, do not express meanings or thoughts autonomously of language because they do not express them at all. For example, Schleiermacher argues that music merely expresses physiologically based “life-conditions [Lebenszustände]”, not representations or thoughts. However, rather like Herder with his ancient coins, in the course of developing this naive solution Schleiermacher stumbles upon a case that forces him to the realization that it is untenable: He develops his naive solution smoothly enough for the cases of music and painting, but then in the middle of his discussion of sculpture he suddenly recalls Pausanias’s account that the very earliest Greek sculptures were merely rough blocks whose function was to serve, precisely, as symbols of religious ideas (oops!). He subsequently goes on to note that an analogous point holds for other non-linguistic arts, such as painting, as well. Accordingly, at this stage in his lectures he changes tack. He now acknowledges that non-linguistic arts do (at least sometimes) express meanings and thoughts after all, and he goes on to vacillate between two new, and mutually conflicting, accounts of that fact: (a) The arts in question do so in such a way that the meanings and thoughts involved are at least sometimes not (yet) linguistically articulable. (In particular, he suggests that the early Greek sculpture just mentioned expressed religious ideas that only later got expressed linguistically.) This account would entail abandoning or at least severely revising principles (4) and (5). (b) The arts in question do so in virtue of a pre-existing linguistic articulation or articulability of the same meanings and thoughts in the artist. (He actually only says in virtue of “something universal”, “a representation”, but a dependence on language seems clearly implied.) This account is similar to Herder’s final account, and, like it, would preserve principles (4) and (5). In the end, then, having renounced his initial—clearly untenable—position, Schleiermacher is left torn between these two more plausible-looking positions, which, however, contradict each other.
The eighteenth- and nineteenth-century German hermeneutic tradition as a whole was similarly torn between these two positions. As has already been mentioned, (b) was the considered position at which Herder eventually arrived. But (a) had strong champions as well—in particular, Hamann, Wackenroder and Tieck, Hegel (concerning architecture and sculpture), and the later Dilthey. The choice between these two positions is a genuinely difficult one, philosophically speaking.
Where does this leave Schleiermacher in relation to the several issues bearing on his hermeneutics and his philosophy of language that, I suggested, encouraged him to undertake this investigation of non-linguistic art in the first place? Concerning the primary question, whether the non-linguistic arts express meanings and thoughts and if so how, he has now realized that they do indeed (at least sometimes) express meanings and thoughts, but he remains torn on exactly how they do so. Concerning his theory of interpretation, that realization is already important, because it shows that interpretation theory does indeed need to extend its coverage beyond linguistic cases to include at least some cases of non-linguistic art. But he remains torn on the further issues in this area—in particular, on whether, as (a) implies, there will be cases in which the interpretation of non-linguistic art will transcend the interpretation of any associated language or, as (b) implies, it will always be dependent on and restricted by the interpretation of associated language. Finally, concerning the philosophy of language that underpins his theory of interpretation, he remains torn about whether the meanings and thoughts that are expressed by non-linguistic art are always parasitic on language (position (b)), so that principles (4) and (5) can be retained without any qualification or modification, or they are instead sometimes independent of language (position (a)), so that principles (4) and (5) will either have to be abandoned or (with Hamann in his Metacritique ) (re)construed in a way that stretches their reference to “language” and “words” to include not-strictly-linguistic-or-verbal symbol use in the non-linguistic arts.
Another motive behind Schleiermacher’s treatment of art in his late aesthetics lectures concerns its cultural status, especially relative to religion. It was an abiding concern of Schleiermacher’s from early in his career until the very end of it—one that set him at odds with the predominant tendency of early German romanticism—to subordinate art to religion. The final cycle of the aesthetics lectures from 1832–3 is merely the last in a long line of attempts to achieve this goal. It seems to me, however, that, partly for reasons already touched on, this last attempt turns out to be oddly and interestingly self-subverting.
Let us first briefly survey Schleiermacher’s whole series of attempts to subordinate art, and then consider how this last one proves self-subverting. It was already one of the early Schleiermacher’s main goals to turn contemporary culture, and especially the romantic movement, away from the then fashionable idea that art was the highest possible type of insight toward the idea that religion was. This is an important part of the project of On Religion (1799), where he criticizes the sort of elevation of art above religion that Goethe and Schiller had begun and the romantics had then accentuated, complains of the trivial nature of modern art, and argues that art ought to subserve religion, as Plato had thought. (The early Schleiermacher was in a way strikingly successful in achieving his goal: after 1799, largely under his influence, the leading romantics did increasingly turn away from art toward religion, and to some extent the same was also true of German culture more generally.) The ethics lectures of 1812–13 continue the same project in a certain way. There Schleiermacher represents art as of its very nature a collective expression of religious feeling (one that differs in accordance with the differences between religions). In other words, he represents art as only true to its own nature when it subserves religion. The 1830 psychology lectures develop an interesting variation on the same theme. There Schleiermacher argues that the perception of beauty is a feeling but one that has a certain sort of deep cognitive content in that it expresses the relation of intelligence to Being. This makes it sound very much like religious feeling, and indeed in these lectures it is treated as a sort of close second-in-command to religious feeling. It might seem as though, from Schleiermacher’s standpoint, there was a danger here of art acquiring too independent and exalted a status. However, that danger is in part averted by the fact that he is here talking primarily about natural beauty, and only secondarily about artistic beauty.
The 1832–3 aesthetics lectures continue this sort of art-demoting project, but in a different manner. Schleiermacher’s initial intention there, it seems, was to demote art (in comparison with religion) in two ways: First, as we saw, the lectures initially set out to give an account of non-linguistic arts (music, painting, and sculpture) that represents them as merely expressive of sensuous feelings and non-cognitive in character. Second, the lectures give an account of poetry that represents it as merely national and indeed individual in nature (not universal). Thus the lectures argue that art generally, and therefore poetry in particular, is national in nature, not universal like science and (in a way) religion, and more radically that it indeed has the function of expressing individuality, of resisting even the commonality of a national language (thereby making explicit a potential that is also present, though less fully realized, in normal language use).
However, as I suggested, this twofold strategy for demoting art turns out to be curiously self-subverting. For one thing, as we saw, the model of non-linguistic art as merely sensuous and non-cognitive in the end proves to be unsustainable. Moreover, not only does non-linguistic art turn out to have a cognitive content after all, but in addition that fact becomes clear from a case (the earliest Greek sculpture) in which the content in question is not trivial but deeply religious in character. Furthermore, this self-subversion would be even more extreme if position (a) won out over position (b) in the end. For another thing, poetry’s function of expressing individuality implies that for Schleiermacher it represents the highest ethical value (for more on individuality’s high status in Schleiermacher’s ethics, see below). In short, what was intended as a demotion of art turns willy-nilly into a sort of cognitive-religious and ethical exaltation of it.
Most of Schleiermacher’s earliest philosophical work was in areas of the subject that might reasonably be described as peripheral in comparison with such central areas as metaphysics and epistemology (in particular, ethics, philosophy of religion, and hermeneutics). This fact, together no doubt with the imposing presence of several intellectual competitors who had recently made or were making contributions in those central areas (including Kant, Fichte, Schelling, and Hegel), seems to have spurred him to develop his own treatment of them. The result was his “dialectics”, which he began presenting in lecture-form in 1811. (This subject-title calls to mind relevant positions not only in Plato and Aristotle, but also in Kant and Hegel.)
Accordingly, Schleiermacher’s dialectics in some ways carries the marks of a discipline that he felt forced to develop, rather than one for which he had a clear, compelling vision (as he had for his philosophy of religion and his hermeneutics, for example). For one thing, the nature of the discipline undergoes a striking shift between its two earliest versions (the lectures of 1811 and 1814–15)—which have the character of fairly conventional treatments of metaphysical and epistemological issues, already concerned to some extent with resolving disagreements indeed, but in a purely theoretical way—and its two main later versions (the lectures of 1822 and the book-fragment from 1833), which make the art of resolving disagreements through conversation the core of the discipline (albeit that “conversation” here includes not only the paradigm case of oral communication but also written communication and even dialogue internal to a single person’s mind). This shift might be roughly described as one from a more Aristotelian to a more Socratic-Platonic conception of “dialectics”.
For another thing, in all of its versions Schleiermacher’s dialectics has an oddly rag-bag appearance, including as it does not only material that would naturally be classified as metaphysics and epistemology, but also large helpings of philosophy of mind, logic (especially the logic of concepts and judgments; Schleiermacher treats the logic of syllogism in a reductive and rather deprecatory way), philosophy of science, and philosophy of religion.
In its final versions (on which I shall focus here), the discipline has the following character: Its concern is with what Schleiermacher calls “pure thought”, as distinguished from the thought of everyday affairs or of art—that is, with thought that aims at truth, rather than merely at achieving practical ends or inventing fictions. (Schleiermacher denies, though, that the former is sharply divorced from the latter two; rather, it is to some degree implicit in them as well as vice versa.)
