Despite its linguistic roots in ancient Greek, the concept of empathy is of recent intellectual heritage. Yet its history has been varied and colorful, a fact that is also mirrored in the multiplicity of definitions associated with the empathy concept in a number of different scientific and non-scientific discourses. In its philosophical heyday at the turn of the 19th to the 20th century, empathy had been hailed as the primary means for gaining knowledge of other minds and as the method uniquely suited for the human sciences, only to be almost entirely neglected philosophically for the rest of the century. Only recently have philosophers become again interested in empathy in light of the debate about our folk psychological mindreading capacities. In the second half of the last century, the task of addressing empathy was mainly left to psychologists who thematized it as a psychological phenomenon and process to be studied by the method of the empirical sciences. Particularly, it has been studied by social psychologists as a phenomenon assumed to be causally involved in creating prosocial attitudes and behavior. Nevertheless, within psychology it is at times difficult to find agreement of how exactly one should understand empathy; a fact of which psychologists themselves have become increasingly aware. The purpose of this entry is to clarify the empathy concept by surveying its history in various philosophical and psychological discussions and by indicating why empathy was and should be regarded to be of such central importance in understanding human agency in ordinary contexts, in the human sciences and for the constitution of ourselves as social and moral agents.
- 1. Historical Introduction
- 2. Empathy and the Philosophical Problem of Other Minds
- 3. Empathy as the Unique Method of the Human Sciences
- 4. Empathy as a Topic of Scientific Exploration in Psychology
- 5. Empathy and Moral Psychology
- 6. Conclusion
- Academic Tools
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- Related Entries
The psychologist Edward Titchener (1867–1927) introduced the term “empathy” in 1909 into the English language as the translation of the German term “Einfühlung” (or “feeling into”), a term that by the end of the 19th century was in German philosophical circles understood as an important category in philosophical aesthetics. Even in Germany its use as a technical term of philosophical analysis did not have a long tradition. Various philosophers certainly speak throughout the 19th century and the second half of the 18th century in a more informal manner about our ability to “feel into” works of arts and into nature. Particularly important here is the fact that romantic thinkers, such as Herder and Novalis, viewed our ability to feel into nature as a vital corrective against the modern scientific attitude of merely dissecting nature into its elements; instead of grasping its underlying spiritual reality through a process of poetic identification. But in using mainly the verbal form in referring to our ability to feel into various things they do not treat such an ability as a topic that is worthy of sustained philosophical reflection and analysis. Robert Vischer was the first to introduce the term “Einfühlung” in a more technical sense—and in using the substantive form he indicates that it is a worthy object of philosophical analysis—in his “On the Optical Sense of Form: A contribution to Aesthetics” (1873).
It was however Theodor Lipps (1851–1914) who scrutinized empathy in the most thorough manner. Most importantly, Lipps not only argued for empathy as a concept that is central for the philosophical and psychological analysis of our aesthetic experiences. His work transformed empathy from a concept of philosophical aesthetics into a central category of the philosophy of the social and human sciences. For him, empathy not only plays a role in our aesthetic appreciation of objects. It has also to be understood as being the primary basis for recognizing each other as minded creatures. Not surprisingly, it was Lipps's conception of empathy that Titchener had in mind in his translation of “Einfühlung” as “empathy.”
In order to appreciate the philosophical motivation for focusing on empathy one has to keep in mind the intellectual context within which an account of aesthetic perception took place at the end of the 19th century. According to the dominant (even though not universally accepted) positivistic and empiricist conception, sense data constitute the fundamental basis for our investigation of the world. Yet from a phenomenological perspective, our perceptual encounter with aesthetic objects and our appreciation of them as being beautiful—our admiration of a beautiful sunset, for example—seems to be as direct as our perception of an object as being red or square. By appealing to the psychological mechanisms of empathy, philosophers intended to provide an explanatory account of the phenomenological immediacy of our aesthetic appreciation of objects. Lipps conceives of empathy as a psychological resonance phenomenon that is triggered in our perceptual encounter with external objects. More specifically, these resonance phenomena are triggering inner “processes” that give rise to experiences similar to ones that I have when I engage in various activities involving the movement of my body. Since my attention is perceptually focused on the external object, I experience them—or I automatically project my experiences—as being in the object. If those experiences are in some way apprehended in a positive manner and as being in some sense life-affirming, I perceive the object as beautiful, otherwise as ugly. In the first case, Lipps speaks of positive; in the later of negative empathy. Lipps also characterizes our experience of beauty as “objectified self-enjoyment,” since we are impressed by the “vitality” and “life potentiality” that lies in the perceived object (Lipps 1906, 1903 a,b. For the contemporary discussion of empathy's role in aesthetics see particularly Breithaupt 2009; Coplan and Goldie 2011 (Part II); Curtis & Koch 2009; and Keen 2007).
In his Aesthetik, Lipps closely links our aesthetic perception and our perception of another embodied person as a minded creature. The nature of aesthetic empathy is always the “experience of another human” (1905, 49). We appreciate another object as beautiful because empathy allows us to see it in analogy to another human body. Similarly, we recognize another organism as a minded creature because of empathy. Empathy in this context is more specifically understood as a phenomenon of “inner imitation,” where my mind mirrors the mental activities or experiences of another person based on the observation of his bodily activities or facial expressions. Empathy is ultimately based on an innate disposition for motor mimicry, a fact that is well established in the psychological literature and was already noticed by Adam Smith (1853). Even though such a disposition is not always externally manifested, Lipps suggests that it is always present as an inner tendency giving rise to similar kinaesthetic sensations in the observer as felt by the observed target. In seeing the angry face of another person we instinctually have a tendency of imitating it and of “imitating” her anger in this manner. Since we are not aware of such tendencies, we see the anger in her face (Lipps 1907). Despite the fact that Lipps's primary examples of empathy focus on the recognition of emotions expressed in bodily gestures or facial expressions, his conception of empathy should not be understood as being limited to such cases. As his remarks about intellectual empathy suggest (1903b/05), he regards our recognition of all mental activities—insofar as they are activities requiring human effort—as being based on empathy or on inner imitation (See also the introductory chapter in Stueber 2006).
The above explication of empathy constitutes Lipps' core concept of empathy. In this respect one could rightfully call Lipps one of the first proponents of simulation theory (and proposing a position that is very similar to the version of simulation theory advocated currently by Goldman 2006). Unfortunately, in Lipps one finds also a much broader sense of empathy that is not compatible with the notion of empathy as a form of vicarious imitation. Lipps talks about a “universal apperceptive empathy” and a general “empathy of nature.” He even utilizes empathy in order to explain certain perceptual illusions. In these contexts, the term “empathy” refers to any mental activity on part of the observer that is triggered in the perceptual encounter with an external stimulus and that has to be understood as being constitutive for our comprehension of an object qua object. Here one should think of mental activities that are, for example, required to see a line as a line or mental activities that are necessary to grasp events within nature as being events in a causal nexus (Lipps 1912/13). Rightfully, this liberal employment of the term found no takers, since in its wider usage the concept of empathy loses all of its distinctiveness. Everything and nothing seems to have to do with empathy.
