Levels of Organization in Biology

First published Mon Feb 5, 2018

Levels of organization are structures in nature, usually defined by part-whole relationships, with things at higher levels being composed of things at the next lower level. Typical levels of organization that one finds in the literature include the atomic, molecular, cellular, tissue, organ, organismal, group, population, community, ecosystem, landscape, and biosphere levels. References to levels of organization and related hierarchical depictions of nature are prominent in the life sciences and their philosophical study, and appear not only in introductory textbooks and lectures, but also in cutting-edge research articles and reviews. In philosophy, perennial debates such as reduction, emergence, mechanistic explanation, interdisciplinary relations, natural selection, and many other topics, also rely substantially on the notion.

Yet, in spite of the ubiquity of the notion, levels of organization have received little explicit attention in biology or its philosophy. Usually they appear in the background as an implicit conceptual framework that is associated with vague intuitions. Attempts at providing general and broadly applicable definitions of levels of organization have not met wide acceptance. In recent years, several authors have put forward localized and minimalistic accounts of levels, and others have raised doubts about the usefulness of the notion as a whole.

There are many kinds of ‘levels’ that one may find in philosophy, science, and everyday life—the term is notoriously ambiguous. Besides levels of organization, there are levels of abstraction, realization, being, analysis, processing, theory, science, complexity, and many others. In this article, the focus will be on levels of organization and debates associated with them, and other kinds of levels will only be discussed when they are relevant to this main topic.

1. The Historical Origins of the Concept

When levels of organization are understood as belonging to the broader category of hierarchical depictions of nature, their history can be traced all the way back to the early days of western science and philosophy. Aristotle suggested that living things could be arranged in a graded scale, starting from plants at the bottom and ending with humans at the top. This idea was further developed in Neoplatonism, and in Medieval times, it transformed into the idea of “the Great Chain of Being” (Lovejoy 1936). This Scala Naturae conveyed a hierarchical conception of the world as modeled after the perfection of the Deity: at the top, there is God, and at lower rungs, angels, humans, animals, plants, and so on. After the scientific revolution, more scientific classifications of nature started to appear, the most famous ones being Linneaus’ taxonomical system and Auguste Comte’s hierarchy of the sciences (Comte 1842 [1853]).

At the beginning of the 20th century, several notions of “levels” began to circulate in the philosophical and scientific literature. Prominent among these was the idea of “levels of existence” (alternatively: “being”; “complexity”) developed by philosophers Samuel Alexander (1920: 3, 45) and Charles Dunbar Broad (1925), which figured prominently in the emergentist and emergent evolution literature of the 1920’s (Sellars 1926; McLaughlin 1992; Stephan 1999). This introduced a number of themes that have become germane to general levels-language. These themes include level-specific laws (Broad 1925: 77; cf. Woodger 1929) and the idea that ‘levels’ exhibit a tendency in nature towards increasing complexity (Sellars 1917: 224; cf. Needham 1937), Although most of these themes were severely underdeveloped and divorced from the cutting-edge work in the life sciences happening at the time (Needham 1937: 242 ff. 4), this tradition has been an influential historical source for explicating levels language in philosophy of mind (see the entries on emergent properties and supervenience; McLaughlin 1992; Beckermann et al. 1992; Kim 1999, 2002).

The roots of the contemporary notion of levels of organization and the associated hierarchical thinking are best linked to the efforts of organicist biologists of the early-mid 20th century (for primers on the organicist movement, see Peterson 2014; Nicholson and Gawne 2015). Particularly important to the introduction and development of the levels concept were Joseph Woodger (1929, 1930), Ludwig von Bertalanffy (1928 [1933], 1932), and Joseph Needham (1936, 1937). These individuals were in turn influenced by Alfred North Whitehead’s philosophy (see, e.g., Whitehead 1929; Needham 1941).

Organicism (alternatively “organismal” or “organismic” biology) did not designate a clearly-defined group of people, but rather a loosely-threaded confluence of scientists and philosophers distributed among many disciplines and across Europe and the Americas. The organicists (like the emergentists) were in part responding to the dispute between the mechanists and the neovitalists of the early 20th century. The mechanists held that biological phenomena were “nothing over and above” their physico-chemical components, meaning that biological phenomena can in principle, and eventually will, be exhaustively accounted for in chemical or physical terms (Loeb 1912, 1916). They also argued that biological phenomena, though seemingly complex, are fundamentally similar to machines (Loeb 1912, 1916; see also Allen 2005: 264; Bechtel & Richardson 1993 [2010: 17]; Nicholson 2012: 160). Neovitalists such as Hans Driesch and Henri Bergson rejected these ideas, arguing that living things cannot be explained solely based on their physico-chemical components, and that biological phenomena therefore must involve non-physical forces or entities. The organicists sought to offer a “third way” into the mechanist-vitalist dispute that served as a middle ground between the austerity of the mechanists and the extravagance of the neovitalists (Peterson 2014: 286; Nicholson & Gawne 2015: 358).

Three major tenets of organicism were particularly congenial to the development of the levels concept. Firstly, the central preoccupation of organicist thought with organization laid down a foundation for levels thinking (cf. Nicholson & Gawne 2015: 364). For the organicists, organization marked the decisive feature for demarcating living phenomena from non-living physico-chemical phenomena (e.g., Woodger 1929: 290–1; von Bertalanffy 1928 [1933: 48]; Needham 1936: ch. 1). Unlike the neovitalists, however, the organicists (particularly during the 1930’s) did not hold organization to be inscrutable, but rather an important explanandum of biological study (Nicholson & Gawne 2015: 365). Moreover, living organisms exhibited a hierarchical ordering among their distinct parts (Woodger 1930: 8; von Bertalanffy 1932: 83; Needham 1936: ch. 5; see also Nicholson & Gawne 2015: 366). This combined nicely with the focus on organization as the major explanandum of biology in that the series of elements that compose different organisms required specific and contextualized treatment. This in turn complemented another main tenet of the organicists, namely the autonomy of biology as a natural science and its phenomena from physico-chemical phenomena (cf. Nicholson & Gawne 2015: 366–7).

The levels concept proved to be a linchpin of these main tenets. Joseph Woodger, combining these features, thus expresses the basic thinking behind levels of organization:

Two principal factors appear to have been responsible for the failure to take organization seriously in biology. First there is the vague belief that only atoms and molecules are ‘real’, and secondly the incautious use of the notion of chemical composition. Also the biological entities are found to be composite in the same sense, and moreover, some of the relata in the relation of composition in the physico-chemical objects are also relata in the biological objects. But the analysis of organisms as carried out by biologists reveal other relata in mutual relation of composition in a different sense, i.e., not in chemical composition, e.g., the organism is analysable into organ-systems, organs, tissues, cells and cell-parts. There is a hierarchy of composing parts or relata in a hierarchy of organizing relations. These relations and relata can only be studied at their own levels (cf. the quartz crystal) and not simply in terms of the lower levels. (Woodger 1929: 292–293, emphasis modified; cf. Bertalanffy 1932: 100–101; Needham 1937 [1943: 234])

Unlike the emergentists’ “levels of existence,” the hierarchical view of the world expounded by the organicists emphasized differentiating the many distinct classes of matter’s possible forms to accommodate the diversity in biological entities. This in turn led them to posit many more levels in the world than the four ‘super levels’ of the emergentists (the physical the chemical, the vital, and the mental), and also implied an increase in complexity as more levels of organization were brought to bear on treating living systems. Woodger again remarks:

If the parts [of an organism] were homogeneous then we should be able to call them units and there would only be one level of organization. But if each part were itself composed of parts forming in each an organized system, then clearly we should have two levels of organization and if the composing sub-parts of the first organization were intrinsically only numerically different we could speak of two homogeneous levels of organization. If, however, the sub-parts were intrinsically different then the first-order parts would be different and we should have a heterogeneous type of organization. By carrying out this process of subdivision further we could obtain very complex types of organization exhibiting a hierarchy of successive levels. And if now we consider one of the higher living organisms it is evident at once that its organization will belong to one of these heterogeneous hierarchical types. (Woodger 1929: 298)

This idea that levels of organization of organization form “nested” compositional hierarchies where there are wholes at higher levels and their components at lower levels, and the components themselves can be further decomposed into parts, remains one of the core features of the notion of levels of organization up to this day.