According to Schleiermacher, genuine knowledge of its very nature requires, not only (1) correspondence to reality, but also (2) systematic coherence with all knowledge, and (3) universal agreement among people. The main motive behind this elaborate position seems to be the thought that there is in principle no way to determine the fulfillment of condition (1) directly, so that believers need to rely on guidance by the fulfillment of conditions (2) and (3). (The German scholar Manfred Frank, in a well known early interpretation of Schleiermacher’s dialectics that he gave in his book Das individuelle Allgemeine (1985) accentuated condition (3), attributing to Schleiermacher on the strength of it a consensus theory of truth. However, in his subsequent edition of Schleiermacher’s dialectics lectures Frank rightly admitted that this interpretation had overlooked the realism implied by condition (1). Incidentally, Frank’s self-correction of the reading of Schleiermacher’s dialectics that he had given in Das individuelle Allgemeine also undercuts his equally well known early reading of Schleiermacher’s hermeneutics there, which built upon this ascription to Schleiermacher of a consensus theory of truth an ascription to him of a—roughly Gadamerian—conception of interpretation as an ongoing construction of facts about meaning through the development of interpretations.)
Not surprisingly given how strong the three conditions just mentioned are, Schleiermacher considers genuine knowledge to be only an “idea” toward which we can make progress, not something that we can ever actually achieve. (Not coincidentally, this position resembles his official positions in hermeneutics and translation theory that the correct understanding of another person and the correct translation of a text are only goals to which we can approximate, not ones that we can ever actually achieve. This is a characteristically romantic pattern.)
Schleiermacher’s dialectics is largely conceived as a methodology for making such progress. This project proceeds relatively smoothly in connection with conditions (1) and (2). For example, in connection with (1), Schleiermacher develops certain principles concerning how to form concepts correctly rather than incorrectly (i.e., in such a way that—as a more recent idiom would put it—they, their superordinate genus-concepts, their subordinate species-concepts, and their contrasting coordinate concepts “carve nature at the joints”). And in connection with (2), while he acknowledges that the task of forming a totality of knowledge is of its nature incompletable, he nonetheless prescribes what he calls “heuristic” and “architectonic” procedures for, respectively, amassing pieces of knowledge and forming them together into a coherent whole.
However, the project runs into deeper difficulties in relation to condition (3). There are two main problems here. First, besides the obvious and avowed impossibility of actually accessing all people in order to come to agreement with them, Schleiermacher also identifies a further obstacle in the way of reaching, or even making significant progress toward, agreement with them: the deep differences that exist between different languages and modes of thought. The dialectics lectures fail to find a promising way of coping with this problem. The 1822 version attempts to do so in two ways, but neither of them looks hopeful. Its first approach consists in hypothesizing a domain of “innate concepts” that are common to everyone (with certain qualifications, for example, that these concepts require sensations in order to be actualized). This would certainly solve the problem, but only by contradicting Schleiermacher’s normal, and philosophically more plausible, position, from which the problem arose in the first place, that there is no such conceptual common ground between all languages (or even, Schleiermacher normally adds, between all individuals who in some sense share a given language). The second approach that the 1822 version tries is an argument that we need to develop a complete history of the differences in question and of how they arose. However, this proposal seems beside the point—a distraction from the problem rather than a solution to it.
In his 1833 book-fragment Schleiermacher at some points seems close to giving up on this problem, saying in one place that because of it dialectics must restrict itself to a specific “linguistic sphere”. But at other points he evidently still clings to the hope of finding common ground that unites different “linguistic spheres”. What sort of solution does he have in mind? The answer can perhaps be seen from an 1831 address that he delivered on Leibniz’s idea of a universal language. In this address he in effect argues that it was a mistake on Leibniz’s part to suppose that there was already a conceptual common ground shared by everyone, which could be captured in a universal language (this also amounts to a rejection of his own dubious idea in the 1822 lectures of common “innate concepts”), but that the sort of conceptual common ground that Leibniz had thus wrongly envisaged as already existing can nonetheless be achieved (or at least approached) for the sciences in the future, namely by cultivating an attitude of openness to the borrowing of conceptual resources from other languages according as such resources prove themselves useful for the sciences (a process that, according to Schleiermacher, is in fact already strongly underway, and which is realizable either through borrowing the foreign words in question outright or by translating them into one’s own language in the sort of scrupulous way that his theory of translation advocates). Schleiermacher notes that this solution requires an (in any case healthy) shedding of prejudices about the superiority of one’s own language, mode of thought, and people over others. This looks like Schleiermacher’s most promising solution to the problem in question. He did not, however, live long enough to develop it in detail or to build on it toward a more complete method for resolving interlinguistic disagreements.
The second, and perhaps more surprising, problem is that Schleiermacher’s dialectics lectures do not even develop a substantive account of how to resolve disagreements through conversation within a “linguistic sphere”. However, here again it is fortunately possible to supplement the dialectics lectures with additional material that goes further in such a direction. One important text in this connection is Schleiermacher’s early essay Toward a Theory of Sociable Conduct (1799), which is precisely concerned with the art of conversation within a linguistic sphere. This early essay emphasizes the importance of finding (conceptual) “content” that one shares with one’s interlocutor(s), and restricting one’s conversation to this. Schleiermacher accordingly recommends that one begin a conversation guided by a sort of minimal estimate of such content arrived at from one’s knowledge of such things as the profession, the educational background, and the class of one’s interlocutor(s), but that one then tentatively and experimentally work outwards toward identifying and exploiting further shared content—a process that he recommends one should undertake, not by the heavy-handed method of introducing doubtfully shared content directly, but rather by the subtler method of introducing it indirectly in the form of a dimension of allusion and satire that one adds to one’s treatment of already established shared content (after which, if the response from the interlocutor(s) is positive, it can join the previously established shared content as a proper subject-matter for direct treatment).
Another helpful text in this connection is Schleiermacher’s hermeneutics lectures, which implicitly revise the earlier account just described in two respects: (a) In that account conversation was to be restricted to conceptual content that was already shared between interlocutors. But as we saw previously, by the time Schleiermacher writes the hermeneutics lectures he is skeptical that people ever really share conceptual content. Consequently, he would presumably now set the bar for fruitful conversation somewhat lower than strict sharing. (b) Also, it seems reasonable to infer from his conception of hermeneutics that he would now place less emphasis on discovering pre-existing commonalities, or even near-commonalities, and more on refining those found and establishing further ones—in both cases, with the help of an adept use of the art of hermeneutics.
Finally, Schleiermacher’s hermeneutics lectures also supply a further part of his seemingly missing solution to the problem of reaching agreement through conversation, both in inter- and in intra-linguistic contexts. Clearly, any art of reaching agreement through conversation is going to depend on an art of interpreting interlocutors. Accordingly, the dialectics lectures explicitly assert that dialectics is dependent on hermeneutics (as well as vice versa), Schleiermacher’s conception of hermeneutics as a universal discipline ensures its applicability to conversations, and Schleiermacher indeed mentions in the hermeneutics lectures that he sometimes applies his own hermeneutical principles in conversational contexts. In short, Schleiermacher’s hermeneutics itself constitutes an important component of his art of reaching agreement through conversation.
In sum, whereas Schleiermacher’s final conception of dialectics as a discipline leads one to expect it to provide a fairly detailed set of procedures for resolving both inter- and intra-linguistic disagreements in conversation (analogous to the detailed set of procedures for interpretation that one finds in his hermeneutics), this expectation is largely disappointed by the dialectics lectures themselves. However, one can supplement the dialectics lectures from other texts in order to see how Schleiermacher might have envisaged a fuller solution to this task.
One last point that should be mentioned in this connection is the following. Schleiermacher’s most prominent motive for developing such an art of conversation is the epistemological one described above. That may or may not be a good motive in the end. However, Schleiermacher also has further, independent motives behind this art that are more obviously attractive. Thus, his 1831 address on Leibniz implies two additional motives behind the intercultural side of the art: first, Schleiermacher’s cosmopolitan concern for humanity as a whole in all of its diversity constitutes a moral reason for promoting fruitful intercultural dialogue; and second, his sense that insight, far from being a monopoly of our own, is dispersed among many cultures constitutes another reason for us to engage in such dialogue. Schleiermacher would presumably say that analogous considerations help to justify the intracultural side of the art as well. Again, the essay Toward a Theory of Sociable Conduct emphasizes yet another motive behind the intracultural side of the art. In this essay Schleiermacher does not yet mention his later epistemological motive at all, but instead focuses on more direct benefits that he expects from fruitful conversation between members of society, in particular the individual’s enrichment of his own limited perspective through an incorporation of the different perspectives of other people. Schleiermacher would presumably say that an analogous consideration helps to justify the intercultural side of the art as well. In short, even if it were to turn out that Schleiermacher’s predominant epistemological motive for developing an art of inter- and intra-cultural conversation were unpersuasive, such an art might still be valuable for other reasons that he also has in mind such as these ones.
