Evolution and Development

First published Wed Jul 8, 2020

The relationship between development and evolution has recently become a lively debated topic among philosophers and biologists. This interest has been increasingly stirred through at least four developments since the 1990s: First, through new findings of the molecular genetic mechanisms underlying the development and evolution of all morphological forms in multicellular organisms. This discovery eventually led to the foundation of the new field of evolutionary developmental biology (evo-devo). Second, the ability to rapidly sequence genes and genomes allowed genetic comparisons to be made between species. Prior to this, evolutionary genetics was confined to allelic differences within a species. Third, new discoveries of environmentally sensitive channels of extra-genetic transmission of information between organisms (e.g., epigenetic inheritance and transmission of microbiota) led to attempts to more closely connect development and inheritance, and, as a consequence, evolution. Fourth, the behavioral patterns developed by organisms are increasingly discussed not only as effects of adaptive processes, but as starting point of evolutionary trajectories. This includes hypotheses conceptualizing organisms as agents that co-modify the selective pressures effecting them (and other species).

These recent trends towards intertwining, rather than separating, the concepts of development and evolution is in contrast to authoritative voices in evolutionary biology (and to a substantial part in philosophy of biology) during most of the twentieth century (see Sapp 1983; Burian 2004; Amundson 2005). As a consequence of this tradition, this new integration faces a number of conceptual and methodological challenges. In this entry, the focus will be on debates associated with the relationship between development and evolution. Other discussions about what each of the two components, development and evolution, are or how they are (or should be) conceptualized or studied individually is only addressed when relevant to this main topic.

1. Evolution and development in historical context

Originally, the concepts of evolution and development were closely connected. In fact, since the end of the 17th century the concept of ‘evolution’ was widely used to describe individual developmental processes, and ‘developmental hypotheses’ often referred to what is now called evolution. In addition, development (‘Entwicklung’) was often considered to not only describe ontogenetic changes in organisms (Goethe 1790; Debraw 1777) but also (what we consider today) phylogenetic changes. For example, Friedrich W.J. Schelling (1798) states that the sequence of stages of all organic beings took shape through the gradual development (‘Entwicklung’) of the same organization. This situation changed in the beginning of the 19th century when evolution was used by some authors for labeling transgenerational transformations of organisms, among others by Charles Lyell and Georg W.F. Hegel. However, in his first edition of his Origin of Species (1859) Darwin did not use the term evolution, likely because he wanted to distance his theory from earlier developmental understandings of the word. Instead, he spoke of ‘descent with modification.’ But especially due to the work of Herbert Spencer, evolution became established as a concept that concerns the “transformation of species”, and Darwin’s theory of transformation through selection was increasingly seen as the exemplar of a “theory of evolution” (Spencer 1852 [1891], 1). According to this theory, evolution is driven through organisms “struggle for existence” (Darwin) and the “survival of the fittest” (Spencer).

Besides this increasing conceptual parting, however, evolution and development were considered to be closely interrelated processes by many scholars throughout the 19th century. By building on earlier comparative studies of embryonic processes across various taxa (among others by Karl E. von Baer (1827) and Fritz Müller (1864)), Ernst Haeckel (1872) argued that all metazoans have the same early stages of development (see Gould 1977). He understood these developmental patterns as modifications of a basic type. According to this biogenetic law, the development of individuals is a recapitulation of species’ evolutionary changes:

During the rapid and short course of its individual development, the organic individual […] repeats the most important changes of form, which its ancestors passed through during their long and slow course of paleontological development, following the laws of heredity and adaptation. (Haeckel 1866, II 300)

This relationship, whereby biodiversity progressively arose from changes in development, was already anticipated by Johann F. Meckel (1812) and Richard Owen (1837), who parallelized ‘transmutations’ of embryonic forms and transmutations of species. Also Darwin (1837) describes the genesis of individuals as a ‘shortened repetition’ of morphological changes during phylogeny. From the end of the 19th century this view of development as a recapitulation of evolution became problematic (see Rasmussen 1991). First, during this time the view of a linear evolution from invertebrates over vertebrates to humans was increasingly questioned. Second, based on comparative studies of cell lineages across different taxa in the 1890s, scholars criticized that not only adult organisms but their developmental pathways evolve, too. For example, in 1898, embryologist Edmund B. Wilson (1898) was using homologous patterns of embryonic cell division to unite taxa, while embryologist Frank R. Lillie (1898) studied differences in these patterns to show the origins of evolutionary adaptations. These studies were (at least to some part) in conflict with Haeckel’s recapitulationism, as they saw ontogeny not as sufficiently explained by historical causes, but rather in need of independent mechanistic laws operating on physical properties of the ontogenetic material (see Guralnick 2002). In addition, this cell lineage research suggested that Haeckel’s law on the relationship between development and evolution should be inverted, as cell lineages evolve over evolutionary time. In more general terms, this means that development does not merely mimic evolution. Rather, it is a source of variation and thus a cause of evolution and adaptation: “ontogeny does not recapitulate phylogeny, it creates it” (Garstang 1922: 81). In short, evolution proceeds through modifications of development.

Another characteristic of 19th century (and early 20th century) biology was the lack of a clear conceptual parting between developmental and reproductive processes. Especially the idea of the inheritance of acquired characteristics was part of the mainstream of evolutionary thought (Bowler 1983, 2017; Gissis & Jablonka 2011). According to Jean Baptiste Lamarck (1809), changes in the structure or function of traits that occurred during an organism’s life, depending on their use or disuse, could be inherited. Darwin adopted this idea in his inheritance theory of pangenesis (see Holterhoff 2014). He suggested that all body parts, at each developmental stage, contain small particles, so-called ‘gemmules,’ that were sensitive to environmental changes. These particles accumulate in the reproductive organs and are transmitted to the next generation. Thus, gemmules modified during development lead to modifications in the next generation. Darwin stated that due to this close connection of development and reproduction, “inheritance must be looked at as merely a form of growth” (Darwin 1868: II, 404). However, this connection between development and inheritance was increasingly criticized in the first half of the 20th century. Following August Weismann (1892), the inheritance of environmentally induced variation in somatic cells (the body) of organisms was increasingly called into question. In sexually reproducing organisms, only the germ plasm used for the sperm and eggs were recognized as carrying information that are passed on to the next generation. According to this view, the germ line was immune from variation occurring in the somatic cells of the body, and thus the inheritance of acquired characteristics or other theories of plasmatic inheritance were rejected (but see Harwood 1993, Gilbert & Epel 2015).