Lipps's core concept of empathy and his claim that empathy should be understood as the primary epistemic means for our perception of other persons as minded creatures were highly influential and were the focus of a considerable debate among philosophers at the beginning of the 20th century (Prandtl 1910, Stein 1917, Scheler 1973). Even philosophers who did not agree with Lipps's specific explication, found the concept of empathy appealing because his argument for empathy was closely tied to a thorough critique of what was widely seen at that time as the only alternative for conceiving of knowledge of other minds, that is, Mill's inference from analogy. This inference is best understood as describing the steps that enable us to attribute mental states to other persons based on the observation of their physical behavior and our direct experience of mental states from the first person perspective. Traditionally, the inference from analogy presupposes a Cartesian conception of the mind according to which access to our own mind is direct and infallible, whereas knowledge of other minds is indirect, inferential, and fallible. More formally one can characterize the inference from analogy as consisting of the following premises or steps.
i.) Another person X manifests behavior of type B. ii.) In my own case behavior of type B is caused by mental state of type M. iii.) Since my and X's outward behavior of type B is similar, it has to have similar inner mental causes. (It is thus assumed that I and the other persons are psychologically similar in the relevant sense.) Therefore: The other person's behavior (X's behavior) is caused by a mental state of type M.
Like Wittgenstein, but predating him considerably, Lipps argues in his 1907 article “Das Wissen von fremden Ichen” that the inference from analogy falls fundamentally short of solving the philosophical problem of other minds. Lipps does not argue against the inference from analogy because of its evidentially slim basis, but because it does not allow us to understand its basic presupposition that another person has a mind that is psychologically similar to our own mind. The inference from analogy thus cannot be understood as providing us with evidence for the claim that the other person has mental states like we do because within its Cartesian framework we are unable to conceive of other minds in the first place. For Lipps, analogical reasoning requires the contradictory undertaking of inferring another person's anger and sadness on the basis of my sadness and anger, yet to think of that sadness and anger simultaneously as something “absolutely different” from my anger and sadness. More generally, analogical inference is a contradictory undertaking because it entails “entertaining a completely new thought about an I, that however is not me, but something absolutely different” (Lipps 1907, 708, my translation).
Yet while Lipps diagnoses the problem of the inference of analogy within the context of a Cartesian conception of the mind quite succinctly, he fails to explain how empathy is able to provide us with an epistemically sanctioned understanding of other minds or why our “feeling into” the other person's mind is more than a mere projection. More importantly, Lipps does not sufficiently explain why empathy does not encounter similar problems to the ones diagnosed for the inference from analogy and how empathy allows us to conceive of other persons as having a mind similar to our own if we are directly acquainted only with our own mental states. The fundamental problem for Lipps's defense of empathy as primary method of knowing other minds consists in the fact that he still conceives of empathy within the context of a Cartesian conception of the mind tying our understanding of mental affairs and mental concepts essentially to the first person perspective (See Stueber 2006).
Wittgenstein's critique of the inference from analogy is in the end more penetrating because he recognizes that its problem depends on a Cartesian account of mental concepts. If my grasp of a mental concept is exclusively constituted by me experiencing something in a certain way, then it is impossible for me to conceive of how that very same concept can be applied to somebody else, given that I cannot experience somebody else's mental states. I therefore cannot conceive of how another person can be in the same mental state as I am because that would require that I can conceive of my mental state as something, which I do not experience. But according to the Cartesian conception this seems to be a conceptually impossible task. Moreover, if one holds on to a Cartesian conception of the mind, it is not clear how appealing to empathy, as conceived of by Lipps, should help us in conceiving of mental states as belonging to another mind.
Within the phenomenological tradition, the above shortcomings of Lipps's position of empathy were quite apparent (see for example Stein 1917, 24 and Scheler 1973, 236). Yet despite the fact that they did not accept Lipps's explication of empathy as being based on mechanisms of inner resonance and projection, authors within the phenomenological tradition of philosophy were persuaded by Lipps's critique of the inference from analogy. For that very reason, Husserl and Stein, for example, continued using the concept of empathy and regarded empathy as an irreducible “type of experiential act sui generis” (Stein 1917, 10), which allows us to view another person as being analogous to ourselves without this “analogizing apprehension” constituting an inference of analogy (Husserl 1963, 141). Scheler went probably the furthest in rejecting the Cartesian framework in thinking about the apprehension of other minds, while keeping committed to something like the concept of empathy. (In order to contrast his position from Lipps, Scheler however preferred to use the term “nachfühlen” rather than “einfühlen.”) For Scheler, the fundamental mistake of the debate about the apprehension of other minds consists in the fact that it does not take seriously certain phenomenological facts. Prima facie, we do not encounter merely the bodily movements of another person. Rather, we are directly recognizing specific mental states because they are characteristically expressed in states of the human body; in facial expressions, in gestures, in the tone of voice, and so on. (See Scheler 1973, particularly 232–258; For a succinct explication of the debate about empathy in the phenomenological tradition consult Zahavi 2010)
Nevertheless, philosophers in the phenomenological tradition never provided a philosophically comprehensive account of mental concepts that would allow us to see them as part of an intersubjectively accessible practice in which we interpret, predict, and explain the behavior of other agents. Certainly, a few of our mental concepts, particularly concepts of emotions, could be easily understood as being definable in light of the characteristic bodily expressions associated with specific mental states. But not all mental concepts can be defined in this manner, particularly the central folk psychological concepts of belief and desire. Besides an unfamiliarity with the phenomenological literature, the lack of a comprehensive account of mental concepts should be viewed as the main systematic reason of why the idea that empathy is the primary means of understanding other minds has never been taken seriously in the analytic tradition of philosophy until very recently and why the theory theory position has been so dominant in philosophical circles after the decline of behaviorism. (For further reasons to reject empathy as a primary means of understanding other minds see also section 3 of this entry.) Theory theorists conceive of our understanding of mental concepts as being constituted by an implicit grasp of their role in a folk psychological theory and its law-like psychological generalizations. They conceive of the attribution of mental states to other people as a theoretical inference. We infer the existence of mental states from behavioral evidence together with knowledge of theoretical principles that link the existence of mental states to such evidence in a complex fashion. In suggesting that attributing a mental state to another person is a theoretical inference based on the use of a theory and available evidence, theory theorists also propose an alternative to the traditional inference from analogy; an alternative that philosophers like Lipps or Scheler never even considered in their defense of empathy. Moreover, theory theorists are not without conceptual resources to account for the phenomenological fact that we seem to directly grasp another person's mental states by looking at his facial expressions. For them, such phenomenological directness in the apprehension of particular mental states can be explicated in terms of our familiarity with a folk psychological theory. (For a critical discussion see Stueber 2006).
2.1 Mirror Neurons, Simulation, and the Discussion of Empathy in the Contemporary Theory of Mind Debate
The idea that empathy— particularly empathy understood as inner imitation — is the primary epistemic means for understanding other minds has been revived in the 1980's by simulation theorists in the context of the interdisciplinary debate about folk psychology; an empirically informed debate about how best to describe the underlying causal mechanisms of our folk psychological abilities to interpret, explain, and predict other agents. (See Davies and Stone 1995). In contrast to theory theory, simulation theorists conceive of our ordinary mindreading abilities as an ego-centric method and as a “knowledge poor” strategy, where I do not utilize a folk psychological theory but use myself as a model for the other person's mental life. It is not the place here to discuss the contemporary debate extensively, but it has to be emphasized that contemporary simulation theorists vigorously discuss how to account for our grasp of mental concepts and whether simulation theory is committed to Cartesianism. Whereas Goldman (2002, 2006) links his version of simulation theory to a neo-Cartesian account of mental concepts, other simulation theorists develop versions of simulation theory that are not committed to a Cartesian conception of the mind. (Gordon 1995a, b, and 2000; Heal 2003; and Stueber 2006, 2012).
