Environmental Ethics

First published Mon Jun 3, 2002; substantive revision Fri Dec 3, 2021

Environmental ethics is the discipline in philosophy that studies the moral relationship of human beings to, and also the value and moral status of, the environment and its non-human contents. This entry covers: (1) the challenge of environmental ethics to the anthropocentrism (i.e., human-centeredness) embedded in traditional western ethical thinking; (2) the development of the discipline from the 1960s and 1970s; (3) the connection of deep ecology, feminist environmental ethics, animism and social ecology to politics; (4) the attempt to apply traditional ethical theories, including consequentialism, deontology, and virtue ethics, to support contemporary environmental concerns; (5) the broader concerns of some thinkers with wilderness, the built environment and the politics of poverty; and (6) the ethics of sustainability and climate change.

1. Introduction: The Challenge of Environmental Ethics

Suppose putting out natural fires, culling feral animals or removing some individual members of overpopulated species is necessary for the protection of the integrity of a certain ecosystem. Will these actions be morally permissible or even required? Is it morally acceptable for farmers in non-industrial countries to practise slash and burn techniques to clear areas for agriculture? Consider a mining company which has performed open pit mining in some previously unspoiled area. Does the company have a moral obligation to restore the landform and surface ecology? And what is the value of a humanly restored environment compared with the originally natural environment? Many people think that it is morally wrong for human beings to pollute and destroy parts of the natural environment and to consume a huge proportion of the planet’s natural resources. If that is wrong, is it simply because a sustainable environment is essential to human existence and well-being? Or is such behaviour also wrong because the natural environment and/or its various contents have certain values in their own right so that these values ought to be respected and protected in any case? These are among the questions investigated by environmental ethics. Some of them are specific questions faced by individuals in particular circumstances, while others are more global questions faced by groups and communities. Yet others are more abstract questions concerning the value and moral standing of the natural environment and its non-human components.

In the literature on environmental ethics the distinction between instrumental value and intrinsic value (in the sense of “non-instrumental value”) is of considerable importance. The former is the value of things as means to further some other ends, whereas the latter is the value of things as ends in themselves regardless of whether they are also useful as means to other ends. For instance, certain fruits have instrumental value for bats who feed on them, since feeding on the fruits is a means to survival for the bats. However, it is not widely agreed that fruits have value as ends in themselves. We can likewise think of a person who teaches others as having instrumental value for those who want to acquire knowledge. Yet, in addition to any such value, it is normally said that a person, as a person, has intrinsic value, i.e., value in their own right independently of their prospects for serving the ends of others. For another example, a certain wild plant may have instrumental value because it provides the ingredients for some medicine or as an aesthetic object for human observers. But if the plant also has some value in itself independently of its prospects for furthering some other ends such as human health, or the pleasure from aesthetic experience, then the plant also has intrinsic value. Because the intrinsically valuable is that which is good as an end in itself, it is commonly agreed that something’s possession of intrinsic value generates a prima facie direct moral duty on the part of moral agents to protect it or at least refrain from damaging it (see O’Neil 1992 and Jamieson 2002 for detailed accounts of intrinsic value).

Many traditional western ethical perspectives, however, are anthropocentric or human-centered in that either they assign intrinsic value to human beings alone (i.e., what we might call anthropocentric in a strong sense) or they assign a significantly greater amount of intrinsic value to human beings than to any non-human things such that the protection or promotion of human interests or well-being at the expense of non-human things turns out to be nearly always justified (i.e., what we might call anthropocentric in a weak sense). For example, Aristotle (Politics, Bk. 1, Ch. 8) apparently maintains that “nature has made all things specifically for the sake of man”. Such purposive or teleological thinking may encourage the belief that the value of non-human things in nature is merely instrumental. It is difficult for anthropocentric positions to articulate what is wrong with the cruel treatment of non-human animals, except to the extent that such treatment may lead to bad consequences for human beings. Immanuel Kant (“Duties to Animals and Spirits”, in Lectures on Ethics), for instance, suggests that cruelty towards a dog might encourage a person to develop a character which would be desensitized to cruelty towards humans. From this standpoint, cruelty towards non-human animals would be instrumentally, rather than intrinsically, wrong. Likewise, anthropocentrism often recognizes some non-intrinsic wrongness of anthropogenic (i.e. human-caused) environmental devastation. Such destruction might damage the well-being of human beings now and in the future, since our very existence and well-being is essentially dependent on a sustainable environment. This argument was made in the previous century (see Passmore 1974; Bookchin 1990; Norton et al. (eds.) 1995), and seems subsequently to have garnered wide public support (see the results of surveys in Pew 2018).

When environmental ethics emerged as a new sub-discipline of philosophy in the early 1970s, it did so by posing a challenge to traditional anthropocentrism. In the first place, it questioned the assumed moral superiority of human beings to members of other species on earth. In the second place, it investigated the possibility of rational arguments for assigning intrinsic value to the natural environment and its non-human contents. It should be noted, however, that some theorists working in the field see no need to develop new, non-anthropocentric theories. Instead, they advocate what may be called enlightened anthropocentrism (or, perhaps more appropriately called, prudential anthropocentrism). Briefly, this is the view that all the moral duties we have towards the environment are derived from our direct duties to its human inhabitants. The practical purpose of environmental ethics, they maintain, is to provide moral grounds for social policies aimed at protecting the earth’s environment and remedying environmental degradation. Enlightened anthropocentrism, they argue, is sufficient for that practical purpose, and perhaps even more effective in delivering pragmatic outcomes, in terms of policy-making, than non-anthropocentric theories given the theoretical burden on the latter to provide sound arguments for its more radical view that the non-human environment has intrinsic value (cf. Norton 1991, de Shalit 1994, Light and Katz 1996). Furthermore, some prudential anthropocentrists may hold what might be called cynical anthropocentrism, which says that we have a higher-level anthropocentric reason to be non-anthropocentric in our day-to-day thinking. Suppose that a day-to-day non-anthropocentrist tends to act more benignly towards the non-human environment on which human well-being depends. This would provide reason for encouraging non-anthropocentric thinking, even to those who find the idea of non-anthropocentric intrinsic value hard to swallow. In order for such a strategy to be effective one may need to hide one’s cynical anthropocentrism from others and even from oneself. The position can be structurally compared to some indirect form of consequentialism and may attract parallel critiques (see Henry Sidgwick on utilitarianism and esoteric morality, and Bernard Williams on indirect utilitarianism).

2. The Development of Environmental Ethics

Although nature was the focus of much nineteenth and twentieth century philosophy, contemporary environmental ethics only emerged as an academic discipline in the 1970s. The questioning and rethinking of the relationship of human beings with the natural environment over the last thirty years reflected an already widespread perception in the 1960s that the late twentieth century faced a human population explosion as part of a serious environmental crisis. Among the accessible work that drew attention to a sense of crisis was Rachel Carson’s Silent Spring (1963), which consisted of a number of essays earlier published in the New Yorker magazine detailing how pesticides such as DDT, aldrin and dieldrin concentrated through the food web. Commercial farming practices using these chemicals to maximize crop yields and profits, Carson speculates, are capable of impacting simultaneously on environmental and public health. Their use, she claims, can have the side effects of killing other living things (besides the targeted insects) and causing human disease. While Carson correctly fears that over-use of pesticides may lead to increases in some resistant insect species, the intensification of agriculture, land-clearing and massive use of neonicotonoid pesticides has subsequently contributed to a situation in which, according to some reviews, nearly half of insect species are threatened with extinction (Sánchez-Bayo and Wickhuys 2019, and compare van der Sluijs and Vaage 2016, Komonen, Halme and Kotiaho 2019). Declines in insect populations not only threaten pollination of plant species, but may also be responsible for huge declines in some bird populations (Goulson 2021) and appear to go hand in hand with cascading extinctions across ecosystems worldwide (Kehoe, Frago and Sanders 2021).

In a much cited essay (White 1967) on the historical roots of the environmental crisis, historian Lynn White argued that the main strands of Judeo-Christian thinking had encouraged the overexploitation of nature by maintaining the superiority of humans over all other forms of life on earth, and by depicting all of nature as created for the use of humans. White’s thesis was widely discussed in theology, history, and has been subject to some sociological testing as well as being regularly discussed by philosophers (see Whitney 1993, Attfield 2001). Central to the rationale for his thesis were the works of the Church Fathers and The Bible itself, supporting the anthropocentric perspective that humans are the only things on Earth that matter in themselves. Consequently, they may utilize and consume everything else to their advantage without any injustice. For example, Genesis 1: 27–8 states: “God created man in his own image, in the image of God created he him; male and female created he them. And God blessed them, and God said unto them, Be fruitful, and multiply, and replenish the earth, and subdue it: and have dominion over fish of the sea, and over fowl of the air, and over every living thing that moveth upon the earth.” Likewise, Thomas Aquinas (Summa Contra Gentiles, Bk. 3, Pt 2, Ch 112) argued that non-human animals are “ordered to man’s use”. According to White, the Judeo-Christian idea that humans are created in the image of the transcendent supernatural God, who is radically separate from nature, also by extension radically separates humans themselves from nature. This ideology further opened the way for untrammeled exploitation of nature. Modern Western science itself, White argued, was “cast in the matrix of Christian theology” so that it too inherited the “orthodox Christian arrogance toward nature” (White 1967: 1207). Clearly, without technology and science, the environmental extremes to which we are now exposed would probably not be realized. The point of White’s thesis, however, is that given the modern form of science and technology, Judeo-Christianity itself provides the original deep-seated drive to unlimited exploitation of nature. Nevertheless, White argued that some minority traditions within Christianity (e.g., the views of St. Francis) might provide an antidote to the “arrogance” of a mainstream tradition steeped in anthropocentrism. This sentiment is echoed in later Christian writings on attitudes to nature (see for example Berry 2018, chs 10, 11, and compare Zaheva and Szasz 2015).

Around the same time, the Stanford ecologists Paul and Anne Ehrlich warned in The Population Bomb (Ehrlich 1968) that the growth of human population threatened the viability of planetary life-support systems. The sense of environmental crisis stimulated by those and other popular works was intensified by NASA’s production and wide dissemination of a particularly potent image of Earth from space taken at Christmas 1968 and featured in the Scientific American in September 1970. Here, plain to see, was a living, shining planet voyaging through space and shared by all of humanity, a precious vessel vulnerable to pollution and to the overuse of its limited capacities. In 1972 a team of researchers at MIT led by Donella Meadows published the Limits to Growth study, a work that summed up in many ways the emerging concerns of the previous decade and the sense of vulnerability triggered by the view of the earth from space. In the commentary to the study, the researchers wrote:

We affirm finally that any deliberate attempt to reach a rational and enduring state of equilibrium by planned measures, rather than by chance or catastrophe, must ultimately be founded on a basic change of values and goals at individual, national and world levels. (Meadows et al. 1972: 195)

The call for a “basic change of values” in connection to the environment (a call that could be interpreted in terms of either instrumental or intrinsic values) reflected a need for the development of environmental ethics as a new sub-discipline of philosophy. The aim of facing up to the challenge of limited resources was fostered subsequently by studies of the growing human “ecological footprint” on the earth (Rees 1992, Wackernagel et al. 2018) and by the exploration of “planetary boundaries” and the concept of a “safe operating space for humanity” (Rokström et al. 2009, Biermann and Kim 2020).

