Thomas of Erfurt

First published Mon May 6, 2002; substantive revision Mon Sep 11, 2023

Thomas of Erfurt was the most influential member of a group of later medieval philosophers known as the speculative grammarians or Modistae (Modists), after the central place they assigned to the modi significandi (modes of signifying) of a word in their analyses of human discourse. The notion that a word, once it has been imposed to signify, carries with it all of its syntactical modes, or possible combinations with other words, had been around since the twelfth century. What the Modistae did was to posit the origins of the modi significandi in terms of parallel theories of modi intelligendi (modes of understanding) and modi essendi (modes of being). The result was a curious amalgam of philosophy, grammar, and linguistics. Thomas of Erfurt’s De modis significandi became the standard Modist textbook in the fourteenth century, though it has since enjoyed even greater fame later thanks to its misidentification as a work of Duns Scotus. The text appeared in early printed editions of Scotus’s Opera Omnia, where it was read and commented upon by later figures such as Charles S. Peirce and Martin Heidegger, whose 1916 doctoral thesis, Die Kategorien- und Bedeutungslehre des Duns Scotus, should have been titled, Die Kategorienlehre des Duns Scotus und die Bedeutungslehre des Thomas von Erfurt.

1. Life

Almost nothing is known about the life of Thomas of Erfurt except that he was active as a teacher and philosopher in the first quarter of the fourteenth century.[1] Presumably, he came from the city of Erfurt in present-day Germany. His work shows the influence of the Paris Arts Masters Radulphus Brito (ca. 1270–1320) and Siger of Courtrai (ca. 1280–1341), which suggests that he was educated and perhaps also taught at the University of Paris.[2] Later documents associate him with the school of St. Severus and the Schottenkloster of St. Jacob at Erfurt.[3] His most famous grammatical text, De modis significandi (On the Modes of Signifying) was known by 1310 and was already being commented upon by 1324. It is possible that he returned to Paris a number of times over the course of his academic career, although there are no records attesting to this.

Some copies of De modis significandi attribute the work to an early fourteenth-century English cleric named Thomas of Occam, but scholars have been skeptical about this because it occurs in just a handful fifteenth-century manuscripts.[4] The vast majority of the manuscript evidence, and all of the earliest witnesses, refer to its author as Thomas of Erfurt.

2. Writings

Six works have been attributed to Thomas of Erfurt. In addition to the aforementioned grammatical treatise, whose full title is Tractatus de modis significandi seu Grammatica speculativa (ed. Bursill-Hall 1972),[5] there are four short expositiones, or literal commentaries: on Porphyry’s Isagoge, Aristotle’s Categories, Aristotle’s De interpretatione, and the anonymous Liber sex principiorum (Book of Six Principles). Finally, there is a very brief work of mnemonic verses for teaching grammar to schoolboys, Commentarius in carmen ‘Fundamentum puerorum’ (ed. Gansiniec 1960), although its editor believes that it is actually an anonymous abridgement of De modis significandi. In any case, Thomas’s reputation derives from De modis significandi, which remains his only work to have been studied in detail.

De modis significandi proved to be so popular that it became the standard (and later, the representative) text for the Modist tradition (see next section), surviving in over 40 fourteenth- and fifteenth-century manuscripts. A printed edition appeared in the late fifteenth century that was reprinted a remarkable 11 times before its ‘definitive’ reprinting in Luke Wadding’s 1639 edition of the complete works of Duns Scotus.[6]

3. Modism

Thomas of Erfurt belonged to an interesting though somewhat obscure group of late thirteenth- and early fourteenth-century philosophers known as the speculative grammarians or Modistae. The term ‘speculative grammarian’ is ambiguous because it is also used by historians of medieval philosophy to refer to twelfth-century Parisian grammar masters such as William of Conches, Peter Helias, and Ralph of Beauvais, who systematically revised the ancient grammars of Donatus and Priscian — textbooks used to teach Latin to schoolboys — to produce a universal semantics.[7] The two groups are related, as it turns out, since these latter-day grammarians adopted many of the theories as well as the universalizing tendencies of their twelfth-century predecessors. Foremost among them was the theory of the modi significandi, or modes of signifying. The term ‘Modistae’ or ‘Modist’ properly refers to the later group.