Moreover, neuroscientific findings according to which so called mirror neurons play an important role in recognizing another person's emotional states and in understanding the goal-directedness of his behavior have been understood as providing empirical evidence for Lipps' idea of empathy as inner imitation. With the help of the term “mirror neuron,” scientists refer to the fact that there is significant overlap between neural areas of excitation that underlie our observation of another person's action and areas that are stimulated when we execute the very same action. A similar overlap between neural areas of excitation has also been established for our recognition of another person's emotion based on his facial expression and our experiencing the emotion. (For a survey on mirror neurons see Gallese 2003a and b, Goldman 2006, chap. 6; Keysers 2011; Rizzolatti and Craighero 2004; and particularly Rizzolatti and Sinigaglia 2008). Since the face to face encounter between persons is the primary situation within which human beings recognize themselves as minded creatures and attribute mental states to others, the system of mirror neurons has been interpreted as playing a causally central role in establishing intersubjective relations between minded creatures. For that very reason, the neuroscientist Gallese thinks of mirror neurons as constituting what he calls the “shared manifold of intersubjectivity” (Gallese 2001, 44). Stueber (2006, chap. 4)—inspired by Lipps's conception of empathy as inner imitation—refers to mirror neurons as mechanisms of basic empathy; as mechanisms that allow us to apprehend directly another person's emotions in light of his facial expressions and that enable us to understand his bodily movements as goal-directed actions. The evidence from mirror neurons—and the fact that in perceiving other people we use very different neurobiological mechanisms than in the perception of physical objects—does suggest that in our primary perceptual encounter with the world we do not merely encounter physical objects. Rather, even on this basic level, we distinguish already between mere physical objects and objects that are more like us (See also Meltzoff and Brooks 2001). The mechanisms of basic empathy have to be seen as Nature's way of dissolving one of the principal assumptions of the traditional philosophical discussion about other minds shared by opposing positions such as Cartesianism and Behaviorism; that is, that we perceive other people primarily as physical objects and do not distinguish already on the perceptual level between physical objects like trees and minded creatures like ourselves. Mechanisms of basic empathy might therefore be interpreted as providing us with a perceptual basis for developing an intersubjectively accessible folk psychological framework that is applicable to the subject and observed other (Stueber 2006, 142–45. It needs to be acknowledged however that this interpretation of mirror neurons crucially depends on the assumption that the primary function of mirror neurons consists in providing us with a cognitive grasp of another person's actions and emotions; an assumption that has met with some criticism more recently from researchers inside and outside of the neuroscientific community. For the debate about mirror neurons see particularly Allen 2010, Borg 2007, Csibra 2009, Debes 2010, Goldman 2009, Hickok 2008, Iacoboni 2011, Jacob 2008, and Stueber 2012a)
Yet it should be noted that everyday mindreading is not restricted to the realm of basic empathy. Ordinarily we not only recognize that other persons are afraid or that they are reaching for a particular object. We understand their behavior in more complex social contexts in terms of their reasons for acting using the full range of psychological concepts including the concepts of belief and desire. Evidence from neuroscience shows that these mentalizing tasks involve very different neuronal areas such as the medial prefrontal cortex, temporoparietal cortex, and the cingulate cortex. (For a survey see Kain and Perner 2003; and Frith and Frith 2003). Low level mindreading in the realm of basic empathy has therefore to be distinguished from higher levels of mindreading (Goldman 2006). It is clear that low level forms of understanding other persons have to be conceived of as being relatively knowledge poor as they do not involve a psychological theory or complex psychological concepts. How exactly one should conceive of high level mindreading abilities, whether they involve primarily knowledge poor simulation strategies or knowledge rich inferences is controversially debated within the contemporary debate about our folk psychological mindreading abilities(See Davies and Stone 1995, Gopnik and Meltzoff 1997, Gordon 1995, Currie and Ravenscroft 2002, Heal 2003, Nichols and Stich 2003, Goldman 2006, and Stueber 2006). Simulation theorists, however, insist that even more complex forms of understanding other agents involve resonance phenomena that engage our cognitively intricate capacities of imaginatively adopting the perspective of another person and reenacting or recreating their thought processes (For various forms of perspective-taking see Coplan 2011 and Goldie 2000). Accordingly, simulation theorists distinguish between different types of empathy such as between basic and reenactive empathy (Stueber 2006) or between mirroring and reconstructive empathy (Goldman 2011). Interestingly, the debate about how to conceive of these more complex forms of mindreading resonates with the traditional debate about whether empathy is the unique method of the human sciences and whether or not one has to strictly distinguish between the methods of the human and the natural sciences. Equally noteworthy is the fact that in the contemporary theory of mind debate voices have grown louder that, in light of insights from the phenomenological and hermeneutic traditions in philosophy, assert that the contemporary theory of mind debate fundamentally misconceives of the nature of social cognition. They claim that on the most basic level empathy should not be conceived of as a resonance phenomenon but as a type of direct perception. (See particularly Zahavi 2010; Zahavi and Overgaard 2012, but Jacob 2011 for a response). More complex forms of social cognition are also not to be understood as being based on either theory or empathy/simulation, rather they are better best conceived of as the ability to directly fit observed units of actions into larger narrative or cultural frameworks (See Gallagher 2012, Gallagher and Hutto 2008, Hutto 2008, and Seemann 2011, but Stueber 2011 and 2012a for a defense of empathy. For skepticism about empathic perspective-taking understood as a complete identification with the perspective of the other person see also Goldie 2011). Regardless of how one views this specific debate it should be clear that ideas about mindreading developed originally by proponents of empathy at the beginning of the 20th century can no longer be easily dismissed and have to be taken seriously.
At the beginning of the 20th century, empathy understood as a non-inferential and non-theoretical method of grasping the content of other minds became closely associated with the concept of understanding (Verstehen); a concept that was championed by the hermeneutic tradition of philosophy concerned with explicating the methods used in grasping the meaning and significance of texts, works of arts, and actions. (For a survey of this tradition see Grondin 1994). Hermeneutic thinkers insisted that the method used in understanding the significance of a text or a historical event has to be fundamentally distinguished from the method used in explaining an event within the context of the natural sciences. This methodological dualism is famously expressed by Droysen in saying that “historical research does not want to explain; that is, derive in a form of an inferential argument, rather it wants to understand” (Droysen 1977, 403), and similarly in Dilthey's dictum that “we explain nature, but understand the life of the soul” (Dilthey 1961, vol. 5, 144). Yet Droysen and authors before him never conceived of understanding solely as an act of mental imitation or solely as an act of imaginatively “transporting” oneself into the point of view of another person. Such “psychological interpretation” as Schleiermacher (1998) used to call it, was conceived of as constituting only one aspect of the interpretive method used by historians. Other tasks mentioned in this context involved critically evaluating the reliability of historical sources, getting to know the linguistic conventions of a language, and integrating the various elements derived from historical sources into a consistent narrative of a particular epoch. The differences between these various aspects of the interpretive procedure were however downplayed in the early Dilthey. For him, grasping the significance of any cultural fact had to be understood as a mental act of “transposition.” Understanding the meaning of a text, an action, or work of art requires us to relate it to the primary realm of significance; that is, our own mental life accessible through introspection. (See for example Dilthey 1961, vol. 5, 263–265). Even though Dilthey himself never used the empathy terminology, his position certainly facilitated thinking about understanding as a form of empathy. No wonder then, that at this time the concepts of empathy and understanding were used almost interchangeably in order to delineate a supposed methodological distinction between the natural and the human sciences. (See Stueber 2006 for a more extensive discussion).
