First published Wed Dec 18, 2002; substantive revision Thu Dec 22, 2016

Envy is a complex and puzzling emotion. It is, notoriously, one of the seven deadly sins in the Catholic tradition. It is very commonly charged with being (either typically or universally) unreasonable, irrational, imprudent, vicious, or wrong to feel. With very few exceptions, the ample philosophical literature defending the rationality and evaluative importance of emotions explicitly excludes envy and a few other nasty emotions as irredeemable. Indeed, some authors who are prepared to defend even jealousy insist that envy is beyond the pale. Yet there is considerable controversy over what precisely envy is, and the cogency of various specific criticisms of envy depends on what view of that subject is adopted.

In addition to its centrality to discussions in the philosophy of emotions, envy has sparked controversies in political philosophy. Perhaps best known among these is the claim that egalitarian views of justice are motivated by envy. It also receives substantial treatment from John Rawls, who takes pains to argue that envy does not pose a threat to his theory of justice. Each of these topics receives some treatment below.

1. The Nature of Envy

1.1 Defining Envy

This entry follows the widespread assumption that envy is an emotion.[1] That is not to say that it is a mere feeling. Emotions are generally agreed to be more than feelings. Most emotion theorists could agree on this vague characterization: emotions are syndromes of thoughts, feelings, motivations, and bodily movements, loosely enough bound together that a given emotional episode may not require the occurrence of every element in the syndrome. Most theories of emotion privilege one of these elements as central, or even essential, to emotion. Cognitive theories identify a defining thought or judgment. Feeling theories and Motivational theories respectively take a particular affective experience or a distinctive motivational role as central or essential to a given emotion type.

The specific contours of the emotional syndrome of envy are controversial. It is agreed that envy involves an envier (“Subject”), a party who is envied (“Rival”)—this may be a person or group of persons—and some possession, capacity or trait that the subject supposes the rival to have (the “good”). The good might be something that only one party could possibly possess (the crown jewels, or being the world’s best go player), or it might be something easily duplicated. It is sometimes held that the good may even be utility, happiness, or some psychological state that Subject could attribute to Rival even if there were no material difference in their possessions or capacities. Most philosophers who have sought to define envy agree in treating it as a form of distress experienced by the subject because he does not possess the good and the rival does, and in attributing a desire for the good to Subject. Many, but not all, go on to add that envy involves a desire that the rival not have the good. This disagreement is explored below, [see benign and invidious envy]. Envy is widely but not universally agreed to be a symptom or instance of the human tendency to evaluate one’s well-being comparatively, by assessing how well one is doing in comparison with others. Influential definitions of envy include:

Envy is pain at the good fortune of others. (Aristotle, Rhetoric, Bk II, Chapter 10)

Envy is a propensity to view the well-being of others with distress, even though it does not detract from one’s own. [It is] a reluctance to see our own well-being overshadowed by another’s because the standard we use to see how well off we are is not the intrinsic worth of our own well-being but how it compares with that of others. [Envy] aims, at least in terms of one’s wishes, at destroying others’ good fortune. (Kant, The Metaphysics of Morals 6:459)

Envy is that passion which views with malignant dislike the superiority of those who are really entitled to all the superiority they possess. (Adam Smith, The Theory of Moral Sentiments, p. 244)

1.2 Envy vs. Jealousy

Ordinary language tends to conflate envy and jealousy. The philosophical consensus is that these are distinct emotions.While it is linguistically acceptable to say that one is jealous upon hearing about another’s vacation, say, it has been plausibly argued that one is feeling envy, if either, in such a case. According to Farrell (1980) and Neu (1980), both envy and jealousy are three-place relations; but this superficial similarity conceals an important difference. Jealousy involves three parties, the subject, the rival, and the beloved; and the jealous person’s real locus of concern is the beloved, a person (or being) whose affection he is losing or fears losing. The locus of concern in jealousy is not the rival. Whereas envy is a two party relation, with a third relatum that is a good (albeit a good that could be a particular person’s affections); and the envious person’s locus of concern is the rival.