This parting between development, on the one side, and inheritance and evolution, on the other, through Weismann’s theory of inheritance, had long lasting effects on how biologists reasoned about evolution in the following years. Despite continuing efforts of neo-Lamarckians well into the 1930s (Bowler 1983), development increasingly vanished from the landscape of evolutionary theory. By uniting Mendel’s laws and new findings in genetics within the statistical framework of population genetics, the modern synthesis came to understand evolution as a change in the frequencies of different alleles in a population (Fisher 1930; Dobzhansky 1951). Variation relevant to evolution was produced only in the genes of the germ line. These random changes, mutations, were screened off from the developmental history of the individual. In the 1940s and 50s this view was increasingly manifested, not least through the so-called ‘central dogma’ of molecular biology (Crick 1958). It states (similar to Weismann’s theory) that information flows always from the DNA to proteins, never vice versa. Thus, phenotypic changes during development could not affect the genes. The trend to link genes with populations in evolutionary explanations, rather than development with evolution reached its climax with the gene’s eye view of evolution (Williams 1966; Dawkins 1976). By focusing on the question how certain traits like altruistic behaviors could be beneficial, it not only identified genes (rather than organisms) as the sole units of selection. In addition, it described development as nothing but the readout of a genetic program (Maienschein 2003; Pigliucci 2010). Genes control the development of traits and organisms’ behaviors, and they replicate to secure their own further propagation in groups and populations.

During the twentieth century these partings of development and evolution led to statements such as: “Problems concerned with the orderly development of the individual are unrelated to those of the evolution of organisms through time” (Wallace 1986: 149). However, such statements were also targeted by a number of critics. For example, the exclusion of developmental biology from the modern synthesis (Harrison 1937; De Beer 1954; Waddington 1957; Hamburger 1980), the explanatory autocracy of the adaptationist program in evolutionary biology (Gould & Lewontin 1979), and the omission of a satisfying theory of evolutionary novelty, in which development would play a role (Goldschmidt 1940), have been criticized. Not least due to this rejection of developmental perspectives, evolutionary theory has been blamed to constrain the direction of research in evolutionary biology (Provine 1989). In fact, throughout the twentieth century a number of theories have been put forward, which argue that due to the partial independence of genetic and phenotypic variation, evolutionary research should put more emphasis on how the changes in developmental and behavioral patterns might drive or bias evolutionary change. This includes cases of ‘canalized’ developmental pathway which are maintained, even though the genotype or the environment might have changed to some degree (Waddington 1957; see also Nijhout 2002; Gilbert & Epel 2015; Sultan 2015). In addition, studies of phenotypic plasticity showed that a trait of an organism can react to an environmental input in various ways, and that the genome codes for a wide range of potential phenotypes (Waddington 1942; Nijhout 1990; Pigliucci 2001). The evolutionary relevance of these findings was emphasized by studies that investigated how the range of variation changes from a plastic trait to a fixed or canalized one over the course of generations (Suzuki and Nijhout 2008; West-Eberhard 2003; B. Baker et al. 2019). What is more, according to the so-called ‘Baldwin effect,’ learned behavioral patterns (e.g., the acclimatization to a new stressor) that were initially rather plastic, can affect the reproductive success of individuals and thus, across generations and through natural selection, be gradually incorporated into the genetic and epigenetic makeup of a species (Baldwin 1896; Simpson 1953; Piaget 1976 [1978]; Newman 2002). While some of these developmental perspectives on evolution were consistent with the population genetic framework of evolutionary biology and were, in fact, gradually incorporated into evolutionary thought, others posed more serious challenges for theoretical integration.

By building on the latter, more problematic set of approaches (especially in recent years), evolutionary theory has been facing calls from developmentally oriented biologists and philosophers of biology to widen the standard explanatory and methodological approaches on evolution (Bonner 1958; Alberch 1982; Bonner 1982; Raff & Kaufman 1983; Gilbert, Opitz, & Raff 1996; Schlichting & Pigliucci 1998; West-Eberhard 2003; G. Müller 2007; Pigliucci & Müller 2010; Bateson & Gluckman 2011; Jablonka & Lamb 2014; Laland et al. 2014, 2015; Gilbert & Epel 2015; G. Müller 2017; for discussion, see Huneman & Walsh 2017; Fábregas-Tejeda & Vergara-Silva 2018; Baedke et al. 2020b). They argue that evolutionary change should not only or primarily be investigated and explained as a change in genotype frequencies in populations but (also) on the level of the developing and acting individual. The underlying idea is that phenotypic variation and the flexibility of organisms’ responses to environmental cues may introduce non-random variation and thus may bias and/or direct morphological evolution to some degree. This includes not only environmentally induced changes in regulatory processes but also the physical constraints of the developing embryo. By focusing on these phenomena, Kevin Laland and colleagues (2014: 161) state: “An alternative vision of evolution is beginning to crystallize, in which the processes by which organisms grow and develop are recognized as causes of evolution”. Others have argued that genes are probably more often followers in evolution than leaders (West-Eberhard 2003, 2005). In other words, the environmentally responsive, developing and acting organism takes the lead. It introduces in a non-random way new phenotypes into populations that are subsequently stabilized by genes.