Ironically, the identification of empathy and understanding and the associated claim that empathy is the sole and unique method of the human sciences also facilitated the decline of the empathy concept and its almost utter disregard by philosophers of the human and social sciences later on, in both the analytic and continental/hermeneutic traditions of philosophy. Within both traditions, proponents of empathy were—for very different reasons—generally seen as advocating an epistemically naïve and insufficiently broad conception of the methodological proceedings in the human sciences. As a result, most philosophers of the human and social sciences maintained their distance from the idea that empathy is central for our understanding of other minds and mental phenomena. Notable exceptions in this respect are R.G. Collingwood and his followers, who suggested that reenacting another person's thoughts is necessary for understanding them as rational agents (Collingwood 1946, Dray 1957 and 1995). Notice however that in contrast to the contemporary debate about folk psychology, the debate about empathy in the philosophy of social science is not concerned with investigating underlying causal mechanisms. Rather, it addresses normative questions of how to justify a particular explanation or interpretation.
Philosophers arguing for a hermeneutic conception of the human and social sciences insist on a strict methodological division between the human and the natural sciences. Yet they nowadays favor the concept of understanding (Verstehen) and reject the earlier identification of understanding and empathy for two specific reasons. First, empathy is no longer seen as the unique method of the human sciences because facts of significance, which a historian or an interpreter of literary and non-literary texts are interested in, do not solely depend on facts within the individual mind. Within the philosophy of history, for example, it has become the established consensus that a historian is not and should not be bound by the agent's perspective in telling the story about a particular historical event or a particular period that he is interested in. Historians necessarily surpass the conceptual categories of the agent, since the significance of historical events is constituted not only by an agent's intentions but by their long range and at times unintended consequences (Danto 1965). Similarly, philosophers such as Hans Georg Gadamer, have argued that the significance of a text is not tied to the author's intentions in writing the text. In reading a text by Shakespeare or Plato we are not primarily interested in finding out what Plato or Shakespeare said but what these texts themselves say. Moreover, like the significance of any historical event, the significance of a literary text is dependent on its effect on subsequent generations and its meaning supervenes on its own interpretive history. (Gadamer 1989; for a critical discussion see Skinner (in Tully 1988); “Introduction” in Kögler and Stueber 2000; and Stueber 2002).
The above considerations, however, do not justify the claim that empathy has no role to play within the context of the human sciences. It justifies merely the claim that empathy cannot be their only method, at least as long as one admits that recognizing the thoughts of individual agents has to play some role in the interpretive project of the human sciences. Accordingly, a second reason against empathy is also emphasized. Conceiving of understanding other agents as being based on empathy is seen as an epistemically extremely naïve conception of the interpretation of individual agents, since it seems to conceive of understanding as a mysterious meeting of two individual minds outside of any cultural context. Philosophers, influenced by considerations of Heidegger and also the later Wittgenstein, have started to think of individual agents as socially and culturally embedded creatures and have started to conceive of the mind of individual agents as being socially constituted. Understanding other agents thus presupposes an understanding of the cultural context within which an agent functions. Moreover, in the interpretive situation of the human sciences, the cultural background of the interpreter and the person, who has to be interpreted, can be very different. In that case, I can not very easily put myself in the shoes of the other person and imitate his thoughts in my mind. If understanding medieval knights, to use an example of Winch (1958), requires me to think exactly as the medieval knight did, then it is not clear how such a task can be accomplished from an interpretive perspective constituted by very different cultural presuppositions. Making sense of other minds has, therefore, to be seen as an activity that is a culturally mediated one; a fact that empathy theorists according to this line of critique do not sufficiently take into account when they conceive of understanding other agents as a direct meeting of minds that is independent of and unaided by information about how these agents are embedded in a broader social environment. (See Stueber 2006, chap.6, Zahavi 2001, 2005; for the later Dilthey see Makreel 2000. For a critical discussion of whether the concept of understanding without recourse to empathy is useful for marking an epistemic distinction between the human and natural sciences consult also Stueber 2012b).
Philosophers, who reject the methodological dualism between the human and the natural sciences as argued for in the hermeneutic context, are commonly referred to as naturalists in the philosophy of social science. They deny that the distinction between understanding and explanation points to an important methodological difference. Even in the human or social sciences, the main point of the scientific endeavor is to provide epistemically justified explanations (and predictions) of observed or recorded events (see also Henderson 1993). At most, empathy is granted a heuristic role in the context of discovery. It however can not play any role within the context of justification. As particularly Hempel (1965) has argued, to explain an event involves—at least implicitly—an appeal to law-like regularities providing us with reasons for expecting that an event of a certain kind will occur under specific circumstances. Empathy might allow me to recognize that I would have acted in the same manner as somebody else. Yet it does not epistemically sanction the claim that anybody of a particular type or anybody who is in that type of situation will act in this manner.
Hempel's argument against empathy has certainly not gone unchallenged. Within the philosophy of history, Dray (1957), following Collingwood, has argued that empathy plays an epistemically irreducible role, since we explain actions in terms of an agent's reasons. For him, such reason explanations do not appeal to empirical generalizations but to normative principles of actions outlining how a person should act in a particular situation. More recently, similar arguments have been articulated by Jaegwon Kim (1984, 1998). Yet as Stueber (2006, chap. 5) argues such a response to Hempel would require us to implausibly conceive of reason explanations as being very different from ordinary causal explanations. It would imply that our notions of explanation and causation are ambiguous concepts. Reasons that cause agents to act in the physical world would be conceived of as causes in a very different sense than ordinary physical causes. Moreover, as Hempel himself suggests, appealing to normative principles explains at most why a person should have acted in a certain manner. It does not explain why he ultimately acted in that way. Consequently, Hempel's objection against empathy retain their force as long as one maintains that reason explanations are a form of ordinary causal explanations and as long as one conceives of the epistemic justification of such explanations as implicitly appealing to some empirical generalizations.
Despite these concessions to Hempel, Stueber suggests that empathy (specifically reenactive empathy) has to be acknowledged as playing a central role even in the context of justification. For him, folk psychological explanations have to be understood as being tied to the domain of rational agency. In contrast to explanations in terms of mere inner causes, folk psychological explanations retain their explanatory force only as long as agents' beliefs and desires can also be understood as reasons for their actions. The epistemic justification of such folk psychological explanations implicitly relies on generalizations involving folk psychological notions such as belief and desire. Yet the existence of such generalizations alone does not establish specific beliefs and desires as reasons for a person's actions. Elaborating on considerations by Heal (2003) and Collingwood (1946), Stueber suggests that recognizing beliefs and desires as reasons requires the interpreter to be sensitive to an agent's other relevant beliefs and desires. Individual thoughts function as reasons for rational agency only relative to a specific framework of an agent's thoughts that are relevant for consideration in a specific situation. Most plausibly—given our persistent inability to solve the frame problem—recognizing which of another agent's thoughts are relevant in specific contexts requires the practical ability of reenacting another person's thoughts in one's own mind. Empathy's central epistemic role has to be admitted, since beliefs and desires can be understood only in this manner as an agent's reasons. (See Stueber 2002, 2003 and 2006, chaps. 4 and 5). For similar reasons, Stueber (2006, chap. 6) argues that, while the above objections to empathy from hermeneutic philosophers limit the scope of empathy within the social sciences, they do not imply that empathy has no role to play in our understanding of individual agency. Accordingly, the fact that we at times experience imaginagive resistance in our attempt to understand others should be understood as indirectly confirming the thesis that empathy is the implicit default method for understanding individual agency that at times however needs to be supplemented by various theoretical and narrative strategies (For a discussion see Henderson and Horgan 2000, Henderson 2011, and Stueber 2008, 2011a). Within the context of anthropology, Hollan and Throop argue that empathy is best understood as a dynamic, culturally situated, temporally extended, and dialogical process actively involving not only the interpreter but also his or her interpretee (Hollan 20012; Hollan and Throop 2008, 2001; Throop 2010).