On this way of distinguishing envy from jealousy there is a difference between them even when the good that the rival has is the affection of another person.[2] Roughly, for the jealous person the rival is fungible and the beloved is not fungible. So he would be equally bothered if the beloved were consorting with someone else, and would not be bothered if the rival were. Whereas in envy it is the other way around. Because envy is centrally focused on competition with the rival, the subject might well be equally bothered if the rival were consorting with a different (appealing) person, but would not be bothered if the ‘good’ had gone to someone else (with whom the subject was not in competition). Whatever the ordinary meaning of the terms ‘envy’ and ‘jealousy,’ these considerations demonstrate that these two distinct syndromes need to be distinguished.

1.3 ‘Benign’ and ‘Invidious’ Envy

Many authors posit a distinction between two kinds of envy: a malicious or invidious form, and a benign, emulative, or admiring variety of envy.[3] Typically, the point of the distinction is to identify a class of cases in which envy is somehow permissible or justifiable and separate them from cases in which it is not. While details differ, the general idea is that invidious envy involves a desire that the rival lose the good, whereas benign envy does not.[4] But other philosophers claim that benign envy is not envy at all.[5] Like many disagreements over the nature of emotions, this one threatens to become a merely verbal dispute, but it can be understood as a substantive question about the character of an empirical phenomenon.[6]

Some of the examples advanced on behalf of the suggested bifurcation threaten to obscure the issue. It will not do, for instance, simply to point out that people commonly say that they envy someone’s skill in cases where it is quite implausible to suppose that they have any desire that the person loses the skill. There is undoubtedly a common tendency to use the term ‘envy’ for any desire for something that is possessed by another. But, given the looseness of natural language noted above, we must not simply assume that these are really cases of the emotional syndrome of envy. Although some discussions of envy seem to treat any desire for [an instance of] what another person has as envy, this threatens to assimilate some cases of envy to admiration.[7]

Most parties to the debate would grant that not every case in which someone would like something that someone else possesses is a case of genuine envy. First, envy is typically agreed to be a form of pain or distress—an unpleasant emotion. To fancy someone else’s linens is not yet to envy them. So not every such desire should be counted as a case of benign envy. Furthermore, even a painful desire for what someone else possesses might be better described as longing than envy. If you badly (painfully) want the new Mercedes convertible, then you long for it. If you then discover that your neighbor has bought one, does your longing become envy? To avoid turning this into a matter of stipulation or a verbal dispute, it should be a substantive psychological question whether you envy her for it. Envy should not be held to follow as a logical consequence of the conjunction of your painful desire with the belief that she has (an instance of) its object. But then there must be something more to envy than painfully wanting something that (you know) someone else has.

Robert Young suggests that what differentiates envy from mere longing is that, in (even benign) envy, the subject is pained because the rival has the good. But it is questionable whether this proposal succeeds as a defense of benign envy. If the “because” in question is causal-explanatory, this seems insufficient to mark the relevant distinction. After all, ordinary longing may be occasioned by seeing the good in someone else’s possession. Perhaps if your neighbor hadn’t acquired the convertible, it would never have come to your attention. It would then be true that you want it because she has it, yet it seems possible that this is longing, not envy. Suppose that you would have been equally pained by not having it regardless of how you discovered its existence. Then the fact that, as it happens, your longing was caused by seeing it in the neighbor’s driveway does not suffice to make this a case of envy.

But perhaps Young’s “because” offers something like the agent’s reason for being pained, or the content of a thought at which she is pained. In other words, perhaps the point is to emphasize the idea that the subject really is bothered specifically by the difference in possession, not just by his own lack of the good. But if so, more would need to be said to explain how how the envy can be benign. If what pains the subject, or what he evaluates as bad, is really the disparity between the subject and the rival (not just the subject’s lack), it is hard to see how the subject could lack any desire for the rival to lose the comparative advantage. After all, by hypothesis the situation in which the rival loses the good without the subject getting it would be better than the status quo, as far as the subject’s envy is concerned – inasmuch as there would then be no disparity to be bothered by. Of course the subject may not prefer all things considered that the rival lose the good. But if he is only motivated to improve his position, and lacks any desire for the rival to lose the good, then why think that what bothers him is really the disparity, rather than just his own lack?