This ‘development first view’ (or sometimes called ‘plasticity first view’) of evolution is currently adopted especially by researchers in three fields of research: evolutionary developmental biology (evo-devo), epigenetics, and niche construction theory. Evo-devo studies how developmental pathways evolve and, more important for the above view, how developmental constraints and biases can affect evolutionary trajectories (Raff 1996, 2000; Gerhart & Kirschner 1997; Love 2003; Amundson 2005; Laubichler & Maienschein 2007; Sansom & Brandon 2007; G. Müller 2007; Minelli 2009; Laubichler 2010; Pigliucci & Müller 2010; Gilbert & Epel 2015; Moczek et al. 2015; Levis & Pfennig 2020). This includes asking how changes in gene regulatory networks cause modifications of developmental processes (associated with major shifts in morphological ‘body plans’) and thus produce evolutionary novelties, or what capacities organisms have to generate heritable, adaptive phenotypic variation and thus to evolve in evolution (i.e. their evolvability; see Hendrikse et al. 2007). This focus on how phenotypic variation is produced, rather than how it is selected, is supported by studies in epigenetics on inter- and transgenerational epigenetic inheritance (see the entry inheritance systems), like through the transmission of regulatory factors of gene activity (Jablonka & Lamb 1989, 2014, Janlonka & Raz 2009, Perez & Lehner 2019). Other forms of extra-genetic inheritance include the transmission of microbiota (Gilbert et al. 2012, 2014, Browne et al. 2017) and behaviorally mediated parental effects (Kappeler & Meaney 2010; Rilling & Young 2014). This set of processes contains environmentally sensitive non-genetic sources of variation for organisms that can be transmitted across generations, in many cases decoupled from the transfer of genetic information. Finally, niche construction theory highlights the self-perpetuating and reciprocal effects of organisms, as agents, that construct their own niche (and/or that of other species) during development (Lewontin 1982; Sterelny 2001; Day et al. 2003; Odling-Smee et al. 2003; Laland et al. 2008, 2009, 2011; Odling-Smee 2010; Chiu & Gilbert 2015, 2020; Aaby & Ramsey forthcoming). These recent studies on developmental evolution will be discussed in detail in section 3.

The various developments in the above fields have led to an increasing philosophical interest in conceptual and explanatory issues arising from the new junction of development and evolution. These include clarifying what causal relationships and boundaries exist between the two realms, which different roles developmental processes play in recent evolutionary research, and how these new roles affect ontological frameworks of the organism. In addition, these developments have been accompanied by debates about the structure of explanations in developmental evolution. Finally, they have informed discussions on anthropological understandings and ethical questions concerning humans. We will now discuss the debates on these issues in detail.

2. Conceptual partings and unifications of evolution and development

One of the most central topics of early philosophy of biology in the 1960s and 1970s was the attempt to develop a suitable conceptual framework that would support the parting between development and evolution in line with the central assumption of the Modern Synthesis that evolution is a change in the genetic composition of populations only (Dobzhansky 1951: 16; see also Charlesworth et al. 2017). This means, as a consequence, that development does not (or not in significant ways) causally effect evolution. Over the decades this assumption has been supported by the historically influential conceptual distinction between proximate causes and ultimate causes (Mayr 1961).

2.1 The proximate-ultimate distinction

The dual framework ‘proximate vs. ultimate’ provides a qualitative distinction of biological causality (for related distinctions, see J. Baker 1938; Tinbergen 1951, 1963). It holds that biologists who study proximate causes ask how questions about individual developmental processes. Thus, functional biologists interested in such proximate causes study how systems work. Instead, evolutionary biologists that study ultimate causes ask why questions, like why phylogenesis has produced particular evolutionary functions. According to this distinction, at least on the surface, proximate causes resemble Aristotelian efficient causes while ultimate causes resemble Aristotelian final causes. To illustrate this distinction, Mayr (1961) draws on an example of avian migration. Migration can be studied by asking how bird migrate (i.e., how they develop skills like navigation) or why they migrate (i.e., due to what selective advantage). These two investigations are understood to be both important and complementary. However, they should be treated as distinct from one another.

The proximate-ultimate distinction can be given an epistemic or ontological reading. First, authors have interpreted it as distinguishing different kinds of explanations (Amundson 2005; Calcott 2013; Scholl & Pigliucci 2015). This epistemic reading includes that how questions cannot be addressed by explanations citing ultimate causes (i.e., telling a story of adaptation) and that why questions cannot be addressed by explanations citing proximate causes (i.e., telling a story of trait development). Second, authors have interpreted this distinction as one between different ontological classes of causes working in ontogenetic and phylogenetic processes (Laland et al. 2013a). This ontological reading is backed up theoretically by Weismann’s concept of the separation of germ line and soma, which provides a demarcation line between two distinct classes of causes. To this day, biologists and philosophers have not reached a consensus on how exactly the division ‘proximate-ultimate’ or ‘how-why’ should be understood, epistemically or ontologically (Francis 1990; Dewsbury 1992, 1999; Sterelny 1992; Beatty 1994; Ariew 2003). Despite this lack of agreement this framework has been applied in various fields, from evolutionary biology (E. O. Wilson 1975 [2000: 23]), evolutionary psychology (Daly & Wilson 1978; Crawford 1998) and behavioral ecology (Morse 1980: 92–95) to human sciences, like in human cooperation (Marchionni & Vromen 2009) and developmental psychology (Lickliter & Berry 1990). Especially in evolutionary biology it has contributed to mainstream causal reasoning for a long time, even among evolutionary biologists interested in developmental processes (see, e.g., Maynard Smith 1982: 6).

2.2 The integration of proximate and ultimate causes

There has been constant criticism of the proximate-ultimate distinction (since even before Mayr 1961), and against its underlying idea to downgrade the explanatory or causal relevance of development to evolution. More recently, the discussion of this issue gained pace through new findings in fields such as epigenetics, evo-devo and niche construction theory (Thierry 2005; Laland et al. 2011, 2013a, 2013b; Haig 2011, 2013; Scott-Phillips et al. 2011; Dickins & Rahman 2012; Guerrero-Bosagna 2012; Calcott 2013; Dickins & Barton 2013; Gardner 2013; Mesoudi et al. 2013; Martínez & Esposito 2014; Scholl & Pigliucci 2015; Baedke 2018; Uller & Laland 2019). In this context, some scholars argue that the proximate-ultimate distinction stands “at the center of some of contemporary biology’s fiercest debates” (Laland et al. 2011: 1512) about the role of developmental plasticity, niche construction and inclusive inheritance for evolutionary trajectories. Participants in this debate have argued that we should, due to different epistemic or heuristic reasons, keep Mayr’s proximate-ultimate distinction (Scott-Phillips et al. 2011; Dickins & Barton 2013) or a revised or reinterpreted form of it (Scholl & Pigliucci 2015; Otsuka 2015), expand it by a third intermediate form of explanations (Haig 2013), or replace it with a concept of ‘reciprocal causation’ (Laland et al. 2011, 2013a, 2013b, 2015; Mesoudi et al. 2013). In line with earlier philosophical work (Oyama 1985; Keller 2010; Griffiths & Stotz 2013), the latter idea of reciprocal causation should allow describing the feedback processes between causal factors in evolving systems. This includes organisms’ capacity of phenotypic plasticity or, more specifically, their activities to alter selection pressures. Paradigmatic feedback cases are niche construction behaviors of organisms that modify their environments and thus shape natural selection pressures working on them. In other words, reciprocal causation holds that organisms are not only effects of adaptive processes, but also causal starting points of evolutionary trajectories. In this sense this framework argues against the causal and/or explanatory asymmetry claim of the proximate-ultimate distinction. It highlights the important role of development for evolution.

