Notes to Evolutionary Psychology

1. Buller refers to “evolutionary psychology” as a “paradigm”. We adopt Laudan's ‘research tradition’ terminology as research traditions have a more fluid structure than paradigms and Laudan allows for sharing of theoretical resources between research traditions.

2. Ethology has since moved away from this line of thinking (Ereshefsky 2007).

3. There is a similarity between the case made for massive modularity and the case made for the language of thought hypothesis. Both cases are made on the basis of argumentation. Austin Booth has argued that the case for the latter looks something like a transcendental argument (Booth 2004).

4. Evolutionary psychologists also propose other accounts of innateness.

5. Buller also presents a version of this argument (2005, 157–158).

6. This is a small subset of the huge critical literature on evolutionary psychology.

7. Richard Lewontin (1998) argues for a much stronger skeptical position, in which he effectively claims that evolutionary psychology is impossible.

8. Here we follow Buller's (2005) account of the approach. The term “reverse engineering” was first used in an evolutionary context by Daniel Dennett. (He explains and elaborates upon the concept in his 1995.) Steven Pinker (1997) also champions the approach as do many in evolutionary psychology.

9. Peter Godfrey-Smith (1996) examines this idea in some detail and a version of it is taken up and pursued in Sterelny (2003).

10. Cosmides's hypothesis was first generated and tested in the context of the psychology of reasoning and not in the context of moral psychology. She proposed the cheat detection module to explain the fact that our performance on reasoning tasks improves dramatically when they are re-cast in terms of social exchange.

Copyright © 2014 by
Stephen M. Downes <>

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