In the aftermath of organicism, development of the levels concept splintered into different intellectual trajectories, with little overall theoretical or conceptual coherence. One direction of development flowed through the framework of general systems theory (von Bertalanffy 1950, 1968), and particularly through so-called hierarchy theory (Whyte et al. 1969; Weiss 1971; Pattee 1973). General systems theory sought to construct isomorphisms between laws of different scientific fields based on their generic system properties (von Bertalanffy 1950: 136), but nonetheless continued to emphasize the hierarchical structure of systems (von Bertalanffy 1968). ‘Levels of organization’ in this tradition was ultimately given secondary consideration to the articulation of system-generic properties and laws. Similarly, in hierarchy theory, ‘levels’ tend to be treated as derivative of the more general notion of a hierarchy, or the ordering of a system into nested subsystems (Simon 1962 [1996: 184–5]; see also Weiss 1971). Hierarchy and levels alike continued to be treated as generic structures of systems of all stripes (see also Allen & Starr 1982; O’Neill et al. 1986). However, one important distinction to come out of this tradition was the distinction between levels of composition and levels of control (Simon 1962; Pattee 1973). The former speaks to the nested compositionality typically identified with levels of organization, while the latter refers to the idea that higher levels impose constraints on the processes at lower levels, for example by limiting the degrees of freedom of the system at a lower level (Pattee 1973: 85).

Other early attempts at clarifying the concept of levels were carried out by individual researchers working alone on similar or related issues, such as reduction or multilevel selection. Mario Bunge (1960, 1977), Marjorie Grene (1969, 1987), and William Wimsatt (1976a, 1981, 1994) each developed several ground-laying observations concerning levels. Bunge (1960) remarks on the plethora of meanings the term can possess, then offers a long taxonomy of nine different meanings of the term “levels”, ranging from the innocuous (levels as degrees or quantity, as in ‘levels of stress’) to the sense of nature being ordered into an evolutionary series, with several corollary senses of levels falling between (such as degrees of complexity). In his 1977 paper, Bunge goes further, offering a set-theoretic treatment of levels, and claiming that the leveled structure of the natural world is what renders natural phenomena intelligible to us (Bunge 1977: R82). Grene (1969) also remarks on the polysemic nature of the term “hierarchy”, noting that ‘levels’ has distinct uses in different fields of sciences. Grene later (1987) distinguishes between two notions of hierarchy, one falling under a mixed notion of levels as composition and control, respectively, and the other exemplifying phylogenetic ranks. Wimsatt’s work will be considered in more detail below in section 2.3.

2. Philosophical Accounts of Levels of Organization

A recurring motif in the literature on levels of organization is to lament the haphazard or unreflective way in which terms such as ‘hierarchy’ or ‘levels’ are applied, and to call for more precise analyses (e.g., Beckner 1974; Bunge 1977; Grene 1987; Korn 2002; Valentine & May 1996). However, surprisingly few philosophers or scientists have taken up the challenge of developing a substantial theory or account of levels of organization. In this section, we discuss three major accounts put forward in philosophy of science to clarify or posit what exactly levels of organization are. These are Paul Oppenheim and Hilary Putnam’s “layer-cake” account, the mechanist account developed and advocated by Carl Craver (2007: ch. 5, 2015) and William Bechtel (2008: ch. 4), and William Wimsatt’s “local maxima” account (1976a, 1994). After these, we also go through recent skeptical approaches to the idea of levels of organization.

The two most visible accounts in philosophy of science, the “layer-cake” and “mechanistic” accounts, mark polarized visions for the levels concept. The layer-cake account comprises a comprehensive conception that posits exhaustive stepwise compositional relations between all constituents of nature and strict correspondence between each putative level and a primary scientific discipline that studies the constituents occupying that level. The mechanistic account proposes a contextualized conception of ontological levels in nature that are defined in terms of constitutive parthood within a mechanism (Craver 2007: 188–189; Kaplan 2015: 20). The third account, Wimsatt’s “local maxima” account, has arguably received less mainstream attention in philosophy, and posits a more overarching framework for conceptualizing levels in science, covering both epistemic and ontological aspects. Though general, Wimsatt’s account is not comprehensive, admitting exceptions and multiple distinct criteria for characterizing levels that are congenial to both local and global conceptions.

2.1 The Layer-Cake Account

In the classic paper “The Unity of Science as a Working Hypothesis” (1958; see also the entry the unity of science), Oppenheim and Putnam (hereafter O&P) put forward a system of levels that became very influential, and is still implicitly present in most references to levels. This “layer-cake” model comprises three components. First, their conception of levels was comprehensive, meaning they wished to subsume all instances of where one could talk of ‘levels’ into their account. Second, O&P posited that levels are related via compositional relations that are structured in a stepwise fashion. That is, all constituents of the objects of study of one branch of science, or, the branch’s “universe of discourse,” are exhaustively related as wholes to the parts located at the next adjacent lower level, and as themselves parts to the constituents occurring at the next adjacent higher level. This component is probably most responsible for the “layer-cake” moniker, which continues to appear in discussions of levels even today. Finally, O&P presumed a strict correspondence between the constituents comprising a level and the predicates and theories linked with these constituents, meaning that levels of science neatly map onto levels of nature, so that for each level in nature there is corresponding science or theory and vice versa (Craver 2007: 174–175; Brigandt 2010: 304–305).

O&P’s usage of ‘levels’ can be broken down into two roles within their framework. The first concerns their use of ‘levels’ in their explication of reduction, i.e., microreduction, which in turn aided in articulating their thesis of unity of science. O&P’s conception of reduction spans three complementary notions:

Kemeny-Oppenheim reduction is understood as an indirect relation between a reducing theory (or branch of science) T1 and reduced theory (or branch) T2 relative to a set of observational data such that (a) both theories contain different vocabulary, (b) T1 explains least as much observational data as T2, but (c) T1 also “explains more” than T2 (1958: 5). The notion of a potential microreducer supplements this by capturing the part-whole coordination between the natural entities constituting the universes of discourse of different scientific theories or branches via exhaustive material compositional relations (1958: 6). This essentially provides an empirical mapping between the two scientific branches. Microreduction then combines these two, and thus amounts to a Kemeny-Oppenheim reduction between two scientific theories plus the fact that T1 is at a lower compositional level than T2.