The new field emerged almost simultaneously in three countries—the United States, Australia, and Norway. In the first two of these countries, direction and inspiration largely came from the earlier twentieth century American literature of the environment. For instance, the Scottish emigrant John Muir (founder of the Sierra Club and “father of American conservation”) and subsequently the forester Aldo Leopold had advocated an appreciation and conservation of things “natural, wild and free”. Their concerns were motivated by a combination of ethical and aesthetic responses to nature as well as a rejection of crudely economic approaches to the value of natural objects (a historical survey of the confrontation between Muir’s reverentialism and the human-centred conservationism of Gifford Pinchot (one of the major influences on the development of the US Forest Service) is provided in Norton 1991; also see Cohen 1984 and Nash (ed) 1990). Leopold’s A Sand County Almanac (1949), in particular, advocated the adoption of a “land ethic”:

That land is a community is the basic concept of ecology, but that land is to be loved and respected is an extension of ethics. (Leopold 1949: vii–ix)

A thing is right when it tends to preserve the integrity, stability, and beauty of the biotic community. It is wrong when it tends otherwise. (Leopold 1949: 224–5)

However, Leopold himself provided no systematic ethical theory or framework to support these ethical ideas concerning the environment. His views therefore presented a challenge and opportunity for moral theorists: could some ethical theory be devised to justify the injunction to preserve the integrity, stability and beauty of the biosphere?

The land ethic sketched by Leopold, attempting to extend our moral concern to cover the natural environment and its non-human contents, was drawn on explicitly by the Australian philosopher Richard Routley (later Sylvan). According to Routley (1973 (cf. Routley and Routley 1980)), the anthropocentrism imbedded in what he called the “dominant western view”, or “the western superethic”, is in effect “human chauvinism”. This view, he argued, is just another form of class chauvinism, which is simply based on blind class “loyalty” or prejudice, and unjustifiably discriminates against those outside the privileged class. Echoing the plot of a popular movie some three years earlier (see Lo and Brennan 2013), Routley speculates in his “last man” (and “last people”) arguments about a hypothetical situation in which the last person, surviving a world catastrophe, acts to ensure the elimination of all other living things and the last people set about destroying forests and ecosystems after their demise. From the human-chauvinistic (or absolutely anthropocentric) perspective, the last person would do nothing morally wrong, since his or her destructive act in question would not cause any damage to the interests and well-being of humans, who would by then have disappeared. Nevertheless, Routley points out that there is a moral intuition that the imagined last acts would be morally wrong. An explanation for this judgment, he argues, is that those non-human objects in the environment, whose destruction is ensured by the last person or last people, have intrinsic value, a kind of value independent of their usefulness for humans. From his critique, Routley concluded that the main approaches in traditional western moral thinking were unable to allow the recognition that natural things have intrinsic value, and that the tradition required overhaul of a significant kind.

Leopold’s idea that the “land” as a whole is an object of our moral concern also stimulated writers to argue for certain moral obligations toward ecological wholes, such as species, communities, and ecosystems, not just their individual constituents. The U.S.-based theologian and environmental philosopher Holmes Rolston III, for instance, argued that species protection was a moral duty (Rolston 1975). It would be wrong, he maintained, to eliminate a rare butterfly species simply to increase the monetary value of specimens already held by collectors. Like Routley’s “last man” arguments, Rolston’s example is meant to draw attention to a kind of action that seems morally dubious and yet is not clearly ruled out or condemned by traditional anthropocentric ethical views. Species, Rolston went on to argue, are intrinsically valuable and are usually more valuable than individual specimens, since the loss of a species is a loss of genetic possibilities and the deliberate destruction of a species would show disrespect for the very biological processes which make possible the emergence of individual living things (also see Rolston 1989, Ch 10). Natural processes deserve respect, according to Rolston’s quasi-religious perspective, because they constitute a nature (or God) which is itself intrinsically valuable (or sacred).

Meanwhile, the work of Christopher Stone (a professor of law at the University of Southern California) had become widely discussed. Stone (1972) proposes that trees and other natural objects should have at least the same standing in law as corporations. This suggestion was inspired by a particular case in which the Sierra Club had mounted a challenge against the permit granted by the U.S. Forest Service to Walt Disney Enterprises for surveys preparatory to the development of the Mineral King Valley, which was at the time a relatively remote game refuge, but not designated as a national park or protected wilderness area. The Disney proposal was to develop a major resort complex serving 14000 visitors daily to be accessed by a purpose-built highway through Sequoia National Park. The Sierra Club, as a body with a general concern for wilderness conservation, challenged the development on the grounds that the valley should be kept in its original state for its own sake.

Stone reasoned that if trees, forests and mountains could be given standing in law then they could be represented in their own right in the courts by groups such as the Sierra Club. Moreover, like any other legal person, these natural things could become beneficiaries of compensation if it could be shown that they had suffered compensatable injury through human activity. When the case went to the U.S. Supreme Court, it was determined by a narrow majority that the Sierra Club did not meet the condition for bringing a case to court, for the Club was unable and unwilling to prove the likelihood of injury to the interest of the Club or its members. In dissenting minority judgments, however, justices Douglas, Blackmun and Brennan mentioned Stone’s argument: his proposal to give legal standing to natural things, they said, would allow conservation interests, community needs and business interests to be represented, debated and settled in court. Stone’s work was later cited in the successful arguments to grant personhood to rivers and other natural features in various parts of the world. In some of these cases, Stone’s arguments—along with those of Arne Næss (see below)—have been said to provide analogues to indigenous understandings of the intrinsic value of the land and the interconnections of such understandings with human actions and ancestral spirituality (Morris and Ruru 2010, Kramm 2020). Similar suggestions have also been made about Leopold’s work, but such claims need to be interpreted with caution (White 2015).

Reacting to Stone’s proposal, Joel Feinberg (1974) raised a serious problem. Only items that have interests, Feinberg argued, can be regarded as having legal standing and, likewise, moral standing. For it is interests which are capable of being represented in legal proceedings and moral debates. This same point would also seem to apply to political debates. For instance, the movement for “animal liberation”, which also emerged strongly in the 1970s, can be thought of as a political movement aimed at representing the previously neglected interests of some animals (see Regan and Singer (eds.) 1976, Clark 1977, and also the entry on the moral status of animals). Granted that some animals have interests that can be represented in this way, would it also make sense to speak of trees, forests, rivers, barnacles, or termites as having interests of a morally relevant kind? This issue was hotly contested in the years that followed. Meanwhile, John Passmore (1974) argued, like White, that the Judeo-Christian tradition of thought about nature, despite being predominantly “despotic”, contained resources for regarding humans as “stewards” or “perfectors” of God’s creation. Skeptical of the prospects for any radically new ethic, Passmore cautioned that traditions of thought could not be abruptly overhauled. Any change in attitudes to our natural surroundings which stood the chance of widespread acceptance, he argued, would have to resonate and have some continuities with the very tradition which had legitimized our destructive practices.

In sum, then, Leopold’s land ethic, the historical analyses of White and Passmore, the pioneering work of Routley, Stone and Rolston, and the warnings of scientists, had by the late 1970s focused the attention of philosophers and political theorists firmly on the environment. The confluence of ethical, political and legal debates about the environment, the emergence of philosophies to underpin animal rights activism and the puzzles over whether an environmental ethic would be something new rather than a modification or extension of existing ethical theories were reflected in wider social and political movements. The rise of environmental or “green” parties in Europe in the 1980s was accompanied by almost immediate schisms between groups known as “realists” versus “fundamentalists” (see Dobson 1990). The “realists” stood for reform environmentalism, working with business and government to soften the impact of pollution and resource depletion especially on fragile ecosystems or endangered species. The “fundies” argued for radical change, the setting of stringent new priorities, and even the overthrow of capitalism and liberal individualism, which were taken as the major ideological causes of anthropogenic environmental devastation. It is not clear, however, that collectivist or communist countries do particularly well in terms of their environmental record (see Dominick 1998). At the same time, the rise of “environmental authoritarianism” in some non-democratic countries appears to show that liberal democracies may not have a monopoly on effective action to support sustainability and biodiversity (Beeson 2010, Shahar 2015).

Underlying these political disagreements was the distinction between “shallow” and “deep” environmental movements, a distinction introduced in the early 1970s by another major influence on contemporary environmental ethics, the Norwegian philosopher and climber Arne Næss. Since the work of Næss has been significant in environmental politics, the discussion of his position is given in a separate section below.

3. Environmental Ethics and Politics

3.1 Deep Ecology

“Deep ecology” was born in Scandinavia, the result of discussions between Næss and his colleagues Sigmund Kvaløy and Nils Faarlund (see Næss 1973 and 1989; also see Witoszek and Brennan (eds.) 1999 for a historical survey and commentary on the development of deep ecology). All three shared a passion for the great mountains. On a visit to the Himalayas, they became impressed with aspects of “Sherpa culture” particularly when they found that their Sherpa guides regarded certain mountains as sacred and accordingly would not venture onto them. Subsequently, Næss formulated a position which extended the reverence the three Norwegians and the Sherpas felt for mountains to other natural things in general.

The “shallow ecology movement”, as Næss (1973) calls it, is the “fight against pollution and resource depletion”, the central objective of which is “the health and affluence of people in the developed countries.” The “deep ecology movement”, in contrast, endorses “biospheric egalitarianism”, the view that all living things are alike in having value in their own right, independent of their usefulness to others. The deep ecologist respects this intrinsic value, taking care, for example, when walking on the mountainside not to cause unnecessary damage to the plants.

Inspired by Spinoza’s metaphysics, another key feature of Næss’s deep ecology is the rejection of atomistic individualism. The idea that a human being is such an individual possessing a separate essence, Næss argues, radically separates the human self from the rest of the world. To make such a separation not only leads to selfishness towards other people, but also induces human selfishness towards nature. As a counter to egoism at both the individual and species level, Næss proposes an alternative relational “total-field image” of the world. According to this relationalism, organisms (human or otherwise) are best understood as “knots” in the biospherical net. The identity of a living thing is essentially constituted by its relations to other things in the world, especially its ecological relations to other living things. If people conceptualise themselves and the world in relational terms, the deep ecologists argue, then people will take better care of nature and the world in general.