Sara Protasi (2016) offers a more complex taxonomy of envy which includes a version of benign envy that she calls “emulative envy.” She draws two cross-cutting distinctions: whether the subject is focused upon the good or upon the rival, and whether she perceives the good as obtainable or unobtainable. Focus is understood not in terms of salience or conscious attention, but as a matter of evaluative concern: “what the envier focuses on is whatever she cares about, from a prudential point of view.” (2016, p. 4) In emulative envy, the envier is focused on the good and believes himself capable of obtaining it. She is motivated to improve her standing, not to bring down the rival. But emulative envy is supposed to be distinct from admiration or even longing. It is meant to be a species of envy in general, which Protasi defines as “an aversive reaction to a perceived inferiority to a similar other, with regard to a good that is relevant to the sense of identity of the envier.” (2016, p.2) A question for this account is what role the perceived inferiority to the rival can be playing in emulative envy, if the envier is held to care only about the good, and not the inferiority as such. If it is playing no role, then why think this is a species of envy in general, rather than a (no doubt common and important) emotion of some other sort? But if it is allowed that emulative envy does also include a concern about inferiority as such, distinct from the desire for the good, then the question is how to make that concern compatible with an insistence that there is no desire that the rival lose the good.

Even those who deny that “benign envy” is a kind of envy (hereafter, “deniers”) will grant the existence of cases in which people want to have skills or other traits that are possessed by another person, and are pained by their lack, but in which they have no desire at all for the other person to lose those traits. Call such a state “emulative desire.” Apparently some other languages have a word for that state.[8] What deniers deny is that emulative desire is an instance of envy (or of “envy proper”, as Rawls puts it). But what is at stake in such a claim? We have already noted that ordinary usage surely permits application of “envy” in such cases, and in others besides, so linguistic propriety is not the issue. One way of understanding the debate concerns which taxonomy of mental states carves emotions at their joints—that is, carves them in ways that reflect psychological kinds that support predictions and explanatory generalizations.

One way to develop the deniers’ position is as follows.[9] Envy is a distinctive kind of psychological state that is essentially competitive. It is concerned specifically with unfavorable comparisons to others with whom the subject in some ways sees himself as in competition. On this view, the characteristic dissatisfaction of envy supplies or embodies some level of motivation toward whatever would ameliorate the situation: in other words, toward either outdoing or undoing the rival’s advantage Which of those motivations will emerge in action depends on many factors. It depends on what the situation affords, including the probabilities and expected costs and benefits of success at either option. And it depends on other attitudes and desires of the subject, including how much he likes the rival, whether he thinks it would be wrong to deprive him of the good, and how much that wrongness matters to him.

On this view, there can still be cases of genuine envy in which the subject would not take steps to undermine the rival. He would not even push a button to deprive the rival in secret—because he likes the rival, or because that would be a rotten thing to do to anyone. Call such a person a “decent envier.” A decent envier may sincerely believe that he has no desire whatever that the rival lose the good. He will be wrong about this, but it can still be true that he would not act on that desire. The attribution of genuine envy in such a case nonetheless explains some things. It explains why even a decent envier’s pain is prone to go away, along with some of his ambition to achieve the good, if the rival should lose it. Why should envy go away in such cases, if all the envier wanted was to secure the good himself? It also explains why even decent enviers may be more likely to be amused by a story that shows the rival in a negative light, and why they become drawn to other goods that the rival acquires within the scope of the rivalry. And it explains why some previously decent enviers become indecent enviers, or at least become aware of some ambivalence about the rival’s possession of the good, when their efforts to secure the good for themselves prove hopeless.

In cases of emulative desire, on the other hand, presumably none of these things should be expected. So what deniers want to say about benign envy is that either it is not really envy (it’s just emulative desire, or something else in the neighborhood) or it is not really benign. Whether the deniers’ view should be preferred may hinge on what explanatory advantages defenders of benign envy can offer for a taxonomy that includes emulative desire as a species of envy.

1.4 Envy vs. Resentment

Although much of the psychological literature on envy supposes that envy is concerned with matters of perceived injustice, most philosophers reject this suggestion.[10] The received view is that envy is to be distinguished from resentment. The latter is held to be a moral emotion, whereas the former is not. What makes a given emotion a moral emotion has been glossed in various ways. Roughly, the idea is that moral emotions are ones that somehow embody moral principles or appraisals. Resentment is a moral emotion because a given emotional episode does not qualify as a state of resentment unless the subject holds some moral complaint against the object of the state. The claim that envy is not a moral emotion should be understood as a denial that any moral complaint is part of the nature of envy as such. It is compatible with the possibility of any number of cases in which envious people also hold moral complaints against those they envy. And it is also compatible with the possibility of envying someone for some moral feature.