Finally, it is worth mentioning a few further positions that Schleiermacher develops in his dialectics, albeit more briefly. One rather striking position is a denial that any concepts, thoughts, or cognitions are either purely a priori in character or purely empirical—either the product of the “intellectual” function alone or of the “organic” function alone. Rather, all are the product of both functions—though the proportions in which they are involved vary from case to case.
More specifically, as Schleiermacher conceives the situation, all are located on a continuum that stretches between the maximally “intellectual” ideas of Being or God and the maximally “organic” chaos of sensations. These two extremes do not themselves involve mixture: Being or God is purely intellectual, while the chaos of sensations is purely organic. However, they do not for that reason constitute counterexamples to the position just mentioned, because they are not themselves strictly speaking concepts, thoughts, or cognitions.
As was mentioned previously, Schleiermacher’s theory of concepts also says that they are in each case defined by relations of subsumption under higher concepts, contrast with correlative concepts similarly subsumed, and subsumption of further concepts under them. Subsumption under the non-concept Being and the subsumption of a class of primitive judgments concerning sensations constitute special cases at the two extremes of this conceptual hierarchy.
Another position that Schleiermacher holds is that the (Kantian) distinction between analytic and synthetic judgments is a merely “relative” one. One reason for this position seems to lie in his view that all judgments are partly empirical in nature (a consideration that anticipates Quine). But what he mainly seems to have in mind here is that it is always in some sense up to us to decide how many and which characteristic marks to build into any given subject concept, and therefore how many and which judgments in which that subject concept features will count as analytic or as synthetic.
A last feature of Schleiermacher’s dialectics is more puzzling. Schleiermacher notes at one point that he wants to chart a sort of middle course between ancient dialectics, which had the virtue of openness but the vice of courting skepticism, and the dogmatism of the scholastics, for whom everything of importance was pre-decided in a religious principle that they presupposed. His concession to the former position has in effect already been described above. But what about his concession to the latter? This takes the form of positing a “transcendental ground” or God which is (1) beyond all oppositions, including those of thought/reality, thought/volition, and concept/judgment, (2) beyond Being (even though Being is itself beyond such oppositions), (3) an essential impulse behind, and accompaniment of, all attempts to know, and (4) not thinkable or linguistically expressible but instead felt. This is all rather mysterious. For example, the philosophical rationale for positing such a “transcendental ground” or God as beyond rather than identical with Being is obscure, and so too is the exact way in which it is supposed to be the impulse behind, and accompaniment of, all attempts to know.
Schleiermacher’s ethical thought divides into two overlapping chronological phases. The first phase—which stretched from the late 1780s until about 1803—was mainly critical in character. Early in this phase, the three unpublished essays On the Highest Good (1789), On What Gives Value to Life (1792–3), and On Freedom (1790–3) mounted a sustained attack on Kant’s ethical theory, and at the end of this phase the longer published work Outlines of a Critique of Previous Ethical Theory (1803) developed that attack into a more comprehensive and systematic critique of previous ethical theories. The second phase—which began around 1800—was by contrast mainly constructive in character. To this phase belong the Soliloquies (1800), the Draft of an Ethics (1805–6), and Schleiermacher’s mature ethics lectures (including the complete draft from 1812–13, as well as a number of later partial drafts).
The three early essays On the Highest Good, On What Gives Value to Life, and On Freedom criticize and reject central tenets of Kant’s moral philosophy: in particular, Kant’s inclusion in the “highest good [summum bonum]” of an apportioning of happiness to moral desert; Kant’s position that this must be believed in as a presupposition of morality, so that its own implicit presuppositions, an afterlife of the soul and a God, must be so as well (the doctrine of the “postulates”); and Kant’s incompatibilism concerning causal determinism and the freedom that is required for moral responsibility, and consequent recourse to the causally indeterministic noumenal realm as the locus for freedom (On Freedom argues that all human actions are causally determined, but that this is compatible with the freedom that is required for moral responsibility).
A further area of disagreement with Kant forms the hinge on which Schleiermacher’s development of his own constructive ethical theory turns. Kant’s fundamental moral principle, the “categorical imperative”, consisted, according to its central formulation, in a requirement that an agent’s moral maxim (or intention) be consistent when universalized, and was conceived by Kant to apply uniformly to all human beings. Schleiermacher rejects this position in two ways. First, already in On What Gives Value to Life, and then especially in the Soliloquies, he argues against the latter idea of uniformity in ethics—instead asserting, in the spirit of Herder (and others influenced by Herder, such as Goethe, Schiller, and fellow romantics), the value of diversity or individuality even in the moral sphere. In this connection, Schleiermacher champions not only a (moral) distinctiveness of different human societies vis-à-vis the human species as a whole (this had been Herder’s main cause), but also a (moral) distinctiveness of the individual vis-à-vis his society (this had also been a cause of Herder’s). (In On Religion Schleiermacher makes an analogous case for both societal and individual diversity in religion. His positive evaluation of societal and individual diversity naturally also extends beyond morals and religion to other domains.)
Second, Schleiermacher also rejects the content of Kant’s “categorical imperative” as specified by its central formulation: the requirement of consistency of a maxim under universalization. In On Religion and the Soliloquies Schleiermacher is rather inclined to champion Kant’s subordinate formula of a commitment to the welfare of humanity, though not in Kant’s sense of a common rational nature, but instead in Herder’s sense of all human beings in their diversities as well as their commonalities. (In On Religion he discusses the historical dimension of this principle of humanity in a Herderian spirit, like Herder in Ideas for the Philosophy of History of Humanity [1784–91] emphasizing the important role that has been played by (Christian) religion in advancing it, and interpreting history as its progressive realization.)
This double position of Schleiermacher’s might seem to court the following sort of problem: What if the moral values of a society or an individual conflict with the ideal of humanity? What, for example, if the society is Nazi Germany or the individual Hitler? In the Soliloquies Schleiermacher forestalls this sort of problem by limiting the forms of moral distinctiveness and individuality that he supports to those that are compatible with, or even supportive of, the ideal of humanity. Thus he expresses his commitment to moral distinctiveness or individuality in such formulas as that a person should be an individual “without violating the laws of humanity”, that “each human being should represent humanity in his own way”, and that what is valuable is a person’s “distinctive being and its relation to humanity”. Similarly, Schleiermacher’s championing of (moral) diversity or individuality is always combined with requirements of a measure of conformity with a broader species-wide or societal whole.
This constructive tension between “distinctive [eigentümlich]” and “universal” sides of ethics survives to constitute the central principle of Schleiermacher’s mature ethics lectures. There he begins by arguing that very general forms or analogues of such a constructive tension exist as universal facts of nature—that all finite beings exhibit such a tension, more specifically, that all life does so in the form of a tension between autonomy and social commonality, and more specifically still, that all human mental life does so in this same form. He then goes on to derive from this a moral duty to realize such a tension in one’s own person.
This position prompts certain questions, to which the answers are not entirely clear. First, is Schleiermacher not here guilty of the so-called “naturalistic fallacy”, that of attempting to deduce an “ought” from an “is”? The answer would depend on the exact nature of his derivation of the moral duty from the universal facts of nature, which is obscure. Second, how can a synthesis of commonality with individuality both be an unavoidable fact about human nature (e.g., since we can never quite share any concepts, we also can never quite share any moral concepts in particular) and be a moral duty? There are two possible answers to this puzzle. One would appeal to Schleiermacher’s determinism and compatibilism: that a mode of existence or behavior is inevitable does not for him preclude its moral obligatoriness. The other would instead appeal to the fact that the sort of synthesis in question can come in varying degrees: it might be that some degree of moral individuality is indeed inevitable for the reason mentioned but that the degree that is morally required is greater.
In addition to the central principle just discussed, three further aspects of the mature ethics lectures are worth mentioning briefly: (a) As was reflected in the argument just sketched, Schleiermacher’s mature conception of ethics is that it is fundamentally ontological rather than merely prescriptive in character: it is based on the immanence of “reason” in “nature”, and is hence more fundamentally a matter of an “is” than of an “ought”. (b) Accordingly (with an eye to the role of “reason” just mentioned), for Schleiermacher ethics is not fundamentally a matter of sentiments—which, he says, simply vary—but instead of cognitions, or more exactly, of something that grounds both ethical sentiments and ethical cognitions. (Here Schleiermacher is close to agreement with Kant.) (c) Accordingly again (but this time with an eye to the predominance of ontology over prescription just mentioned), Schleiermacher divides his ethics into a Doctrine of Goods, a Doctrine of Virtue, and a Doctrine of Duties, treating them in this sequence in order to reflect what he takes to be the priority, or greater fundamentalness, of goods over virtues and of virtues over duties.