In this framework, O&P suggest ordering the branches of sciences so that the major potential reductions standing between the current situation and unified science can be identified. For this purpose, they propose six “reductive levels” (1958: 9): Social groups; (Multicellular) living things; Cells; Molecules; Atoms; Elementary particles. The branch of science with the things of a given level as its universe of discourse is a potential microreducer of a branch with the things of the next higher level as its universe of discourse (O&P 1958: 9).

O&P’s second use of levels concerns the justificatory role the concept plays for their framework. This role is anticipated by O&P’s ideas of microreduction and potential microreducer, and requires positing ‘levels’ as existing independent of the other elements of their framework. More precisely: The O&P account of reduction essentially assumes the existence of certain empirical facts captured by potential microreducers, which are then accounted for, i.e., justified, by postulating the existence of ‘levels’. O&P considered this dual epistemic-ontological importance of ‘levels’ to be a significant contribution provided by their layer-cake account apart from its role in explicating microreduction. Speaking to the epistemic ordering of the sciences, they say:

The idea of reductive levels employed in our discussion suggests what may plausibly be regarded as a natural order of sciences. For this purpose, it suffices to take as ‘fundamental disciplines’ the branches corresponding to our levels. It is understandable that many of the well-known orderings of things have a rough similarity to our reductive levels, and that corresponding orderings of sciences are more or less similar to our order of 6 ‘fundamental disciplines’. (O&P 1958: 28, emphasis added)

This shows that O&P assumed that the structure of the sciences follows the structure of nature. Though they acknowledge the numerous precedents to this hierarchical ordering of the sciences (e.g., Comte’s pyramid of the sciences, 1958: 28), O&P considered their layer-cake account to be superior to these other “intuitive” senses of the order of sciences, since the existence of levels themselves are grounded in the stepwise, compositional continuity of nature:

[I]t does not seem to have been realized that these orderings are ‘natural’ in a deeper sense, of being based on the relation of potential micro-reducer obtaining between the branches of science. (1958: 28)

The problems with the layer-cake account have been well-documented (Craver 2007: 172–6; Eronen 2015; Kim 2002; Potochnik & McGill 2012; Rueger & McGivern 2010). For one thing, if we look at contemporary science, the strict correspondence between levels and scientific fields breaks down immediately: Fields such as cognitive neuroscience span multiple levels, and the level of multicellular organisms is studied by a plethora of different scientific disciplines (Craver 2005; Bechtel 2008: 145). Likewise, the exhaustive stepwise condition on compositional relations between natural constituents, requiring that entities at one level are composed of only entities at the next lower level, is largely a caricature (e.g., Kim 2002): think of blood, nominally a tissue-level phenomenon, which is directly composed by molecular constituents such as vitamins and water without adjacent-level constituents, e.g., cells, playing any intermediary role (Brooks 2017). Finally, and most importantly, the layer-cake account aspires to a comprehensive notion of ‘levels’ that is wildly at odds with the way that ‘levels’ is actually used in science. Scientists often operate with a much more limited definition of the levels concept that either (a) is restricted to a specific and local context (see section 2.2) or (b) makes room for exceptions to what ‘levels’ expresses. Many biological sources in fact are completely aware that levels do not capture a completely uniform reality, and sometimes remark on important exceptions to the rules that are laid down by the levels concept. This is most prominently seen when referring to “organisms” in a piecemeal way so as to capture both multicellular and unicellular forms of life (Mader 2010: 2).

2.2 Levels of Mechanisms

The account of “levels of mechanisms” introduced by Bill Bechtel (2008) and Carl Craver (2007) has recently become the standard view of levels in philosophy of neuroscience. The context of this account is the paradigm of “new mechanism” that currently dominates philosophy of neuroscience and large parts of philosophy of science more generally (see the entry mechanisms in science). In levels of mechanisms, there are mechanisms at higher levels and their components at lower levels. The mechanistic account proposes a contextualized conception (as opposed to the comprehensive conception of the layer-cake) that articulates levels in terms of constitutive parthood within a mechanism (Craver 2007: 188–189; Kaplan 2015: 20; see also Cummins 1975 for an early expression of this idea). This approach offers several advantages over the layer-cake account: For one thing, it abandons the goal of providing a global or comprehensive understanding of levels that applies homogeneously to all systems in nature. Instead, the aim is to construe levels in a scientifically informed manner whereby level demarcations only make sense on case-based grounds (see also Love 2012 for a local approach to levels that is not explicitly tied to the notion of a mechanism). The mechanistic account also completely eschews any tidy correspondence between the structure of the natural world and the structure of the natural sciences: Levels of mechanisms are levels in nature, and there is no straightforward mapping from these levels to theories or fields of science (Craver 2007: 176). Finally, the mechanistic account of levels supports a positive account of pluralistic, multilevel explanation that emerges as a powerful alternative to accounts of reductionism in biology (Craver 2005; cf. Brigandt 2010: 297).

More specifically, levels of mechanisms have been defined as follows:

In levels of mechanisms, the relata are behaving mechanisms at higher levels and their components at lower levels. … The interlevel relationship is as follows: X’s Φ-ing is at a lower mechanistic level than Ψ-ing if and only if X’s Φ-ing is a component in the mechanism for S’s Ψ-ing. Lower level components are organized together to form higher-level components. (Craver 2007: 189)

Within a mechanism, the relevant parts are … working parts—the parts that perform the operations that enable the mechanism to realize the phenomenon of interest. These may be of different sizes, but they are distinguished by the fact that they figure in the functioning of the mechanism. It is the set of working parts that are organized and whose operations are coordinated to realize the phenomenon of interest that constitute a level. (Bechtel 2008: 146)

So far, these characterizations suggest that there are just two levels, the level of the mechanism and the level of its components. However, when we take into account that a component can also be mechanism in itself, this picture is expanded into a multilevel hierarchy: The components of that nested mechanism then form a third level, which is two levels lower than the overall mechanism (Bechtel 2008: 147). This mechanistic decomposition can be repeated as many times as necessary; there is no a priori limit to the number of levels in a mechanism.

The standard example of levels of mechanisms is the case of spatial memory and long-term potentiation (LTP; Craver 2007: 165–170). In the spatial memory mechanism, four levels of mechanisms can be identified: the level of spatial memory, the level of spatial map formation, the cellular-electrophysiological level, and finally the molecular level. In this hierarchy, entities at each lower level are components in the higher-level mechanism. For example, an NMDA receptor at the molecular level is a component of the LTP mechanism at the cellular level, and the LTP mechanism is in turn a component of the hippocampal mechanism of memory consolidation (at the level of spatial map formation). The hippocampal mechanism of memory consolidation then contributes to the overall mechanism at the level of spatial memory, which is the highest level and includes things such as the mouse performing behavioral tasks (e.g., navigating a water maze).

Levels of mechanisms share some key features with the more standard accounts of levels of organization: They are by definition compositional, entities at higher levels are typically larger than entities at lower levels, and levels of mechanisms can potentially amount to local peaks of regularity and predictability (Craver 2007: 190; see next section). However, levels of mechanisms are far more limited and minimalistic than any other extant approaches to levels of organization. First of all, as already mentioned, levels of mechanisms can only be identified on a case-by-case basis, and different mechanisms can have entirely different levels. For example, the set of levels in the mechanism of protein folding is very different from the levels in the spatial memory mechanism.