As developed by Næss and others, the position also came to focus on the possibility of the identification of the human ego with nature. The idea is, briefly, that by identifying with nature I can enlarge the boundaries of the self beyond my skin. My larger—ecological—Self (the capital “S” emphasizes that I am something larger than my body and consciousness), deserves respect as well. To respect and to care for my Self is also to respect and to care for the natural environment, which is actually part of me and with which I should identify. Næss quotes the example of Saami people and their identification with the rivers on which they depend for sustenance. Recognition of such identification has underpinned the establishment in New Zealand of legal personhood for some rivers and other natural areas (Kramm 2020). “Self-realization” is thus the realization of a wider ecological Self. Næss maintains that the deep satisfaction that we receive from identification with nature and close partnership with other forms of life in nature contributes significantly to our life quality. (One historical antecedent to this kind of nature spiritualism is the romanticism of Jean-Jacques Rousseau as expressed in his last work, the Reveries of the Solitary Walker)

When Næss’s view crossed the Atlantic, it was sometimes merged with ideas emerging from Leopold’s land ethic (see Devall and Sessions 1985; also see Sessions (ed) 1995). But Næss—wary of the supposed totalitarian political implications of Leopold’s position that individual interests and well-being should be subordinated to the holistic good of the earth’s biotic community (see section 4 below)—took care to distance himself from advocating any sort of “land ethic”. (See Anker 1999 for cautions on interpreting Næss’s relationalism as an endorsement of the kind of holism displayed in the land ethic; cf. Grey 1993, Taylor and Zimmerman 2005). Some critics have argued that Næss’s deep ecology is no more than an extended social-democratic version of utilitarianism, which counts human interests in the same calculation alongside the interests of all natural things (e.g., trees, wolves, bears, rivers, forests and mountains) in the natural environment (see Witoszek 1997). However, Næss failed to explain in any detail how to make sense of the idea that oysters or barnacles, termites or bacteria could have interests of any morally relevant sort at all. Without an account of this, Næss’s early “biospheric egalitarianism”—that all living things whatsoever had a similar right to live and flourish—was an indeterminate principle in practical terms. It also remains unclear in what sense rivers, mountains and forests can be regarded as possessors of any kind of interests. This is an issue on which Næss always remained elusive.

Biospheric egalitarianism was modified in the 1980s to the weaker claim that the flourishing of both human and non-human life has value in itself, without any commitment to these values being equal. At the same time, Næss declared that his own favoured ecological philosophy—“Ecosophy T”, as he called it after his Tvergastein mountain cabin—was only one of several possible foundations for an environmental ethic. Deep ecology ceased to be a specific doctrine, but instead became a “platform” of eight simple points on which Næss hoped all deep green thinkers could agree. The platform was conceived as establishing a middle ground, between underlying orientations, whether indigenous, Christian, Buddhist, Daoist, process philosophy, or whatever, and the practical principles for action in specific situations, principles generated from the underlying philosophies. Thus the deep ecological movement became explicitly pluralist both morally and epistemologically (see Brennan 1999; c.f. Light 1996, Akamani 2020).

While Næss’s Ecosophy T sees human Self-realization as a solution to the environmental crises resulting from human selfishness and exploitation of nature, some of the followers of the deep ecology platform in the United States and Australia further argue that the expansion of the human self to include non-human nature is supported by the Copenhagen interpretation of quantum theory, which is said to have dissolved the boundaries between the observer and the observed (see Fox 1984, 1990, and Devall and Sessions 1985; cf. Callicott 1985). These “relationalist” developments of deep ecology are, however, criticized by some feminist theorists. The idea of nature as part of oneself, they argue, could justify the continued exploitation of nature instead. For one is presumably more entitled to treat oneself in whatever ways one likes than to treat another independent agent in whatever ways one likes. According to these feminist critics, the deep ecological theory of the “expanded self” is in effect a disguised form of human colonialism, unable to give nature its due as a genuine “other” independent of human interest and purposes (see Plumwood 1993, Ch. 7, 1999, and Warren 1999).

Meanwhile, other critics accuse deep ecology of being elitist in its attempts to preserve wilderness experiences for only a select group of economically and socio-politically well-off people. Ramachandra Guha (1989, 1999) for instance, depicts the activities of many western-based conservation groups as a new form of cultural imperialism, aimed at securing converts to conservationism (cf. Bookchin 1987 and Brennan 1998a). “Green missionaries”, as Guha calls them, represent a movement aimed at further dispossessing the world’s poor and indigenous people. “Putting deep ecology in its place,” he writes, “is to recognize that the trends it derides as “shallow” ecology might in fact be varieties of environmentalism that are more apposite, more representative and more popular in the countries of the South.” Although Næss himself repudiates suggestions that deep ecology is committed to any form of imperialism (see Witoszek and Brennan (eds.) 1999, Ch. 36–7 and 41), Guha’s criticism raises important questions about the application of deep ecological principles in different social, economic and cultural contexts. Finally, in other critiques, deep ecology is portrayed as having an inconsistent utopian vision (see Anker and Witoszek 1998).

3.2 Feminism and the Environment

Broadly speaking, a feminist issue is any that contributes in some way to understanding the oppression of women. Feminist theories attempt to analyze women’s oppression, its causes and consequences, and suggest strategies and directions for women’s liberation. By the mid 1970s, feminist writers had raised the issue of whether patriarchal modes of thinking encouraged not only widespread inferiorizing and colonizing of women, but also of people of colour, animals and nature. Sheila Collins (1974), for instance, argued that male-dominated culture or patriarchy is supported by four interlocking pillars: sexism, racism, class exploitation, and ecological destruction.

Emphasizing the importance of feminism to the environmental movement and various other liberation movements, some writers, such as Ynestra King (1989a and 1989b), argue that the domination of women by men is historically the original form of domination in human society, from which all other hierarchies—of rank, class, and political power—flow. For instance, human exploitation of nature may be seen as a manifestation and extension of the oppression of women, in that it is the result of associating nature with the female, which had been already inferiorized and oppressed by the male-dominating culture. But within the plurality of feminist positions, other writers, such as Val Plumwood (1993), understand the oppression of women as only one of the many parallel forms of oppression sharing and supported by a common ideological structure, in which one party (the colonizer, whether male, white or human) uses a number of conceptual and rhetorical devices to privilege its interests over that of the other party (the colonized: whether female, people of colour, or animals). Facilitated by a common structure, seemingly diverse forms of oppression can mutually reinforce each other (Warren 1987, 1990, 1994, Cheney 1989, and Plumwood 1993).

Not all feminist theorists would call that common underlying oppressive structure “androcentric” or “patriarchal”. But it is generally agreed that core features of the structure include dichotomies, hierarchical thinking, and a “logic of domination”, which are typical of, if not essential to, male-chauvinism. These patterns of thinking and conceptualizing the world, many feminist theorists argue, also nourish and sustain other forms of chauvinism including human-chauvinism (i.e., anthropocentrism), which is responsible for much human exploitation of, and destructiveness towards, nature. Writers comment on dichotomous forms of thinking which depict the world in polar opposite terms, such as male/female, masculinity/femininity, reason/emotion, freedom/necessity, active/passive, mind/body, pure/soiled, white/coloured, civilized/primitive, transcendent/immanent, human/animal, culture/nature. When these dichotomies involve hierarchy and domination they are often labelled "dualisms". Under the influence of such dualisms all the first items in these contrasting pairs are assimilated with each other, and all the second items are likewise linked with each other. For example, the male is seen to be associated with the rational, active, creative, Cartesian human mind, and civilized, orderly, transcendent culture; whereas the female is regarded as tied to the emotional, passive, determined animal body, and primitive, disorderly, immanent nature. These interlocking dualisms are not just descriptive dichotomies, according to the feminists, but involve a prescriptive privileging of one side of the opposed items over the other. Dualism confers superiority to everything on the male side, but inferiority to everything on the female side. The “logic of domination” then dictates that those on the superior side (e.g., men, rational beings, humans) are morally entitled to dominate and utilize those on the inferior side (e.g., women, beings lacking in rationality, non-humans) as mere means.

The problem with dualistic modes of thinking, however, is not just that they are epistemically unreliable. It is not just that the dominating party often falsely sees the dominated party as lacking (or possessing) the allegedly superior (or inferior) qualities, or that the dominated party often internalizes false stereotypes of itself given by its oppressors, or that stereotypical thinking often overlooks salient and important differences among individuals. More important, according to feminist analyses, the very premise of prescriptive dualism—the valuing of attributes of one polarized side and the devaluing of those of the other, the idea that domination and oppression can be justified by appealing to attributes like masculinity, rationality, being civilized or developed, etc.—is itself problematic.

Feminism represents a radical challenge for environmental thinking, politics, and traditional social ethical perspectives. It promises to link environmental questions with wider social problems concerning various kinds of discrimination and exploitation, and fundamental investigations of human psychology. However, whether there are conceptual, causal or merely contingent connections among the different forms of oppression and liberation remains a contested issue (see Green 1994). The term “ecofeminism” (first coined by Françoise d’Eaubonne in 1974) or “ecological feminism” was for a time generally applied to any view that combines environmental advocacy with feminist analysis. However, because of the varieties of, and disagreements among, feminist theories, the label may be too wide to be informative (see the entry on feminist environmental philosophy).

3.3 Disenchantment and the New Animism

An often overlooked source of ecological ideas is the work of the neo-Marxist Frankfurt School of critical theory founded by Max Horkheimer and Theodore Adorno (Horkheimer and Adorno 1969). While classical Marxists regard nature as a resource to be transformed by human labour and utilized for human purposes, Horkheimer and Adorno saw Marx himself as representative of the problem of “human alienation”. At the root of this alienation, they argue, is a narrow positivist conception of rationality—which sees rationality as an instrument for pursuing progress, power and technological control, and takes observation, measurement and the application of purely quantitative methods to be capable of solving all problems. Such a positivistic view of science combines determinism with optimism. Natural processes as well as human activities are seen to be predictable and manipulable. Nature (and, likewise, human nature) is no longer mysterious, uncontrollable, or fearsome. Instead, it is reduced to an object strictly governed by natural laws, which therefore can be studied, known, and employed to our benefit. By promising limitless knowledge and power, the positivism of science and technology not only removes our fear of nature, the critical theorists argue, but also destroys our sense of awe and wonder towards it. That is to say, positivism “disenchants” nature—along with everything that can be studied by the sciences, whether natural, social or human.

The progress in knowledge and material well-being may not be a bad thing in itself, where the consumption and control of nature is a necessary part of human life. However, the critical theorists argue that the positivistic disenchantment of natural things (and, likewise, of human beings—because they too can be studied and manipulated by science) disrupts our relationship with them, encouraging the undesirable attitude that they are nothing more than things to be probed, consumed and dominated. According to the critical theorists, the oppression of “outer nature” (i.e., the natural environment) through science and technology is bought at a very high price: the project of domination requires the suppression of our own “inner nature” (i.e., human nature)—e.g., human creativity, autonomy, and the manifold needs, vulnerabilities and longings at the centre of human life. To remedy such an alienation, the project of Horkheimer and Adorno is to replace the narrow positivistic and instrumentalist model of rationality with a more humanistic one, in which the values of the aesthetic, moral, sensuous and expressive aspects of human life play a central part. Thus, their aim is not to give up our rational faculties or powers of analysis and logic. Rather, the ambition is to arrive at a dialectical synthesis between Romanticism and Enlightenment, to return to anti-deterministic values of freedom, spontaneity and creativity.

In his later work, Adorno advocates a re-enchanting aesthetic attitude of “sensuous immediacy” towards nature. Not only do we stop seeing nature as primarily, or simply, an object of consumption, we are also able to be directly and spontaneously acquainted with nature without interventions from our rational faculties. According to Adorno, works of art, like natural things, always involve an “excess”, something more than their mere materiality and exchange value (see Vogel 1996, ch. 4.4 for a detailed discussion of Adorno’s views on art, labour and domination). The re-enchantment of the world through aesthetic experience, he argues, is also at the same time a re-enchantment of human lives and purposes. Adorno’s work remains largely unexplored in mainstream environmental philosophy, although the idea of applying critical theory (embracing techniques of deconstruction, psychoanalysis and radical social criticism) to both environmental issues and the writings of various ethical and political theorists has spawned the field of “écocritique” or “ecocriticism” (Vogel 1996, Luke 1997, van Wyk 1997, Dryzek 1997, Garrard 2014).