Against this new approach, scholars have argued that reciprocal causation does, in fact, not pose any conceptual challenges for evolutionary biology, as it has been included since quite some time ago in the field (Svennson 2018). A true challenge, however, is to develop this idea into a methodologically sound framework that allows studying and modeling complex non-linear organism-environment relations. Other have cast doubt on the central causal role the unit of the organism is supposed to play in this reciprocity framework (Baedke 2019a), or questioned whether this conceptualization can, in fact, capture all causal dependency relations of interest for evolutionary biology (Martínez & Esposito 2014; Scholl & Pigliucci 2015). Moreover, some argued that also this framework relies on the dichotomy between development and evolution (Dickins & Barton 2013; Martínez & Esposito 2014) and that it is not conducive to successful biological science, as it does not lead to falsifiable questions (Dickins & Rahman 2012) and bleeds proximate and ultimate explanations into each other so that their distinction becomes meaningless (Gardner 2013; one should mention, however, that this might be the very aim of this approach). More generally, it has been requested that advocates of this approach should provide more conceptual clarifications on what reciprocal causation actually is supposed to mean (Buskell 2019).

Besides distinguishing development and evolution in a qualitative manner as proximate and ultimate causal processes, a less common attempt is to quantitatively distinguish (or relate) the two. Here, especially distinctions based on the rates or time scales on which different developmental and biological processes occur have been made (see the entry levels of organization in biology). For example, Conrad H. Waddington (1957) developed a hierarchical model of time scales that includes biochemical processes on lower molecular levels of organization with a faster rate, medium paced processes of development on a medium level, and evolutionary processes on higher levels with a slower rate. According to such a view, evolutionary processes are simply processes occurring with a different rate and thus at a different level than developmental ones. Thus, they differ gradually rather than in kind. Rate-based distinctions have been described to be consistent with the ultimate-proximate framework (when interpreting it as one that distinguishes different timescales of phenotypic change; see Francis 1990; Haig 2013) or as different from proximate-ultimate distinctions (Baedke & Mc Manus 2018). In addition, time-scale (or size-scale) conceptualizations have been applied for developing methodologies and multi-scale modeling that integrate, among others, developmental and evolutionary processes (S. Levin 1992; Green & Batterman 2017; Duckworth 2019).

3. Developmental change as the mechanism for evolution

The idea that evolution constitutes changing developmental relationships is central for the field of evolutionary developmental biology (evo-devo). The field describes itself as the science that studies how alterations in development create the variations that nature can select (Raff & Kaufman 1983; Gilbert, Opitz, & Raff 1996). In other words, natural selection did not create variation; development creates variation. Development is the artist; natural selection is the curator (Gilbert 2006, 2019). Both have creative agency; but they are working at different levels. Although this view had been expressed by scientists such as Thomas Huxley, Julian Huxley, Conrad H. Waddington, and Richard B. Goldschmidt, it gained credence through more recent discoveries that explained how normal development could occur. Chief among these discoveries was the explication of developmental pathways that connected embryonic induction with gene expression. Here, paracrine factors (proteins that influence the behaviors or gene expression patterns of neighboring cells) secreted by one set of cells were received by receptors on the membranes of other cells. These receptors then activated proteins within the cytoplasm, which eventually activated or repressed proteins that entered the nucleus to regulate transcription of particular genes.

The second major discovery that promoted evo-devo was the discovery of modular enhancers. The above-mentioned transcription factors would bind to specific regions of DNA, called enhancers. Most genes have multiple enhancers. Thus, a gene might have a ‘limb’ enhancer that activates the expression of the gene in the limb, and an ‘eye’ enhancer that enables the expression of the gene in the eye. Moreover, each enhancer usually binds several transcription factors and could be activated in Boolean <and> or <or> fashion. Evolution could occur by creating or deleting enhancers, thereby enabling genes to be expressed differently in different species. King and Wilson (1975) and Jacob (1977) had speculated that evolution occurred by changes in gene regulation. This provided a model for such regulation, and some of the best examples are seen in the divergence of humans from other apes (Geschwind & Konopka 2012; Pollard et al. 2006). As Haraway (2008) noted, “relationships are the smallest possible pattern for analysis”, and the relation between enhancer and transcription factor may indicate the ‘natural kinds’ of the biological world (Gilbert & Bard 2014). Moreover, the entities defined by enhancer/transcription factor interactions during development are often unexpected and do not mirror intuitive boundaries between entities in adults. Activation of genes to form the distal rib, for instance, is controlled by a different enhancer than that which activates genes in the proximal rib (Guenther et al. 2008).

These differences in gene expression could be categorized into four categories (Arthur 2004). One of these categories involves the place of gene expression, where different populations of cells express a particular gene in different species. For instance, the gremlin gene in the duck hindlimb webbing protects these cells from cell death, enabling webbed feet (Laufer et al, 1997; Merino et al. 1999). A second category involves changes in the timing of gene expression, as in the continued expression of the fgf8 gene at the tip of the dolphin forelimbs, thus enabling the extension of its flippers (Richardson & Oelschläger 2002). A third category of change involves alterations in the magnitude of gene expression, as in the differences in Bmp4 gene expression that determine the width of finch beaks (Abzhanov et al. 2004). A fourth category focuses on the alterations of the actual protein sequence of regulatory proteins, as in the changes of the Antennapedia gene in insects, which restrict insects from forming more than six limbs (Galant and Carroll 2002).