Moreover, even within one mechanism, the question whether two items are at the same or different levels often has no well-defined answer. This is due to the fact that levels are defined solely in terms of direct part-whole (or component-mechanism) relationships. For example, NMDA receptors and synaptic vesicles are components of the cellular LTP mechanisms, and thus can be said to be at the same level. The components of NMDA receptors in turn include things such as glutamate binding sites and glutamate ions, whereas the components of synaptic vesicles include things such as transport proteins. However, as glutamate binding sites and transport proteins are neither components of one another nor direct components in the same (sub)mechanism, they are neither at the same level nor at different levels (Bechtel 2008: 147). The question how they are related levels-wise has no answer in the mechanistic framework. What this means is that even within a specific mechanism, levels of mechanisms do not form horizontal layers that span across the mechanism, but rather small islands or spotlights formed by the working parts of a (sub)mechanism. Another implication is that even identical things (e.g., NMDA molecules) in the same mechanism are often not at the same level (Eronen 2013). Recently Craver (2015) has argued that the whole idea of being “at the same level” is in fact unimportant or even meaningless in the context of levels of mechanisms; it is sufficient that there is a clear sense in which mechanisms are at a higher level relative to their components (and the components are at a lower level relative to the mechanism as a whole), and this does not require that the components or mechanisms also form horizontal levels.

A further problem that the mechanistic account shares with the layer-cake account is that it is embedded within a conceptual framework where ‘levels’ are defined in terms of other technical terms that are more foundational in that framework (Brooks 2017). For instance, the layer-cake account was originally embedded in Oppenheim and Putnam’s overarching project of arguing for the unity of science, and their understanding of ‘levels’ was originally in part conceived to explicate how microreduction works. The mechanistic account for its part is embedded within the New Mechanism’s program of explicating mechanistic explanation and mechanisms; since “levels of mechanisms” largely overlap with technical terms that define what a mechanism is, it is a legitimate question what distinct notion of ‘levels’ results at all that is not directly derivable from the notion of a mechanism (cf. Eronen 2013).

In this light, it is clear that levels of mechanisms are only distantly related to earlier attempts at elucidating levels in the life sciences, and have many features that we intuitively would not associate with the idea of levels (Eronen 2013, 2015). However, there is no doubt that the relationships of mechanistic composition that levels of mechanisms track are as such crucially important for understanding and explaining biological organization.

Marie Kaiser (2015) seeks to recover a more general notion of ‘levels’ along the lines of the mechanistic account in a way that escapes the account’s restrictiveness. Kaiser’s focus here is to relax the conditions under which we consider something a level (2015: 183–185): First, instead of defining levels in terms of working components of mechanisms, she suggests to think of levels in terms of (biological) part-whole relations generally, that is, in a way that is not derived from the definition of a mechanism. Second, Kaiser suggests that a level can also include things that belong to the same “general biological kind” as some parts of the higher-level system in question (2015: 183–185): In this way, levels expand beyond the boundaries of an organism or mechanism. How this approach avoids the problems of general levels of organization discussed below (section 2.4) has not been explicitly spelled out. For further attempts at expanding or developing the notion of levels of mechanisms, see Bertolaso & Buzzoni (2017) and Harbecke (2015).

2.3 Wimsatt’s “Local Maxima” Account

Both the layer-cake and the mechanistic approach to levels aim at defining levels in the sense of giving at least necessary conditions for what constitutes a level. William Wimsatt (1976a, 1994) takes a different approach and sets out to characterize the key features that levels of organization typically (but not necessarily) exhibit across different instances. His aim is to delineate major structural or organizational features of nature, of which levels of organization are the most salient ones. First, levels are compositional and form nested hierarchical structures, so that wholes at lower levels function as parts at higher levels. Second, levels of organization are a

deep, non-arbitrary, and extremely important feature of the ontological architecture of our natural world, and almost certainly of any world which could produce, and be inhabited or understood by, intelligent beings. (Wimsatt 1994 [2007: 203])

In other words, Wimsatt considers levels to be units that “cut nature at its joints” (1976a: 237).

A further feature of levels of organization is that they are

constituted by families of entities usually of comparable size and dynamical properties, which characteristically interact primarily with one another. (Wimsatt 1994 [2007: 204])

A helpful metaphor that Wimsatt uses to illustrate this is that we can think of theories or models of specific levels as sieves of different sizes that sift out things with the appropriate size and dynamical properties (Wimsatt 1976a: 237). Thus, theories at the levels of organisms sift out roughly organism-sized things that are capable of reproduction and primarily interact with each other.

Finally, and perhaps most importantly,

[l]evels of organization can be thought of as local maxima of regularity and predictability in the phase space of alternative modes of organization of matter. (1976a: 209; see also 1976a: 238)

This point is “the closest that [Wimsatt] will come to a definition” (1976a: 209), and requires some explanation. The idea is roughly that patterns and regularities that can be used as a basis for prediction and explanation are found clustered around certain scales, and such clusters indicate levels of organization. Thus, if we plot regularity and predictability against (size) scale, then levels of organization will appear as peaks in the plot (see Figure). The entities that we find at these “local maxima” will exhibit stable regularities in virtue of the criteria (size, rate, dynamic properties, etc.) with which they are grouped into levels, and these regularities can also serve as the basis for reliable predictability. Moreover, levels of organization comprise “the most probable states of matter” (1976a: 239), meaning that if we could vary the initial conditions, under a range of conditions natural selection or other selection processes would result in the same levels (Wimsatt 1976a: 238–239). For example, if the level of molecules is a level of organization in Wimsatt’s sense, then there should be a peak in regularity and predictability at the scale(s) where molecules are located, and molecules should be the most probable mode of organization of matter under a range of conditions.

[3  parallel diagrams one below the other 
labeled 'a: regular periodic', 
'b: random fluctuations (wrong choice of variables?)', 
and 'c: dissipative wave: (pro-reduction). 7 points horizontally are labeled and have a
 description in diagram a; each point is also the high point of a wavy line (each wave the same amplitude).  
Going from left to right they are 'atomic', 'molecular', 'macro-molecule', 'uni-cellular', 
'smaller metazoan', 'larger metazoan', and 'socio-cultural ecological'.  Diagram b has a line with many ups and downs. 
Diagram c has a wave with the same high points as in diagram a but the amplitude declines as it goes from left to right; 
the wave is also labeled halfway with 'entification greater at lower levels' and at the end 'OUR WORLD?' . ]

Figure. Wimsatt, created in 1973; used with permission.

Wimsatt points out many other features that levels may have: For example, processes at higher levels tend to happen at slower rates than processes at lower levels, higher level properties are typically multiply realized by lower level properties, and higher-level causal relationships are dynamically autonomous in the sense of being largely independent of what happens at lower-levels. What differentiates different levels will also vary between instances, and may include part-whole distinctions, the magnitudes of forces by which things interact, or, pragmatically, considerations of size of different constituents. Importantly, Wimsatt also argues that in contexts where part-whole relationships become too complex, such as in the organization of biological systems, levels of organization break down, and in these cases a more appropriate organizational notion is “perspective” (Wimsatt 1994 [2007: 227]). Perspectives are (incomplete) accounts of systems based on a set of variables, and in contrast to levels, need not have any part-whole structure. For example, we can approach organisms from anatomical, physiological or genetic perspectives, each perspective coming with a proprietary set of variables.