Some students of Adorno’s work have argued that his account of the role of “sensuous immediacy” can be understood as an attempt to defend a “legitimate anthropomorphism” that comes close to a weak form of animism (Bernstein 2001, 196). Others, more radical, have claimed to take inspiration from his notion of “non-identity”, which, they argue, can be used as the basis for a deconstruction of the notion of nature and perhaps even its elimination from ecocritical writing. For example, Timothy Morton argues that “putting something called Nature on a pedestal and admiring it from afar does for the environment what patriarchy does for the figure of Woman. It is a paradoxical act of sadistic admiration” (Morton 2007, 5), and that “in the name of all that we value in the idea of ‘nature’, [ecocritique] thoroughly examines how nature is set up as a transcendental, unified, independent category. Ecocritique does not think that it is paradoxical to say, in the name of ecology itself: ‘down with nature!’” (ibid., 13). In this vein, some thinkers have insisted that environmental ethics makes a mistake in drawing a significant distinction between the natural and the artificial (Vogel 2015). Such an idea, however, has drawn fierce criticism from some Marxist theorists who argue that the “end of nature” thesis is deeply confused (for example Malm 2018). It remains to be seen, however, whether the radical attempt to purge the concept of nature from ecocritical work meets with success. Likewise, it is unclear whether the dialectic project on which Horkheimer and Adorno embarked is coherent, and whether Adorno, in particular, has a consistent understanding of “nature” and “rationality” (see Eckersley 1992 and Vogel 1996, for a review of the Frankfurt School’s thinking about nature, and on rationality see also the entry on critical theory).

On the other hand, the new animists have been much inspired by the serious way in which some indigenous peoples placate and interact with animals, plants and inanimate things through ritual, ceremony and other practices (for examples see Kimmerer 2020). According to the new animists, the replacement of traditional animism (the view that personalized souls are found in animals, plants, and other material objects) by a form of disenchanting positivism directly leads to an anthropocentric perspective, which is accountable for much human destructiveness towards nature. In a disenchanted world, there is no meaningful order of things or events outside the human domain, and there is no source of sacredness or dread of the sort felt by those who regard the natural world as peopled by divinities or demons (Stone 2006). When a forest is no longer sacred, there are no spirits to be placated and no mysterious risks associated with clear-felling it. A disenchanted nature is no longer alive. It commands no respect, reverence or love. It is nothing but a giant machine, to be mastered to serve human purposes. The new animists argue for reconceptualizing the boundary between persons and non-persons. For them, “living nature” comprises not only humans, animals and plants, but also mountains, forests, rivers, deserts, and even planets.

Whether the notion that a mountain or a tree is to be regarded as a person is taken literally or not, the attempt to engage with the surrounding world as if it consists of other persons might possibly provide the basis for a respectful attitude to nature (see Harvey 2005 for a popular account of the new animism). If disenchantment is a source of environmental problems and destruction, then the new animism can be regarded as attempting to re-enchant, and help to save, nature. More poetically, David Abram has argued that a phenomenological approach of the kind taken by Merleau-Ponty can reveal to us that we are part of the “common flesh” of the world, that we are in a sense the world thinking itself (Abram 1995).

In her work, Freya Mathews has tried to articulate a version of animism or panpsychism that captures ways in which the world (not just nature) contains many kinds of consciousness and sentience. For her, there is an underlying unity of mind and matter in that the world is a “self-realizing” system containing a multiplicity of other such systems (cf. Næss). According to Mathews, we are meshed in communication, and potential communication, with the “One” (the greater cosmic self) and its many lesser selves (Mathews 2003, 45–60). Materialism (the monistic theory that the world consists purely of matter), she argues, is self-defeating by encouraging a form of “collective solipsism” that treats the world either as unknowable or as a social-construction (Mathews 2005, 12). Mathews also takes inspiration from her interpretation of the core Daoist idea of wuwei as “letting be” and bringing about change through “effortless action”. The focus in environmental management, development and commerce should be on “synergy” with what is already in place rather than on demolition, replacement and disruption. Instead of bulldozing away old suburbs and derelict factories, the synergistic panpsychist sees these artefacts as themselves part of the living cosmos, hence part of what is to be respected. Likewise, instead of trying to eliminate feral or exotic plants and animals, and restore environments to some imagined pristine state, ways should be found—wherever possible—to promote synergies between the newcomers and the older native populations in ways that maintain ecological flows and promote the further unfolding and developing of ecological processes (Mathews 2004). Panpsychism, Mathews argues, frees us from the “ideological grid of capitalism”, can reduce our desire for consumer novelties, and can allow us and the world to grow old together with grace and dignity. Again, some of Mathews work echoes indigenous understandings of an enlarged subjectivity. As Deborah Rose puts it: “subjectivity in the form of sentience and agency is not solely a human prerogative but is located throughout other species and perhaps throughout country itself” (Rose 2005, 302).

In summary, if disenchantment is a source of environmentally destructive or uncaring attitudes, then both the aesthetic and the animist/panpsychist re-enchantment of the world are intended to offer an antidote to such attitudes, and perhaps also inspirations for new forms of managing and designing for sustainability. The general project of re-enchanting the world has surprising resonances with the views of others who draw more explicitly on scientific understandings of life on earth. Earth systems science, for example, draws on the Gaia hypothesis proposed by James Lovelock (Lovelock 1972, 1979) suggesting that living things acting together regulate significant aspects of the global environment (Lovelock and Margulis 1974). Later writers describe the Gaia hypothesis as conjecturing that something overlooked by previous scientific thinking was of vital importance to understanding the one thing that supports all life on earth, namely a great stabilizing feedback system which regulates itself in a way that maintains the habitability of the planet (Lenton et al. 2020). This feedback system is itself under threat from a changing climate, human overpopulation and reductions in biodiversity (see further section 6 below and also Latour 2017). In place of a vision of a grand cosmic self, champions of Gaia theory argue for recognizing the value of Life itself, where the capital "L" draws attention to the great feedback system—a single entity comprising all the living things descended from the last universal common ancestor (Mariscal and Dolittle 2008).

3.4 Social Ecology and Bioregionalism

Apart from feminist-environmentalist theories and Næss’s deep ecology, Murray Bookchin’s “social ecology” has also claimed to be radical, subversive, or countercultural (see Bookchin 1980, 1987, 1990). Bookchin’s version of critical theory takes the “outer” physical world as constituting what he calls “first nature”, from which culture or “second nature” has evolved. Environmentalism, in his view, is a social movement, and the problems it confronts are social problems. While Bookchin is prepared, like Horkheimer and Adorno, to regard (first) nature as an aesthetic and sensuous marvel, he regards our intervention in it as necessary. He suggests that we can choose to put ourselves at the service of natural evolution, to help maintain complexity and diversity, diminish suffering and reduce pollution. Bookchin’s social ecology recommends that we use our gifts of sociability, communication and intelligence as if we were “nature rendered conscious”, instead of turning them against the very source and origin from which such gifts derive. Exploitation of nature should be replaced by a richer form of life devoted to nature’s preservation.

John Clark has argued that social ecology is heir to a historical, communitarian tradition of thought that includes not only the anarchist Peter Kropotkin, but also the nineteenth century socialist geographer Elisée Reclus, the eccentric Scottish thinker Patrick Geddes and the latter’s disciple, Lewis Mumford (Clark 1998). Ramachandra Guha has described Mumford as “the pioneer American social ecologist” (Guha 1996, 210). Mumford adopted a regionalist perspective, arguing that strong regional centres of culture are the basis of “active and securely grounded local life” (Mumford 1944, 403). Like the pessimists in critical theory, Mumford was worried about the emergence under industrialised capitalism of a “megamachine”, one that would oppress and dominate human creativity and freedom, and one that—despite being a human product—operates in a way that is out of our control. While Bookchin is more of a technological optimist than Mumford, both writers have inspired a regional turn in environmental thinking. Bioregionalism gives regionalism an environmental twist. This is the view that natural features should provide the defining conditions for places of community, and that secure and satisfying local lives are led by those who know a place, have learned its lore and who adapt their lifestyle to its affordances by developing its potential within ecological limits. Such a life, the bioregionalists argue, will enable people to enjoy the fruits of self-liberation and self-development (see the essays in List 1993, and the book-length treatment in Thayer 2003, for an introduction to bioregional thought).

However, critics have asked why natural features should be significant in defining the places in which communities are to be built, and have puzzled over exactly which natural features these should be—geological, ecological, climatic, hydrological, and so on (see Brennan 1998b). If relatively small, bioregional communities are to be home to flourishing human societies, then a question also arises over the nature of the laws and punishments that will prevail in them, and also of their integration into larger regional and global legal, political and economic groupings. For anarchists and other critics of the predominant social order, a return to self-governing and self-sufficient regional communities is often depicted as liberating and refreshing. But for the skeptics, the worry remains that the bioregional vision is politically over-optimistic and is open to the establishment of illiberal, stifling and undemocratic communities. Further, given its emphasis on local self-sufficiency and the virtue of life in small communities, a question arises over whether bioregionalism is workable in an overcrowded planet. Later bioregional proposals have identified ways of connecting with nature by showing stewardship for green infrastructure within cities (Andersson et al. 2014).

Deep ecology, feminism, and social ecology had a considerable impact on the development of political positions in regard to the environment. Feminist analyses have often been welcomed for the psychological insight they bring to several social, moral and political problems. There is, however, considerable unease about the implications of critical theory, social ecology and some varieties of deep ecology and animism. Some writers have argued, for example, that critical theory is bound to be ethically anthropocentric, with nature as no more than a “social construction” whose value ultimately depends on human determinations (see Vogel 1996). Others have argued that the demands of “deep” green theorists and activists cannot be accommodated within contemporary theories of liberal politics and social justice (see Ferry 1995). A further suggestion is that there is a need to reassess traditional theories such as virtue ethics, which has its origins in ancient Greek philosophy (see the following section) within the context of a form of stewardship similar to that earlier endorsed by Passmore (see Barry 1999). If this last claim is correct, then the radical activist need not, after all, look for philosophical support in radical, or countercultural, theories of the sort deep ecology, feminism, bioregionalism and social ecology claim to be (but see Zimmerman 1994).

4. Traditional Ethical Theories and Contemporary Environment Ethics

Although environmental ethicists often try to distance themselves from the anthropocentrism embedded in traditional ethical views (Passmore 1974, Norton 1991 are exceptions), they also quite often draw their theoretical resources from traditional ethical systems and theories. Consider the following two basic moral questions: (1) What kinds of thing are intrinsically valuable, good or bad? (2) What makes an action right or wrong?

Consequentialist ethical theories consider intrinsic “value” / “disvalue” or “goodness” / “badness” to be more fundamental moral notions than “rightness” / “wrongness”, and maintain that whether an action is right/wrong is determined by whether its consequences are good/bad. From this perspective, answers to question (2) are informed by answers to question (1). For instance, utilitarianism, a paradigm case of consequentialism, regards pleasure (or, more broadly construed, the satisfaction of interest, desire, and/or preference) as the only intrinsic value in the world, whereas pain (or the frustration of desire, interest, and/or preference) is the only intrinsic disvalue, and maintains that right actions are those that would produce the greatest balance of pleasure over pain (see the entry on consequentialism).