The discussion of empathy within psychology has been largely unaffected by the critical discussion and negative view of empathy that became prevalent in mainstream philosophical circles until the 1980's. Rather, psychologists were more influenced by the positive evaluation of empathy by philosophers from the beginning of the century. Empathy related phenomena were in general understood as playing an important role in interpersonal understanding and as causal factors motivating humans to act in a prosocial manner. Indeed by the time philosophers were ready to retire the empathy concept, psychologists tried to investigate empathy in an experimentally rigorous manner. Throughout the early 20th century, but particularly since the late 1940's, empathy has been an intensively studied topic of psychological research.
As psychologists themselves have become increasingly aware, the empirical investigation of empathy has been hindered (particularly in the beginning) by conceptual confusions and a multiplicity of definitions of the empathy concept. (See for example Davis 1994; Eisenberg and Strayer 1987; and Batson 2009). Within social psychology, this state of affairs is due to the fact that the empathy concept merged with and completely replaced the multi-dimensional concept of sympathy used by earlier psychologists and philosophers (Wispe 1986, 1987, and particularly 1991). Whereas the emphasis in the philosophical discussion—outside the context of aesthetics—lay on empathy's cognitive role in providing us with knowledge of other minds, the concept of sympathy was primarily situated within the context of moral psychology and moral philosophy. In the works of David Hume and Adam Smith, sympathy referred to a family of psychological mechanisms that would allow us to explain how an individual could be concerned about and motivated to act on behalf of another human being. Given its focus on human social motivation, it is no wonder that within this context one did not only stress cognitive abilities to understand other persons. One also referred to our emotional reactivity in encountering another person, particularly when perceiving another person's suffering or distress.
More broadly one can distinguish two psychological research traditions studying empathy related phenomena; that is, the study of what is currently called empathic accuracy and the study of empathy as an emotional phenomenon in the encounter of others. The first area of study defines empathy primarily as a cognitive phenomenon and conceives of empathy in general terms as “the intellectual or imaginative apprehension of another's condition or state of mind,” to use Hogan's (1969) terminology. Within this area of research, one is primarily interested in determining the reliability and accuracy of our ability to perceive and recognize other persons' enduring personality traits, attitudes and values, and occurrent mental states. One also investigates the various factors that influence empathic accuracy. One has, for example, been interested in determining whether empathic ability depends on gender, age, family background, intelligence, emotional stability, the nature of interpersonal relations, or whether it depends on specific motivations of the observer. (For a survey see Ickes 1993 and 2003; and Taft 1955). A more detailed account of the research on empathic accuracy and some of its earlier methodological difficulties can be found in the
Philosophically more influential has been the study of empathy defined primarily as an emotional or affective phenomenon, which psychologists in the middle of the 1950's started to focus on. In this context, psychologists have also addressed issues of moral motivation that have been traditionally topics of intense discussions among moral philosophers. They were particularly interested to investigate (i) the development of various means for measuring empathy as a dispositional trait of adults and of children and as a situational response in specific situations, (ii) the factors on which empathic responses and dispositions depend, and (iii) the relation between empathy and pro-social behavior and moral development. Before discussing the psychological research on emotional empathy and its relevance for moral philosophy and moral psychology in the next section, it is vital to introduce important conceptual distinctions that one should keep in mind in evaluating the various empirical studies.
Anyone reading the emotional empathy literature has to be struck by the fact that empathy tended to be incredibly broadly defined in the beginning of this specific research tradition. Stotland, one of the earliest researcher who understood empathy exclusively as an emotional phenomenon, defined it as “an observer's reacting emotionally because he perceives that another is experiencing or is about to experience an emotion” (1969, 272). According to Stotland's definition very diverse emotional responses such as feeling envy, feeling annoyed, feeling distressed, being relieved about, feeling pity, or feeling what Germans call Schadenfreude (feeling joyful about the misfortune of another) have all to be counted as empathic reactions. Since the 1980's however, psychologists have fine tuned their understanding of empathy conceptually and distinguished between different aspects of the emotional reaction to another person; thereby implicitly acknowledging the conceptual distinctions articulated by Max Scheler (1973) almost a century earlier. In this context, it is particularly useful to distinguish between the following reactive emotions that are differentiated in respect to whether or not such reactions are self or other oriented and whether they presuppose awareness of the distinction between self and others. (See also the survey in the Introduction to Eisenberg/Strayer 1987, and the introduction in Stueber 2006)
- Emotional contagion: Emotional contagion occurs when people start feeling similar emotions caused merely by the association with other people. You start feeling joyful, because other people around you are joyful or you start feeling panicky because you are in a crowd of people feeling panic. Emotional contagion however does not require that one is aware of the fact that one experiences the emotions because other people experience them, rather one experiences them primarily as one's own emotion (Scheler 1973, 22). A newborn infant's reactive cry to the distress cry of another, which Hoffman takes as a “rudimentary precursor of empathic distress” (Hoffman 2000, 65), can probably be understood as a phenomenon of emotional contagion, since the infant is not able to properly distinguish between self and other.
Affective Empathy: More narrowly and properly understood, empathy in the affective sense is the vicarious sharing of an affect. Authors however differ in how strictly they interpret the phrase of vicariously sharing an affect. For some, it requires that the empathizers and the persons they empathize with need to be in very similar affective states (Coplan 2011; de Vignemont and Singer 2006; Jacob 2011). For Hoffman, on the other hand, it is an emotional response requiring only “the involvement of psychological processes that make a person have feelings that are more congruent with another's situation than with his own situation” (Hoffman 2000, 30). According to this definition, empathy does not necessarily require that the subject and target feel similar emotions (even though this is most often the case). Rather the definition also includes cases of feeling sad when seeing a child who plays joyfully but who does not know that it has been diagnosed with a serious illness (assuming that this is how the other person himself or herself would feel if he or she would fully understand his or her situation). In contrast to mere emotional contagion, genuine empathy presupposes the ability to differentiate between oneself and the other. It requires that one is minimally aware of the fact that one is having an emotional experience due to the perception of the other's emotion, or more generally due to attending to his situation. In seeing a sad face of another and feeling sad oneself, such feeling of sadness should count as genuinely empathic only if one recognizes that in feeling sad one's attention is still focused on the other and that it is not an appropriate reaction to aspects of one's own life. Moreover, empathy outside the realm of a direct perceptual encounter involves some appreciation of the other person's emotion as an appropriate response to his or her situation. To be happy or unhappy because one's child is happy or sad should not count necessarily as an empathic emotion. It cannot count as a vicarious emotional response if it is due to the perception of the outside world from the perspective of the observer and her desire that her children should be happy. My happiness about my child being happy would therefore not be an emotional state that is more congruent to his situation. Rather, it is an emotional response appropriate to my own perspective on the world. In order for my happiness or unhappiness to be genuinely empathic it has to be happiness or unhappiness about what makes the other person happy. (See Sober and Wilson 1998, 231–237; for a useful discussion see also H. Maibom 2007). It is exactly for this reason that perspective taking has been traditionally conceived of as a mechanism of empathy. Yet it has to be admitted that empirically both forms of emotional responses are very often intertwined.