By including so many caveats and possible but unnecessary characteristics of levels, Wimsatt makes his account extremely versatile and wide in scope, but at the same time open to charges of vagueness or inconsistency (cf. Craver 2007: 182–183). It contains a multitude of criteria that levels could but do not necessarily have to satisfy, so that almost any set of entities that are in some respect similar to one another could be said to form a level. Moreover, the individual criteria as such also raise many questions. For example, how should we understand the “local maxima of regularity and predictability”? What kinds of regularities should we include—only causal generalizations, or also regularities describing associational or compositional relations (Craver 2007: 182–183)? How do we count or estimate the number of regularities on a given scale? How do these peaks match with the other proposed criteria, such as the part-whole organization of levels?

These worries are to some extent alleviated by taking into account an important background idea in Wimsatt’s approach: Levels of organization and the entities that occupy them should be robust, meaning that they should be detectable, measurable, derivable, definable, and so on, in a variety of independent ways (1981 [2007: 63–4]; 1994 [2007: 210]). In other words, they should exhibit redundancy between independent means of accessing, detecting or defining them, and therefore should not depend on any single criterion or defining feature. Thus, if levels of organization are robust, the choice of criteria, or the problems of some individual criterion, will not be crucial. However, the extent to which there are such robust levels of organization in nature remains an open question.

2.4 Levels Skepticism and Deflationary Accounts

Despite the familiarity of scientists and philosophers with the levels concept, calls for its dismissal or de-emphasis in the scientific lexicon are increasingly common (Eronen 2013, 2015; Guttman 1976; Ladyman & Ross 2007; Potochnik & McGill 2012; Rueger & McGivern 2010; Thalos 2013; for rebuttals see also DiFrisco 2017; Brooks 2017). For one thing, nature may simply be too messy to fit any layer-cake style picture. Consider as an illustration the putative level of “organisms.” Blue whales and yeast cells are both clearly organisms and thus should nominally be located at this level, but each comprises radically different kinds of entities with radically different properties (Potochnik & McGill 2012). This may still be palatable, but when we consider the next lower level, namely the one indicated by the components of these organisms, the picture of levels as neat horizontal layers breaks down completely. The components of blue whales include things such as organs, tissues and cells, whereas yeast cells are composed of things like the cell membrane, nucleus and mitochondria (cf. Potochnik & McGill 2012). Furthermore, the whale is in part composed of various symbionts, including gut bacteria. Such symbionts are at the same time components of the whale and organisms in themselves. Thus, the components of different kinds organisms do not form any homogeneous “level”.

These problems are not just due to the difficulties of defining what an organism is. Similar issues arise when we consider the components of cells, such as the cell membrane and mitochondria—their subcomponents (e.g, lipid molecules and the outer mitochondrial membrane respectively) also exhibit too much heterogeneity to form a neat “level” (cf. Eronen 2013). Moreover, the same kinds of things can be parts in very different higher-level wholes: For example, hydrogen ions can be free-standing components in the oxidative phosphorylation mechanism that involves the cell membrane as a component, but they can also be components of the lipid molecules that make up the cell membranes (Bechtel 2008: 147).

More generally, Potochnik and McGill (2012) argue that ‘levels’ imposes a radically false, rigid uniformity onto nature:

The basic idea [behind ‘levels’] is that higher-level entities are composed of (and only of) lower-level entities, but the prevalent concept of hierarchical organization involves stronger claims as well. The compositional hierarchy is often taken to involve stratification into discrete and universal levels of organization. It is also often assumed that levels are nested, that is, that an entity at any level is composed of aggregated entities at the next lower level. (Potochnik & McGill 2012: 121; emphasis added)

This identifies these problem with the “basic idea” of the levels concept itself. They continue:

Indeed, the very notion of stratified levels depends on not only the ubiquity, but also the uniformity, of part-whole composition. For strata to emerge, atoms must always compose molecules, populations must always compose communities, and so forth. But the uniformity of composition needed for stratified levels simply does not exist. (2012: 126; emphasis added; see also Guttman 1976: 113; Thalos 2013: 10)

This comprehensive, uniform rigidity in turn undermines other features attributed to levels of organization. One of these features is the supposed epistemic merit (or fault) inherently exhibited by natural constituents due to their position at a particular level (Potochnik & McGill 2012. 129–30). For instance, reductionists frequently argue that molecular-level explanations are generally more secure, more fundamental, or otherwise superior to explanations citing higher-level structures like chromosomes or cells (and conversely, anti-reductionists claim that higher-level constituents are often necessary for producing adequate explanations). However, as has been pointed out by many authors, blanket attributions of significance like these are deeply misleading (e.g., Wimsatt 1976a; Jackson & Pettit 1992; cf. Potochnik & McGill 2012: 129; Noble 2012: 56; Craver 2007: 191). One reason for this is that particular levels exhibit epistemic merit only in regard to what is being investigated. As such, what is taken to be the relevant level will shift depending on what structures or processes comprise the focus of scientists’ investigative tasks, and hence no level will have inherent or principled epistemic superiority. Moreover, epistemic products like explanations and theories in biology rarely exhibit a monolevel structure, but rather include multiple levels simultaneously (e.g., Schaffner 1993: 97–8, 387; Mitchell 2003: 147; Craver 2007).

The basic conclusion that Potochnik and McGill and other levels skeptics draw from this is the following. The levels concept precludes a sophisticated discussion of philosophical and scientific issues by imposing an overly simplistic representation of science and nature. So, although perhaps no one would deny the attractiveness of ‘levels’ in seeking to make complex natural systems tractable to analysis, depicting these systems using the concept seems to do far more harm than good. Burton S. Guttman is very clear on this, stating that “if it is stated in any but the sloppiest and most general terms, [the concept of levels] is a useless and even misleading concept” (Guttman 1976: 112). Similarly, Miriam Thalos emphasizes “the conceit of levels” and argues that “the notion of levels provides no useful philosophical ideas whatever” (Thalos 2013: 13).

This levels-skepticism has also a more constructive side. Several authors have suggested replacing or reinterpreting levels talk in terms of other concepts, most importantly scale (Eronen 2013, 2015; Noble 2012; Potochnik & McGill 2012; see also P.S. Churchland & Sejnowski 1992; McCauley 2009; Rueger & McGivern 2010). The motivation behind this is that the problems associated with levels of organization can be avoided if more well-defined notions are applied instead. For instance, the notion of scale arguably does not lead to the same kinds of problems as the idea of levels of organization. All that it is needed for arranging things on a scale is measuring some quantitative property of those things. Scales also have the advantage of being entirely continuous, while levels require placing things at distinct and discrete positions in the hierarchy (Eronen 2015; Potochnik & McGill 2012). The scale that is the most obviously relevant one in this context is the size scale, which is based on how big things are: Organisms are usually (though not always) bigger than cells, which are bigger than molecules, which are bigger than atoms, and so on. However, also the time scale (the rate at which processes occur) is crucially important for understanding biological organization (Simon 1962; DiFrisco 2017): Interactions between organisms (e.g., sexual reproduction) take place at much slower rates than interactions between cells (e.g., synaptic communication), which again are slower than interactions between molecules (e.g., receptor binding).

