Supplement to Environmental Ethics

Pathologies of Environmental Crisis – Theories and Empirical Research

Part of environmental philosophy’s project since its inception is the diagnosis of the origins of our present-day environmental extremities. The best known of these is probably Lynn White’s theory. As seen in section 2 above, White argues that Judæo-Christian monotheism, because of its essentially anthropocentric attitude towards nature, is the ideological source of the modern environmental crisis. At the heart of his philosophical cum cultural-historical analysis seems to be a simple structure:

W1. Christianity leads to anthropocentrism.
W2. Anthropocentrism leads to environmentally damaging behaviours.
W3. So, Christianity is the origin of environmental crisis.

The second premise of White’s argument also seems to have a central place in a number of rival diagnoses. In fact, the structure of the major theories in the field is regularly of this sort: (1) X leads to anthropocentrism, (2) anthropocentrism leads to environmentally damaging behaviours; therefore (3) X is the origin of environmental crisis. Three other well-known cases have already been discussed (section 3 above), namely: ecofeminism (which identifies X with those patterns of thought that are characteristically patriarchal), deep ecology (which takes X to be atomistic individualism), and the new animism (which regards the disenchantment of nature as the X-factor).

The four theories all seem to have one view in common: that anthropocentrism is at the heart of the problem of environmental destructiveness. If anthropocentrism is the problem, then perhaps non-anthropocentrism is the solution. At this point, it may be helpful to separate two theses of non-anthropocentrism, ones that are not normally distinguished in the literature:

The evaluative thesis (of non-anthropocentrism) is the claim that natural non-human things have intrinsic value, i.e., value in their own right independent of any use they have for others.

The psycho-behavioural thesis (of non-anthropocentrism) is the claim that people who believe in the evaluative thesis of non-anthropocentrism are more likely to behave environmentally (i.e., behave in beneficial ways, or at least not in harmful ways, towards the environment) than those who do not.

Much of the last three decades of environmental ethics has been spent analysing, clarifying and examining the evaluative thesis of non-anthropocentrism, which has now achieved a nearly canonical status within the discipline. By contrast, the psycho-behavioural thesis is seldom discussed, but is part of the tacit background of environmental ethics. When it does get explicit mention this is often in the introductions or prefaces of books, or in reference works – for example, when it is said that deep ecology’s “greatest influence … may be through the diverse forms of environmental activism that it inspires” (Taylor and Zimmerman 2005, compare Rolston 1988, xii, Sessions 1995, xx-xxi, and Sylvan and Bennett 1994, 4–5). If the psycho-behavioural thesis is true, then it is important in two ways: (1) it provides a rationale for both the diagnosis and solution of environmental problems, and (2) it gives practical justification to the discipline of environmental ethics itself (conceived as the mission to secure converts to the evaluative thesis of non-anthropocentrism). Conversely, if the psycho-behavioural thesis turns out to be false, then—since the thesis is the common tacit assumption of all four theories—not only the discipline itself, but also the four major diagnostic theories of the origin of the environmental predicament will be seriously undermined .

Central to the psycho-behavioural thesis is a problematic assumption: that if people believe they have a moral duty to respect nature or believe that natural things are intrinsically valuable, then they really will act in more environmental-friendly ways. This empirical question cannot be answered by purely a priori philosophical reasoning. In fact, the other core premises in the four major philosophical theories on the origin of environmental crisis are also empirical claims about social and cultural reality. To be credible, they must be able to stand up to empirical testing. For example, are people who think in dualistic and hierarchical ways (as described by feminists) in fact more likely to have anthropocentric attitudes and more likely to act harmfully towards the environment? Are people who believe in animism (as panpsychists argue) in fact less likely to have anthropocentric attitudes and also less likely to harm the environment? What about people who adopt some relational or holistic view of the world, as advocated by deep ecologists? How do they act toward nature compared to those who adopt a more individualistic and atomistic worldview? These questions about the relations among various belief systems and behaviours look no different in kind from the sorts of questions that social scientists regularly ask.

Of the major philosophical theories on the origin of environmental crisis, Lynn White’s is the only one to have been empirically tested by social scientists. The net result of these studies so far has been “inconclusive”, especially when education, sex, age and social class are also factored in (Shaiko 1987, Greeley 1993, Woodrum and Hoban 1994, Eckberg and Blocker 1996, Boyd 1999). Moreover, like their philosophical counterparts, environmental sociologists often take the psycho-behavioural thesis of non-anthropocentrism for granted. Some of the best-known and most widely used survey instruments in the field are also problematic. Riley Dunlap and collaborators developed many years ago the “New Environmental Paradigm” (NEP) scale, to measure pro-environmental attitudes (Dunlap and van Liere 1978). That scale, and its later revisions (see Dunlap et al. 2000), is problematic precisely because it explicitly uses indicators of beliefs in anthropocentrism to measure the presence of un-environmental attitudes, thus assuming in advance that anthropocentric beliefs are harmful to the environment. But whether that is so should be settled by empirical investigation rather than by an act of a priori stipulation in survey design.

Despite the fact that there is a striking common underlying structure between White’s theory and the other major theories discussed above, no sociological studies so far have been done on the other theories, nor on the common underlying psycho-behavioural thesis of non-anthropocentrism and its effects. This presents an opportunity for interdisciplinary collaborations among philosophers and social scientists. Many tools and methods well established in the social sciences can justifiably be adapted for use in research on environmental philosophy, giving the subject an empirical or even experimental turn. Such work may stimulate new ideas about the origins of our environmental pathologies, and for testing the extent to which belief systems and worldviews actually drive attitudes and behaviours. As long as empirical facts are relevant to philosophical and ethical thought, adoption of social science methods will be a means of keeping our theorising in touch with the motivations and behaviours of the people we are trying to describe and influence.

Similar points about the role of empirical investigations can also be made about theorizing over a range of other problems, including drought, the preservation of biodiversity, and climate change. While it has become commonplace to refer to the present era as “the age of terror”, there is increasing agreement across the entire globe that the world is facing chronic and unprecedented environmental problems, many of them of human origin. Indeed, the United States military, responding to an albeit speculative report on abrupt climate change prepared for the Pentagon by the Global Business Network (see Schwartz and Randall 2003, in the Other Internet Resources section below), have declared that the problems of adjustment to climate change constitute a far more severe threat to national and international security than does terrorism itself. Drought, changing weather patterns, the expected burden of caring for environmental refugees, the effects of consumerism, and the health decline associated with various forms of pollution are continuing and major problems for human beings themselves (see Shue 2001, Sagoff 2001, Thompson 2001), and raise crucial issues about environmental justice (see Shrader-Frechette 2002). At the same time, the continuing destruction of natural environments and the widespread loss of both plant and animal species poses increasing problems for other forms of life on the planet. In facing these problems, there will likely be great opportunities for co-operation and synergy between philosophers and both natural and social scientists.

Like many other important and interesting questions, no single discipline could claim sole ownership of those just raised about the origins of modern environmental crisis and the quandaries we now face, the relation between environmental problems and social injustice, and the vexed question of how human beings should relate to the natural environment in their pursuit of happiness and well-being. The move away from armchair speculation to link up with a wider community of inquiry may be inevitable not only in environmental ethics but in all areas of practical philosophy.

Copyright © 2015 by
Andrew Brennan <>
Yeuk-Sze Lo <>

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