Despite all these intriguing lines of thought, Schleiermacher’s ethics lectures are not a great success. They contain a rather unholy mixture of, not only ethics in the usual sense, but also political philosophy, metaphysics, epistemology, and philosophy of mind; lurch back and forth between claims of startling dubiousness and claims of startling banality (with too little in between); and hold all of this together with a thick stain of obscurantism and a thin varnish of systematicity. One is often left with the impression that, having put the more critical phase of his work in ethics behind him, Schleiermacher found that he did not really have enough constructive to say about the subject to fill up the hours in the lecture hall.
10. Political and Social Philosophy
Schleiermacher’s political and social philosophy is found scattered through a considerable number of works from different periods. Its most systematic, though not necessarily most interesting, statement occurs in his lectures on the theory of the state, which were delivered between 1808–9 and 1833.
Concerning international politics, Schleiermacher’s fundamental position is thoroughly Herderian: a cosmopolitan commitment to equal moral respect for all peoples in all their diversity. This position is already articulated in On What Gives Value to Life (1792–3); it is central to On Religion (1799) and the Soliloquies (1800), in the form of a commitment to the Herderian ideal of “humanity”; and it survives in later works as well (for example, in the 1831 address on Leibniz’s idea of a universal language).
Concerning domestic politics: Schleiermacher was always somewhat reticent about fundamental constitutional questions. To judge from his early enthusiasm for the French Revolution, and his republican-democratic model of an ideal church in On Religion, the early Schleiermacher was strongly attracted to republicanism and democracy (like Herder and the young Friedrich Schlegel). However, his later position—while it still makes consent a conditio sine qua non of any genuine state—is more sympathetic to aristocratic and monarchical forms of government. Thus in his lectures on the theory of the state from 1829–33 he argues that whereas smaller and “lower” states are naturally democratic, large and “higher” ones are naturally aristocratic or monarchical.
However, Schleiermacher’s domestic politics is more consistently radical in another respect: liberalism. (Here again he is heavily indebted to Herder.) This ideal is already prominent in two works from 1799: the essay Toward a Theory of Sociable Conduct argues that there should be a sphere of free (by which Schleiermacher means especially: state-free) social interaction, in order to make possible the development and communication of individuality; and On Religion argues strongly against state-interference in religion, making the liberation of religion from such interference a fundamental part of its program for developing individualism in religion, and diagnosing some of the worst vices of current churches and religion in terms of such interference. This liberalism remains prominent in the ethics lectures of 1812–13, which add to the positions just mentioned a proscription of state interference in the universities. And it is still central to Schleiermacher’s political thought in his (otherwise much more conservative) late lectures on the theory of the state from 1829–33, where he argues that the three spheres of sociality, religion, and science (e.g., the universities) lie beyond the legitimate power of the state, and notes critically that the current (Prussian) state falls short of this ideal. His Augsburg Confession sermons from 1830 are likewise still liberal. Schleiermacher has several reasons for this broad liberalism, but one of his most fundamental ones lies in the need to free up a domain in which the basic good of individuality can develop.
Schleiermacher devotes especially close attention to the question of religion’s proper relation to the state (and to other socio-political institutions). As was mentioned, in On Religion he indicates two main reasons why religion should be liberated from state interference: first, because individualism in religion, the autonomous development of a multiplicity of forms of religion, is valuable; and second, because state-interference corrupts the nature of religion by, for example, attracting the wrong sorts of people into leadership positions within the church (men with worldly skills and motives rather than religious ones) and foisting alien political functions onto religious mysteries such as baptism and marriage. He argues that the true socio-political center of religion should instead be the family—a position that he subsequently goes on to illustrate in Christmas Eve (1806), a work that depicts in a literary way a sort of ideal interweaving of (Christian) religion with family life.
One especially important and interesting case to which he applied his general insistence on the freedom of religion from state-interference was that of Prussia’s Jews. (Once again, Herder had already set an example here—by both developing a highly sympathetic interpretation of ancient Judaism and forcefully criticizing modern anti-semitism.) In an early work on the subject of Jewish emancipation in Prussia, Letters on the Occasion of the Political-Theological Task and the Open Letter of Jewish Householders (1799), Schleiermacher argues that Jews should receive full citizenship and civil rights, provided only that they compromise in their religious observances to a point that allows them to meet their duties to the state and that they give up such politically threatening commitments as those to a coming messiah and to their status as a separate nation. He argues that Jews should not have to resort to the expedient of baptism as a means of achieving citizenship and civil rights (as some (Jewish) contemporaries had proposed), on the grounds that this expedient would be detrimental both to the Jews and their religion themselves and to Christianity. In the latter connection the main concern he expresses is that it would further water down an already rather watery church. But another of his concerns is that it would in effect amount to yet more interference by the state in a religious mystery (baptism). It is significant to note that Schleiermacher adopts this strikingly liberal position concerning the Jews despite himself being rather critical of Judaism as religion: in On Religion he argues that Reimarus’s conception that there are deep continuities between Judaism and Christianity is mistaken, and that although Judaism was a beautiful religion in its day it has long since become corrupted and is now effectively moribund (unlike vibrant Christianity).
A further important aspect of Schleiermacher’s socio-political philosophy, especially in its earlier phases, is his proto-feminism (in which he is again influenced by Herder, who was a pioneer in this area, but even more so by Friedrich Schlegel). His proto-feminism has several sides. First, he encourages women to strive for goods that have traditionally been the monopoly of men. For example, in his short Idea for a Catechism of Reason for Noble Ladies, he enjoins women, “Let yourself covet men’s culture, art, wisdom, and honor”. Second, as a special case of this, he encourages women to seek sexual fulfillment, and to free themselves from inhibitions about discussing sex. This is one of the central themes of his Confidential Letters Concerning Friedrich Schlegel’s Lucinde (1800). Third, he identifies women as a source of valuable moral and intellectual resources for the benefit and improvement of society as a whole. One example of this lies in their natural aversion to the sorts of insensitivity and violence to which men are commonly prone, and their potential ability to restrain instead of encouraging or permitting these. In this vein the Idea for a Catechism enjoins women, “You should not bear false witness for men. You should not beautify their barbarism with words and works”. Another (less morally urgent and more localized) example, discussed in Toward a Theory of Sociable Conduct, concerns the ability of women, due to their broad education but their freedom from the narrow confines of the professions, to direct social conversation away from limited professional concerns toward deeper and more broadly shared ones (Schleiermacher is thinking here especially of the hostesses of salons of the period that he himself attended). Yet another example can be found in an argument that Schleiermacher develops in his ethics lectures to the effect that women are by nature more attuned to recognizing and respecting individuality, whereas men are more attuned to recognizing and respecting abstract generalizations, and that accordingly one of the key functions of marriage is to bring about a valuable blending of these (equally important) intellectual-moral qualities in each partner. (It should be noted, however, that Schleiermacher in his later years tended to be more conservative in his views about women.)
At the risk of repetition, it is worth underscoring that in its broad cosmopolitan concern for other peoples, Jews, and women Schleiermacher’s socio-political philosophy was continuing a paradigm that was above all the achievement of a single predecessor: Herder.
Another noteworthy feature of Schleiermacher’s socio-political philosophy, especially prominent in the works from 1799–1800, is a broad critique of some central modern socio-economic institutions and a set of proposals for remedying their harmful effects. (The Soliloquies casts this critique in the form of an attack on the self-satisfaction of the Enlightenment very reminiscent of Herder’s attack on the same in This Too a Philosophy of History (1774).) Three parts of Schleiermacher’s case are especially interesting: First, in Toward a Theory of Sociable Conduct he implicitly criticizes modern division of labor on the grounds that it blinkers people, inhibiting their development of their own individuality and their sense for the individuality of others. His proposed solution here is the development of a sphere of “sociability”—that is, a sphere of free conversation and social intercourse, in which such one-sidedness can be overcome. Second, in On Religion he criticizes the deadeningly repetitive labor that is typical of modern economies as an obstacle to spiritual, and in particular religious, self-development. His proposed solution here is mainly a hope that advances in technology will free people from the sort of labor in question. Third, in On Religion and the Soliloquies he criticizes the hedonism, utilitarianism, and materialism of the modern age for preventing people’s spiritual and religious self-development. His proposed solution here is mainly the sort of revival of a vibrant religious and moral life for which On Religion and the Soliloquies plead.