As the utilitarian focus is the balance of pleasure and pain as such, the question of to whom a pleasure or pain belongs is irrelevant to the calculation and assessment of the rightness or wrongness of actions. Hence, the eighteenth century utilitarian Jeremy Bentham (1789), and later Peter Singer (1993), have argued that the interests of all the sentient beings (i.e., beings who are capable of experiencing pleasure or pain)—including non-human ones—affected by an action should be taken equally into consideration in assessing the action. Furthermore, rather like Routley (see section 2 above), Singer argues that the anthropocentric privileging of members of the species Homo sapiens is arbitrary, and that it is a kind of “speciesism” as unjustifiable as sexism and racism. Singer regards the animal liberation movement as comparable to the liberation movements of women and people of colour. Unlike the environmental philosophers who attribute intrinsic value to the natural environment and its inhabitants, Singer and utilitarians in general attribute intrinsic value to the experience of pleasure or interest satisfaction as such, not to the beings who have the experience. Similarly, for the utilitarian, non-sentient objects in the environment such as plant species, rivers, mountains, and landscapes, all of which are the objects of moral concern for environmentalists, are of no intrinsic but at most instrumental value to the satisfaction of sentient beings (see Singer 1993, Ch. 10). Furthermore, because right actions, for the utilitarian, are those that maximize the overall balance of interest satisfaction over frustration, practices such as whale-hunting and the killing of an elephant for ivory, which cause suffering to non-human animals, might turn out to be right after all: such practices might produce considerable amounts of interest-satisfaction for human beings, which, on the utilitarian calculation, outweigh the non-human interest-frustration involved. As the result of all the above considerations, it is unclear to what extent a utilitarian ethic can also be an environmental ethic. This point may not so readily apply to a wider consequentialist approach, which attributes intrinsic value not only to pleasure or satisfaction, but also to various objects and processes in the natural environment.

Deontological ethical theories, in contrast, maintain that whether an action is right or wrong is for the most part independent of whether its consequences are good or bad (see the entry on deontological ethics). From the deontologist perspective, there are several distinct moral rules or duties (e.g., “not to kill or otherwise harm the innocent”, “not to lie”, “to respect the rights of others”, “to keep promises”), the observance/violation of which is intrinsically right/wrong; i.e., right/wrong in itself regardless of consequences. When asked to justify an alleged moral rule, duty or its corresponding right, deontologists may appeal to the intrinsic value of those beings to whom it applies. For instance, “animal rights” advocate Tom Regan (1983) argues that those animals with intrinsic value (or what he calls “inherent value”) have the moral right to respectful treatment, which then generates a general moral duty on our part not to treat them as mere means to other ends. We have, in particular, a prima facie moral duty not to harm them. Regan maintains that certain practices (such as sport or commercial hunting, and experimentation on animals) violate the moral right of intrinsically valuable animals to respectful treatment. Such practices, he argues, are intrinsically wrong regardless of whether or not some better consequences ever flow from them. Exactly which animals have intrinsic value and therefore the moral right to respectful treatment? Regan’s answer is: those that meet the criterion of being the “subject-of-a-life”. To be such a subject is a sufficient (though not necessary) condition for having intrinsic value, and to be a subject-of-a-life involves, among other things, having sense-perceptions, beliefs, desires, motives, memory, a sense of the future, and a psychological identity over time.

Some authors have extended concern for individual well-being further, arguing for the intrinsic value of organisms achieving their own good, whether those organisms are capable of consciousness or not. Paul Taylor’s version of this view (1981 and 1986), which we might call biocentrism, is a somewhat deontological example. He argues that each individual living thing in nature—whether it is an animal, a plant, or a micro-organism—is a “teleological-center-of-life” having a good or well-being of its own which can be enhanced or damaged, and that all individuals who are teleological-centers-of life have equal intrinsic value (or what he calls “inherent worth”) which entitles them to moral respect. Furthermore, Taylor maintains that the intrinsic value of wild living things generates a prima facie moral duty on our part to preserve or promote their goods as ends in themselves, and that any practices which treat those beings as mere means and thus display a lack of respect for them are intrinsically wrong. For a summary and overview of Taylor’s biocentric ethic, see Brennan and Lo 2010, 69—86. A biologically detailed defence of the idea that living things have representations and goals and hence have moral worth is found in Agar 2001. Unlike Taylor’s egalitarian and deontological biocentrism, Robin Attfield (1987) argues for a hierarchical view that while all beings having a good of their own have intrinsic value, some of them (e.g., persons) have intrinsic value to a greater extent. Attfield also endorses a form of consequentialism which takes into consideration, and attempts to balance, the many and possibly conflicting goods of different living things (see also Varner 1998 for a defense of biocentric individualism with affinities to both consequentialist and deontological approaches). However, some critics have pointed out that the notion of biological good or well-being is only descriptive not prescriptive (see Williams 1992 and O’Neill 1993, Ch. 2). For instance, even if HIV has a good of its own this does not mean that we ought to assign any positive moral weight to the realization of that good.

Subsequently the distinction between these two traditional approaches has taken its own specific form of development in environmental philosophy. Instead of pitting conceptions of value against conceptions of rights, it has been suggested that there may be two different conceptions of intrinsic value in play in discussion about environmental good and evil. One the one side, there is the intrinsic value of states of affairs that are to be promoted—and this is the focus of the consequentialist thinkers. On the other (deontological) hand there is the intrinsic values of entities to be respected (see Bradley 2006, McShane 2014). These two different foci for the notion of intrinsic value still provide room for fundamental argument between deontologists and consequentialist to continue, albeit in a somewhat modified form.

Note that the ethics of animal liberation or animal rights and biocentrism are both individualistic in that their various moral concerns are directed towards individuals only—not ecological wholes such as species, populations, biotic communities, and ecosystems. None of these is sentient, a subject-of-a-life, or a teleological-center-of-life, but the preservation of these collective entities is a major concern for many environmentalists. Moreover, the goals of animal liberationists, such as the reduction of animal suffering and death, may conflict with the goals of environmentalists. For example, the preservation of the integrity of an ecosystem may require the culling of feral animals or of some indigenous animal populations that threaten to destroy fragile habitats. So there are disputes about whether the ethics of animal liberation is a proper branch of environmental ethics (see Callicott 1980, 1988, Sagoff 1984, Jamieson 1998, Crisp 1998 and Varner 2000).

Criticizing the individualistic approach in general for failing to accommodate conservation concerns for ecological wholes, J. Baird Callicott (1980) once advocated a version of land-ethical holism which takes Leopold’s statement “A thing is right when it tends to preserve the integrity, stability, and beauty of the biotic community. It is wrong when it tends otherwise” to be the supreme deontological principle. In this theory, the earth’s biotic community per se is the sole locus of intrinsic value, whereas the value of its individual members is merely instrumental and dependent on their contribution to the “integrity, stability, and beauty” of the larger community. A straightforward implication of this version of the land ethic is that an individual member of the biotic community ought to be sacrificed whenever that is needed for the protection of the holistic good of the community. For instance, Callicott maintains that if culling a white-tailed deer is necessary for the protection of the holistic biotic good, then it is a land-ethical requirement to do so. But, to be consistent, the same point also applies to human individuals because they are also members of the biotic community. Not surprisingly, the misanthropy implied by Callicott’s land-ethical holism was widely criticized and regarded as a reductio of the position (see Aiken (1984), Kheel (1985), Ferré (1996), and Shrader-Frechette (1996)). Tom Regan (1983, p.362), in particular, condemned the holistic land ethic’s disregard of the rights of the individual as “environmental fascism”. Since then commentators have noted the links between fascism and conservation thinking (Biehl and Staudenmaier 2011). The subsequent emergence of explicitly ecofascist on-line movements and terrorist acts that claim to be ecologically-inspired (Lawton 2019) lead one writer to declare that there is a danger the world will enter an age of “climate barbarism”(Klein 2019).

Under pressure from the charge of ecofascism and misanthropy, Callicott (1989 Ch. 5, and 1999, Ch. 4) later revises his neo-Leopodian position to maintain that the biotic community (indeed, any community to which humans belong) as well as its individual members (indeed, any individual who shares with us membership in some common community) all have intrinsic value. To further distance himself from the charge of ecofascism, Callicott introduced explicit principles which prioritize obligations to human communities over those to natural ones. He called these “second-order” principles for specifying the conditions under which the land ethic’s holistic and individualistic obligations were to be ranked. As he put it:

... obligations generated by membership in more venerable and intimate communities take precedence over these generated in more recently-emerged and impersonal communities... The second second-order principle is that stronger interests (for lack of a better word) generate duties that take precedence over duties generated by weaker interests. (Callicott 1999, 76)

Lo 2001 provides an overview and critique of Callicott’s changing position over two decades, while Ouderkirk and Hill (eds.) 2002 gives an overview of debates between Callicott and others concerning the metaethical and metaphysical foundations for the land ethic and also its historical antecedents. As Lo points out, the final modified version of the land ethic needs more than two second-order principles, since a third-order principle is needed to specify Callicott’s implicit view that the second second-order principle generally countermands the first one when they come into conflict (Lo 2001, 345). In later work, Callicott follows Lo’s suggestion, while cautioning against aiming for too much precision in specifying the demands of the land ethic (Callicott 2013, 66–7). While Callicott’s reading of Leopold is widely regarded as authoritative, later writers have queried whether Leopold might be better interpreted a a moral pluralist (Dixon 2017) and have also raised doubts about the form of Darwinism that Leopold is supposed to have espoused (Millstein 2015). For further critique of Callicott on Leopold, see also Newman, Varner and Linquist 2017, ch.10.

The controversy surrounding Callicott’s original position, however, has inspired efforts in environmental ethics to investigate possibilities of attributing intrinsic value to ecological wholes, not just their individual constituent parts. Following in Callicott’s footsteps, and inspired by Næss’s relational account of value, Warwick Fox has championed a theory of “responsive cohesion” which aims to give supreme moral priority to the maintenance of ecosystems and the biophysical world (Fox 2007). It remains to be seen if this position escapes the charges of misanthropy and totalitarianism laid against earlier holistic and relational theories of value.

Individual natural entities (whether sentient or not, living or not), Andrew Brennan (1984, 2014) argues, are not designed by anyone to fulfill any purpose and therefore lack “intrinsic function” (i.e., the function of a thing that constitutes part of its essence or identity conditions). This, he proposes, is a reason for thinking that individual natural entities should not be treated as mere instruments, and thus a reason for assigning them intrinsic value. Furthermore, he argues that the same moral point applies to the case of natural ecosystems, to the extent that they lack intrinsic function. In the light of Brennan’s proposal, Eric Katz (1991 and 1997) argues that all natural entities, whether individuals or wholes, have intrinsic value in virtue of their ontological independence from human purpose, activity, and interest, and maintains the deontological principle that nature as a whole is an “autonomous subject” which deserves moral respect and must not be treated as a mere means to human ends. Carrying the project of attributing intrinsic value to nature to its ultimate form, Robert Elliot (1997) argues that naturalness itself is a property in virtue of possessing which all natural things, events, and states of affairs, attain intrinsic value. Furthermore, Elliot argues that even a consequentialist, who in principle allows the possibility of trading off intrinsic value from naturalness for intrinsic value from other sources, could no longer justify such kind of trade-off in reality. This is because the reduction of intrinsic value due to the depletion of naturalness on earth, according to him, has reached such a level that any further reduction of it could not be compensated by any amount of intrinsic value generated in other ways, no matter how great it is.