It seems clear that in many (perhaps even most) cases of envy, the subject is liable to find some moral complaint with which to justify negative feelings toward his rival. This would explain various experimental findings that correlate feelings of envy with complaints of injustice. But, of course, such complaints may be defensive rationalizations of rancorous feelings, rather than elements in envy. Claims about which of the various thoughts that commonly attend a given type of emotion belong in a characterization of that emotion type are best defended within the context of a general theory of how to individuate emotion types, which is beyond the scope of this entry. In any case, some version of the thesis that envy is not a moral emotion seems both plausible and necessary to make sense of the debate over whether egalitarianism is motivated by envy (see section 3.1 below).

2. The Rationality of Envy

Assessments of the rationality of emotions take various forms. It is useful to distinguish the prudential advisability of emotions (whether they are good for the person who has them) from their fittingness (roughly, whether the appraisal of circumstances involved in the emotion is accurate or not). Both of these assessments are to be distinguished from various ethical appraisals of emotions. Most authors who address the issue seem to agree that envy is seldom advisable: insofar as one is able to control or influence one’s emotions, it is best not to be envious, because envy harms those who feel it. This is sometimes urged simply on the grounds that envy is a form of pain, but more often because, in envy, a person’s subjective sense of well-being, self-worth or self-respect is diminished. But if envy involves certain characteristic patterns of motivation, such as a motive to outdo or undo the rival’s advantages, then the advisability of envy may be strongly dependent on the advisability of the actions it motivates. And whether these actions are advisable, in turn, depends upon whether they are efficient means to the ends at which they aim, and whether those ends are themselves in the subject’s interests. Thus an adequate assessment of the prudential advisability of envy may well depend on whether the envious subject’s sense that he is worse off because of his rival’s possession of the good that he lacks is accurate. If it is accurate, then motivation to change the situation may well be beneficial for the Subject. We turn now to issues of accuracy.

It is commonly supposed that emotions, envy included, involve a way of taking the circumstances—a thought, construal, appraisal, or perception of the circumstances—which can then be assessed for fittingness (objective rationality) and/or warrant (subjective rationality).[11] Thus fear can be unfittingly directed at something that isn’t really dangerous, or fittingly directed at something that is. And it can be unwarrantedly directed at something the subject has good reason to believe poses no danger, or warrantedly directed at what she has good reason to think dangerous—even if that good reason is supplied by misleading evidence, so that the object of the emotion is not, in fact, dangerous. Similarly, in light of the discussion above, we might say that envy involves thinking that the rival has something good that the subject lacks, and negatively evaluating this difference in possession, per se. Each of the various strands in this way of taking the circumstances, then, can be appraised for fittingness and warrant. We will focus on fittingness here, but analogous points can be made in terms of warrant. Envy will be unfitting, for instance, if the rival does not really have the good, or if the ‘good’ isn’t really good—for instance if the envy is directed at some possession that the subject would not really value if he knew its true nature. These suggestions are uncontroversial. A more interesting question concerns the last element in envy’s characteristic appraisal: the negative evaluation of the difference in possession. This too might be thought to be amenable of broadly rational appraisal.

Some philosophers suggest that envy is always or typically irrational, and they seem to have in mind the charge that it is unfitting.[12] Theirs is a restricted version of the Stoic critique of emotions, according to which (roughly) all emotions are unfitting because they involve taking various worldly things to matter that don’t really matter. Not many contemporary philosophers are attracted to the Stoic view of value, which is embedded in an idiosyncratic ancient cosmology. But perhaps specific emotions can be convicted of the putative mistake, and envy appears to be a likely suspect. If envy involves taking the difference in possession between subject and rival to be bad in itself, then, if such differences are not bad in themselves, envy is systematically unfitting. Developing this charge demands getting clearer about the sense in which envy can be said to involve taking the difference in possession to be bad in itself.