Finally, another noteworthy aspect of Schleiermacher’s political and social philosophy is his philosophy of education, a subject with which he engaged throughout his career. Especially interesting in this regard is a work that he published in 1808 in connection with the plans for founding a new university in Berlin (now known as the Humboldt University): Occasional Thoughts on Universities in a German Spirit, together with an Appendix on One about to be Founded. This work preceded Wilhelm von Humboldt’s better known pieces on the same topic, which date from 1809–10, and it evidently had a strong influence on them. Schleiermacher and Humboldt both write in a very liberal and progressive spirit (with only modest differences of position), and thereby not only collectively generated the model of the university that Humboldt helped to implement in Berlin and which thereby became the model of the modern university tout court, but also developed many principles on the subject that would still repay serious consideration today (for example, Britain could learn a lot from them). Among the principles that Schleiermacher develops and which Humboldt took over are: a conception that the university should promote not only knowledge but also individuality; a principle that this requires the greatest possible independence of the university from the state (something that will in the end also serve the state’s own interests better); a principle that it also requires that there should be as much freedom as possible within the university for both faculty and students; a principle that students should be admitted to university regardless of their class provided only that they are academically qualified; a principle that philosophy should replace theology as the top faculty; a principle of combining research with teaching; and a principle (based on a philosophy of language that Schleiermacher shares with Humboldt according to which not only is language fundamental to thought but also oral language is more fundamental than written) that the teaching in question should be primarily oral in character (for Schleiermacher the lecture, for Humboldt the seminar). Indeed, Schleiermacher is in certain ways even more radical and progressive than Humboldt in that he, for example, explicitly calls for the university to be run on a democratic model and demands that students from the lower classes not only be admitted to university but also receive financial support from the state in order to enable them to attend.
Schleiermacher also gave more general lectures on pedagogy, or the philosophy of education, in 1813–14, 1820–1, and 1826—among which those from 1826 are most fully developed. But by the time he delivered this last cycle of lectures his views had become much more politically conservative and orthodoxly Christian, so that the radical edge of his earlier work on the subject was blunted, the interests of the state and the church were now assigned greater weight as goals of education, and such principles as freedom in education accordingly underwent heavy qualification.
11. Philosophy of Religion
Schleiermacher’s most radical and important work in the philosophy of religion is On Religion: Speeches to Its Cultured Despisers from 1799. (Later editions of this work, and the later theological treatise The Christian Faith, strive for greater Christian orthodoxy, and are consequently as a rule less interesting from a philosophical point of view.)
As its title implies, the project of On Religion is to save religion from the contempt of enlightenment and especially romantic skeptics about religion, “its cultured despisers”. At least where the romantics were concerned, the work was strikingly successful in this regard, in that several of them, especially Friedrich Schlegel, did turn to religion following the book’s publication (though admittedly not to quite the sort of religion that Schleiermacher had envisaged). Schleiermacher’s later philosophy of religion has a similar motivation. In his 1829 open letters to Lücke he especially emphasizes the pressing need to defend religion against the twin threats posed to it by modern natural science and modern historical-philological scholarship.
This project of defending religion against educated skeptics is reminiscent of Kant’s similarly motivated critical philosophy. Schleiermacher is also sympathetic to Kant’s strategy in connection with religious matters of “deny[ing] knowledge in order to make room for faith” (Critique of Pure Reason, Bxxx), and in particular to Kant’s attack on the traditional proofs of the existence of God; Schleiermacher himself denies that religion is a form of knowledge or can be based on metaphysics or science. However, as can already be seen from his early unpublished essays On the Highest Good (1789) and On What Gives Value to Life (1792–3), Schleiermacher’s approach is in other respects defined more by opposition to than by agreement with Kant’s. In particular, Schleiermacher sharply rejects Kant’s alternative moral proof of an otherworldly God and human immortality (i.e., Kant’s proof of them by showing them to be necessary presuppositions of morality); for Schleiermacher religion can no more be based on morality than on metaphysics or science.
As this stance already suggests, Schleiermacher has a large measure of sympathy with the skeptics about religion whom he means to answer. But, at least in his early period, his sympathy with them also goes much deeper than this. In On Religion he is skeptical about the ideas of God and human immortality altogether, arguing that the former is merely optional (to be included in one’s religion or not depending on the nature of one’s imagination), and that the latter is downright unacceptable. Moreover, he diagnoses the modern prevalence of such religious ideas in terms of the deadening influence that is exerted by modern bourgeois society and state-interference on religion. He reconciles this rather startling concession to the skeptics with his ultimate goal of defending religion by claiming that such ideas are inessential to religion. This stance strikingly anticipates such later radical religious positions as Fritz Mauthner’s “godless mysticism”. (Schleiermacher’s own later religious thought tended to backtrack on this radicalism, however, restoring God and even human immortality to a central place in religion.)
This naturally leaves one wondering what the content and the epistemological basis of religion are for the early Schleiermacher. As can already be seen from the 1793–4 essays Spinozism and Brief Presentation of the Spinozistic System, and then again from On Religion, he follows Spinoza in believing in a monistic principle that encompasses everything, a “one and all”. However, he also modifies Spinoza’s conception in certain ways—partly under the influence of Herder (whom he mentions by name in the essays on Spinoza). In particular, whereas Spinoza had conceived his monistic principle as a substance, Schleiermacher follows Herder in thinking of it rather as an original force and the unifying source of a multiplicity of more mundane forces. (Later on Schleiermacher distanced himself from this neo-Spinozistic position. Indeed, he explicitly denied that he was a follower of Spinoza. Accordingly, in the dialectics lectures he argued that there was an even higher “transcendental ground” beyond the Spinozist natura naturans or the Herderian highest force. His main motive behind this change of position seems to have been a desire to avoid the heavily charged accusations of Spinozism and pantheism—which is hardly an impressive motive philosophically speaking.)
So much for the early Schleiermacher’s conception of the content of religion. What about its epistemological basis? As was mentioned, for Schleiermacher religion is founded neither on theoretical knowledge nor on morality. According to On Religion, it is instead based on an intuition or feeling of the universe: “Religion’s essence is neither thinking nor acting, but intuition and feeling. It wishes to intuit the universe” (OR Second Speech: 22).
The term “intuition” here is both revealing and problematic. As Kant had defined it, “intuition is that through which [a mode of knowledge] is in immediate relation to [objects]” (Critique of Pure Reason, A19). So part of what Schleiermacher means to convey here is evidently some sort of immediate cognitive relation to some sort of object, namely, the universe as a single whole. On the other hand, the term “intuition” also imported certain implications that Schleiermacher in fact wanted to avoid. In particular, Kantian pure or empirical intuition required the addition of concepts in order to constitute any sort of real insight (“intuitions without concepts are blind”—Critique of Pure Reason, A51), whereas Schleiermacher had in mind a sort of insight that is unmediated by concepts. In the later editions of On Religion he therefore retreated from speaking of “intuition” in connection with religion (instead reserving this term for science), and instead spoke simply of “feeling”. In accordance with this change, The Christian Faith went on to define religion more specifically as a feeling of absolute dependence, or what Schleiermacher also described in his open letters to Lücke as the immediate consciousness of “an immediate existence-relationship”.
A further aspect of the “feeling” on which Schleiermacher bases religion should also be mentioned: its inclusion of motivating force, its self-manifestation in actions. The wish to include this aspect was one of Schleiermacher’s reasons for supplementing religious “intuition” with “feeling” even in the first edition of On Religion. And his later work emphasizes this dimension of religious “feeling” as well.
This whole epistemological position looks suspiciously like philosophical sleight-of-hand, however. “Feelings” can be of at least two very different sorts: on the one hand, non-cognitive “feelings”, such as physical pains and pleasures; on the other hand, “feelings” that incorporate beliefs, for example, a feeling that such and such is the case. Whereas the possession and awareness of non-cognitive feelings such as pains and pleasures may indeed be conceptually unmediated, beyond mediation by reasons for or against, and hence in a sense infallible, the possession and awareness of feelings that incorporate beliefs, for instance, the feeling that such and such is the case, does require conceptual mediation, is subject to reasoning for or against, and is fallible. As can be seen from the neo-Spinozistic content that Schleiermacher’s religious intuition or feeling was originally supposed to have, his original characterization of it as an intuition in the Kantian sense of an immediate cognitive relation to an object, his later characterization of it as representing “an immediate existence-relationship”, and so on, he does not mean religious feeling to be merely non-cognitive, but rather to incorporate some sort of belief. However, he also helps himself to the apparent epistemological advantages that belong only to non-cognitive feelings: non-mediation by concepts, transcendence of reasons for or against, and infallibility. In short, it looks as though his epistemological grounding of religion in “feeling” depends on a systematic confusion of these two crucially different sorts of cases.
Turning more briefly to some additional features of Schleiermacher’s philosophy of religion in On Religion: He recognizes a potentially endless multiplicity of valid religions, and strongly advocates religious toleration. However, he also arranges the various types of religion in a hierarchy, with animism at the bottom, polytheism in the middle, and monotheistic or otherwise monistic religions at the top. This hierarchy is understandable given his fundamental neo-Spinozism.
