Evolutionary Psychology

First published Fri Feb 8, 2008; substantive revision Tue Jan 30, 2024

Evolutionary psychology is one of many biologically informed approaches to the study of human behavior. Along with cognitive psychologists, evolutionary psychologists propose that much, if not all, of our behavior can be explained by appeal to internal psychological mechanisms. What distinguishes evolutionary psychologists from many cognitive psychologists is the proposal that the relevant internal mechanisms are adaptations—products of natural selection—that helped our ancestors get around the world, survive and reproduce. To understand the central claims of evolutionary psychology we require an understanding of some key concepts in evolutionary biology, cognitive psychology, philosophy of science and philosophy of mind. Philosophers are interested in evolutionary psychology for a number of reasons. For philosophers of science —mostly philosophers of biology—evolutionary psychology provides a critical target. Although here is a broad consensus among philosophers of biology that evolutionary psychology is a deeply flawed enterprise, this does not entail that these philosophers completely reject the relevance of evolutionary theory to human psychology. For philosophers of mind and cognitive science evolutionary psychology has been a source of empirical hypotheses about cognitive architecture and specific components of that architecture. However, some philosophers of mind are also critical of evolutionary psychology but their criticisms are not as all-encompassing as those presented by philosophers of biology. Evolutionary psychology is also invoked by philosophers interested in moral psychology both as a source of empirical hypotheses and as a critical target.

In what follows I briefly explain evolutionary psychology’s relations to other work on the biology of human behavior and the cognitive sciences. Next I introduce the research tradition’s key theoretical concepts. In the following section I take up discussions about evolutionary psychology in the philosophy of mind, specifically focusing on the debate about the massive modularity thesis. I go on to review some of the criticisms of evolutionary psychology presented by philosophers of biology and assess some responses to those criticisms. I then go on to introduce some of evolutionary psychology’s contributions to moral psychology and human nature and, finally, briefly discuss the reach and impact of evolutionary psychology.

1. Evolutionary Psychology: One research tradition among the various biological approaches to explaining human behavior

This entry focuses on the specific approach to evolutionary psychology that is conventionally named by the capitalized phrase “Evolutionary Psychology”. This naming convention is David Buller’s (2000; 2005) idea. He introduces the convention to distinguish a particular research tradition (Laudan 1977) from other approaches to the biology of human behavior.[1] This research tradition is the focus here but lower case is used throughout as no other types of evolutionary psychology are discussed. Evolutionary psychology rests upon specific theoretical principles (presented in section 2 below) not all of which are shared by others working in the biology of human behavior (Laland & Brown 2002; Brown et al. 2011). For example, human behavioral ecologists present and defend explanatory hypotheses about human behavior that do not appeal to psychological mechanisms (e.g., Hawkes 1990; Hrdy 1999). Behavioral ecologists also believe that much of human behavior can be explained by appealing to evolution while rejecting the idea held by evolutionary psychologists that one period of our evolutionary history is the source of all our important psychological adaptations (Irons 1998). Developmental psychobiologists take yet another approach: they are anti-adaptationist. (Michel & Moore 1995; but see Bateson & Martin 1999; Bjorklund & Hernandez Blasi 2005 for examples of developmentalist work in an adaptationist vein.) These theorists believe that much of our behavior can be explained without appealing to a suite of specific psychological adaptations for that behavior. Instead they emphasize the role of development in the production of various human behavioral traits. From here on, “evolutionary psychology” refers to a specific research tradition among the many biological approaches to the study of human behavior.