As the notion of “natural” is understood in terms of the lack of human contrivance and is often opposed to the notion of “artifactual”, one much contested issue concerns the value of those parts of nature that have been touched by human artifice—for instance, previously degraded natural environments which have been humanly restored. Based on the premise that the properties of being naturally evolved and having a natural continuity with the remote past are “value adding” (i.e., adding intrinsic value to those things which possess those two properties), Elliot argues that even a perfectly restored environment would necessarily lack those two value-adding properties and therefore be less valuable than the originally undegraded natural environment. Katz, on the other hand, argues that a restored nature is really just an artifact designed and created for the satisfaction of human ends, and that the value of restored environments is instrumental. He further argues that restoration is a form of the “domination of reality” and controversially compares such domination to Nazi policies of xenophobia, nativism and eliminationsm (Katz 2021). Critics have pointed out that advocates of a moral dichotomy between the natural and the artifactual run the risk of diminishing the value of human life and culture, and fail to recognize that the natural environments interfered with by humans may still have morally important qualities other than pure naturalness (see Lo 1999, and Katz’s response in Katz 2012).

Two other issues central to this debate are that the key concept “natural” seems ambiguous in many different ways (see Hume 1751, App. 3; Mill 1874; Brennan [1988] 2014; Ch. 6; Elliot 1997, Ch. 4), and that those who argue that human interference reduces the intrinsic value of nature seem to have simply assumed the crucial premise that naturalness is a source of intrinsic value. Some thinkers maintain that the natural, or the “wild” construed as that which “is not humanized” (Hettinger and Throop 1999, p. 12) or to some degree “not under human control” (ibid., p. 13) is intrinsically valuable. Yet, as Bernard Williams points out (Williams 1992), we may, paradoxically, need to use our technological powers to retain a sense of something not being in our power. The retention of wild areas may thus involve planetary and ecological management to maintain, or even “imprison” such areas (Birch 1990), raising a question over the extent to which national parks and wilderness areas are free from our control. An anlogy with gardening has sometimes been used to explore the nature of restoration (Allison 2004).

Given the significance of the concept of naturalness in these debates, it is perhaps surprising that there has been relatively little analysis of that concept itself in environmental thought. In his pioneering work on the ethics of the environment, Holmes Rolston has worked with a number of different conceptions of the natural (see Brennan and Lo 2010, pp.116–23, for an analysis of three senses of the term “natural” that may be found in Rolston’s work). An explicit attempt to provide a conceptual analysis of a different sort is found in Siipi 2008, while an account of naturalness linking this to historical narratives of place is given in O’Neill, Holland and Light 2008, ch. 8 (compare the response to this in Siipi 2011). For reflections on how to protect “one nature with several representations” from the perspective of science policy see Ducarme and Couvet 2020.

Finally, as an alternative to consequentialism and deontology both of which consider “thin” concepts such as “goodness” and “rightness” as essential to morality, virtue ethics proposes to understand morality—and assess the ethical quality of actions—in terms of “thick” concepts such as “kindness”, “honesty”, “sincerity” and “justice”. These, and other excellent traits of character are virtues (see the entry on virtue ethics). As virtue ethics speaks quite a different language from the other two kinds of ethical theory, its theoretical focus is not so much on what kinds of things are good/bad, or what makes an action right/wrong. Indeed, the richness of the language of virtues, and the emphasis on moral character, is sometimes cited as a reason for exploring a virtues-based approach to the complex and always-changing questions of sustainability and environmental care (Hill 1983, Wensveen 2000, Sandler 2007). One question central to virtue ethics is what the moral reasons are for acting one way or another. For instance, from the perspective of virtue ethics, kindness and loyalty would be moral reasons for helping a friend in hardship. These are quite different from the deontologist’s reason (that the action is demanded by a moral rule) or the consequentialist reason (that the action will lead to a better over-all balance of good over evil in the world). From the perspective of virtue ethics, the motivation and justification of actions are both inseparable from the character traits of the acting agent. Furthermore, unlike deontology or consequentialism the moral focus of which is other people or states of the world, one central issue for virtue ethics is how to live a flourishing human life, this being a central concern of the moral agent himself or herself. “Living virtuously” is Aristotle’s recipe for flourishing. Versions of virtue ethics advocating virtues such as “benevolence”, “piety”, “filiality”, and “courage”, have also been held by thinkers in the Chinese Confucian tradition. The connection between morality and psychology is another core subject of investigation for virtue ethics. It is sometimes suggested that human virtues, which constitute an important aspect of a flourishing human life, must be compatible with human needs and desires, and perhaps also sensitive to individual affection and temperaments. As its central focus is human flourishing as such, virtue ethics may seem unavoidably anthropocentric and unable to support a genuine moral concern for the non-human environment. But just as Aristotle has argued that a flourishing human life requires friendships and one can have genuine friendships only if one genuinely values, loves, respects, and cares for one’s friends for their own sake, not merely for the benefits that they may bring to oneself, some have argued that a flourishing human life requires the moral capacities to value, love, respect, and care for the non-human natural world as an end in itself (see O’Neill 1992, O’Neill 1993, Barry 1999). Not only Aristotle, but also Kant can be used in support of such a position. Toby Svoboda argues, for example, that even indirect duties to protect nature can be the basis of good moral reasons to promote the flourishing of natural things, regardless of whether doing so promotes human interests (Svoboda 2019). Other virtue ethicists claim to be able to provie an account of what it is to feel guilt about damage people have done to the environment and to make sense of the idea of a genuine feeling of gratitude toward nature “for being what it is” (Wood 2019).

Supplementary Document:
Biodiversity Preservation

5. Wilderness, the Built Environment, Poverty and Politics

Despite the variety of positions in environmental ethics developed over the last thirty years, they have often focused on issues concerned with wilderness and the reasons for its preservation (see Callicott and Nelson 1998 for a collection of essays on the ideas and moral significance of wilderness). The importance of wilderness experience to the human psyche has been emphasized by many environmental philosophers. Næss, for instance, urges us to ensure we spend time dwelling in situations of intrinsic value, whereas Rolston seeks “re-creation” of the human soul by meditating in the wilderness. Likewise, the critical theorists believe that aesthetic appreciation of nature has the power to re-enchant human life. As wilderness becomes increasingly rare, people’s exposure to wild things in their natural state has become reduced, and according to some authors this may reduce the chance of our lives and other values being transformed as a result of interactions with nature. An argument by Bryan Norton draws attention to an analogy with music. Someone exposed for the first time to a new musical genre may undergo a transformation in musical preferences, tastes and values as a result of the experience (Norton 1987. Such a transformation can affect their other preferences and desires too, in both direct and indirect ways (see Sarkar 2005, ch. 4, esp. pp. 82–7). In the attempt to preserve opportunities for experiences that can change or enhance people’s valuations of nature, there has been a move since the early 2000s to find ways of rewilding degraded environments, and even parts of cities (Fraser 2009, Monbiot 2013). Note that such rewilding is distinct from more traditional forms of restoration, since it need not be pursued with the intention of re-creating some original landscape or biological system (duToit and Pettorelli 2019). A spectacular form of rewilding may be associated with efforts to resurrect some long-dead species by using genetic technology to combine the DNA of an extinct species with the DNA of some closely-related contemporary species. For a review of some of the issues about de-extinction see Minteer 2015, and also Siipi and Finkelman 2017. Cautions about thinking of de-extinction as radically different from more conventional conservation and restoration practices are expressed in Novak 2018.

By contrast to the focus on wild places, relatively little attention has been paid to the built environment, although this is the one in which most people spend most of their time. In post-war Britain, for example, cheaply constructed new housing developments were often poor replacements for traditional communities. They have been associated with lower amounts of social interaction and increased crime compared with the earlier situation. The destruction of highly functional high-density traditional housing, indeed, might be compared with the destruction of highly diverse ecosystems and biotic communities. Likewise, the loss of the world’s huge diversity of natural languages has been mourned by many, not just professionals with an interest in linguistics. Urban and linguistic environments are just two of the many “places” inhabited by humans. Some philosophical theories about natural environments and objects have potential to be extended to cover built environments and non-natural objects of several sorts (see King 2000, Light 2001, Palmer 2003, while Fox 2007 aims to include both built and natural environments in the scope of a single ethical theory). Certainly there are many parallels between natural and artificial domains: for example, many of the conceptual problems involved in discussing the restoration of natural objects such as landscapes and ecosystems also appear in the parallel context of restoring human-made objects such as buildings and works of art (Vogel 2015).

Lovers of wilderness sometimes consider the high human populations in some developing countries as a key problem underlying the environmental crisis. Rolston (1996), for instance, claims that (some) humans are a kind of planetary “cancer”. He maintains that while “feeding people always seems humane, ... when we face up to what is really going on, by just feeding people, without attention to the larger social results, we could be feeding a kind of cancer.” This remark is meant to justify the view that saving nature should, in some circumstances, have a higher priority than feeding people. But such a view has been criticized for seeming to reveal a degree of misanthropy, directed at those human beings least able to protect and defend themselves (see Attfield 1998, Brennan 1998a). The empirical basis of Rolston’s claims has been queried by work showing that poor people are often extremely good environmental managers (Martinez-Alier 2002). Guha’s worries about the elitist and “missionary” tendencies of some kinds of deep green environmentalism in certain rich western countries can be quite readily extended to theorists such as Rolston (Guha 1999). Can such an apparently elitist sort of wilderness ethics ever be democratised? How can the psychically-reviving power of the wild become available to those living in the slums of Kolkata or São Paolo? These questions so far lack convincing answers.

Connections between environmental destruction, unequal resource consumption, poverty and the global economic order have been discussed by political scientists, development theorists, geographers and economists as well as by philosophers. Links between economics and environmental ethics are particularly well established. Work by Mark Sagoff (1988), for instance, has played a major part in bringing the two fields together. He argues that “as citizens rather than consumers” people are concerned about values, which cannot plausibly be reduced to mere ordered preferences or quantified in monetary terms. Sagoff’s distinction between people as consumers and people as citizens was intended to blunt the use of cost-benefit analysis as the final arbiter in discussions about nature’s value. Of course, spouses take out insurance on each others’ lives. We pay extra for travel insurance to cover the cost of cancellation, illness, or lost baggage. Such actions are economically rational. They provide us with some compensation in case of loss. No-one, however, would regard insurance payments as replacing lost limbs, a loved one or even the joys of a cancelled vacation. So it is for nature, according to Sagoff. We can put dollar values on a stand of timber, a reef, a beach, a national park. We can measure the travel costs, the money spent by visitors, the real estate values, the park fees and all the rest. But these dollar measures do not tell us the value of nature any more than my insurance premiums tell you the value of a human life (also see Shrader-Frechette 1987, O’Neill 1993, and Brennan 1995). If Sagoff is right, cost-benefit analysis cannot be a basis for an ethic of sustainability any more than for an ethic of biodiversity. The potentially misleading appeal to economic reason used to justify the expansion of the corporate sector has also come under critical scrutiny by globalisation theorists (see Korten 1999). These critiques do not aim to eliminate economics from environmental thinking; rather, they resist any reductive, and strongly anthropocentric, tendency to believe that all social and environmental problems are fundamentally or essentially economic. The development of ecological economics explores the scope for common ground between economists and environmental policy-makers, and also the role of environmental ethics in such discussions (Washington and Maloney 2020).