The third discovery was the elucidation of gene regulatory networks (GRNs). A GRN is based on paracrine factors, signal transduction cascades, and transcription factors. While ignoring post-transcriptional gene regulation, this concept attempts to explain how initial conditions (RNAs and proteins within the oocyte, position of the embryo within the uterus, etc.) could create the conditions whereby cell types differ, even though their genomes are identical. Spearheaded by Eric Davidson (2001, 2006), this approach uses systems theory concepts such as modularity and dissociability to explain how the genes interact in a hierarchical manner to produce different cell types (Levine & Davidson 2005) and how the cell types in related species could differ by the recruitment (co-option) of a particular GRN by altering transcription factor binding. More generally, the discovery of GRNs has enabled the integration of developmental biology with paleontology (Jablonski 2017; Hinman et al. 2003; Hinman & Cheatle Jarvela 2014) and may also be extended into areas of symbiosis and niche construction (Laubichler & Renn 2015).

A fourth discovery of evolutionary developmental biology was the importance of developmental plasticity for evolution (Nijhout 1990; Gilbert 2001; Pigliucci 2001). By the end of the 20th century, the roles of temperature, sunlight, diet, crowding, maternal behaviors, and predation were seen to have major roles in effecting phenotypes in plants and animals. Thus, the environment not only selected variations, it helped produce them. Since evo-devo postulated that changes in development cause evolution, and since developmental plasticity played a role in development, then it became necessary to look at changes in plasticity as being part of evolution. In the early years of the 21st century, developmental plasticity was seen to play roles in evolutionary change (West-Eberhard 2003; Abouheif et al. 2014; Suzuki & Nijhout 2006; Rajakumar et al. 2018; Levis & Pfennig 2020), and the notion of ‘plasticity-first evolution’ (or ‘development-first evolution’) integrated data from numerous sources into a program where the physiological ability to alter one’s phenotype due to environmental agents could become canalized and genetically fixed by selection. The mechanisms by which such plasticity-first evolution was effected (unmasking and selection of cryptic genetic variants, stress-related inability of molecular chaperones to allow proper folding of mutant proteins, etc.) became a new research program.

A fifth discovery was the realization that one of the major environmental agents effecting development were symbiotic microbes (McFall-Ngai 2002; Gilbert et al. 2012, 2015). The notion of the holobiont (i.e. an integrated composite organism composed of microbial and host eukaryotic species) organized much of the data to look at the roles of microbes in causing both the normal development of the organism and variations of normal development (in disease and evolution) (Rosenberg & Zilber-Rosenberg 2016; see entry biological individuals). For instance, in the mouse, the normal development of the immune system and the gut capillary network depends upon specific bacteria obtained during birth. These bacteria induce the expression of particular genes in the eukaryotic cells, and the proteins made by these genes influence cell fate (Hooper et al. 2001; McFall-Ngai et al. 2013). In other words, the bacteria can act as an embryonic cell would, regulating gene expression in neighboring cells. Here, the eukaryotic organism needs and expects these bacteria to be present for normal development.

As in the other cases of developmental plasticity, the next step was to see if changes in developmental symbionts could produce changes in evolution (see O'Malley 2015). It was shown that changes in symbionts could provide selectable variants for evolution (Zhang et al. 2019), and it could provide the basis for reproductive isolation through cytoplasmic incompatibility or mating preference (Brucker & Bordenstein 2013; Sharon et al. 2010). One of the most interesting possibilities, though, comes from the view that most, if not all, eukaryotic organisms are holobionts, and that symbionts open new evolutionary trajectories. Symbiotic microbes, for instance, have long been known to be responsible for the plant-digesting enzymes in the stomachs of ruminants. Without cellulose-digesting bacteria, cows cannot digest grass or grain. Moreover, the microbes help create the rumen after they colonize the digestive system at birth. Thus, these microbes also induce the formation of the organ that houses them, and allows them to function (Gilbert 2020; Chiu & Gilbert 2020). Developmental symbiosis (sympoiesis) thus has opened evolutionary trajectories for certain mammals. This is an example of both developmental symbiosis and niche construction. Niche construction depends on developmental plasticity (Laland et al. 2008).

These five new (or renewed) aspects of developmental biology have several philosophical implications. Among others, they concern ontological questions of what developing organisms are and how they should be explained from an integrated perspective of developmental evolution.

4. Ontological challenges of developmental evolution

Many ontological debates on the relation between development and evolution focus on the organism as the central unit, which both develops and evolves, in contrast to, for example, genes or populations. Several theories have tried to clarify the nature of this organismic unit: According to one influential view, the organism is a series of integrated processes during a life cycle (Bonner 1965; Nicholson & Dupré 2018; Fusco 2019a; DiFrisco 2019), with complex and reciprocal relationships between the whole organism and its parts (Gilbert & Sarkar 2000; Esposito 2016; Peterson 2017). Central elements of this view are based on an organicist framework developed by Kant, which states that in organisms “the parts, with respect to both form and being, are only possible through their relationship to the whole” and “that the parts bind themselves mutually into the unity of a whole in such a way that they are mutually cause and effect of one another” (Kant 1790/1793 [1902: 373]; see also Lenoir 1982). Haraway (2008) highlights the latter idea of reciprocal interaction between organisms’ parts by saying: “Reciprocal induction is the name of the game” (2008: 228) and it is “reciprocating complexity all the way down” (2008: 42).

These ideas of life cycle integration and ubiquitous reciprocity suggest a more processual and organism-centered ontological perspective on the organism. This view is becoming important in studies of evolution. For example, in order to understand how nervous systems evolve one need to consider that the nervous system of the developing organism has different functions than the adult nervous system and may be used to coordinate body construction as it develops (M. Levin 2019; Fields et al. 2020). That developing systems show exaptation and competition and that evolving systems show cooperation has allowed Fields and Levin (forthcoming) to suggest that developmental and evolutionary processes can be integrated on a scale-free level through the language of information processing and communication.

A second ontological consideration states that developing and evolving organisms are integrated collective individuals, so-called holobionts or ‘meta-organisms’ (Zilber-Rosenberg & Rosenberg 2008; Bosch & McFall-Ngai 2011; Gilbert, Sapp, & Tauber 2012; see also O'Malley 2017; Baedke et al. 2020a). Therefore, our discussions about evolution must take into consideration that each organism is a consortium having numerous genomes, not just one, as traditionally assumed. Mathematical modeling of the evolution of holobionts that take this diversity into consideration is just beginning (Roughgarden et al. 2018; Osmanovic et al. 2018; Roughgarden 2020). This new ontological framework states that symbiosis is the norm; it is not peripheral. These symbionts can act at different stages of the life cycle and are seen to scaffold development (Griesemer 2014; Chiu & Gilbert 2015; Minelli 2016). In ‘scaffolding,’ each developmental stage is made possible by entities and processes that catalyze these activities, which allows novel and evolutionary relevant processes to occur at lower difficulties and costs.