Sympathy: In contrast to affective empathy, sympathy is not an emotion that is congruent with the other's emotion or situation such as feeling the sadness of the other person's grieving for the death of his father. Rather, sympathy is seen as an emotion sui generis that has the other's negative emotion or situation as its object from the perspective of somebody who cares for the other person's well being (Darwall 1998). In this sense, sympathy consists of “feeling sorrow or concern for the distressed or needy other,” a feeling for the other out of a “heightened awareness of the suffering of another person as something that needs to be alleviated.” (Eisenberg 2000a, 678; Wispe 1986, 318; and Wispe 1991).
Whereas it is quite plausible to assume that empathy—that is, empathy with negative emotions of another or what Hoffman (2000) calls “veridical empathic distress”—under certain conditions (and when certain developmental markers are achieved) can give rise to sympathy, it should be stressed that the relation between affective empathy and sympathy is a contingent one; the understanding of which requires further empirical research. First, sympathy does not necessarily require feeling any kind of congruent emotions on part of the observer, a detached recognition or representation that the other is in need or suffers might be sufficient. (See Scheler 1973 and Nichols 2004). Second, empathy or empathic distress might not at all lead to sympathy. People in the helping professions, who are so accustomed to the misery of others, suffer at times from compassion fatigue. It is also possible to experience empathic overarousal because one is emotionally so overwhelmed by one's empathic feelings that one is unable to be concerned with the suffering of the other (Hoffman 2000, chap. 8). In the later case, one's empathic feeling are transformed or give rise to mere personal distress, a reactive emotional phenomenon that needs to be distinguished from emotional contagion, empathy, and sympathy.
Personal Distress: Personal distress in the context of empathy research is understood as a reactive emotion in response to the perception/recognition of another's negative emotion or situation. Yet, while personal distress is other-caused like sympathy, it is, in contrast to sympathy, primarily self-oriented. In this case, another person's distress does not make me feel bad for him or her, it just makes me feel bad, or “alarmed, grieved, upset, worried, disturbed, perturbed, distressed,and troubled;” to use the list of adjectives that according to Bateson's research indicates personal distress (Batson et al. 1987 and Batson 1991). And, in contrast to empathic emotions as defined above, my personal distress is not any more congruent with the emotion or situation of another. Rather it wholly defines my own outlook onto the world.
While it is conceptually necessary to differentiate between these various emotional responses, it has to be admitted that it is empirically not very easy to discriminate between them, since they tend to occur together. This is probably one reason why early researchers tended not to distinguish between the above aspects in their study of empathy related phenomena. Yet for the purpose of evaluating the impact and contribution of empathy to an agent's motivation (and for evaluating empathy's centrality for moral psychology), it is important to distinguish between various aspects of emotional responding to another person. As Batson's work—first summarized in his 1991 and more comprehensively in his 2011—suggests, personal distress is only inducing us to help another for egoistic reasons: One wants to get rid of the unpleasant feeling of seeing the other in need, and one helps because one conceives of helping as a means of achieving those egoistic ends. Feelings of being sympathetic, moved by, being compassionate, tender, warm and soft-hearted towards the other's plight (Batson et al. 1987, 26)—that is, feelings that are associated with sympathy according to the above classification but which Batson calls feelings of empathy (see his 1991 , 86/87)—on the other hand motivate for altruistic reasons. In such altruistic motivations the welfare of the other is the ultimate goal of my helping behavior (for this terminology see Sober and Wilson 1998); my helping behavior is not regarded to be a further means to another goal that I desire. Nevertheless, given the ambiguity of the empathy concept within psychology—particularly in the earlier literature—in evaluating and comparing different empirical empathy studies it is always crucial to keep in mind how empathy has been defined and measured within the context of these studies. For a more extensive discussion of the methods used by psychologists to measure empathy see the
Moral philosophers have always been concerned with moral psychology and with articulating an agent's motivational structure, since the philosophical articulation of principles for the normative evaluation of human behavior has to be psychologically plausible. Normative rules are commonly thought of as expressing an obligation for human agents and as asserting a motivational pull on the agent's will. For that very reason, descriptive knowledge of the psychological or biological constitution of human beings can be understood as providing us with knowledge of plausible constraints for evaluating the validity of various normative standards. Moreover, two additional assumptions have traditionally been important for considerations by moral philosophers. First, moral norms have to be distinguished from mere social conventions in that they are somehow regarded to be universally valid, independent from the commands of social authority and a particular culture. Second, moral motivation is in some sense self-less, it is not the mere satisfaction of selfish desires (an intuition that despite their differences both Kant and Schopenhauer agree on.) Giving to charity for selfish reasons seems to diminish the moral worth of that action. For Kant, both intuitions imply that we have to think of morality and moral norms as being derived from pure reason with its abstract notions of duty and conformity to the law. Philosophers who have been skeptical about the claim that pure reason with its abstract notion of duty can be motivationally effective, on the other hand, have tended to emphasize our natural ability to sympathize with the suffering of other people and have claimed that sympathy has to be seen as the primary non-selfish (moral) motivation in human beings.(See Schopenhauer's critique of Kant (Schopenhauer 1995) in this respect). Moreover, some philosophers like Smith (1853) and Schopenhauer (1995) also suggest that the normative force of various moral standards is derived from reflections on the results of sympathizing with others in various situations. Yet the claim that sympathy leads to actions that are in some sense selflessly motivated and that it is the capacity for sympathy that is empirically necessary for moral agency has never been sufficiently substantiated by those very same philosophers. It is easily imaginable that, even if the suffering of another person makes me feel sad, I am just interested in helping the other person not for selfless reasons—because I am interested in his well-being—but because I want for selfish reasons to get rid off a bad feeling. It is also imaginable that moral agency is possible without sympathy, even if as a matter of fact most people do have such feelings from time to time. It is exactly for this very reason that psychological research on emotional empathy has become so important for contemporary philosophers. It promises that the question regarding the validity of some of the above assumptions about the structure of human motivation can be answered in an empirically informed and rigorous manner. In this context, the work of the psychologists Batson and Hoffman are of particular interest. (For a survey of other relevant issues from social psychology, specifically social neuroscience, consult also Decety and Lamm 2006; Decety and Ickes 2009, and Decety 20012. For a discussion of the importance empathy for medical practice see Halpern 2001)
In a series of ingeniously designed experiments, Batson has accumulated evidence for what he calls the empathy-altruism thesis. The task of those experiments consists in showing that empathy/sympathy does indeed lead to genuinely altruistic motivation rather than to helping behavior because of predominantly egoistic motivations. According to the egoistic interpretation of empathy related phenomena, empathizing with another person in need is associated with a negative feeling or can lead to a heightened awareness of the negative consequences of not helping; such as feelings of guilt, shame, or social sanctions. Alternatively, it can lead to an enhanced recognition of the positive consequences of helping behavior such as social rewards or good feelings. Empathy according to this interpretation induces us to help through mediation of purely egoistic motivations. We help others only because we recognize helping behavior as a means to egoistic ends. It allows us to reduce our negative feelings (aversive arousal reduction hypothesis), to avoid “punishment,” or to gain specific internal or external “rewards” (empathy-specific punishment and empathy-specific reward hypotheses).