This “deflationary” approach (Eronen 2013, 2015), where levels are reduced or deflated to more well-defined concepts, is also consistent with the idea that at some scales we may find peaks of regularity or predictability (Wimsatt 1994), or clusters of causal relationships (Potochnik & McGill 2012). However, to what extent such peaks or clusters can be discerned in biological systems is an open question. It also remains to be seen whether the deflationary approach is sufficient for accounting for the role of levels of organization in biological theories and explanations.

3. Levels of Organization in Philosophical Debates

Levels of organization figure into a number of perennial debates in philosophy of science. Here we go through three broad topics where levels traditionally have and continue to play a prominent role: Reduction, antireductionism and pluralism, and downward causation. Within these topics, we focus on issues and theories that directly involve levels.

3.1 Reduction

As we saw above, Oppenheim and Putnam introduced their highly influential view of levels in the context of the reductive unity of science. Since then, levels have also continued to play an important role in debates on reductionism (see the entry reductionism in biology). Questions of reductionism are often explicitly formulated in terms of levels: Do higher level properties, theories, or explanations reduce to lower level ones?

In the classical Nagelian account (Nagel 1961), reduction amounts to deriving a theory that is to be reduced from a more fundamental reducing theory on the basis of two conditions: deducibility and connectability (see the entry scientific reduction). The standard example is the reduction of thermodynamics to statistical mechanics. Nagel thought that from the laws of statistical mechanics one can derive the laws of thermodynamics (deducibility), with the help of “bridge principles” that connect the terms of these two theories (connectability; Nagel 1961: ch. 11; Schaffner 1967). Nagel’s original approach to reduction has been criticized from many angles, but in the present context, the most relevant criticism is that the classical model ignores the distinction between interlevel and intralevel reductions in science (Wimsatt 1976a, 1976b; McCauley 1996). Intralevel (or successional) settings involve competing theories within a particular science and within a particular level, for example the phlogiston theory and the caloric theory of heat. Interlevel settings, on the other hand, involve theories at different levels of organization that thereby have differing explananda, terminology and methodology: for example, cognitive psychology and molecular neuroscience. Nagel’s model in its classic form treats these different contexts equally. Other shortcomings of the Nagelian account are that it only applies to (formalized) theories, ignoring other products of science, and that it fails to incorporate the fact that the reducing theory often corrects the reduced theory (see, e.g., Walter & Eronen 2011). For these and many other reasons, it is widely agreed that the Nagelian model fails to reconstruct reductive relations as they appear in actual science (Wimsatt 1976b, 1979), and that the model in its original form is inapplicable to actual biological cases (Kaiser 2012).

Problems of the Nagelian model led to the development of alternative accounts based on the same basic idea, which actively incorporated the idea of levels into their framework (Hooker 1981; P.S. Churchland 1986; Schaffner 1993; Bickle 1998, 2003). This culminated in the “New Wave” model of reduction, where intertheoretic relations form a continuum ranging from complete elimination to retentive Nagel-style reduction (Bickle 1998). For a summary of this model, see the entry scientific reduction §2.6. In the present context, what is noteworthy is that the cases that inspire the eliminativist aspirations of the New Wave model encompass only intralevel, i.e., successive, relations, while the conclusions they draw concern cases of the interlevel kind (particularly the relationship between psychology and neuroscience; McCauley 1996). Historical cases of elimination, such as the replacement of the phlogiston theory with the caloric theory of heat, have arguably all been cases where a theory is replaced by a successor at roughly the same level of organization. Theories at different levels of organization can coevolve and exert selective pressures on each other’s terminology, practices, explanations, and such (Wimsatt 1976b [2007: 252]; P.S. Churchland 1986: 363, 373), but this rarely if ever results in elimination or replacement of one of the theories.

Other accounts of reduction also countenance the levels concept, albeit in different ways. In his “ruthless” account of reductionism, Bickle (2003) abandons the idea of reduction progressing stepwise from level to level, and argues that cellular and molecular neuroscience can directly replace psychology. If one can intervene onto the molecular level to change variables at the behavioral level, then, Bickle contends, one has discovered the “genuine” causal mechanism for those variables (Bickle 2003). Here ‘levels’ figure into ruthless reductionism as useful fictions, where intermediary levels such as tissues, organs, and the like provide a scaffolding for emerging molecular-level explanations. These intermediary levels exhibit “merely” heuristic value, but only in the service of constructing behavior-to-molecules reductions (Bickle 2003: 130).

More recently, Hüttemann and Love (2011) note that part-whole reduction in particular has become a widely-endorsed alternative to the Nagelian framework (see also Brigandt 2013: 77). In documenting some of the facets that this form of reduction has acquired in the intervening years, they put forward as two aspects of reductive explanation compositionality and causality (Hüttemann & Love 2011: 4). In reductive contexts, both are expressed in levels-laden language. Compositionality, for instance, is couched in ‘levels’ in that the very notions of part and whole in biological contexts correspond to respectively lower- and higher-level status (cf. Kaiser 2015: 192; Winther 2006). This is reflected in the issues they raise for identifying and evaluating reductive explanations as reductive. One of these, “intrinsicality”, refers to the constraint of a part that it always be contained within, or inherent to, the whole to which it belongs (Hüttemann & Love 2011: 9–10). ‘Levels’ offers one way of straightforwardly capturing this feature of part-whole relations (cf. 2011: 5). Another feature is “fundamentality,” which

corresponds to the assumption that higher levels of organization are reduced to lower levels of organization: parts are taken as more fundamental than the compound. (2011: 5–6)

As these features are applied to evaluate whether an explanation is justifiably considered “reductive” or not, by extension ‘levels’ can be seen here as contributing to the criteria of adequacy to the conceptual issue of reduction. Kaiser (2015) goes further than this approach in claiming that a “lower-level character” is a necessary condition for an explanation to even be considered reductive (2015: 188).

3.2 Antireductionism and Pluralism

The idea of levels has also figured prominently into arguments for antireductionism and pluralism. In his classic treatise, Philip Kitcher (1984) elevates the level concept to a centerpiece of the antireductionist position. According to Kitcher, the reductionist aspiration of reducing classical Mendelian to molecular genetics will not pan out because molecular constituents do not capture the causal relations between Mendelian constituents (e.g., chromosomes) and heritable traits. The reason for this is that the cytological processes that form the basis for Mendelian patterns of heredity (such as meiosis) form a natural kind that cannot be delineated at the molecular level (1984: 349; Brigandt 2013: 76). Importantly, Kitcher grounds this in the structure of the world as captured by the levels concept:

Anti-reductionism construes the current division of biology not simply as a temporary feature of our science stemming from our cognitive imperfections but as the reflection of levels of organization in nature. (1984: 371, emphasis modified; Rosenberg 1985: 119, makes a similar statement)

Elevating the levels concept even further, Kitcher makes levels (albeit a layer-cake variety of the term) part of the conception of antireductionism itself, concluding that

to the extent that we can make sense of the present explanatory structure within biology—that division of the field into subfields corresponding to levels of organization in nature—we can also understand the antireductionist doctrine. (Kitcher 1984: 373)