There was already a grammatical concept of the modi significandi by the time the first Modistae, Martin of Dacia and Boethius of Dacia, appeared in Paris sometime before 1270.[8] Originally, the idea referred to the different ways in which a word or expression (dictio) is able to signify something. Words themselves are the product of a primary act of imposition by which a particular utterance is connected to some thing or property of a thing, the utterance providing the matter, which is said to be ‘informed’ by the act of imposition. The word acquires its modi significandi through a second act of imposition encoding all of the general syntactic roles it can play in connection with other words and expressions, such as the various parts of speech it can fulfill (e.g., noun, verb, adverb) and the grammatical forms of these parts (e.g., the gender, number, and case of nouns; the tense and mood of verbs). These modes are said to cause the various lexical forms exhibited by the word in spoken and written languages. Thus, Latin uses the word ‘canis’ to signify what English speakers mean by ‘dog’, but the same modes of signifying determine their function as singular and as nouns.[9] We might think of modi significandi metaphorically as hooks or fasteners on a word because they reflect its potential for combination with other words in propositions and other grammatically well-formed constructions.

It is easy to see how such an account of meaning could lead to a bona fide theory of grammar, what Jan Pinborg called “the first systematic syntax developed in western linguistics”.[10] Indeed, speculative grammarians of both periods have attracted the attention of linguists and philosophers alike.[11] But the stakes were higher for the Modistae because the influx of Aristotle’s writings on metaphysics and natural philosophy in the late twelfth and early thirteenth centuries forced everyone to think in terms of a new paradigm of knowledge. Could grammar be reconceived as the science of language (scientia sermocinalis)? The question here was whether grammar could count as an Aristotelian speculative science, i.e., whether it is demonstrative in the sense of being a knowledge-producing activity ordained by a single subject whose principles are universal and necessary.[12] Concerns of this sort clearly underlie Boethius of Dacia’s appraisal of traditional grammar:

subjects in which a demonstrative mode of knowing is possible are seldom taught in a demonstrative way, but descriptively [sed modo narrativo] … That is why Priscian states many conclusions for which he offers no reasons, but merely the authority of ancient grammarians. Accordingly, he does not teach, for only those who offer reasons for what they say are teachers.[13]

Thomas of Erfurt indicates in the opening lines of De modis significativis that he aims to be one of these teachers:

The rationale of the method. Since in all science, to understand and to know come about from the knowledge of principles, as is written in I Physics, text comment 1, therefore, wishing to have knowledge of the science of grammar, it is primarily necessary for us to dwell upon all of its primary per se principles of which modes are the modes of signifying. But before knowledge is sought after in the particulars, there are certain things to be set out in advance in general, without which it is not possible to have the fullest understanding of them. (DMS, Preamble; Bursill-Hall: 1)

For Modistae such as Boethius of Dacia and Thomas of Erfurt, the proper subject of grammar is well-formed, significant speech (sermo congrue significativus), the principles of which are expressed in the modi significandi.

But this is where things get interesting, for the Modistae also understood the theory of the modi significandi to involve claims about the nature of thought and reality. The problem with Priscian, as twelfth-century grammarians had pointed out, is that he said nothing about what causes the different parts of speech. Hence the need for a theory of the modi significandi. But the Modistae saw that this could only be part of the answer, for grammar is a linguistic phenomenon, and linguistic phenomena must have a cause within the natural order of things. Therefore, to complete the explanation, they argued that the formal structure of the modi significandi owes its existence to modi intelligendi, or modes of understanding, which in turn are caused by modi essendi, or the modes of being a thing can exhibit outside the mind.

The heart of the Modist project is the assumption that there is a triadic or parallel relationship between word, concept, and thing. Meaning is based proximately on understanding but ultimately on being. According to Thomas of Erfurt:

Every mode of signifying is from some property of the thing. Concerning the second thing to be noted, that since such notions or modes of signifying are not fictions, it must be that every mode of signifying radically originates from some property of the thing. This is plain thus: since the intellect, in order to signify, imposes the voice under some mode of signifying, it considers the property itself of the thing from which it originally drew the mode of signifying; this is because the intellect, since it is a passive power indeterminate of itself, does not advance to a determinate act unless it is determined from another source. Whence since it imposes the voice in order to signify under the determinate mode of signifying, it is necessarily moved by a determinate property of the thing; therefore some property of a thing, or mode of being of a thing, corresponds to any mode of signifying. (DMS, 2.4; Bursill-Hall: 3)

Note the phrase, “since such notions or modes of signifying are not fictions.” The modi significandi could not play any causal role in determining the parts of speech, nor the corresponding modi intelligendi in determining the modi significandi, nor the modi essendi in determining the modi intelligendi, unless they all actually exist. Here the Modistae drew on the Aristotelian idea that although spoken sounds and written marks differ from language to language, “what these are in the first place signs of — affections of the soul — are the same for all; and what these affections are likenesses of — actual things — are also the same” (De interpretatione 1.16a3–9).[14] Likewise, the ordering of modes was intended to replicate the ordering of disciplines in an Aristotelian speculative science: just as psychology, the study of moving things qua animate, is subordinate to physics, the study of things qua moving, and physics is subordinate to metaphysics, the study of things qua existing, so the principles of grammar (modi significandi) are derived from mental acts of signifying (modi intelligendi), which reflect the way things really are (modi essendi).

