Notes to Thomas of Erfurt

1. The factual information in this section and the next has been gathered from Lorenz 1989, still the definitive source for Thomas of Erfurt’s life and writings.

2. Stephan Grotz comments on the remarkable similarities between the commentaries of Siger and Thomas on Porphyry’s Isagoge and Aristotle’s Categories (1998: vii, n. 1). Likewise, Jan Pinborg notes that “long passages of the Grammatica speculativa [i.e. De modis significandi] are simply taken over from Radulphus Brito” (Pinborg 1974: 372; see also Pinborg 1967).

3. Schottenklosteren (lit. ‘Scottish cloisters’) were monasteries founded by Scottish and Irish Benedictine monks in continental Europe beginning in the eighth century.

4. See Pinborg 1967: 132 and Lorenz 1989: 312–13.

5. Bursill-Hall’s edition unfortunately carries over a number of corrupt readings from the text of this work in Wadding 1639. For a list of corrected readings, see Pinborg 1974.

6. See Lorenz 1989: 317–24.

7. See Pinborg 1982 and especially Fredborg 1988. This earlier movement culminated in the Summa super Priscianum of Peter Helias (ca. 1100–1166), which is also the first example of the genre later made famous by Thomas Aquinas, in his theological Summae.

8. Modism originated in Paris and was for the most part a Parisian phenomenon, although Modist philosophers later came to teach in England and (of course) Erfurt. For the former, see Robert Andrews: 1999, “Andrew of Cornwall and the Reception of Modism in England,” in Medieval Analyses in Language and Cognition, Acts of the Symposium, ‘The Copenhagen School of Medieval Philosophy’, January 10–13, 1996, ed. Sten Ebbesen and Russell L. Friedman, Royal Danish Academy of Sciences and Letters, C. A. Reitzels Forlag, Copenhagen.

9. Of course, not all of the possible modi significandi of a word will be realized in all languages. In Latin, ‘canis’ is masculine, but English omits the modus of gender as a means of distinguishing nouns.

10. Pinborg 1982: 260. Karin Margareta Fredborg (1980) has shown that virtually all twelfth-century authors accepted the idea of a universal grammar.

11. See, e.g., Kelly 1971. For a linguistic account of Modism, see Bursill-Hall 1971 and Robins 1997: 79–109. A more detailed study can be found in Michael A. Covington: 1984, Syntactic Theory in the High Middle Ages: Modistic Models of Sentence Structure, Cambridge University Press, London-New York.

12. More than anything else, it was the search for properly Aristotelian foundations for grammar that led to the eclipse of the twelfth-century notion of grammatica universalis and its gradual replacement by the full-blown grammatica speculativa. See Kneepkens 1995: 247–8.

13. Boethius of Dacia, Modi Significandi, Q. 9; Pinborg, Roos, and Jensen 1969: 39, ll. 24–33.

14. Aristotle, De interpretatione 1.16a3–9, tr. J. L. Ackrill in Jonathan Barnes (ed.): 1984, The Complete Works of Aristotle, vol. 1, Bollingen Series LXXI.2, Princeton University Press, Princeton NJ, 25.

15. For a discussion of developments among “second generation” Modistae such as Thomas of Erfurt, see Marmo 1995.

16. 1330 is regarded as the terminus ad quem of Modism because in that year, the Averroist master John Aurifaber delivered a scathing attack at the University of Erfurt on the doctrine of the modi significandi from which it never fully recovered. But by then the doctrine was already in retreat at Paris, where it had suffered a similar fate at the hands of another Averroist, John of Jandun (see Pinborg 1967: 195–209; 1982: 267–8). The most famous critique of modism—called, appropriately enough, the Destructiones modorum significandi—was composed nearly half a century later by an unknown Parisian author, once believed to have been Peter d’Ailly (Kaczmarek 1994). Also appearing in the third quarter of the fourteenth century was the Quaestiones super secundam partem Doctrinalis of a certain Master Marsilius (= Marsilius of Inghen?), who seems to have been acquainted with the Destructiones. Modism found a few isolated advocates in later centuries, but never again emerged into the semantic mainstream. For discussion of the Erfurt and Paris responses to Modism, see Biard 1989: 242–88.