Suppose that envy includes some desire that the rival not have the good. Then envy may be interpreted so as to involve a preference for the situation in which neither subject nor rival have the good to the one in which rival has it and subject does not.[13] Call this the “envious preference.” The envious preference is invoked as a basis for the claim that envy appraises the former situation as better than the latter. But better in what respect? There are a number of possibilities, and we will consider just two. First, it might be held to be better, from the point of view of the universe (“impersonally better” for short). Secondly, it might be held to be better for the subject.

If envy holds that the situation in which neither has the good is better, impersonally, than the one in which Rival has it, this can be criticized as an axiological mistake.[14] Surely the world is a better place, ceteris paribus, if someone possesses a given good than if no one does. But this is too quick. First, consider cases in which rival has acquired the good by wrongdoing. Arguably the world is not a better place when the fortunes of some are wrongfully improved. Secondly, an extreme egalitarian may hold that inequalities themselves are prima facie bad, because they are unjust. On that view, it may sometimes be better that neither possesses a given good than that one does. Either of these considerations might then be invoked as a defense of fittingness of envy. Thus, if envy is interpreted as making a claim about impersonal value, it will be difficult to prevent moral considerations from guiding verdicts about its fittingness.[15] While this does not completely collapse the distinction between envy and resentment, it renders it considerably murkier.

Alternatively, envy can be held to present the difference in possession between subject and rival as bad specifically for Subject. This interpretation of envy’s characteristic appraisal is more plausible, and it jibes better with the doctrine that envy is not a moral feeling. Envy can nonetheless be criticized as irrational, on this interpretation, for taking something to be bad for Subject that is not in fact bad for him. What matters to how well things are going for Subject is a function of what goods Subject has, not what goods his rival has, the critic will suggest. Hence, while the present state of affairs is worse for Subject than a situation in which he has the good and Rival lacks it, it is not worse than a situation in which neither has the good. So there is no self-interested reason for Subject to have the envious preference. Envy is therefore systematically unfitting because it takes something to be bad for the subject that is not in fact bad for him.

The cogency of this argument for the irrationality of envy depends, of course, on the plausibility of its claims about well-being. If people do in fact systematically care about the possessions of others, and regard themselves as worse or better off accordingly as they stack up against their selected comparison class, some subjectivist accounts will license taking this concern as itself a part of these subjects’ well-being—in which case, some envy will be fitting. Whereas most objective accounts of well-being either treat it as a measure of primary goods, or supply content restrictions on the desires whose satisfaction contributes to well-being which would exclude desires like the envious preference. One recent defense of the claim that envy is sometimes fitting relies on the idea that being excellent in various domains of human achievement contributes to well-being and yet is essentially a comparative matter (D’Arms and Jacobson, 2005). If such excellences, or other positional goods, are granted to contribute in themselves to well-being, then it appears that envy will be fitting whenever a rival’s diminution with respect to the relevant positional good improves the Subject’s position.

3. Envy and Justice

3.1 Egalitarianism and Envy

A recurring suggestion in the history of philosophical and political thought has been that envy supplies the psychological foundations of the concern for justice, and, especially, of egalitarian conceptions of justice.[16] Both the proponents of this charge and those who contest it have commonly taken it to be a damaging suggestion for egalitarianism.[17] It is worth distinguishing genetic versions of the charge from occurrent ones. Genetic versions concern the historical or developmental sources of a concern for equality. Freud, for instance, held that concern with justice is the product of childhood envy of other children leading to concern for equal treatment, and thereby to ‘group spirit’: “If one cannot be the favorite oneself, at all events nobody else shall be the favorite.” (p. 120). Nietzsche can be read as tendering an account of the origins of egalitarian values or ideals in envy in his account of the “slave revolt in morality.”[18] Whatever their merits, these claims should be distinguished from the claim that those who defend egalitarian views of justice are motivated by occurrent bouts of envy or propensities to them.[19]

Defense of the charge that egalitarianism is occurrently motivated by envy hinges both on the commitments of egalitarianism and on the nature of envy. The common motif is that egalitarians wish to do away with the advantages of the better off, and that they wish to do this because they are bothered by the very fact that the better off are better off. This is supposed to show that egalitarians are motivated by envy. Whether this is a fair characterization of any prominent egalitarian position is certainly open to question.[20] But in any case, in light of the distinction between envy and resentment, it is clear that there can be no direct move from the claim that egalitarians are ‘bothered’ by the advantages of the better off to the claim that they are envious. For another possibility is that what they feel is resentment, occasioned by the thought that the present distribution is unjust.[21] Note that the claim that what is felt is resentment does not depend upon showing that the resentment is fitting—that the distribution really is unjust. It would suffice to show that the response really is a moral evaluation, justified or not.