Tidy conceptual schemes tend to become less so when confronted with the empirical facts, and the Modistae spent a great deal of time trying to explain recalcitrant linguistic data. After sketching the origins of the modi significandi in the first chapters of his treatise, Thomas immediately considers a few objections: how can ‘goddess [dea]’ be signified with a feminine noun, which connotes passivity? Answer: a mode of signifying need not always be drawn from the thing signified, for sometimes it “can be taken from the property of the thing of another utterance;” thus, when we say ‘in God’, we do not mean to attribute passivity to God, who suffers not, but only to “imagine him as if being affected by our prayers.” When we use a passive or feminine mode of signifying in relation to God, what we are really doing is signifying our own passive or feminine conception of some other thing that is a genuine recipient, i.e., something that does correspond to a determinate mode of being qua recipient, and then imposing the same word to signify God. In the same way, we impose names on things we cannot sense via the properties of sensible things, thereby attributing “active modes of signifying to their names” (DMS 2.5; Bursill-Hall: 4).

But what about words signifying fictions, such as ‘chimera’, or privations, such as ‘blindness’? These do not correspond to any mode of being, active or passive, since they signify nothing (i.e., no thing). According to Thomas, the active modes of signifying chimeras “are taken from the parts from which we imagine a chimera to be composed, which [fiction] we imagine from the head of a lion, the tail of a dragon, etc” (DMS 2.5; Bursill-Hall: 4). Names of privations, on the other hand, “designate the modes of understanding of privations, which are their modes of being, through their own active modes of signifying about privations”. The idea here is that ‘blindness’ corresponds to our positive concept of sight qua absent, which enjoys a positive modus essendi in our intellects. Thus, “although privations are not positive beings outside the soul, they are nevertheless positive beings in the soul … and since the understanding of them is their being, therefore, their mode of understanding would be their mode of being” (DMS 2.6; Bursill-Hall: 4). Blindness outside the soul cannot cause any conception of itself per se, since blindness per se does not exist, and what does not exist cannot be the cause of anything. Accordingly, when we say, ‘Homer was a blind man,’ the word ‘blind’ actively signifies the passive mode of understanding something as being without sight, and owes its semantic function to the way its corresponding concept is understood. In the case of concepts that are neither fictions nor privations, these modes of understanding are further determined by their corresponding modes of being, i.e., by actual substances and properties outside the soul.

For the Modistae, then, the words ‘chimera’ and ‘horse’ differ, but only in terms of the complexity of their underlying modes. Thomas follows Siger of Courtrai in distinguishing between active and passive modi significandi/modi intelligendi to explain the difference between the act of signifying/understanding (materially construed as a property of the utterance/concept) and the object signified/understood (materially construed as a property of the thing signified/understood). The fact that nothing answers to the name ‘chimera’ simply does not matter. Modism was a theory about meaning (significatio) of a word as opposed to its reference (suppositio), and reference was regarded as something determined by logicians. Besides, if grammatical truths are universal and necessary — i.e., if there really is a science of grammar — then they cannot be altered by the fact that there are no chimeras. It is the assumption that some palpable phenomenon must underlie every grammatical truth, causing it to be the way it is, which guides Thomas’s discussion in the remainder of the treatise, which soon moves on to more practical matters such as the different parts of speech (‘Etymologia’) and their syntax (‘Diasynthetica’). Included in the latter are the concepts of constructio (the syntactic joining of one word to another), congruitas (the proper formation of such constructions), and perfectio (the proper formation of complete expressions).

Modist explanations of semantic phenomena tended to be extremely complicated. Indeed, if we consider the manifold ways in which a word can be a signifier together with its potential for combination with other words in expressions, there could be infinitely many modi significandi — a proliferation of modes repeated all over again at the level of modi intelligendi. Philosophers today think of Meinong’s theory of objects as a paradigm of ontological incontinence. These philosophers have never met the Modistae, who would make even Meinong seem parsimonious. But in a way this is unfair, of course, since the Modistae were not ontologists and had no interest in the ontological consequences of their theories. They were first and foremost concerned with the phenomenon of linguistic meaning, and invoked whatever entities they felt could best explain what they observed.

Thomas’s De modis significandi was the last work to develop Modist doctrine to any significant degree.[15] Its clarity and relative brevity led to its adoption as the standard Modist text in medieval universities, replacing the earlier Modi significandi of Martin of Dacia. But by 1330 and for reasons that remain unclear, Modism had completely disappeared from Paris, pushed aside by the more powerful and comprehensive approach of the Summulae de dialectica of John Buridan (ca. 1300–1361).[16] Modism was never able to overcome certain difficulties, such as its refusal to recognize extra-linguistic context, as a result of which it could not explain how meaning can be communicated via incongruous or imperfect expressions.[17] But the most likely reason for its demise was that it no longer provided satisfying explanations of the phenomena it was supposed to explain. The one thing it could do, provide an account of the syntax of Latin grammar, could be achieved more economically by other means. In addition, the theory became absurdly complicated in order to save the phenomena of the modi significandi, suggesting that the modi finally collapsed under their own weight, like so many Ptolemaic epicycles.