Other interdisciplinary approaches link environmental ethics with biology, policy studies, public administration, political theory, cultural history, post-colonial theory, literature, geography, and human ecology (for some examples, see Norton, Hutchins, Stevens, Maple 1995, Shrader-Frechette 1984, Gruen and Jamieson (eds.) 1994, Karliner 1997, Diesendorf and Hamilton 1997, Schmidtz and Willott 2002). Many assessments of issues concerned with biodiversity, ecosystem health, poverty, environmental justice and sustainability look at both human and environmental issues, eschewing in the process commitment either to a purely anthropocentric or purely ecocentric perspective (see Hayward and O’Neill 1997, and Dobson 1999 for collections of essays looking at the links between sustainability, justice, welfare and the distribution of environmental goods). The future development of environmental ethics depends on these, and other interdisciplinary synergies, as much as on its anchorage within philosophy (Dereniowska and Matzke 2014).

6. Sustainability and Climate Change

The Convention on Biological Diversity discussed in the supplementary document on Biodiversity Preservation was influenced by Our Common Future, an earlier United Nations document on sustainability produced by the World Commission on Environment and Development (WCED 1987). The commission was chaired by Gro Harlem Brundtland, Prime Minister of Norway at the time, and the report is sometimes known as the Brundtland Report. This report noted the increasing tide of evidence that planetary systems vital to supporting life on earth were under strain. The key question it raised is whether it is equitable to sacrifice options for future well-being in favour of supporting current lifestyles, especially the comfortable, and sometimes lavish, forms of life enjoyed in the rich countries. As Bryan Norton puts it, the world faces a global challenge to see whether different human groups, with widely varying perspectives, can perhaps “accept responsibility to maintain a non-declining set of opportunities based on possible uses of the environment”. The preservation of options for the future can be readily linked to notions of equity if it is agreed that “the future ought not to face, as a result of our actions today, a seriously reduced range of options and choices, as they try to adapt to the environment that they face” (Norton 2001: 419). Note that references to “the future” need not be limited to the future of human beings only. In keeping with the non-anthropocentric focus of much environmental philosophy, a care for sustainability and biodiversity can embrace a care for opportunities available to non-human living things.

However, when the concept “sustainable development” was first articulated in the Brundtland Report, the emphasis was clearly anthropocentric. In face of increasing evidence that planetary systems vital to life-support were under strain, the concept of sustainable development is constructed in the report to encourage certain globally coordinated directions and types of economic and social development. The report defines “sustainable development” in the following way:

Sustainable development is development that meets the needs of the present without compromising the ability of future generations to meet their own needs. It contains within it two key concepts:

  • the concept of “needs”, in particular the essential needs of the world’s poor, to which overriding priority should be given; and
  • the idea of limitations imposed by the state of technology and social organization on the environment’s ability to meet present and future needs.

Thus the goals of economic and social development must be defined in terms of sustainability in all countries—developed or developing, market-oriented or centrally planned. Interpretations will vary, but must share certain general features and must flow from a consensus on the basic concept of sustainable development and on a broad strategic framework for achieving it. (WCED 1987, Ch. 2, paragraphs 1–2)

The report goes on to argue that “the industrial world has already used much of the planet’s ecological capital. This inequality is the planet’s main ‘environmental’ problem; it is also its main ‘development’ problem” (WCED 1987, Overview, paragraph 17). In the concept of sustainable development the report combines the resource economist’s notion of “sustainable yield” with the recognition that developing countries of the world are entitled to economic growth and prosperity. The notion of sustainable yield involves thinking of forests, rivers, oceans and other ecosystems, including the natural species living in them, as a stock of “ecological capital” from which all kinds of goods and services flow. Provided the flow of such goods and services does not reduce the capacity of the capital itself to maintain its productivity, the use of the systems in question is regarded as sustainable. Thus, the report argues that “maximum sustainable yield must be defined after taking into account system-wide effects of exploitation” of ecological capital (WCED 1987, Ch. 2, paragraph 11).

There are clear philosophical, political and economic precursors to the Brundtland concept of sustainability. For example, John Stuart Mill (1848, IV. 6. 1) distinguished between the “stationary state” and the “progressive state” and argued that at the end of the progressive state lies the stationary state, since “the increase of wealth is not boundless”. Mill also recognized a debt to the gloomy prognostications of Thomas Malthus, who had conjectured that population tends to increase geometrically while food resources at best increase only arithmetically, so that demand for food will ultimately outstrip the supply (see Milgate and Stimson 2009, Ch. 7, and the discussion of Malthus in the Political Economy section of the Spring 2016 version of the entry on Mill). Reflection on Malthus led Mill to argue for restraining human population growth:

Even in a progressive state of capital, in old countries, a conscientious or prudential restraint on population is indispensable, to prevent the increase of numbers from outstripping the increase of capital, and the condition of the classes who are at the bottom of society from being deteriorated (Mill 1848, IV. 6. 1).

Such warnings resonate with pessimism about increasing human population and its impact on the poorest people, as well as on loss of biodiversity, fresh water scarcity, overconsumption and climate change. In their controversial work The Population Bomb, Paul and Anne Ehrlich, argue that without restrictions on population growth, including the imposition of mandatory birth control, the world faced “mass starvation” in the short term (Ehrlich 1968). This prediction was not fulfilled. In a subsequent defence of their early work, the Ehrlichs declared that the most serious flaw in their original analysis “was that it was much too optimistic about the future”, and comment that “Since The Bomb was written, increases in greenhouse gas flows into the atmosphere, a consequence of the near doubling of the human population and the near tripling of global consumption, indicate that the results will likely be catastrophic climate disruption caused by greenhouse heating” (Ehrlich and Ehrlich 2009, 66). It was also in 1968 that Garrett Hardin published his much cited article on the “tragedy of the commons” arguing that common resources can always be subject to degradation and extinction in the face of the rational pursuit of self-interest. For Hardin, the increasing pressure on shared resources, and increasing pollution, are inevitable results of the fact that “there is no technical solution to the population problem” (Hardin 1968). The problem may be analysed from the perspective of the so-called prisoner’s dilemma (also see the entry on the free rider problem). Despite the pessimism of writers at the time, and the advocacy of setting limits to population growth, there was also an optimism that echoes Mill’s own view that a “stationary state” would not be one of misery and decline, but rather one in which humans could aspire to more equitable distribution of available and limited resources. This is clear not only among those who recognize limits to economic growth (Meadows et al. 1972) but also among those who champion the move to a steady state economy (Daly 1991) or at least want to see more account taken of ecology in economics (Norgaard 1994, Rees 2020).

The Brundtland report puts less emphasis on limits than do Mill, Malthus and later writers. It depicts sustainability as a challenge and opportunity for the world to become more socially, politically and environmentally fair. In pursuit of intergenerational justice, it suggests that there should be new human rights added to the standard list, for example, that “All human beings have the fundamental right to an environment adequate for their health and well being” (WCED 1987, Annexe 1, paragraph 1). The report also argues that “The enjoyment of any right requires respect for the similar rights of others, and recognition of reciprocal and even joint responsibilities. States have a responsibility towards their own citizens and other states” (ibid., chapter 12, paragraph 83). Since the report’s publication, many writers have supported and defended the view that global and economics [normative] and economic justice require that nations which had become wealthy through earlier industrialization and environmental exploitation should allow less developed nations similar or equivalent opportunities for development especially in term of access to environmental resources (Redclift 2005). As intended by the report the idea of sustainable development has become strongly integrated into the notion of environmental conservation. The report has also set the scene for a range of subsequent international conferences, declarations, and protocols many of them maintaining the emphasis on the prospects for the future of humanity, rather than considering sustainability in any wider sense.

Some non-anthropocentric environmental thinkers have found the language of economics used in the report unsatisfactory in its implications since it already appears to assume a largely instrumental view of nature. The use of notions such as “asset”, “capital” and also the word “resources” in connection with natural objects and systems has been identified by some writers as instrumentalizing natural things which are in essence wild and free. The objection is that such language promotes the tendency to think of natural things as mere resources for humans or as raw materials with which human labour could be mixed, not only to produce consumable goods, but also to generate human ownership (Plumwood 1993, Sagoff 2004). If natural objects and systems have intrinsic value independent of their possible use for humans, as many environmental philosophers have argued, then a policy approach to sustainability needs to consider the environment and natural things not only in instrumental and but also in intrinsic terms to do justice to the moral standing that many people believe such items possess. Despite its acknowledgment of there being “moral, ethical, cultural, aesthetic, and purely scientific reasons for conserving wild beings” (WCED 1987, Overview, paragraph 53), the strongly anthropocentric and instrumental language used throughout the Brundtland report in articulating the notion of sustainable development can be criticised for defining the notion too narrowly, leaving little room for addressing sustainability questions directly concerning the Earth’s environment and its non-human inhabitants: should, and if so, how should, human beings reorganise their ways of life and the social-political structures of their communities to allow sustainability and equity not only for all humans but also for the other species on the planet?

The concern for preserving nature and non-human species is addressed to some extent by making a distinction between weaker and stronger conceptions of sustainability (Beckerman 1995). Proponents of weak sustainability argue that it is acceptable to replace natural capital with human-made capital provided that the latter has equivalent functions. If, for example, plastic trees could produce oxygen, absorb carbon and support animal and insect communities, then they could replace the real thing, and a world with functionally equivalent artificial trees would seem just as good—from an economic perpective—as one with real or natural trees in it. For weak sustainability theorists, the aim of future development should be to maintain a consistently productive stock of capital on which to draw, while not insisting that some portion of that capital be natural. Strong sustainability theorists, by contrast, generally resist the substitution of human for natural capital, insisting that a critical stock of natural things and processes be preserved. By so doing, they argue, rivers, forests and biodiverse systems are maintained, hence providing maximum options—options in terms of experience, appreciation, values, and ways of life—for the future human inhabitants of the planet (Norton 2005). The Brundtland report can also be seen as advocating a form of strong sustainability in so far as it recommends that a “first priority is to establish the problem of disappearing species and threatened ecosystems on political agendas as a major resource issue” (ibid., chapter 6, paragraph 57). Furthermore, despite its instrumental and economic language, the report in fact endorses a wider moral perspective on the status of and our relation to nature and non-human species, evidenced by its statement that “the case for the conservation of nature should not rest only with development goals. It is part of our moral obligation to other living beings and future generations” (WCED 1987, chapter 2, paragraph 55). Implicit in the statement is not only a strong conception of sustainability but also a non-anthropocentric conception of the notion. Over time, strong sustainability came to be focused not only on the needs of human and other living things but also on their rights (Redclift 2004, 218). In a further development, the discourses on forms of sustainability have generally given way to a more ambiguous usage, in which the term “sustainability” functions to bring people into a debate rather than setting out a clear definition of the terms of the debate itself. As globalization leads to greater integration of world economies, the world after the Brundtland report has seen greater fragmentation among viewpoints, where critics of globalization have generally used the concept of sustainability in a plurality of different ways (Sneddon, Howarth and Norgaard 2006). Some have argued that “sustainability”, just like the word “nature” itself, has come to mean very different things, carrying different symbolic meanings for different groups, and reflecting very different interests (Redclift 2004, 220). For better or for worse, such ambiguity can on occasion allow different parties in negotiations to claim a measure of agreement. For example, commenting on the connections between agricultural systems, sustainability and climate change, one writer has argued that there is exciting scope for negotiation across different world views in working out the conditions for a future sustainable form of agriculture (Thompson 2017).