Paul Griffiths argues that evolutionary psychology owes theoretical debt to both sociobiology and ethology (Griffiths 2006; Griffiths 2008). Evolutionary psychologists acknowledge their debt to sociobiology but point out that they add a dimension to sociobiology: psychological mechanisms. Human behaviors are not a direct product of natural selection but rather the product of psychological mechanisms that were selected for. The relation to ethology here is that in the nineteen fifties, ethologists proposed instincts or drives that underlie our behavior;[2] evolutionary psychology’s psychological mechanisms are the correlates to instincts or drives. Evolutionary psychology is also related to cognitive psychology and the cognitive sciences. The psychological mechanisms they invoke are computational, sometimes referred to as “Darwinian algorithms” or as “computational modules”. This overt cognitivism sets evolutionary psychology apart from much work in the neurosciences and from behavioral neuroendocrinology. In these fields internal mechanisms are proposed in explanations of human behavior but they are not construed in computational terms. David Marr’s (e.g., 1983) well known three part distinction is often invoked to distinguish the levels at which researchers focus their attention in the cognitive and neurosciences. Many neuroscientists and behavioral neuroendocrinologists work at the implementation level while cognitive psychologists work at the level of the computations that are implemented at the neurobiological level (see Griffiths 2006).

Evolutionary psychologists sometimes present their approach as potentially unifying, or providing a foundation for, all other work that purports to explain human behavior (e.g., Tooby & Cosmides 1992). This claim has been met with strong skepticism by many social scientists who see a role for a myriad of types of explanation of human behavior, some of which are not reducible to biological explanations of any sort. This discussion hangs on issues of reductionism in the social sciences. (Little 1991 has a nice introduction to these issues.) There are also reasons to believe that evolutionary psychology neither unifies nor provides foundations for closely neighboring fields such as behavioral ecology or developmental psychobiology. (See the related discussion in Downes 2005.) In other work, evolutionary psychologists present their approach as being consistent with or compatible with neighboring approaches such as behavioral ecology and developmental psychobiology. (See Buss’s introduction to Buss 2005.) The truth of this claim hangs on a careful examination of the theoretical tenets of evolutionary psychology and its neighboring fields. We now turn to evolutionary psychology’s theoretical tenets and revisit this discussion in section 4 below.

2. Evolutionary Psychology’s Theory and Methods

Influential evolutionary psychologists, Leda Cosmides and John Tooby, provide the following list of the field’s theoretical tenets (Tooby & Cosmides 2005):

  1. The brain is a computer designed by natural selection to extract information from the environment.
  2. Individual human behavior is generated by this evolved computer in response to information it extracts from the environment. Understanding behavior requires articulating the cognitive programs that generate the behavior.
  3. The cognitive programs of the human brain are adaptations. They exist because they produced behavior in our ancestors that enabled them to survive and reproduce.
  4. The cognitive programs of the human brain may not be adaptive now; they were adaptive in ancestral environments.
  5. Natural selection ensures that the brain is composed of many different special purpose programs and not a domain general architecture.
  6. Describing the evolved computational architecture of our brains “allows a systematic understanding of cultural and social phenomena” (16–18).

Tenet 1 emphasizes the cognitivism that evolutionary psychologists are committed to. 1 in combination with 2 directs our attention as researchers not to parts of the brain but to the programs run by the brain. It is these programs—psychological mechanisms—that are products of natural selection. While they are products of natural selection, and hence adaptations, these programs need not be currently adaptive. Our behavior can be produced by underlying psychological mechanisms that arose to respond to particular circumstances in our ancestors’ environments. Tenet 5 presents what is often called the “massive modularity thesis” (see, e.g., Samuels 1998; Samuels 2000). There is a lot packed into this tenet and we will examine this thesis in some detail below in section 3. In brief, evolutionary psychologists maintain that there is an analogy between organs and psychological mechanisms or modules. Organs perform specific functions well and are products of natural selection. There are no general purpose organs, hearts pump blood and livers detoxify the body. The same goes for psychological mechanisms; they arise as responses to specific contingencies in the environment and are selected for to the extent that they contribute to the survival and reproduction of the organism. Just as there are no general purpose organs, there are no general purpose psychological mechanisms. Finally, tenet 6 introduces the reductionist or foundational vision of evolutionary psychology, discussed above.