4. Influence

Thomas of Erfurt’s De modis significandi has enjoyed more attention than it might otherwise have received thanks to its early misidentification as a work of Duns Scotus.[18] As a result, it was printed along with authentic works on logic in volume 1 of Luke Wadding’s seventeenth-century edition of the Opera Omnia of Duns Scotus (Lyons 1639), and again in the nineteenth-century reprint of Wadding by Juan-Luis Vivès (Paris 1891).[19] Until recently, the Wadding-Vivès edition was the definitive source for the works of Scotus, so anyone consulting it would have associated De modis significandi with him.[20] Complicating the story somewhat is the fact that Scotus was influenced by Modism early in his career, though this was probably due to his exposure to Modist authors such as Simon of Faversham and Andrew of Cornwall.[21] It is unlikely that he was influenced by Thomas of Erfurt, because De modis significandi did not circulate widely until after Scotus’s death.

Thomas of Erfurt had a famous contemporary, Meister Eckhart (c. 1260–1328), the German Dominican philosopher and mystical theologian. Meister Eckhart was not only present in Erfurt at roughly the same time as Thomas, but also lived only a few streets away. It seems incredible that they could not have known each other personally and academically, though there is no explicit evidence that they did. Despite this, there is indirect evidence that Meister Eckhart was influenced by Thomas in his grammatical approach to interpreting scripture. Their intellectual relationship is the subject of a recent volume of essays.[22]

One of the many later figures to have unwittingly admired Thomas was the American philosopher, Charles Sanders Peirce (1839–1914), who regarded Duns Scotus as a fellow traveler in metaphysics and whose own semiotic theory resembles the Modist program in certain respects.[23] Peirce quotes verbatim the first six chapters of De modis significandis in an 1869 lecture comparing (what he took to be) the views of Duns Scotus and William of Ockham on names and signification. But the lecture is introductory in character, leaving it uncertain whether Peirce fully appreciated what was at stake in Modistic grammar, rather than viewing it, say, as some sort of linguistic addendum to Scotus’s metaphysics.[24]

Another figure so influenced was Martin Heidegger, whose Habilitationsschrift was published in 1916 under the title, Die Kategorien- und Bedeutungslehre des Duns Scotus. This book is only beginning to be studied by Heidegger scholars, which is a pity because it is really about Heidegger’s own project of advancing the Husserlian notion of a priori grammar. A work of historical scholarship it is not. In what now seems a classic understatement, the historian of medieval philosophy Martin Grabmann wrote of this book in 1926, “Martin Heidegger has demonstrated the continuity of the Grammatica speculativa hitherto attributed to Duns Scotus with the terminology and overall intellectual outlook of Husserl, so that the structure and distinctiveness of the medieval original is somewhat obscured”.[25] In his defense, Heidegger never pretends to be doing history of philosophy in Die Kategorien- und Bedeutungslehre des Duns Scotus. On the contrary, he states at the beginning of Part II that he is mostly interested in exploring the implications of De modis significandi for the broader theory of meaning, and that he is following scholarly consensus in attributing it to Duns Scotus.[26]

In 1922, however, Grabmann conclusively demonstrated that it was Thomas of Erfurt who wrote De modis significandi, not Duns Scotus.[27] So the claim that Heidegger wrote his Habilitationsschrift on Duns Scotus is only partly true. The first half, die Kategorienlehre, is correctly addressed to Scotus’s theory of the categories as developed in his authentic commentaries on Porphyry’s Isagoge, and Aristotle’s Categories and De sophisticis elenchis. But the second half, die Bedeutungslehre, is based almost entirely on Thomas of Erfurt.[28]

For more recent influence, we need look no further than Jacques Derrida, who mentions Thomas of Erfurt (this time dressed as himself) in connection with the old Peircean idea that logic is a branch of semiotics: “As in Husserl (but the analogy, although it is most thought-provoking, would stop there and one must apply it carefully), the lowest level, the foundation of the possibility of logic (or semiotics) corresponds to the project of the Grammatica speculativa of Thomas d’Erfurt, falsely attributed to Duns Scotus” (1976: 48). What impresses Derrida is not so much the reduction of logic to grammar as the deconstructive potential of Husserl’s phenomenology of signs. The idea of deconstructing the science of language would have struck Thomas as absurd, of course, though he probably would have felt some affinity with the highly variegated notion of the sign in modern semiotics.


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