Meadows’ and Daly’s arguments about the need to recognize that planetary resources are limited have continued to resonate with thinkers, especially those working in ecological economics (Daly and Farley 2011). As one author puts it, “the overriding aim [of ecological economics] ... is to seek viable responses to the biggest dilemma of our times: reconciling our aspirations for the good life with the limitations and constraints of a finite planet” (Jackson 2017, 3). While economic growth is a central focus of neoclassical economic theory (see the entry on philosophy of economics) a minority of thinkers have joined in supporting an agenda of “de-growth” (or “degrowth”) as an alternative to what is sometimes called “growthism” (for a popular overview see Hickel 2020). From small beginnings in the late 20th century, the idea of de-growth developed from “a political slogan with theoretical implications” to become a significant challenge to the idea of sustainable development considered as a kind of sustainable growth (Martinez-Alier et al. 2010). Advocates of de-growth advocate that the transition to sustainability will be aided by pursuing de-growth instead of economic growth (D’Alisa et al. 2015, Khamara and Kronenbeg 2020). At the same time some ecological economists argue for a rejection of the anthropocentrism they claim is central to neoclassical economics and support embracing a new ecological economics that explicitly incorporates an ecological ethic (Washington and Maloney 2020). Having drawn attention to the huge impact of the human ecological footprint, Rees has gone on to gloomily ponder the kind of economics needed to deal with a situation in which “we are currently ‘financing’ economic growth by liquidating the biophysical systems upon which humanity ultimately depends” (Rees 2020, 1). He concludes that “the mainstream fantasy…...this obsession with growth, cannot end well” (ibid., 6). Assuming that some forms of consumption are important to a satisfying human life, some writers have explored the idea that developing more modes of virtual consumption, while reducing physical forms of consumption, might be a significant contribution to sustainable lifestyles (Pike and DesRoches 2020).

The preservation of opportunities to live well, or at least to have a minimally acceptable level of well being, is at the heart of population ethics and many contemporary conceptions of sustainability. Many people believe such opportunities for the existing younger generations, and also for the yet to arrive future generations, to be under threat from continuing environmental destruction, including loss of fresh water resources, continued clearing of wild areas, decreasing biodiversity and a changing climate thus raising questions not only about sustainability but also about environmental justice (see Gonzalez, Atapattu, and Seck 2021). Of these, climate change has come to prominence as an area of intense policy and political debate, to which applied philosophers and ethicists were slow to contribute (Heath 2021). An early exploration of the topic by John Broome shows how the economics of climate change could not be divorced from considerations of intergenerational justice and ethics (Broome 1992), and this has set the scene for subsequent discussions and analyses (see the entry on climate justice). More than a decade later, when Stephen Gardiner analyses the state of affairs surrounding climate change in an article entitled “A Perfect Moral Storm” (Gardiner 2006), his starting point is also that ethics plays a fundamental role in all discussions of climate policy. But he argues that even if difficult ethical and conceptual questions facing climate change (such as the so-called “non-identity problem” along with the notion of historic injustices) could be answered, it would still be close to politically and socially impossible to formulate, let alone to enforce, policies and action plans to deal effectively with climate change. This is due to the multi-faceted nature of a problem that involves vast numbers of agents and players. At a global level, there is first of all the practical problem of motivating shared responsibilities (see the entry on moral motivation) in part due to the dispersed nature of greenhouse gas emissions which makes the effects of increasing levels of atmospheric carbon and methane not always felt most strongly in the regions where they originate. Add to this the fact that there is an un-coordinated and also dispersed network of agents—both individual and corporate—responsible for greenhouse gas emissions, and that there are no effective institutions that can control and limit them. But this tangle of issues constitutes, Gardiner argues, only one strand in the skein of quandaries that confronts us. There is also the fact that by and large only the future (and perhaps the current younger) generations will carry the brunt of the impacts of climate change, explaining why so many people in the current generations seem not to have strong enough incentive to act. Finally, he argues it is evident that mainstream political, economic, and ethical models are not up to the task of reaching global consensus, and in many cases not even national consensus, on how best to design and implement fair climate policies. Some consequentialist theorists, however, have argued that a form of rule consequentialism can take account of the interests of future generations who may be inhabiting a "broken world" (Mulgan 2011, 2017). Mulgan argues that by imagining a broken world of limited resources and precarious human survival, it may be possible to devise an ideal moral ooutlook that differs from the ideal code of many rule consequentialists who usually presuppose that the future will be just like the present.

However, Gardiner takes a pessimistic view of the prospects for progress on climate issues. His view includes pessimism about technical solutions, such as geoengineering as the antidote to climate problems, echoing the concerns of others that large scale interventions in—and further domination of—nature may turn out to be an even worse climate catastrophe (Gardiner 2011, ch 11, Jamieson 1996 and see also the papers in Gardiner and McKinnon 2020). A key point in Gardiner’s analysis is that the problem of climate change involves a tangle of issues, the complexity of which conspires to encourage buck-passing, weakness of will, distraction and procrastination, “mak[ing] us extremely vulnerable to moral corruption” (ibid., 397; cf. Gardiner 2011; see also the concept of “wicked problem” in Brennan 2004). Because of the grave risk of serious harm to current and future generations of people and other living things, our failure to take timely mitigating actions on climate issues can be seen as a major moral failing, especially in the light of our current knowledge and understanding of the problem (IPCC 2021).

In a related reinterpretation of a classic study in psychology, Russell and Bolton re-examine Milgram’s classic “obedience studies” (see the entry on the concept of evil, section 4.5). In these experiments, Milgram explored the conditions under which ordinary people would be disposed to perform evil actions (such as administering electric shocks to strangers). Russell and Bolton argue that, when properly interpreted, Milgram’s studies show that political, administrative and bureaucratic structures can lead to a general and tacit agreement for those in an advantaged situation to harm the interests of those less powerful. In Russell and Bolton’s new interpretation of the Milgram experiments, those who are in the advantaged situation are those living comfortably in wealthy countries, while the powerless are distant strangers and members of future generations. Corporate structures and long organizational chains, Russell and Bolton argue, encourage inaction, denial and diffusion of responsibility that typifies both the common responses to climate change and also the behaviour of participants in Milgram’s experiments. They conjecture that Milgram’s work thus explains the phenomenon of what they call “responsibility ambiguity” that underlies hesitancy to take action on climate change (Russell and Bolton 2019, and see also Rees 2020). While they make no mention of the work of Hannah Arendt, their analysis recalls some of Arendt’s analysis of the banality of evil (see the entry on the concept of evil, section 2.3). There appears to be scope for more empirical research and interdisciplinary study on topics such as the diffusion of responsibility and denialism. A similar analysis might also apply to inaction in the face of declining biodiversity.

John Broome tries to show some of the ways that one form of climate denialism takes, when it uses ingenious but, Broome claims, flawed reasoning to depict individuals as making no significant contribution to climate change (Broome 2019, see also McKinnon 2014). A stronger form of denialism refuses to acknowledge the fact of anthropogenic climate change at all. A puzzle remains over why much ingenuity is expended on such denial in the face of the urgent problems that now confront the world (see the entry on science and pseudo-science). In response, some argue that the persisting denialism over the reality of the environmental and climate crises may be a product of shame or guilt over the human treatment of natural things and systems (Aaltola 2021). These emotions may interfere with and block a much-needed and honest confrontation of a frightening situation—even if it is one humans have brought upon themselves. There is also a well-known psychological phenomenon of “knowing but not knowing” which can contribute, along with other factors, to denialism (Norgaard 2011, 404, and compare the classic studyof this in Cohen 2001, ch. 2). Many countries’ initial and ongoing response to the 2020s COVID-19 pandemic, for example, appears to show that denialism, typically accompanied by widespread misinformation and unfounded hypotheses about conspiracies, may be a very human way to react in the face of a global catastrophe. Using factor analysis studies, some psychologists have claimed to demonstrate that anti-scientific views have close association with beliefs in creationism and animism. Further, they conjecture that purposive or teleological thinking is the gateway to such associations (Wagner-Egger et al. 2018). Note that the role of teleological notions in biology remains contested and subject to further research. Other research claims to show that people simply reject scientific findings that make them uncomfortable and threaten their worldviews (see Lewandowsky and Oberauer 2016).

Writers have also tried to make sense of why so much misinformation about climate change and other catastrophes is so widespread. On the part of some theorists (see McIntyre 2018), the blame for the evils of a “post-truth” era has been laid at the feet of some postmodern thinkers who endorse social epistemology. But social constructionist writers have their own diagnosis of the social forces that have given rise to the “new climatic regime” (Latour 2017), which combines science denialism and what has be called “out-of-this-world”—fanciful and over-optimistic—thinking about the human prospects for escaping climate catastrophe. One suggested remedy for these cognitve failings is to encourage the recognition that natural systems respond to human action and are not merely the material resources for economic development. It has been proposed that awareness that humans and the natural systems that support them share a dwelling place might pave the way to a new kind of “terrestrial politics” (Lenton and Latour 2018, Latour 2018). The shape of such a politics is still under-theorized, and could take many forms (Mann and Wainwright 2018). Meanwhile, some animal ethicists blame “speciesist anthropocentrism” (see the entry on the moral status of animals) for blinding humanity to the evils of its overpopulation and denialism (Almiron and Tafalla 2019). Whatever the future holds, many thinkers insist that solving the problem of climate change is an essential ingredient of sustainability and that the alternative to decisive action may result in the degrading not only of nature and natural systems, but also of human dignity itself (see Nanda (ed.) 2011, especially chapters by Heyd, Balafrej, Gutrich and Brennan and Lo, see also section 3.4 of the entry on human rights). As humanity faces an uncertain future of declining biodiversity and increasing extreme weather events driven by escalating planetary heating—causing suffering and alienation for humans and non-humans alike—the moral challenges listed at the start of this entry seem more pressing than ever.

Supplementary Document:
Pathologies of Environmental Crisis: Theories and Empirical Research


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The authors are deeply grateful to the following people who gave generously of their time and advice to help shape the final structure of this entry: Clare Palmer, Mauro Grün, Lori Gruen, Gary Varner, William Throop, Patrick O’Donnell, Thomas Heyd, Dale Jamieson and Edward N. Zalta.

Copyright © 2021 by
Andrew Brennan <A.Brennan@latrobe.edu.au>
Norva Y. S. Lo <norvayslo@gmail.com>

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