Notice however that in arguing for the empathy-altruism thesis, Batson is not claiming that empathy always induces helping behavior. Rather, he argues against the predominance of an egoistic interpretation of an agent's motivational structure. He argues for the existence of genuinely altruistic motivations and more specifically for the claim that empathy causes such genuinely altruistic motivation. These genuinely altruistic motives (together with other egoistic motives) are taken into account by the individual agent in deliberating about whether or not to help. Even for Batson, the question of whether the agent will act on his or her altruistic motivations depends ultimately on how strong they are and what costs the agent would incur in helping another person.
The basic set up of Batson's experiments consists in the manipulation of the situation of the experimental subjects (dependent on the egoistic alternative to be argued against) and the manipulation of empathy/sympathy felt for an observed target in need. The decisive evidence for the empathy/sympathy-altruism thesis is always the recorded behavior of the subject, who is in a high empathy condition and in a situation where his helping behavior can not plausibly be seen as a means for the satisfaction of a personal goal. Since here is not the place to extensively describe the details of Batson's experiments, a brief description of the experimental set up—focusing on Batson's argument against the aversive arousal interpretation of empathy—and a brief evaluation of the success of his general argumentative strategy has to suffice (for more details see Batson 1991 and 2011). In all of his experiments Batson assumes—based on Stotland (1969) and others—that empathy/sympathy can be manipulated either by manipulating the perceived similarity between subjects and targets or by manipulating the perspective taking attitude of the subjects. Empathy according to these assumptions can be increased by enhancing the perceived similarity between subject and target or by asking the subject to imagine how the observed person would feel in his or her situation rather than asking the subject to attend carefully to the information provided. [Note also that instructing the subject to imagine how they themselves would feel in the other's situation, rather than instructing them to imagine how the other feels, is associated with an increase in personal distress and not only sympathetic feelings. (Batson et al. 1997b and Lamm, Batson, and Decety 2007).]
In trying to argue against the aversive arousal reduction interpretation, Batson also manipulates the ease with which a subject can avoid helping another person (in this case taking his place when they see him getting electric shocks). He reasons that if empathy leads to genuinely altruistic motivations, subjects in the high empathy/easy escape condition should still be willing to help. If they were only helping in order to reduce their own negative feelings, they would be expected to leave in this situation, since leaving is the less costly means for reaching an egoistic goal. As Batson was happy to report, the results confirmed his empathy/sympathy-altruism hypothesis, not only in the above experiments but also in experiments testing other alternative interpretations of empathy such as the empathy- specific punishment and the empathy-specific award hypotheses.
Researchers generally agree in finding Batson's experimental research program and the accumulated evidence for the empathy-altruism thesis to be impressive. Yet they disagree about how persuasive one should ultimately regard his position. In particular it has been pointed out that his experiments have limited value, since they target only very specific egoistic accounts of why empathy might lead to helping behavior. Batson is not able to dismiss conclusively every alternative egoistic interpretation. In addition, it has been claimed that egoism has the resources to account for the result of his experiments. For example, one might challenge the validity of Batson's interpretation by speculating whether empathy/sympathy leads to a heightened awareness of the fact that one will be troubled by bad memories of seeing another person in need, if one does nothing to help him or her. In this case even an egoistically motivated person would help in the high empathy/easy escape condition. (For this reply and various other egoistic interpretations of Batson's experiments see Sober and Wilson 1998, 264–271).
Cialdini and his collaborators have suggested an even more elaborate non-altruistic interpretation of helping behavior in high empathy/easy escape conditions. According to their suggestions, conditions of high empathy are also conditions of increased “interpersonal unity, wherein the conception of self and other are not distinct but are merged to some degree” (Cialdini et al. 1997, 490). It is this increased feeling of oneness rather than empathy that is causally responsible for motivating helping behavior (For a discussion see Batson et al. 1997a, Neuberg et al. 1997, and Batson 1997 and 2011). One therefore has to be cautious in claiming that Batson has conclusively proven that the empathy/sympathy-altruism hypothesis is true, if that means one has logically excluded every egoistic alternative in accounting for helping behavior. But it has to be acknowledged that Batson has radically changed the argumentative dialectic of the egoism-altruism debate by forcing the egoistic account of human agency to come up with ever more elaborate alternative interpretations in order to account for helping behavior within its framework. Egoism was supposed to provide a rather unified and relatively simple account of the motivational structure of human agency. In challenging the predominance and simplicity of this framework in an empirically acute fashion, Batson has at least established altruism—claiming that besides egoistic motivations we are also motivated by genuinely altruistic reasons—as an empirically plausible hypothesis. He has shown it to be a hypothesis one is almost persuaded to believe that it is true, as he himself recently has characterized his own epistemic attitude (Batson 1997, 522.) More positively expressed, Batson's research has at least demonstrated that empathy/sympathy is a causal factor in bringing about helping behavior. Regardless of the question of the exact nature of the underlying motivation for helping or prosocial behavior, psychologists generally assume that in adults and children a positive correlation between empathy—measured in a variety of ways—and prosocial behavior has been established; and this despite the fact that the above aspects of emotional responding to another person have not always been sufficiently distinguished. (For a survey see Eisenberg and Miller 1987; Eisenberg/Fabes 1998. For a general survey of the various factors contributing to prosocial behavior see Bierhoff 2002).
Regardless of how exactly one views the strength of Batson's position, his research alone does not validate the thesis, articulated by various traditional moral philosophers, that sympathy or empathy is the basis of morality or that it constitutes the only source for moral motivation. First, nothing in his research has shown that empathy/sympathy is empirically necessary for moral agency. Second, some of Batson's own research casts doubt on the claim that sympathy/empathy is the foundation of morality as empathy induced altruism can lead to behavior that conflicts with our principles of justice and fairness. One, for example, tends to assign a better job or a higher priority for receiving medical treatment to persons with whom one has actually sympathized, in violation of the above moral principles (See Batson et al. 1995). For that very reason, Batson himself distinguishes between altruistic motivation concerned with the well-being of another person and moral motivation guided by principles of justice and fairness (Batson 2011). Feelings of sympathy/empathy might thus lead to selfless and other oriented behavior, such behavior is however not necessarily derived from the right sort of selflessness and impartiality characteristic of the moral attitude. Since Batson understands empathy primarily as an emotional phenomenon, it should also be kept in mind that the research discussed above is not at all relevant for deciding the question of whether or not sophisticated mindreading abilities are required for full blown moral agency. (See Nichols 2001 and Batson et al. 2003 in this respect.)
Within the psychological literature, one of the most comprehensive accounts of empathy and its relation to the moral development of a person is provided by the work of Martin Hoffman (for a summary see his 2000). Hoffman views empathy as a biologically based disposition for altruistic behavior (Hoffman 1981). He conceives of empathy as being due to various modes of arousal allowing us to respond empathically in light of a variety of distress cues from another person. Hoffman mentions mimicry, classical conditioning, and direct association—where one empathizes because the other's situation reminds one of one's own painful experience—as “fast acting and automatic” mechanisms producing an empathic response. As more cognitively demanding modes, Hoffman lists mediated association—where the cues for an empathic response are provided in a linguistic medium—and role taking.