A third ontological point concerns the exact nature of the link between development and evolution. Two approaches have been put forward: One draws on the idea that the biological entity that is causally efficacious in both realms can only be found on the level of integrated collectives of symbiotic interactions. Following in the tradition of Leibnitz’ notion of compossibility as well as Margulis’ (1999) claim that we live on a ‘symbiotic planet,’ this view argues that symbiotic collectives are not only essential units of development but also of evolution. This leads to a view of evolution that is not centered on interspecies conflict and competition between individuals (Huxley 1888; Williams 1966; Dawkins 1976). Instead the entities that evolve are cooperative co-developing collectives (Rosenberg & Zilber-Rosenberg 2016; Roughgarden et al. 2018; for discussion, see Peacock 2011; Suárez 2018).

A different ontological framework links development and evolution through the entity of the acting organism (Nicholson 2014, 2018; Walsh 2015; for discussion, see Pradeu 2016; Baedke 2019a, 2019b). These approaches usually are less related to symbiosis research than to studies on niche construction or maternal effects. Here the organism (e.g., a beaver that builds a dam or an earthworm that processes the soil) is constructed as a self-determined agent that through its behavior modulates the selection pressures acting on it (Odling-Smee et al. 2003; Uller & Helanterä 2019). Thus, so the argument goes, it can bias and direct population dynamics. The holobiont perspective and the niche construction perspective join together when one appreciates that the microbes and the host form each other’s environment. Here, the host and the microbes scaffold each other’s development and evolution (Chiu & Gilbert 2015, 2020).

Whether or not we consider collectives or organismic individual agents as the core entities partaking both in development and evolution, attempts to integrate the two realms have to show in each case that, in fact, it is the same unit that develops and evolves. In other words, if we want to unify development and evolution through the unit of the biological individual (being the one entity that partakes in both) this unit needs to meet criteria of both physiological (e.g., metabolic) and evolutionary individuality (see the entry on biological individuals). Evolutionary individuals have been traditionally conceptualized as reproductive units with differential fitness and shared lineages (so-called ‘Darwinian individuals’; see Godfrey-Smith 2009) or as units of selection (‘interactors’; see Hull 1980). Unfortunately, both of these units do not always coincide (Godfrey-Smith 2013; Pradeu 2016). For example, some organisms (holobionts) form developing but no reproductive units, as they include a multitude of lineages (e.g., microbial ones). Other possible units of selection (like genes or populations) are not identical with physiological individuals. Thus, a physiological individual may not necessarily be an evolutionary unit or vice versa.

This brings us to a fourth ontological point: developmental plasticity, which is considered to bias or even guide evolutionary trajectories (West-Eberhard 2003; Radersma et al. forthcoming). The concept of plasticity states that development can be regulated in important ways by the environment. This rules out genetic determinism (but not necessarily environmental determinism; see Waggoner and Uller 2015). In the original conception of phenotype production (i.e., development), Wilhelm Johannsen (1909) had pointed out that the phenotype is the product of both the genotype and environmental circumstance, and Woltereck (1909; see also Sarkar 1999) argued that what was inherited is the “Reaktionsnorm”, a potential to generate phenotypic variations in response to environmental agents. In line with this view, many embryology texts in the late 1800s (e.g., Hertwig 1894) had promulgated the perspective that development demanded both the interactions between embryonic cells and the further interactions of those cells with the environment (see Nyhart 1995).

Despite this history, developmental plasticity was marginalized as genetic explanations came to the fore in the mid-20th century (Sarkar 1998; Keller 2002). Against this background, embryologists such as Lewis Wolpert (1994) could ask whether an organism’s phenotype could be computed if we had the total description of the egg. Due to the above findings on organism-environment interaction (see section 3), a different view emerged that more seriously considers the environmental-responsiveness and plasticity of the developing phenotype. This view includes a shift from externalist to internalist or constructionist understandings of the organism-environment relationship (Godfrey-Smith 1996). While the externalist view – the orthodox view in evolutionary theory – conceptualizes properties of organisms as a result of their environments (i.e. natural selection targeting genetic programs), the internalist view sees “one set of organic properties in terms of other internal or intrinsic properties of the organic system” (Godfrey-Smith 1996: 30). According to these two accounts, organisms occupy an environment that covaries with them or that is largely independent of their variation. The above research in developmental evolution suggests a switch from an externalist to a constructionist perspective, in which the organism actively molds its internal states and responds to and alters its external environment (see Laland et al. 2014, 2015). In addition, in this framework also the causal role of the environment becomes more complex. It now includes the idea that the environment has active agency that can determine the phenotype. Rather than conceptualizing the environment as nothing but a passive filter for evolution, in this view the environment plays a role in actuating the phenotype in addition to selecting it (Moczek 2015; Gilbert & Epel 2015).

5. Explanations of developmental evolution

Besides these discussions about the ontology of developing and evolving organisms, other central philosophical debates on the interface between development and evolution have targeted the topic of scientific explanation. This refers to the questions of what studies of developmental evolution (should) explain and how they explain.

5.1 Mechanistic explanations of developmental evolution

Philosophers of science have long argued for the explanatory autonomy of biological explanations. Especially, they have criticized understanding biological explanation as similar to law-based accounts of explanations in physics (see Lange 2007). In contrast, scholars have argued that explanation in the biosciences often includes describing a mechanism that brings about a certain biological phenomenon (Bechtel & Richardson 1993; Craver 2007; Bechtel & Abrahamsen 2010; see also entry mechanisms in science). Especially evo-devo has been described as a paradigmatic mechanistic science, which – against the ultimate-proximate distinction – seeks to identify developmental mechanisms that can explain evolutionary change in phenotypes (Gilbert 2003; Hall 2012). This mechanistic approach is often flanked by mathematical models of various developmental patterns, from changes in gene regulatory networks to growth patterns of organisms, and by historical narratives on how organisms and species evolve (Jaeger & Sharpe 2014; Winther 2015). However, besides the accepted centrality of mechanistic explanation for developmental evolution, a much-debated topic concerns what exactly a developmental mechanism is and how it functions in evolutionary explanation compared to standard explanations citing natural selection.