There are numerous examples of the kinds of mechanisms that are hypothesized to underlie our behavior on the basis of research guided by these theoretical tenets: the cheater-detection module; the mind-reading module; the waist/hip ratio detection module; the snake fear module and so on. A closer look at the waist/hip ratio detection module illustrates the above theoretical tenets at work. Devendra Singh (Singh 1993; Singh & Luis 1995) presents the waist/hip ratio detection module as one of the suite of modules that underlies mate selection in humans. This one is a specifically male psychological mechanism. Men detect variations in waist/hip ratio in women. Men’s preferences are for women with waist/hip ratios closer to .7. Singh claims that the detection and preference suite are adaptations for choosing fertile mates. So our mate selection behavior is explained in part by the underlying psychological mechanism for waist/hip ratio preference that was selected for in earlier human environments.

What is important to note about the research guided by these theoretical tenets above is that all behavior is best explained in terms of underlying psychological mechanisms that are adaptations for solving a particular set of problems that humans faced at one time in our ancestry. Also, evolutionary psychologists stress that the mechanisms they focus on are universally distributed in humans and are not susceptible to much, if any, variation. They maintain that the mechanisms are a product of adaptation but are no longer under selection (Tooby & Cosmides 2005, 39–40). Clark Barrett’s (2015) accessible and wide ranging introduction to evolutionary psychology sustains this emphasis on evolved mechanisms as the main focus of evolutionary psychology research. Barrett also expands the scope of evolutionary psychology and notes the addition of research methods developed since Cosmides and Tooby first set out the parameters for research in the field. Some of Barrett’s proposals are discussed in sections 6 and 7 below. Todd Shackleford and Viviana Weekes-Shackleford (2017) have just completed a huge compendium of work in the evolutionarily based psychological sciences. In this volume a vast array of different research methods are presented and defended and there are a number of entries comparing the merits of alternative approaches to evolutionary psychology.

The methods for testing hypotheses in evolutionary psychology come mostly from psychology. For example, in Singh’s work, male subjects are presented with drawings of women with varying waist hip ratios and ask to give their preference rankings. In Buss’s work supporting several hypothesized mate selection mechanisms, he performed similar experiments on subjects, asking for their responses to various questions about features of desired mates (Buss 1990). Buss, Singh and other evolutionary psychologists emphasize the cross cultural validity of their results, claiming consistency in responses across a wide variety of human populations. (But see Yu & Shepard 1998; Gray et al. 2003 for alternate conflicting results to Singh’s.) For the most part standard psychological experimental methods are used to test hypotheses in evolutionary psychology. This has raised questions about the extent to which the evolutionary component of evolutionary psychologists’ hypotheses is being tested (see, e.g., Shapiro & Epstein 1998; Lloyd 1999; Lloyd & Feldman 2002). A response profile may be prevalent in a wide variety of subject populations but this says nothing about whether or not the response profile is a psychological mechanism that arose from a particular selective regimen.

3. The Massive Modularity Hypothesis

Claims that the mind has a modular architecture, and even massively modular architecture, are widespread in cognitive science (see, e.g., Hirshfield & Gelman 1994). The massive modularity thesis is first and foremost a thesis about cognitive architecture. As defended by evolutionary psychologists, the thesis is also about the source of our cognitive architecture: the massively modular architecture is the result of natural selection acting to produce each of the many modules (see, e.g., Barrett & Kurzban 2006; Barrett 2012). Our cognitive architecture is composed of computational devices, that are innate and are adaptations (Samuels 1998; Samuels et al. 1999a; Samuels et al. 1999b; Samuels 2000). This massively modular architecture accounts for all of our sophisticated behavior. Our successful navigation of the world results from the action of one or more of our many modules.

