Notes to Envy

1. Although the term is widely enough used that various non-emotional patterns of behavior and motivation can be called “envious” without linguistic impropriety, it seems clear that these are so called because of their resemblance to the emotional syndrome.

2. This test case, and its upshot, are explored in Farrell (1980).

3. Farrell (1989), Neu, Protasi, Roberts, Young. Typically, the point of the distinction is to identify a class of cases in which envy is somehow legitimate or justifiable from another class in which it is not.

4. This is the simplest way to draw the distinction, and the one that will be used to frame a debate in what follows. It fits best with a Motivational Theory of the nature of emotions. But the distinction can also be expressed in terms that better suit a Cognitive Theory of emotion. Then the idea would be, roughly, that invidious envy involves, among other things, the thought that it is bad that Rival has the good, given that Subject lacks it; whereas benign envy does not involve a negative evaluation of the rival having the good [em-dash] only of the subject lacking it.

5. Thus, for instance, Rawls characterizes the distinction as being between benign envy and “envy proper.” See also Nozick, D'Arms and Jacobson (2000), D'Arms and Kerr (2008).

6. For a discussion of this general problem, and a proposal about how best to make sense of competing accounts of the characteristic beliefs and desires in a range of emotions, see D'Arms and Jacobson 2002.

7. For instance, Gabrielle Taylor (2006, p. 43) introduces a notion of “object-envy” in which “… the envy is of the good the other has; its possessor plays a relatively minor role as being merely the occasion for the envious person's realization of her deficiencies.” She then says that object envy is not vicious, in part on the grounds that the subject of such envy “may admire those who possess the good and strive to improve her own position in the relevant respect.” It is not clear whether she thinks such an admiring attitude would suffice for attributing object-envy, but if so this makes it quite unclear why it should be treated as envy. Protasi (2016) expresses a similar misgiving about Taylor's proposal, noting that admiration is not unpleasant.

8. See van de Ven, Zeelenberg and Pieters (2009) for some relevant discussion. They treat this linguistic point as evidence in support of the idea that benign envy is a kind of envy. But it is at least unclear that the linguistic point supports that conclusion. Some scholars, including Kripke (1977), treat the existence of distinct words in a foreign language that are translated with a single word in our own as evidence of ambiguity in English. In any case, it is not clear that anything in van de Ven et al's interesting experiments motivates translating the relevant terms as “benign envy” rather than as “emulative desire,” or understanding the benign and malicious phenomena they distinguish as two variants of one emotion.

9. This view of the characteristic motivation of envy is advanced in D'Arms and Jacobson, 2000, and further developed in D'Arms and Kerr, 2008.

10. See Smith; Smith, Parrott et al; and Ortony et al. Ben Ze'ev suggests that envy is concerned with inferiority and desert, but urges that the notion of desert in play is not moral.

11. This gloss of the common supposition is intended to be neutral on the controversy between judgmentalists, who hold that emotions essentially involve beliefs or judgments, and their opponents. Note that evidence for claims about the content of the appraisal involved in a given type of emotion comes not only from beliefs a subject may be said to have, but from desires and feelings as well. It is in part because envy is a form of pain or distress at the rival's possession of the good that the subject can be said to regard it as bad in some way that rival has what he has.

12. cf. Neu; Farrell (1980).

13. This is Nozick's gloss of envy.

14. cf. de Sousa on axiological mistakes.

15. At least, this will be so if moral considerations are permitted to be adduced in support of axiological claims. Consequentialists and others who insist on treating the good as conceptually prior to the right would either have to reject the relevance of the considerations advanced above to the fittingness of envy, or find alternative, nonmoral terms in which to express the axiological mistake involved.

16. The suggestion can be found in Nietszche and Freud, and arguably, as far back as Aristotle. A comprehensive survey of historical sources is to be found in Schoeck. It receives a sympathetic treatment in Nozick, though he does not explicitly endorse it. See also Cooper.

17. Some defenders of the charge appear willing to settle for something much less contentious: that many claims of injustice on the basis of inequality are motivated by envy. But of course, egalitarians can and do grant that appeals to justice in ordinary life are often enough rationalizations for envy.

18. Genealogy Treatise 1. Nietzsche's notion of ‘ressentiment’ seems to be a propensity that begins life as envy and takes on moral content only with the creation of the moral ideals to which it gives rise.

19. Of course, defenders of the genetic thesis may also hold the occurrent one, and Freud at least seems to have thought them closely connected. For Freud, emotional energies are highly labile, so that occurrent moral resentment may be an outlet of psychic forces springing from envy.

20. One particularly careful effort to defend egalitarianism in this context is Young. He points out that the charge would be more promising if egalitarians were committed to “levelling down” differences in cases where redistribution is not available, but argues that none of the most prominent egalitarians are so committed. For a discussion of varieties of egalitarianism, see egalitarianism and equality.

21. This reply is offered by Neu and by Rawls.

22. cf. Rawls p. 540; Ben-Ze'ev 1992.

23. Nozick appears to deny this: “Nor is [the claim that egalitarianism is not motivated by envy] proven by the fact that once people accept egalitarian principles, they might support the worsening of their own position as an application of these general principles.” (p. 240). Perhaps proof is too much to hope for here—the relevant data does seem to constitute powerful evidence against the charge of occurrent envy. His remark is most easily understood in defense of an ontogenetic version of the charge, yet his surrounding discussion seems to be addressed to the occurrent charge.

24. The term originates in economic theory, where it has generated a vast literature. See Foley; Varian 1974. Varian 1975 uses the idea as the foundation for a theory of fairness, which is incisively criticized in Sugden. Dworkin takes up the idea in his influential definition of equality.

25. It is easy to see that even a distribution that is not envy-free might be one where there is no actual envy, since people can prefer someone else's bundle of resources without envying it. Elster points out, in addition, that an envy-free allocation does not ensure that no one experiences envy, if an individual can envy someone else's utility, rather than his resources. (Elster p. 179-80f.)

26. This rationale is also somewhat problematic, since it is plausible that one's absolute share of some primary goods, such as power, is determined by ones relative share of other goods.

27. See the entry on distributive justice

28. It might be supposed that the phenomenon Rawls is concerned with is not envy at all, then, but resentment. But the supposition that a society is well-ordered ensures that the imagined underclass accepts the principles of justice. They must therefore grant that there is no complaint of justice against the better off. Yet it seems undeniable that gross differences in distribution would likely occasion some sort of rancorous feelings. It is tempting then to characterize the responses as resentment that is unfitting by the subjects' own lights. But Rawls wants to grant that such feelings are rational, if in fact the differences are damaging to the subjects' self-esteem.

29. Ben-Ze'ev 1992 provides references to empirical literature in support of this claim. See also Frank.

Copyright © 2016 by
Justin D’Arms <>

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