In a more recent defense of antireductionism, Robert McCauley (1996, 2007) expands on Wimsatt’s intra-interlevel distinction to plea for a multilevel explanatory pluralism between higher- and lower-level theories. McCauley targets the New Wave model where intertheory relations result in a spectrum of consequences, ranging from identity to elimination, for higher-level theories (P.M. Churchland 1979; P.M. Churchland and P.S. Churchland 1990; and later Bickle 1998). He argues that a single spectrum of reductive consequences misrepresents the nature of intertheory coevolution. Intralevel reductions, focusing on reduction in terms of replacement, do not capture the historical dynamics involved in evaluating interlevel cases, and elimination is virtually nonexistent in interlevel cases. Moreover, eliminating or reducing higher-level theories would also undermine the status of the higher-level’s scientific institutions. As this rarely happens, and attributing epistemic, ontological, or methodological superiority to the lower levels is at best a claim that needs to be substantiated, reductions appear to be wildly at odds with actual scientific practice. Instead, we observe intertheory coevolution, which proceeds by exploiting the ontological, explanatory, and methodological resources that each theory brings to the table. Higher-level theories can offer lower-level theories criteria for external coherency, novel problem solving strategies, and serve as evidentiary sources for lower-level scientific efforts (McCauley 1996: 32, 35).

Other arguments for pluralism also take their start from levels of organization. Sandra Mitchell (2003), for instance, argues that since biological systems are typically multilevel, this dissipates locating causes within the system from one single level into multiple interacting causes that are simultaneously in effect at the different levels (2003: 147; 2009: 114–5). Mitchell argues on this basis for a broader integrative pluralism that takes itself to be suggested by the multilevel and multicomponential “ontology of complex systems” (2009: 109). The basic idea of integrative pluralism falls out of the fact that biological systems evolve in a contingent manner (2003: 58), thus setting the stage for multilevel evolutionary scenarios (2003: 24, 31). This in turn highlights the preponderance of ‘emergent properties’ in biological systems, which appear at novel levels of organization out of the interactions of simpler components. Both of these factors inflate the overall number of explanatory sources that could contribute to explaining a given phenomenon (2003: 6; 2009: 8). Consequently, discovering unilateral causes for complex phenomena will not be forthcoming (2003: 160). Likewise, Ingo Brigandt (2010, 2013) emphasizes the pursuance of investigation at multiple levels of organization as a fact about scientific practice (2010: 303), but also as cause to articulate the localized significance of explanatory contributions to particular problems, as in the case of evo-devo explanations (2010: 303).

This kind of multilevel pluralism is also defended by the supporters of the New Mechanism (Bechtel 2008; Craver 2005, 2007; Brigandt 2010: 297). As McCauley (2007) points out, mechanistic explanation can be seen as explanatory pluralism “writ small”: In each localized mechanistic context, several levels (understood as levels of mechanisms) are needed to fully explain the phenomenon (see, however, Fazekas and Kertész (2011) and Soom (2012), who argue that the commitments of New Mechanism are incompatible with robust antireductionism).

3.3 Downward Causation

Levels of organization have traditionally provided the framework for the debate on downward causation, where the question is whether higher-level entities or properties can exert causal influence on lower-level ones (e.g., Bechtel 2008; Campbell 1974; Emmeche et al. 1997, 2000; Kim 1992, 1999; Craver & Bechtel 2007). The idea of downward causation is closely connected to emergentism, and is often seen as one of its core tenets (Emmeche et al. 1997, 2000; Kim 1999). Examples of putative downward causation include psychological states causing physical behavior, the activity of an organism causing changes in the tissues and cells of that organism, and cell-level processes such as synaptic communication causing molecular changes. Downward causation seems prima facie to be common or even ubiquitous in experiments and explanations in the life sciences (Craver & Bechtel 2007; Love 2012). However, in contemporary philosophy, downward causation is often approached with skepticism. If it is understood as higher-level things or properties exerting some kind of physically measurable influence on lower-level things, there seems to be no evidence for it (McLaughlin 1992). Downward causation also faces metaphysical difficulties, most importantly the much-debated causal exclusion argument (e.g., Kim 1992, 1999, 2005). To put it very roughly, the core of this argument is that if we accept the plausible assumption that all physical occurrences must have sufficient physical causes, it is not clear how there could be room for additional higher-level causes of lower-level physical effects. For more on causal exclusion and downward causation, see the entries mental causation and emergent properties.

Although the discussion on downward causation relies heavily on the notion of levels, this notion itself has not received much explicit attention. However, recently the account of levels of mechanisms has been put to use to provide a new take on the issue (Bechtel 2008; Craver & Bechtel 2007; Craver 2015). The idea is that genuine top-down or downward causation does not exist; there are just normal same-level causal relationships that sometimes have “mechanistically mediated” effects downward in the mechanism. What is meant by “mechanistically mediated” is that changes in the higher levels of the mechanism immediately result in changes in the lower levels of the mechanisms due to the constitutive relationship between the higher-level mechanism and its lower-level components. Mechanistically mediated effects may have the initial appearance of downward causation, but the relationship between the mechanism and its components is constitutive, not causal, and therefore mechanistically mediated effects are not causal.

To clarify this, consider the example of Hal’s glucose metabolism (Craver & Bechtel 2007: 559–560). Hal is playing tennis, and as he keeps running around and swinging the racket, the cells in Hal’s body start taking in and using more glucose. It seems that the cause of the increase in Hal’s glucose metabolism at the cellular level is Hal playing tennis, which suggests causation from a higher level (the level of the whole organism playing tennis) to a lower level (the cellular level). However, in the framework of Craver and Bechtel described above, what is really going on is just regular same-level causal relationships at the cellular level: Nerve signals to the muscle cells cause a cascade of events that results in increased glucose metabolism. Hal’s tennis playing activity is partly constituted by these cellular mechanisms, and this constitutive relationship is responsible for the illusion of downward causation. As Hal starts to play, there are changes in these mechanisms, but only in virtue of them partly making up the tennis playing activity.

This approach is appealing, but faces several challenges. First, it has been argued that there are no clear methods of distinguishing between causal and constitutive relationships in mechanisms (e.g., Leuridan 2011); if this is correct, there seems to be no reason to posit that “mechanistically mediated” effects are non-causal. Second, the idea of “normal” intralevel causation is problematic in the framework of levels of mechanisms (Eronen 2013). As we have seen in section 2.2, the idea of “being at the same level” has little if any significance in this framework, so same-level causation cannot be the default or normal type of causation. The idea seems to be rather that there is no causation from a mechanism as a whole to the components of that same mechanism, but this is just one specific form of putative downward causation, and how other forms should be treated is left open in this account (Eronen 2013). Third, it is not clear whether higher-level causal processes in mechanisms can be distinct from causal processes at lower levels of the mechanism—if not, there are no higher-level causal processes that could have mechanistically mediated effects downwards in the mechanism to begin with (Fazekas & Kertész 2011).

A different way of approaching downward causation in biology is to explicate it in terms of higher-level constraints or boundary conditions. The idea is that the behavior of lower-level things is constrained by the higher-level whole that they are a part of, and therefore explaining the behavior of these lower-level things is not possible exclusively at the lower level, but requires appealing to higher-level factors (e.g., Bishop 2008; Campbell 1974; Emmeche et al. 1997, 2000; Kistler 2009; Noble 2012; Sperry 1969). In a classic article, Donald Campbell expressed this idea as follows: “processes at the lower levels of a hierarchy are restrained by and act in conformity to the laws of the higher level” (Campbell 1974: 180). For example, explaining protein folding (at the level of molecules) seems to require appealing to factors in the environment at the cellular level, such as the presence of chaperones (Love 2012).