More internally problematic, however, is a further elaboration of this hierarchy that he introduces: he identifies Christianity as the highest among the monotheistic or monistic religions, and in particular as higher than Judaism. His rationale for this is that Christianity introduces “the idea that everything finite requires higher mediation in order to be connected with the divine” (i.e., the higher mediation of Christ) (OR Fifth Speech: 120). But this looks contrived. It is left unclear why “higher mediation” is supposed to be a good thing. Moreover, even if one were to grant that it is, why do other monotheistic religions such as Judaism not share in this putative advantage as well, namely, in the form of their prophets? And if the answer is that this is because prophets are not themselves divine, then why is the mediator’s divinity supposed to be such a great advantage?
In addition, Schleiermacher remarks insightfully on the distinctively polemical nature of Christianity, the striking extent to which Christianity’s religious and moral standpoint is defined by a hostile opposition to other standpoints, and even to other dissenting positions within Christianity itself. This observation recalls that of another well-informed and honest Christian, Montaigne, who had noted in his Apology for Raymond Sebond (1580) that “there is no hostility quite as perfect as Christian hostility”. And it is amply borne out by the historical evidence—for example, the bloody early history of Christianity, the Crusades, the Inquisition’s treatment of Jews and witches, the Wars of Religion of the sixteenth and seventeenth centuries, and many other, similar horrors (all of which only stopped, or at least diminished, when Christianity was rendered politically impotent by the Enlightenment and the American and French Revolutions in the eighteenth century). Moreover, this striking feature of Christianity has since received deeper explanations—including Jan Assman’s observation that Judeo-Christian-Muslim religion was from the start a sort of “anti-religion [Gegenreligion]”, defined by its opposition to other religions and cultures, and Nietzsche’s observation that Christianity and its morality specifically were from the beginning a reaction against Greek and Roman culture motivated by resentment against Greek and Roman imperial oppression in Palestine and elsewhere, so that, for example, (a point that Nietzsche does not himself make clearly) the Greeks’ most general word for a god, daimôn, became the Christian concept of a demon, and (a point that he makes very clearly) Christian moral values performed a systematic inversion of traditional Greek and Roman values. So Schleiermacher’s observation is an insightful one. But then how can a proponent of religious pluralism and toleration like Schleiermacher consistently see this striking trait of Christianity as anything but a very serious vice?
On the (flimsy) basis of his perception of Christianity’s superiority as a religion, Schleiermacher also tries to reconcile his neo-Spinozism with traditional Christian doctrines as far as possible. This project already begins in a modest way in On Religion, where, for example, he tries to salvage the Christian doctrine of miracles in the modified form of a doctrine that classifies all events as miracles (insofar as viewed from a religious perspective). A similar project is pursued more elaborately (and tediously) in The Christian Faith.
Finally, a more fruitful contribution of Schleiermacher’s to the study of Christianity was the series of lectures on the life of Jesus that—under the influence of two late works of Herder’s: On the Savior of Mankind according to our First Three Gospels (1796) and On God’s Son, the World’s Savior, according to John’s Gospel (1797)—he began to deliver in 1819 and which were published posthumously. Schleiermacher tried in these lectures to combine an interpretation of Jesus as a mere human being with a claim that his extraordinary level of awareness of God nonetheless amounted to a sort of presence of God in him. This compromise was strained and implausible. But Schleiermacher’s project nonetheless constituted an important step toward much more consistently naturalistic and plausible treatments of the life of Jesus by subsequent scholars, especially David Friedrich Strauss’s The Life of Jesus, Critically Examined (1835–6).
Guide to the Literature
Life and Works
Berner 1995; Dilthey  1966–1970; Haym  1920 (ch. 3); Mariña 2005; Redeker 1973; Scholtz 1984.
Philosophy of Language
Coseriu 2015 (vol. 2, ch. 8) (a detailed, helpful treatment); Forster 2011b, 2014; Gipper and Schmitter 1985 (92–98) (an excellent book).
Philosophy of Mind
Coseriu 2015 (vol. 2, ch. 8) (Coseriu pays close attention to Schleiermacher’s lectures on psychology); Sigwart 1857.
Hermeneutics (i.e., Theory of Interpretation)
Boeckh 1877; Bowie 1997; Dilthey 1860, 1900; Forster 2010b, 2011c; Frank 1985, 1990 (these two books, especially the former of them, are arguably the most important secondary literature on Schleiermacher’s hermeneutics available); Gadamer  2002 (part 2) (a decidedly hostile but nonetheless important treatment of Schleiermacher’s hermeneutics); Hirsch 1967 (a significant Anglophone appropriation of Schleiermacher’s hermeneutics); Kimmerle 1957 (an important and influential contribution that counteracts Dilthey’s overemphasis of the psychological, as opposed to linguistic, side of interpretation in Schleiermacher’s hermeneutics); Palmer 1969 (ch. 7) (helpful on Schleiermacher as well as on other figures); Patsch 1966 (a learned and important article that discusses Schleiermacher’s hermeneutics in relation to Friedrich Schlegel’s); Ricoeur 1973, 1977 (helpful though dull); Szondi  1986 (Szondi’s writings are consistently thoughtful and helpful); Wach 1926–1933 (learned and informative, though not exciting). Also helpful are the introductory materials in the two German editions of Schleiermacher’s hermeneutics (H, HK) as well as in their English translations (HHM, HC).
Historiography of Philosophy
Bréhier 1963; Forster 2012; Geldsetzer 1968; Gueroult 1984 (vol. 2); Zeller 1843.
Theory of Translation
Berman 1984 (an excellent treatment of the translation theories of Schleiermacher and some of his contemporaries); Berman and Berner 1999 (very helpful not only for Schleiermacher’s own texts but also for the editors’ introduction); Cercel and Serban 2015 (an important and valuable volume of articles on this subject); Forster 2010c, 2015; Huyssen 1969; Thomas 2015 (an excellent treatment of Schleiermacher’s translation theory that also takes the competing French tradition of translation theory that preceded it into account); Venuti 1995 (helpfully touches on, and especially still works in the spirit of, Schleiermacher’s theory of translation).
Lehnerer 1987; Odebrecht 1932.
Burdorf and Schmücker 1998; Kaulbach 1968; Wagner 1974; Wehrung 1920. Also helpful is Frank’s introduction to his edition of Schleiermacher’s dialectics (D).
Louden’s introduction to Lectures on Philosophical Ethics (LPE: vii–xxx); Scholtz 1995.
Political and Social Philosophy
Faull 1995; Forster 2013 (mainly focuses on Humboldt’s model of the university, but also contains some discussion of Schleiermacher’s Occasional Thoughts on Universities in a German Spirit); Guenther-Gleason 1997. Also helpful are M. Winkler and J. Brachmann’s introduction and commentary to Texte zur Pädagogik. Kommentierte Studienausgabe (TP).
Philosophy of Religion
Brandt  1968; Lamm 1996; Niebuhr 1964. Also helpful is Richard Crouter’s introduction to On Religion: Speeches to Its Cultured Despisers (OR: xi–xxxix).
There are two main German editions of Schleiermacher’s works:
- [SW] Gesamtausgabe der Werke Schleiermachers in drei Abteilungen = Friedrich Schleiermacher’s sämmtliche Werke, Berlin: G. Reimer, 1835–62.
- [KGA] Kritische Gesamtausgabe, Hans-Joachim Birkner et al. (eds.), Berlin/New York: de Gruyter, 1980–. (This edition should eventually supersede the former one, but it is still far from complete.)
The following are the locations in KGA for some of the less well known pieces referred to in this article (listed in the order in which they were mentioned in the article): Spinozism (KGA I.1, 513–557); Brief Presentation of the Spinozistic System (KGA I.1, 563–582); Idea for a Catechism of Reason for Noble Ladies (KGA, I.2, xxxviii, 153-154); Letters on the Occasion of the Political-Theological Task and the Open Letter of Jewish Householders (KGA I.2, lxxviii–lxxxv, 327–361); Outlines of a Critique of Previous Ethical Theory (KGA I.4, 27–357); Confidential Letters Concerning Friedrich Schlegel’s Lucinde (KGA I.3, xlviii–lxviii, 139–216); 1831 address on Leibniz’s idea of a universal language (KGA I.11, 707–717).
In addition, the following editions are especially useful for philosophers:
- [H] Friedrich Schleiermacher: Hermeneutik, Heinz Kimmerle (ed.), 1959; second, revised edition, Heidelberg: Heidelberger Akademie der Wissenschaften, 1974.
- [HK] Friedrich Schleiermacher: Hermeneutik und Kritik, Manfred Frank (ed.), 1972; seventh edition, Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp, 1999.
- [D] Friedrich Schleiermacher: Dialektik, Manfred Frank (ed.), 2 vols., Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp, 2001.
- [TP] Friedrich Schleiermacher: Texte zur Pädagogik. Kommentierte Studienausgabe, 2 vols., Michael Winkler and Jens Brachmann (eds.), Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp, 2000. (Includes a version of Occasional Thoughts on Universities in a German Spirit .)
- Psychologie, G. Leopold (ed.), 1862, Berlin: Georg Reimer.