Hoffman also distinguishes between five developmental stages of empathic responses ranging from the reactive newborn cry, egocentric empathic distress, quasi-ego-centric empathic distress, to veridical distress and empathy for another beyond the immediate situation. He conceives of full blown empathy on a developmental continuum that ranges from emotional contagion (as in the case of a reactive newborn cry) to empathy proper reached at the fourth stage. At the developmentally later stages, the child is able to emotionally respond to the distress of another in a more sophisticated manner due to an increase of cognitive capacities, particularly due to the increased cognitive ability to distinguish between self and other and by becoming aware of the fact that others have mental states that are independent from its own. Only at the fourth stage of empathic development (after the middle of the second year) do children acquire such abilities. They do no longer try to comfort themselves, when emotionally responding to another child's distress—like seeking comfort from their own mother—, or use helping strategies that are more appropriate to comfort themselves than the other person—like using their own teddy-bear in trying to comfort the other child. Only at the fourth stage does empathy become also transformed or associated with sympathy leading to appropriate prosocial behavior. Hoffman's developmental view is further supported by Preston and DeWaal's account of empathy as a phenomenon to be observed across species at various levels of complexities related to different degrees of cognitive development. (Preston and DeWaal 2002a,b. For a discussion of the philosophical relevance of DeWaal's view see also DeWaal 2006).
Significantly, Hoffman combines his developmental explication of empathy with a sophisticated analysis of its importance for moral agency. He is also acutely aware of the limitations in our natural capacity to empathize or sympathize with others, particularly what he refers to as “here and now” biases, that is, the fact that we tend to empathize more with persons that are in some sense perceived to be closer to us. (For a neuro-scientific investigation of how racial bias modulates empathic responses see Xuo, Zuo, Wang and Han 2009). Accordingly, Hoffman does not regard the moral realm as being exclusively circumscribed by our ability to empathize with other people. Besides empathic abilities, moral agency requires also knowledge of abstract moral principles, such as the principles of caring and justice. Hoffman seems to conceive of those principles as being derived from cognitive sources that are independent from our empathic abilities. For him, stable and effective moral agency requires empathy in order for moral principles to have a motivational basis in an agent's psychology. Knowledge of abstract moral principles is however needed in order to overcome the limits and biases of an emotional and empathic response to seeing others in distress (For a measured evaluation of empathy in the legal context see also Deigh 2011 and Hoffman 2011).
Hoffman's remarks about the centrality of empathy for moral agency and his account of the relation between empathy and universal moral rules are certainly suggestive. However, they are in need of further empirical confirmation and philosophical clarification, so that one can more fully understand how empathy/sympathy as a non-moral emotional phenomenon provides a motivational basis for moral principles. It is also worthwhile emphasizing in this context that moral sentimentalists from the eighteenth century, such as David Hume or Adam Smith, were quite aware of empathy's natural limitations. They already recognized the need for corrective mechanisms such as “some steady and general points of view” or the perspective of the “impartial spectator” in order to argue for empathy or sympathy's foundational role in moral judgments. (For a good analysis of the philosophical discussion about empathy/sympathy in the eighteenth century see Frazer 2010).
How exactly we should think of the importance of our capacity for empathy/sympathy for the constitution of moral agency and the foundation of moral judgment has also been controversially discussed among moral philosophers in recent years. Philosophers with Kantian leanings do admit at times admit that empathy understood as the ability to take the perspective of another person is epistemically relevant for moral deliberations, even if they do not agree with moral sentimentalists that empathy is solely constitutive for moral agency (Deigh 1996; Darwall 2006, Shermann 1998). Within the context of an ethics of care, Michael Slote (2007, 2008) has most dramatically made the case for moral sentimentalism. He argues that empathy, particularly the vicarious sharing of the sympathetic feelings of an observed agent toward the target of his or her actions, should be conceived of as the foundational principle of moral judgments. Interestingly, in contrast to Hume and Smith, he does not regard empathy's natural limitations as shortcomings in this respect but conceives of them as tracking morally relevant aspects of a situation. (For a review see also Oxley 2011).
While some evidence for empathy as a “building block” of morality has come from an evolutionary perspective and ethology (DeWaal 2006 & 2009), to a large extent the contemporary philosophical debate about the moral significance of empathy —and whether or not we should conceive of morality in a sentimentalist or rationalist manner— has been driven by the results of empirical investigations into the causes of psychopathy and autism. Both pathologies are seen as involving a deficit in some dimensions of empathy (For a survey of additional issues in contemporary moral psychology see Sinnott–Armstrong 2008). Most forcefully, Blair defends the claim that a psychopath's inability to behave morally is related to a deficit in empathy or a reduced ability to emotionally respond to the observation of distress in others (Blair, Mitchel, and Blair 2005). Autistic persons on the other hand behave morally because they still are able to appropriately respond to the distress of others, despite their generally reduced mindreading abilities (Blair 1996). Yet Blair's interpretation of these empirical findings have been controversial. Jesse Prinz, who is otherwise a committed moral sentimentalist, argues that a psychopath's moral deficits are better explained by their inability to feel strong emotions. For Prinz (2011a, b), empathy is neither necessary nor sufficient for morality. Rather emotions like anger, resentment, or guilt play a foundational role in this context (see also Nichols 2004 and Maibom 2009 for further discussion of this topic). Other philosophers also link the moral shortcomings of psychopaths to a deficit in their rational capacities. They moreover argue that evidence from autistic individuals, whose imaginative role-playing and thus empathic capacities are diminished, does not support the claim that empathy is necessary for moral agency. It rather suggests that empathy plays a contingent role in the normal development of a moral agent in making it easier to live up to moral standards. (For a position understanding psychopathy as rational deficit see Maibom 2005. For claiming that empathy is not essential for moral agency based on an interpretation of research on autism see Kennett 2002.).
This entry has delineated some of the main domains of traditional and more recent philosophical discussion within which empathy has played an important role. It has also analyzed various areas of psychological empathy research, particularly if they intersect with philosophical interests. At the end, it is important to emphasize that empathy is the topic of an ongoing interdisciplinary research project that has transcended the disciplinary and subdisciplinary boundaries, which have characterized empathy research so far. Specifically, the addition of a neuroscientific perspective has been crucial in recent years. Such interdiciplinarity has contributed to overcoming the conceptual confusions hindering and unnecessarily compartmentalizing the scientific study of empathy. For that very reason, researchers in psychology nowadays tend no longer to conceive of empathy exclusively either in affective or cognitive terms but as encompassing both. Such a unified conception of empathy is further supported by the above mentioned neuroscientific research on mirror neurons. If mirror neurons are indeed the primary underlying causal mechanisms for cognitively recognizing certain emotional states in others by looking at their facial expressions, then it is quite understandable how such an observation could also lead to the feeling of an emotion that is more congruent with the situation of the other; that is, to empathy in the affective sense. Such affective responses are due to the fact that the perception of another person activates similar neurons in the subject and the target. Moreover, the above research would also suggest that empathy is indeed a phenomenon to be found across various species—given the fact that neuronal mirror systems are found across species—and a phenomenon at various levels of complexity starting with the capacity for emotional contagion to proper affective empathy and sympathy in light of increased cognitive capacities and abilities to distinguish between self and other (DeWaal 2006, 2009; Preston and DeWaal 2002a, b). In thinking of empathy in such a unified manner, current empathy research in psychology and neuroscience connects again with the philosophical tradition from the beginning of the 20th century. It is to be hoped that further interdisciplinary research—freed from the limitations of the framework of psychological research of the middle of the 20th century—will enable us to acquire a better understanding of empathy's importance for understanding other agents. It should do so by enabling us to conceive of empathy in a conceptually concise and differentiated manner and by providing us with an even more detailed picture of its underlying mechanisms.
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