Philosophers of biology (in the so-called new mechanistic philosophy) have conceptualized mechanistic explanations in biology as the construction of models of mechanisms that connect parts of systems, located on one level of organization, with behaviors of the whole system, usually located on a higher level of organization (Machamer et al. 2000; Craver 2007; Illari & Williamson 2012). In this framework, mechanistic models relate different compositional levels of organization, like genes and phenotypes or cells and tissues. These inter-level relations exist between causal capacities of parts of a system and their organization and the capacities of a system as a whole. Such relations are established following a procedure of decomposition and localization (Bechtel & Richardson 1993; Craver 2007; Menzies 2012). This conceptual framework to describe biological mechanisms and mechanistic explanation has been developed based on case studies in molecular and cell biology. However, scholars have cast doubt on whether it is also useful to describe mechanistic explanations in studies of development and developmental evolution.

With respect to development, it has been argued, first, that organization plays a different role in mechanistic developmental explanations (Mc Manus 2012). In contrast to the above framework, which usually presupposes that levels of organization are simply there, and thus it does not have to clarify how levels of organization actually originate, the origin of levels and other forms of organization (e.g., spatial axes) are specifically addressed in mechanistic developmental explanations. Second, philosophers have argued that the relations between levels traced by developmental mechanisms are not exhausted by the synchronic, constitutive relations between parts and wholes, as some new mechanists suggest (Craver & Bechtel 2007). In contrast, developmental explanations trace changing diachronic relationships between causal capacities of a system at different levels of organization at different time intervals (Ylikoski 2013; Baedke & Mc Manus 2018; Baedke 2020; see also Love & Hüttemann 2011). Third, it has been argued that explanations in evo-devo using developmental mechanisms face a challenge due to the heterogeneity of these mechanisms (Love 2018). When trying to integrate two types of explanations of developmental mechanisms – explanations of highly conserved molecular genetic mechanisms, like gene regulatory networks, and explanations of cellular-physical mechanisms, like cell migration – sometimes a tradeoff emerges. Rather than allowing a more complete explanation, integrating the two mechanisms may lead to a less general explanation, since non-phylogenetically conserved cellular-physical mechanisms yield less generality in explanations. This tradeoff can introduce an explanatory bias to projects that seek to integrate development and evolution. It could lead researchers to favors the generality of explanations, which cite highly conserved molecular genetic mechanisms and no cellular-physical mechanisms, over integrated explanations citing both kinds of mechanisms.

With respect to the concept of mechanism in developmental evolution, Brigandt (2015) highlights that some mechanistic explanations in evo-devo – like those on how development biases evolution (Radersma et al. forthcoming), how novel variation arises through developmental plasticity (Pigliucci 2001, Gilbert 2006), and how organisms generate heritable, adaptive phenotypic variation (evolvability; see Brown 2014) – significantly expand the standard analysis of decomposition and localization by dynamical models (see also Bechtel & Abrahamsen 2010; Brigandt 2013; Baedke 2020). These models allow predicting the dynamics of developing systems. After decomposing a system and identifying causal contributions of parts or sub-systems, dynamical models help to demonstrate how these contributions operate together to bring about a whole system’s behavior. In this way, they answer how developmental mechanisms create evolutionary relevant qualitative changes in phenotypic properties, like robustness, phenotypic plasticity, and modularity, through underlying quantitative changes in their component parts and activities. One classical example of this are mathematical models on the robustness of spatial pattering and segmentation in Drosophila. They provide quantitative information about the interaction of underlying gene network components, including, for example, gene transcription rates and decay rates of gene products (von Dassow et al. 2000).

Other discussions on the interface between development and evolution focus on the structure of explanations that address how developmental mechanisms evolve. Calcott (2009, 2013) has argues that Mayr’s distinction characterizes two kinds of explanation: developmental explanation that answers ‘How do individuals work at a time?’ and evolutionary explanation that answers ‘How do populations change over time?’ However, there is a third kind, called ‘lineage explanation’. Lineage explanation differs from the above by answering ‘How do individuals change over time?’ Therefore, they offer a series of mechanistic models, which trace differences between the developmental mechanisms of individuals that produce the relevant morphological structures at different times. Over evolutionary time, these relations undergo small modifications, which ultimately bring about novelties, like eyes and feathers, in the whole system. Thus, lineage explanation expands the standards philosophical framework from a single description of a mechanism into a series of mechanistic models.

5.2 The explanatory power of developmentalist explanations of evolution

Besides these debates about the structure of biological mechanisms and their role in explaining developmental evolution, philosophers of biology and biologists have discussed, more generally, which virtue developmental explanations (could) have for addressing evolutionary phenomena. Related to this issue is the question how much – in the sense of what kind of facts – natural selection alone can explain (see the entry adaptationism). It is widely accepted that such explanations can address the general dynamics of trait frequencies and survival (see Sober 1984). However, whether this also holds for addressing in more detail the development of particular traits of individuals is an unsettled issue. While some authors claim that evolutionary explanations by natural selection can explain why a particular individual has a certain trait rather than another trait (Neander 1995; Forber 2005) others deny this (Sober 1984; Stegmann 2010). What is more, it has been argued that integrating explanations of developmental phenomena, like developmental bias, phenotypic plasticity, niche construction, and inclusive inheritance, to the explanatory framework of evolutionary theory would lead to a “significantly expanded explanatory capacity” of this theory (Pigliucci & Müller 2010: 12). However, while there is often agreement in evolutionary biology over the existence of these developmental phenomena (Laland et al. 2014; Wray et al. 2014), their explanatory relevance is questioned. Against this background, scholars have begun analyzing based on which criteria of explanatory power, like precision, proportionality, sensitivity, and idealization, developmentalist evolutionary explanations are better than selectionist explanations. This includes identifying, which tradeoffs between explanatory standards (e.g., between precision and sensitivity or idealization) those accounts face that seek to integrate developmental and evolutionary explanations (Baedke et al. 2020b; Uller et al. 2020).