It seems clear that the occurrent version of the charge is only damaging to egalitarianism if the basic distinction between envy and resentment is accepted. Otherwise, envy could be granted to motivate egalitarianism, but this would not impute any concern aside from concerns with justice to the position. With the distinction in hand, however, the charge is difficult to defend. Envy does not arise in cases where inequalities favor the subject. So defenders of the charge appear to be committed to the falsifiable thesis that egalitarians are inconsistent in their commitment to inequality.[22] If the charge were true, egalitarians should oppose only the inequalities that are unfavorable to their own interests. To the extent that egalitarians are sincere and consistent in the embrace of their principles, this counts against the charge that their occurrent motivation is envy.[23]

3.2 Envy-free allocations

A different way in which envy might be thought to motivate broadly egalitarian thought is by appeal to the idea of envy-free allocations. A distribution of goods is said to be “envy-free” when no one prefers anyone else’s bundle of resources to her own.[24] The suggestion here is not that envy is the psychological motivation for the concern with equality, but rather that, where a distribution in fact produces envy, this is grounds to doubt the fairness of the distribution. But ‘envy’ in these contexts is a technical term for any situation in which someone prefers another’s bundles of goods, and does not refer to the emotional syndrome with which this entry is concerned.[25]

3.3 Rawls’ Problem of Envy

In constructing the “original position” from which deliberators select principles of justice in A Theory of Justice, Rawls assumes that the imagined deliberators are not motivated by various psychological propensities. One of these is the propensity to envy. One justification Rawls offers for this stipulation is that what principles of justice are chosen should not be affected by individual inclinations, which are mere accidents. This rationale is less persuasive if envious concerns are universal in human nature. Another justification is that parties in the original position should be concerned with their absolute level of primary social goods, not with their standing relative to others as such.[26] He then proceeds in the second part of the argument for the principles of justice to consider whether, in fact, human propensities being what they are, the tendency to envy will undermine the arrangements of a well-ordered society (in which case the principles of justice would have to be reconsidered). The ‘Problem of Envy’ is the possibility that widespread envy might do just this. The reason that Rawls takes this to be a live possibility is that “the inequalities sanctioned by the difference principle may be so great as to arouse envy to a socially dangerous extent.”[27]

The primary way in which Rawls thinks envy could pose such a threat is if it comes to undermine the self-respect of those who are less well off. It might do this, he thinks, if the differences between the haves and the have-nots are so great that, under existing social conditions, the differences cannot help but cause loss of self-esteem. “For those suffering this hurt,” he continues, “envious feelings are not irrational; the satisfaction of their rancor would make them better off.” (534) He calls this “excusable general envy,” and offers two reasons for doubting that it will be prevalent in a well-ordered society. First, he argues that the liberties and political status of equal citizens encourage self-respect even when one is less well off than others. Second, he suggests that background institutions (including a competitive economy) make it likely that excessive inequalities will not be the rule.

Rawls’ discussion is in some tension with the received view of envy. He supposes that “the main psychological root of our liability to envy is a lack of self-confidence in our own worth combined with a sense of impotence.” This leads him to expect that envy will be more severe the greater the differences between subjects and those they envy.[28] However most observers of envy, from Aristotle on, have urged that it is most often felt toward those with whom the subject perceives himself as in competition, so that typically very great disparities in well-being are not envied. And there is some empirical evidence to support this claim.[29] This is usually explained by the hypothesis that the benchmarks against which people measure their comparative well-being are, in some (possibly metaphorical) sense, local. If true, this calls into question whether preventing excessive inequalities is likely to reduce the frequency or intensity of envy. But it also suggests that the phenomenon of general, or class, envy toward which Rawls’ discussion is directed may not pose a substantial threat to the well-ordered society.


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Copyright © 2016 by
Justin D'Arms <darms.1@osu.edu>

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