- Platons Werke (translations of Plato’s dialogues by Schleiermacher), 1804–1828. Berlin: Realschulbuchhandlung.
- Brouillon zur Ethik (1805/06), (Draft of an Ethics), Hans-Joachim Birkner (ed.), Hamburg: Meiner, 1981.
A further useful resource is:
- Aus Schleiermachers Leben in Briefen, 4 vols., Ludwig Jonas and Wilhelm Dilthey (eds.), Berlin: Georg Reimer, 1858–1863.
- [HHM] Hermeneutics: The Handwritten Manuscripts, James Duke and Jack Forstman (trans.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1978; Atlanta: Scholars Press, 1986. (This is a translation of H.)
- [HC] Hermeneutics and Criticism, Andrew Bowie (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998. (This is a translation of HK.)
- [DM] “On the Different Methods of Translation” (1813), André Lefevere (trans.), in German Romantic Criticism, A. Leslie Willson (ed.), New York: Continuum, 1982. (This is a good translation of Schleiermacher’s essay though unfortunately it omits an important footnote on the translation of verse.)
- Introductions to the Dialogues of Plato, William Dobson (trans.), Cambridge and London: Pitt Press, Deighton, and Parker, 1836.
- Dialectic or The Art of Doing Philosophy, Terrence N. Tice (ed.), Atlanta, GA: Scholars Press, 1996. (This contains Schleiermacher’s first lecture notes on dialectics from 1811.)
- [SC] Friedrich Schleiermacher’s “Toward a Theory of Sociable Conduct” and Essays on Its Intellectual-Cultural Context, Ruth D. Richardson (ed.), Lewiston, NY: Edwin Mellen, 1995.
- On the Highest Good (Ueber das höchste Gut), H. Victor Froese (ed.), Lewiston, NY: Edwin Mellen, 1992.
- On What Gives Value to Life (Über den Wert des Lebens), Edwina G. Lawler and Terrence N. Tice (eds.), Lewiston, NY: Edwin Mellen, 1995.
- On Freedom (Über die Freiheit), Albert L. Blackwell (ed.), Lewiston, NY: Edwin Mellen, 1992.
- Schleiermacher’s Soliloquies: an English translation of the Monologen, Horace L. Friess (ed.), Chicago: Open Court, 1926.
- [LPE] Lectures on Philosophical Ethics, Robert B. Louden (ed.) and Louise Adey Huish (trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002.
- Occasional Thoughts on Universities in a German Spirit, T.N. Tice and E. Lawler (trans.), Lewiston: Edwin Mellen, 1991.
- [OR] On Religion: Speeches to Its Cultured Despisers, Richard Crouter (trans. & ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1988.
- Christmas Eve: Dialogue on the Incarnation (Die Weihnachtsfeier; ein Gespräch), Terrence N. Tice (ed.), San Francisco: Edwin Mellen, 1990.
- The Life of Jesus (Das Leben Jesu), Jack C. Verheyden (ed.) and S. Maclean Gilmour (trans.), Philadelphia: Fortress, 1975.
- The Christian Faith (Der Christliche Glaube), H.R. Mackintosh and J.S. Stewart (eds.), Edinburgh: T. and T. Clark, 1928.
- On the “Glaubenslehre”, James Duke and Francis Fiorenza (eds.), Chico, CA: Scholars Press, 1981. (This is a translation of Schleiermacher’s two open letters to Lücke from 1829.)
- Schleiermacher on Workings of the Knowing Mind, Ruth Drucilla Richardson (ed.), Lewiston, NY: Edwin Mellen, 1998. (This volume includes a translation of Schleiermacher’s 1799 review of Kant’s Anthropology.)
- “Idea for a catechism of reason for noble ladies” (1798), in LF Fragment 364: 220–221. Original German “Idee zu einem Katechismus der Vernunft für edle Frauen” published in the Athenaeum 1798, available in KGA I.2, xxxviii, 153–4.
Primary Works by Others
- Boeckh, August, 1877, Enzyklopädie und Methodologie der philologischen Wissenschaften (Encyclopedia and Methodology of the Philological Sciences), originally delivered as lectures 1809–66, published Leipzig: Teubner.
- Brandis, Christian August, 1815, Von dem Begriff der Geschichte der Philosophie (On the Concept of History of Philosophy), inaugural dissertation, Copenhagen: Bonnier.
- –––, 1835–66, Handbuch der Geschichte der Griechisch-Römischen Philosophie (Handbook of the History of Greek-Roman Philosophy), 3 volumes in 6 parts, Berlin: G. Reimer.
- Hamann, Johann Georg, 1784, Metacritique, in Hamann: Writings on Philosophy and Language, (2007), trans. Kenneth Haynes, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Herder, Johann Gottfried, [S] Johann Gottfried Herder Sämtliche Werke, B. Suphan et al. (eds.), Berlin: Weidmann, 1877–.
- ––––, [G] Johann Gottfried Herder Werke, U. Gaier et al. (eds.), Frankfurt am Main: Deutscher Klassiker Verlag, 1985–.
- ––––, [HPW] J.G. Herder: Philosophical Writings, Michael N. Forster (trans. & ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002.
- –––, 1767–8, Fragments on Recent German Literature (excerpts on language), HPW 33–64. (Full text available in G.)
- –––, 1768, On Thomas Abbt’s Writings, HPW 167–177.
- –––, 1769, Critical Forests, bks. 1 and 4, in Selected Writings on Aesthetics, Gregory Moore (ed.), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 2006. (Bks. 2 and 3 have not yet been translated and are only available in S.)
- –––, 1772, Treatise on the Origin of Language, HPW 65–164.
- –––, 1774, This Too a Philosophy of History, HPW 272–358.
- –––, 1774 and 1778/9, Volkslieder (Popular Songs), available in G.
- –––, 1778, On the Cognition and Sensation of the Human Soul, HPW 187–244.
- –––, 1784–91, Ideas for the Philosophy of History of Humanity, translated under the title Outlines of a Philosophy of the History of Man, T. Churchill (ed.), London: J. Johnson/L. Hansard, 1803.
- –––, 1787, God: Some Conversations, Frederick H. Burkhardt (ed.), New York: Veritas Press, 1940. Reprinted Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill, 1962.
- –––, 1796, On the Savior of Mankind according to our First Three Gospels, available in S and G.
- –––, 1797, On God’s Son, the World’s Savior, according to John’s Gospel, available in S.
- Jacobi, Friedrich, 1785, Über die Lehre des Spinoza in Briefen an Herrn Moses Mendelssohn (On the Doctrine of Spinoza in Letters to Mr. Moses Mendelssohn), Breslau: Löwe.
- Kant, Immanuel, [1781/7] , Critique of Pure Reason, Norman Kemp Smith (trans.), London: Macmillan, 1929.
- Luther, Martin, 1530, Sendbrief vom Dolmetschen (Letter on Translation), Stuttgart: Reclam, 1928.
- Montaigne, Michel de, 1580, “Apologie de Raimond de Sebonde” (“Apology for Raymond Sebond”), in his Les Essais, Paris: Gallimard, 2007.
- Ritter, Heinrich, 1817, Ueber die Bildung des Philosophen durch die Geschichte der Philosophie (On the Education of the Philosopher through History of Philosophy), in his Welchen Einfluß hat die Philosophie des Cartesius auf die Ausbildung der des Spinozas gehabt, und welche Berührungspunkte haben beide Philosophien mit einander gemein? Nebst einer Zugabe: Ueber die Bildung des Philosophen durch die Geschichte der Philosophie, Leipzig: Brockhaus.
- –––, 1829–53, Geschichte der Philosophie (History of Philosophy), 12 volumes, Hamburg: F. Perthes.
- Schlegel, Friedrich, [KFSA] Kritische Friedrich Schlegel Ausgabe, E. Behler et al. (eds.), Munich: F. Schöningh, 1958–.
- –––, [PJ] Friedrich Schlegel 1794–1802. Seine prosaischen Jugendschriften, J. Minor (ed.), Vienna: Carl Konegen,1882.
- –––,1797, Philosophie der Philologie (Philosophy of Philology), in “Friedrich Schlegels ‘Philosophie der Philologie’ mit einer Einleitung herausgegeben von Josef Körner”, Logos 17 (1928).
- –––, 1798, “Athenaeum Fragments”, translated in LF.
- –––, 1798, “On Goethe’s Meister”, in PJ.
- –––, 1799, Lucinde, translated in LF: 41–140.
- –––,  1849, On the Language and Wisdom of the Indians (Über die Sprache und Weisheit der Indier), in The Aesthetic and Miscellaneous Works of Friedrich von Schlegel, E. Millington (trans.), London: H. G. Bohn.
- –––, [LF] Lucinde and the Fragments, P. Firchow (trans.), Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1999.