6. Anthropological and ethical dimensions of developmental evolution

The above debates about the relationship between evolution and development primarily emerged within philosophy of science, especially in history and philosophy of biology. However, there are other, more general debates about anthropological and ethical issues that concern developmental evolution. The primarily refer to how we conceptualize developing and evolving humans, their life, body and health, as well as how we assign responsibilities for health care interventions.

First, new findings in the plasticity of developing organism, their interconnectedness, and modes of transgenerational transmission of information have affected scientific and public understandings of what humans are. For example, if humans are conceptualized as holobionts – as collectives of co-developing and co-evolving organisms – this also means that development is a matter of co-construction, of interactions between species. It means, as Haraway (2016) has phrased it, that we – as humans – very literally ‘become with others.’ In this context, sympoiesis (developmental symbiosis) means that development is co-development. Against this background, John Dupré and Maureen O'Malley (2009) see living entities as interactive collections: “Life, we claim, is typically found at the collaborative intersections of many lineages, and we even suggest that collaboration should be seen as a central characteristic of living matter”.

Second, biological and biophilosophical debates on developmental evolution and organisms’ plasticity and environmental responsiveness have informed debates on what the human body is. For example, Jörg Niewöhner (2011) states that a new concept of the human body is currently emerging in modern biology, the so-called ‘embedded body’. According to this view, the human body is no longer a machine-like unit, which is genetically programmed, neurally controlled and bounded by the skin, but an open and dynamic unit which cannot be grasped in isolation from its material and social environment (see also Baedke 2017). Additionally, the body is embedded into different time scales ranging from its evolutionary and transgenerational to ontogenetic past, which permanently constitute its present. Others have argued, against the standard human birth narrative and Aristotle, who defined the temporal boundaries of individuals at birth and death, that birth in humans is not the creation of a new individual. Instead, birth should be understood as the origin of a new multi-species collective (Gilbert 2014; Chiu & Gilbert 2015).

Another anthropological issue arising from recent research in evo-devo and epigenetics is, third, the question how to define normality and health in humans (see Baedke 2019b). There is evidence that bacteria are needed for our normal cognitive and social development. For example, germ-free mice are asocial and have autistic-like behavior (Desbonnet et al. 2014) and this behavior can be replicated by implanting the microbiome from autistic patients (but not control patients) into germ-free mice (Sharon et al. 2019). Such cases suggest that biological normality is not as intrinsic property to organisms but emerges through interconnections with other organisms and the environment. In addition, our understanding of health is increasingly challenged. This especially refers to the view that describes human health as freedom and autonomy from external interference. It usually sees bacteria as deviations from the norm and parasitism as pathological, because it threatens and contaminates the purity of the individual’s energy pattern. Instead, in a (more processual) holobiontic framework, microbes are needed for normal development and are thought to prevent the development of certain diseases (Bello et al. 2018; Kirjavainen et al. 2019). In addition, certain entities, bacteria or viruses, previously thought to be harmful, are now increasingly considered to be ‘good’ or ‘healthy’ collaborators, not ‘bad intruders’ (Dupré & Guttinger 2016). In more general term, this means that since microbiota are increasingly recognized as important components that stabilize normal development and co-evolve with humans, they therefore carry traits crucial for humans’ fitness, i.e., health. This new perspective could lead to radical changes in personalized surveillance and treatment of disease, and, more generally, to new strategies in policy making, which replace the idea of preserving the autonomous individual from contamination by the idea of maintaining (equilibrium states of) collectives of co-developing and co-evolving individuals.

Finally, on a more ethical dimension, these findings about humans’ openness to their environments and to one another has led, first, to discussions about who takes responsibilities for humans’ health states and interventions (e.g., on epigenomes and microbiomes) on intra- and transgenerational timescales (Dupras & Ravitsky 2016). If plastic development can shape evolution, who is responsible for developmental outcomes and evolutionary trajectories in humans? Should the individual being as the central heath care agent, which is ‘freed from the chains of its genes’ (Pickersgill et al. 2013), take this responsibility? Or should collectives, such as national states or international bodies, be responsible for levels of toxins in the environment as well as for the food individuals eat and stress they are exposed to (Hedlund 2012)? The latter account of responsibility aims to prevent overemphasizing the causal role of mothers as the most central public health care agents who should be held accountable (and guilty) if their children or later generations become sick (Richardson et al. 2014).

7. Concluding Remarks

The relationship between evolution and development has been a long debated topic in the history of biology and philosophy of biology. This entry has sampled a small portion of work relevant to the conceptual, epistemological, anthropological and ethical reflections on this relationship. Besides the issues discussed here, philosophers of biology and biologists have discussed how developmental and phylogenetic approaches to homology can be integrated (Amundson 2004; Wagner 2014; DiFrisco 2019; see the entry developmental biology), what model organisms (Love 2009; Lloyd et al. 2012; Minelli & Baedke 2014; Zuk et al. 2014; see entry developmental biology) and representational tools scientists (should) use for studying relationships between evolution and development (e.g., normal plates, cell fate maps, epigenetic landscapes) and what the epistemic and heuristic roles of these tools in scientific practice are (see Haraway 1976; Gilbert 1991; Hopwood 2007; Love 2010; Baedke 2013; Baedke & Schöttler 2017; Nicoglou 2018). In addition, long standing debates on teleology in biology (see the entry teleological notions in biology) drew on the relation between evolution and development to distinguish the teleological dimension of development from non-teleological evolutionary processes (Mayr 1961), to introduce new conceptual frameworks, like teleonomy, which refer to only apparently purposeful systems (Pittendrigh 1958), or to highlight the purposeful acting organismic agent as a starting point to reason about the teleological nature of evolution (Russell 1950; Piaget 1976 [1978]; Walsh 2015).

At the moment, philosophical debates about the appropriate conceptual and explanatory approach to combine or integrate developmental and evolutionary processes have not reached a consensus. This is not least due to the fact that the relevant disciplinary fields, such as evo-devo, epigenetics and niche construction theory, which foster such integration, are still relatively young. Their theoretical and conceptual frameworks are highly heterogeneous. Thus, important aims for future philosophical research is to understand obstacles for the stabilization and solidification of these frameworks, to identify their explanatory virtues and limitations, as well as to call attention to their effects on how we understand humans and human health.


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