It is widely agreed that downward or top-down explanation of this kind is required in science. The controversial and unsettled question is whether these cases also involve causation in a substantial sense, or whether it would be more appropriate to just designate them as some form of downward determination or explanation (see, e.g., Hulswit 2005). It should also be noted that both this approach and that of Craver and Bechtel are largely silent on the issue of downward causation understood as causation across levels of organization or scales in a broader sense, for example, between a nerve cell and molecules that are not part of that same nerve cell, or between psychological states and behavior.

4. Levels in Biological Theory

Besides the more philosophical debates discussed above, levels of organization also play an important conceptual role in biological research and theory. Interestingly, this growing body of literature on levels in evolutionary biology is almost entirely disconnected from the debates on levels in philosophy of science discussed above.

A prominent example is the issue of levels of selection. In this debate, the hierarchical organization of nature into levels is an important background assumption, as the aim is to find out at which level(s) of the biological hierarchy natural selection is taking place (Griesemer 2000; Okasha 2006). Although Darwin’s original account was focused on evolution at the level of organisms, arguably the conditions for natural selection can be formulated abstractly without referring to any specific kinds of entities, which allows for natural selection to operate at any level where the conditions are satisfied (Griesemer 2000; Lewontin 1970). Since the 1970s, the debate on levels of selection has kept on growing and extending to different areas, though no precise consensus has been reached. Positions range from the gene-centered view, where natural selection is taken to operate almost exclusively at the level of genes (e.g., Dawkins 1976; Williams 1966), to the pluralistic multilevel selection theory, which allows for natural selection to operate on any level of the biological hierarchy where we find the right kind of units (e.g., Sober & Wilson 1998; Wilson & Wilson 2008).

One branch of the levels of selection debate that is particularly interesting from the point of view of levels of organization is the issue of evolutionary transitions. Here the focus is on the emergence of new levels of organization through evolutionary processes (Buss 1987: ch. 5; Griesemer 2000; Maynard Smith & Szathmáry 1995; Okasha 2006). The background idea is that the complex hierarchical organization of nature that we observe today must itself be a result of evolution, and therefore requires an evolutionary explanation. For example, somehow prokaryotes evolved to eukaryotic cells, single-celled organisms evolved to multicellular organisms, individual animals evolved to colonies, and so on. In their highly influential book, Maynard Smith and Szathmáry (1995) proposed that the characteristic feature of major evolutionary transitions is that entities that were capable of replicating independently before the transitions are only capable of replicating as parts of higher-level wholes after the transitions (see also Buss 1987). For example, after a single-celled organism has evolved into a multicellular organism, the cells of the organism can no longer replicate independently of the organism as a whole. For more on levels of selection and evolutionary transitions, see Okasha (2006) and the entry units and levels of selection.

In these debates, the notion of levels of organization is typically used as a primitive term that is assumed to be clear enough and is therefore left undefined (Griesemer 2005). A notable exception is Okasha (2006), who puts forward a proposal for understanding levels of organization in natural selection, building on earlier work by McShea (2001). The starting point is the part-whole relationship, which is the standard definitive feature of levels of organization, but taken alone is insufficient for defining levels of organization: A big heap of sand is made up of smaller heaps of sands, but does not constitute a higher level of organization. Therefore, Okasha (2006) and McShea (2001) propose two further conditions: The parts that form higher-level wholes must interact with each other, and they must be homologous with organisms in a free-living state. For example, the cells that compose organisms interact with each other and are homologous to free-living unicellular organisms, and therefore constitute a level of organization. On the other hand, candidates such as heaps of sand are ruled out, as they do not significantly interact with each other, nor are they homologous to free-living organisms.

Another context in biology where the nature of levels has received explicit attention is the “hierarchy theory of evolution” developed by Niles Eldredge and colleagues (Eldredge et al. 2016, Vrba & Eldredge 1984). In this theoretical framework, levels and hierarchies are taken to be fundamentally important ontological features of nature:

Biological evolutionary theory is ontologically committed to the existence of nested hierarchies in nature and attempts to explain natural phenomena as a product of complex dynamics of real hierarchical systems. (Tëmkin & Eldredge 2015: 184)

In the hierarchy theory of evolution, a distinction is made between two types of hierarchies and the corresponding levels (Eldredge 1996; Vrba & Eldredge 1984): The ecological and the genealogical hierarchy. In both kinds of hierarchies, higher-level things are formed through specific interactions among lower-level things. In the ecological hierarchy, these interactions are exchanges of matter and energy, such as consuming and gathering resources, and in this hierarchy, we find things such as cells, organisms, avatars and ecosystems. In the genealogical hierarchy, the defining activity through which levels are formed is the transmission of information through replication, and the hierarchy includes things such as cells, organisms, demes and species. Note that cells and organisms appear in both hierarchies, but in the ecological hierarchy they are seen as interactors, whereas in the genealogical hierarchy they are seen as replicators.

Besides these theoretical debates, levels of organization also play an important role in textbooks and other introductory texts in biology (e.g., Begon, Townshend & Harper 2006; Lobo 2008; Mader 2010; O’Neill et al. 1986). Depictions of levels are ubiquitous in biological textbooks, often appearing in the first few pages and with a prominent ‘centerfold’ illustration. In this capacity, the levels concept serves as an organizational principle that aids in imparting basic knowledge of the study of biology to novice scientists early in their training. Some of the ideas that the levels concept is used to introduce to students include (i) the apparent preponderance of emergence in living systems, (ii) reductive and non-reductive approaches to analyzing biological phenomena (oftentimes with an antireductionist gloss), and (iii) the context-sensitivity of posing biological problems. Apart from these introductory uses, levels are also used throughout textbooks to introduce the basic layout of multiple ideas and important phenomena that are themselves ubiquitous to different areas of biological study. The hierarchical structure of proteins, being comprised of primary, secondary, tertiary, and quaternary structures is one important instance. Interestingly, textbooks vary between global and local treatments of levels. On the one hand, centerfold depictions often represent the canonical levels of organization in biology; the series of atoms-molecules-organelles-cells-tissues-organs-organisms-populations-communities-ecosystems-biosphere make up the basic idea of levels in these contexts. On the other hand, depictions like protein structure are strongly localized to only two classes of macromolecules (nucleic acids and proteins), while excluding others (lipids, sugars) (Love 2012: 117).

5. Concluding Remarks

Although ‘levels of organization’ has been a key concept in biology and its philosophy since the early 20th century, there is still no consensus on the nature and significance of the concept. In different areas of philosophy and biology, we find strongly varying ideas of levels, and none of the accounts put forward has received wide acceptance. At the moment, the mechanistic approach is perhaps the most promising and acclaimed account, but as we have seen, it may be too minimalistic to fulfill the role that levels of organization continue to play in biological theorizing. We have also noted that there is a curious disconnect between the tradition ranging from Oppenheim and Putman to Bechtel, Craver and Wimsatt on the one hand, and the discussions of levels in evolutionary biology (e.g., Eldredge, McShea, Okasha) on the other. One important aim for future research would be to bridge this gap.


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