- Strauss, David Friedrich, 1835–6, Das Leben Jesu, kritisch bearbeitet (The Life of Jesus Critically Examined), Tübingen: C.F. Osiander.
- Berman, Antoine, 1984, L’Épreuve de l’étranger: Culture et traduction dans l’Allemagne romantique, Paris: Gallimard.
- Berman, Antoine and Christian Berner (trans. & eds.), 1999, Des différentes méthodes du traduire et autre texte, by Friedrich Schleiermacher, Paris: Seuil.
- Berner, Christian, 1995, La philosophie de Schleiermacher, Paris: Editions du Cerf.
- Bowie, Andrew, 1997, From Romanticism to Critical Theory: The Philosophy of German Literary Theory, London: Routledge.
- Brandt, Richard B.,  1968, The Philosophy of Schleiermacher: The Development of His Theory of Scientific and Religious Knowledge, New York: Greenwood.
- Bréhier, Émile,  1963, “The Formation of Our History of Philosophy”, in Philosophy and History: Essays Presented to Ernst Cassirer, Raymond Klibansky and H.J. Paton (eds.), New York: Peter Smith / Harper Torchbooks.
- Burdorf, Dieter and Reinhold Schmücker (eds.), 1998, Dialogische Wissenschaft, Paderborn: F. Schöningh.
- Cercel, Larisa and Adriana Serban (eds.), 2015, Friedrich Schleiermacher and the Question of Translation, 1813–2013, Berlin: de Gruyter, 2015.
- Coseriu, Eugenio, 2015, Von Herder bis Humboldt, (Geschichte der Sprachphilosophie, vol. 2), Tübingen: Narr Franck Attempto.
- Dilthey, Wilhelm,  1985, “Schleiermacher’s Hermeneutical System in Relation to Earlier Protestant Hermeneutics”, in HSH: 33–228.
- –––,  1966–1970, Leben Schleiermachers, 2 vols., Martin Redeker (ed.), Berlin: de Gruyter.
- –––,  1985, “The Rise of Hermeneutics”, in HSH: 235–260.
- –––, [HSH] Hermeneutics and the Study of History (Selected Works, vol. 4), Rudolf A. Makkreel and Frithjof Rodi (eds.), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1985.
- Faull, Katherine M., 1995, “Beyond Confrontation? The Early Schleiermacher and Feminist Moral Theory”, in SC: 41–65.
- Forster, Michael N., 2010a, After Herder: Philosophy of Language in the German Tradition, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- –––, 2010b, “Schleiermacher’s Hermeneutics: Some Problems and Solutions”, in his 2010a: 362–390.
- –––, 2010c, “Herder, Schleiermacher, and the Birth of Foreignizing Translation”, in his 2010a: 391–468.
- –––, 2011a, German Philosophy of Language: From Schlegel to Hegel and Beyond, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:osobl/9780199604814.001.0001
- –––, 2011b, “Philosophy of Language in the Nineteenth Century”, in his 2011a: 253–285.
- –––, 2011c, “Hermeneutics”, in his 2011a: 286–332.
- –––, 2012, “The History of Philosophy”, in The Cambridge History of Philosophy in the Nineteenth Century (1790–1870), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pages 263–292. doi:10.1017/CHO9780511975257.015
- –––, 2013, “Humboldts Bildungsideal und sein Modell der Universität”, in Michael Dreyer, Michael N. Forster, Kai-Uwe Hoffmann, and Klaus Vieweg (eds.), Die Bildung der Moderne, Francke Verlag: Marburg.
- –––, 2014, “Romanticism and Language”, in Dalia Nassar (ed.), The Relevance of Romanticism, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pages 68–86. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199976201.003.0005
- –––, 2015, “Eine Revolution in der Philosophie der Sprache, der Linguistik, der Hermeneutik und der Übersetzungstheorie im späten 18. und frühen 19. Jahrhundert: deutsche und französische Beiträge”, in Cercel and Serban 2015, pages 23–40.
- Frank, Manfred, 1985, Das individuelle Allgemeine: Textstrukturierung und -interpretation nach Schleiermacher, Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp.
- –––, 1990, Das Sagbare und das Unsagbare: Studien zur deutsch-französischen Hermeneutik und Texttheorie, Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp.
- Gadamer, Hans-Georg,  2002, Truth and Method, New York: Continuum.
- Geldsetzer, Lutz, 1968, Die Philosophie der Philosophiegeschichte im 19. Jahrhundert—Zur Wissenschaftstheorie der Philosophiegeschichtsschreibung und -betrachtung, Meisenheim am Glan: Hain.
- Gipper, Helmut and Peter Schmitter, 1979, Sprachwissenschaft und Sprachphilosophie im Zeitalter der Romantik, Tübingen: Gunter Narr.
- Guenther-Gleason, Patricia E., 1997, On Schleiermacher and Gender Politics, Harrisburg, PA: Trinity Press International.
- Gueroult, Martial, 1984–, Histoire de l’histoire de la philosophie, vol. 2, Paris: Aubier.
- Haym, Rudolf, 1870, Die Romantische Schule: Ein Beitrag zur Geschichte des deutschen Geistes, Berlin: Gaertner. Fourth edition, Berlin: Weidmann, 1920.
- Hirsch, Eric Donald Jr., 1967, Validity in Interpretation, New Haven and London: Yale University Press.
- Huyssen, Andreas, 1969, Die frühromantische Konzeption von Übersetzung und Aneignung, Zürich and Freiburg: Atlantis.
- Kaulbach, Friedrich, 1968, “Schleiermachers Idee der Dialektik”, Neue Zeitschrift für systematische Theologie und Religionsphilosophie, 10(3): 225–260. doi:10.1515/nzst.19126.96.36.199
- Kimmerle, Heinz, 1957, Die Hermeneutik Schleiermachers im Zusammenhang seines spekulativen Denkens, dissertation, Heidelberg.
- Lamm, Julia A., 1996, The Living God: Schleiermacher’s Theological Appropriation of Spinoza, University Park, PA: Pennsylvania State University Press.
- Lehnerer, Thomas, 1987, Die Kunsttheorie Friedrich Schleiermachers, Stuttgart: Klett-Cotta.
- Mariña, Jacqueline (ed.), 2005, The Cambridge Companion to Schleiermacher, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CCOL0521814480
- Niebuhr, Richard R., 1964, Schleiermacher on Christ and Religion, New York: Scribner.
- Odebrecht, Rudolf, 1932, Schleiermachers System der Ästhetik, Berlin: Junker und Dünnhaupt.
- Palmer, Richard E., 1969, Hermeneutics: Interpretation Theory in Schleiermacher, Dilthey, Heidegger, and Gadamer, Evanston, IL: Northwestern University Press.
- Patsch, Hermann, 1966, “Friedrich Schlegels »Philosophie der Philologie« und Schleiermachers frühe Entwürfe zur Hermeneutik”, in Zeitschrift für Theologie und Kirche, 63(4): 434–472.
- Redeker, Martin, 1973, Schleiermacher: Life and Thought, Philadelphia: Fortress.
- Ricoeur, Paul, 1973, “The Task of Hermeneutics”, Philosophy Today, 17(2): 112–128. doi:10.5840/philtoday197317232
- –––, 1977, “Schleiermacher’s Hermeneutics”, The Monist, 60(2): 181–197. doi:10.5840/monist19776025
- Scholtz, Gunter, 1984, Die Philosophie Schleiermachers, Darmstadt: Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft.
- –––, 1995, Ethik und Hermeneutik: Schleiermachers Grundlegung der Geisteswissenschaften, Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp.
- Sigwart, Christoph von, 1857, Schleiermachers psychologische Voraussetzungen, insbesondere die Begriffe des Gefühls und der Individualität, in Jahrbücher für deutsche Theologie: 829–864. Reprinted Darmstadt: Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft 1974.
- Szondi, Peter, 1970, “L’herméneutique de Schleiermacher”, Poétique, 2: 141–155. Published in English, 1986, “Schleiermacher’s Hermeneutics Today”, in his On Textual Understanding and Other Essays (Theory and History of Literature 15), Harvey Mendelsohn (trans.), Manchester: Manchester University Press, 95–114.
- Thomas, François, 2015, L’art de traduire: enjeux philosophiques, éthiques et politiques de la traduction, à partir de la critique formulée par les Romantiques allemands à l’encontre des traductions françaises, doctoral dissertation, Université de Lille 3.
- Venuti, Lawrence, 1995, The Translator’s Invisibility: A History of Translation, London: Routledge.
- Wach, Joachim, 1926–1933, Das Verstehen. Grundzüge einer Geschichte der hermeneutischen Theorie im 19. Jahrhundert; reprinted Hildesheim: Georg Olms, 1966.
- Wagner, Falk, 1974, Schleiermachers Dialektik. Eine kritische Interpretation, Gütersloh.
- Wehrung, Georg, 1920, Die Dialektik Schleiermachers, Tübingen: J.C.B. Mohr.
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