17. On these points, see Pinborg 1982 and Marmo 1995.

18. Grabmann has found evidence that the misidentification occurred as early as the first half of the fifteenth century (1926: 116–25). And Duns Scotus is identified as its author in one of the earliest (1491) printed editions (Lorenz 1989: 321ff.).

19. A separate edition of the Wadding version of De modis significandi was printed in Garcia 1902.

20. The Wadding-Vivès edition has been made obsolete as the definitive text of many of Duns Scotus’s works by the critical edition of his Opera Omnia, which, unlike its predecessors, has been prepared according to modern editorial principles. His authentic commentaries on Porphyry’s Isagoge and Aristotle’s Categories may be found in Volume I of his Opera Philosophica (St. Bonaventure, NY: The Franciscan Institute, 1999), and his commentaries on Aristotle’s Sophistical Refutations and On Interpretation (both versions) in Volume II (St. Bonaventure, NY-Washington, DC: The Franciscan Institute and The Catholic University of America, 2004).

21. For discussion, see the editors’ introduction to B. Ioannis Duns Scoti, Quaestiones in Librum Porphyrii Isagoge et Quaestiones super Praedicamenta Aristotelis, ed. R. Andrews et al., Opera Philosophica I, (St. Bonaventure, NY: The Franciscan Institute, 1999): xxxi-xxxiv.

22. Markus Vinzent and Christopher M. Wojtulewicz (eds.): 2020, Meister Eckhart and Thomas of Erfurt: Modism and the Philosophy of Grammar, Leuven: Peeters.

23. Both, for example, understood logic as belonging to semiotics or the general theory of signs. For discussion, see Maurizio Ferriani, “Peirce’s Analysis of the Proposition: Grammatical and Logical Aspects,” in D. Buzzetti and M. Ferriani (eds.): 1987, Speculative Grammar, Universal Grammar and Philosophical Analysis of Language, John Benjamins, Amsterdam-Philadelphia.

24. Peirce viewed logic as a species of semiotics, but Thomas of Erfurt draws no conclusions at all about logic, which he would have regarded as a separate field of inquiry. For other areas in which Thomas might have influenced Peirce’s thinking, see Linde 2020.

25. Grabmann 1926: “Martin Heidegger hat den Gedankengang der bisher dem Duns Scotus zugeteilten Grammatica speculativa mit dem Terminologie und der ganzen geistigen Einstellung Husserls wiedergegeben, so daß das mittelalterliche Original in seiner Eigenart und Struktur etwas zurücktritt” (118).

26. Heidegger 1972: 245–6. An English translation of the entire work is available in Heidegger 2022. For recent discussions of Heidegger’s take on Thomas of Erfurt, see McGrath 2003, 2006, and 2016, and Quero-Sánchez 2020.

27. See Grabmann 1922. It is noteworthy that there were concerns about the authenticity of Duns Scotus’s logic within two centuries of his death. The early sixteenth-century logician Jacob Naveros found the inconsistencies between these texts and his commentary on the Sentences sufficient to doubt whether he had written any logical works at all (see E. J. Ashworth, “Jacobus Naveros (fl. ca. 1533) on the Question: ‘Do Spoken Words Signify Concepts or Things?’,” in Logos and Pragma. Essays on the Philosophy of Language in Honour of Professor Gabriel Nuchelmans, ed. L. M. de Rijk and H. A. G. Braakhuis (Nijmegen: Ingenium, 1987): 204). Modern editors have identified four works as authentic: the commentaries on Aristotle’s Categories, On Interpretation (two different versions), Sophistical Refutations, and Porphyry’s Isagoge

28. Heidegger does not ever seem to have acknowledged the mistake in print, despite having known Grabmann personally and despite having a splendid opportunity to set the record straight in his introduction to the 1972 reprint of Die Kategorien- und Bedeutungslehre des Duns Scotus. This seems to have precipitated needless confusion about his exact relation to Duns Scotus. For example, in a French translation of this work (Heidegger 1970), there is nary a word to suggest that he might have been commenting on anyone other than Duns Scotus. The translator remarks in the introduction that he was able to benefit on several points from correspondence with Heidegger himself. Evidently, the topic of the authenticity of De modis significandi never came up. I am grateful to Professor Sean McGrath for confirming my hunch about Heidegger on this point.

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