Jerry Fodor was the first to mount a sustained philosophical defense of modularity as a theory of cognitive architecture (Fodor 1983). His modularity thesis is distinct from the massive modularity thesis in a number of important ways. Fodor argued that our “input systems” are modular—for example, components of our visual system, our speech detection system and so on—these parts of our mind are dedicated information processors, whose internal make-up is inaccessible to other related processors. The modular detection systems feed output to a central system, which is a kind of inference engine. The central system, on Fodor’s view is not modular. Fodor presents a large number of arguments against the possibility of modular central systems. For example, he argues that central systems, to the extent that they engage in something like scientific confirmation, are “Quinean” in that “the degree of confirmation assigned to any given hypothesis is sensitive to properties of the entire belief system” (Fodor 1983, 107). Fodor draws a bleak conclusion about the status of cognitive science from his examination of the character of central systems: cognitive science is impossible. So on Fodor’s view, the mind is partly modular and the part of the mind that is modular provides some subject matter for cognitive science.

A distinct thesis from Fodor’s, the massive modularity thesis, gets a sustained philosophical defense from Peter Carruthers (see especially Carruthers 2006). Carruthers is well aware that Fodor (see e.g. Fodor 2000) does not believe that central systems can be modular but he presents arguments from evolutionary psychologists and others that support the modularity thesis for the whole mind. Perhaps one of the reasons that there is so much philosophical interest in evolutionary psychology is that discussions about the status of the massive modularity thesis are highly theoretical.[3] Both evolutionary psychologists and philosophers present and consider arguments for and against the thesis rather than simply waiting until the empirical results come in. Richard Samuels (1998) speculates that argument rather than empirical data is relied on, because the various competing modularity theses about central systems are hard to pull apart empirically. Carruthers exemplifies this approach as he relies heavily on arguments for massive modularity often at the expense of specific empirical results that tell in favor of the thesis.

There are many arguments for the massive modularity thesis. Some are based upon considerations about how evolution must have acted; some are based on considerations about the nature of computation and some are versions of the poverty of the stimulus argument first presented by Chomsky in support of the existence of an innate universal grammar. (See Cowie 1999 for a nice presentation of the structure of poverty of the stimulus arguments.) Myriad versions of each of these arguments appear in the literature and many arguments for massive modularity mix and match components of each of the main strands of argumentation. Here we review a version of each type of argument.

Carruthers presents a clear outline of the first type of argument “the biological argument for massive modularity”: “(1) Biological systems are designed systems, constructed incrementally. (2) Such systems, when complex, need to have massively modular organization. (3) The human mind is a biological system and is complex. (4) So the human mind will be massively modularly in its organization” (Carruthers 2006, 25). An example of this argument is to appeal to the functional decomposition of organisms into organs “designed” for specific tasks, e.g. hearts, livers, kidneys. Each of these organs arises as a result of natural selection and the organs, acting together, contribute to the fitness of the organism. The functional decomposition is driven by the response to specific environmental stimuli. Rather than natural selection acting to produce general purpose organs, each specific environmental challenge is dealt with by a separate mechanism. All versions of this argument are arguments from analogy, relying on the key transitional premise that minds are a kind of biological system upon which natural selection acts.

The second type of argument makes no appeal to biological considerations whatsoever (although many evolutionary psychologists give these arguments a biological twist). Call this the computational argument, which unfolds as follows: minds are computational problem solving devices; there are specific types of solutions to specific types of problems; and so for minds to be (successful) general problem solving devices, they must consist of collections of specific problem solving devices, i.e. many computational modules. This type of argument is structurally similar to the biological argument (as Carruthers points out). The key idea is that there is no sense to the idea of a general problem solver and that no headway can be made in cognitive science without breaking down problems into their component parts.

The third type of argument involves a generalization of Chomsky’s poverty of the stimulus argument for universal grammar. Many evolutionary psychologists (see, e.g., Tooby & Cosmides 1992) appeal to the idea that there is neither enough time, nor enough available information, for any given human to learn from scratch to successfully solve all of the problems that we face in the world. This first consideration supports the conclusion that the underlying mechanisms we use to solve the relevant problems are innate (for evolutionary psychologists “innate” is usually interchangeable with “product of natural selection”[4]). If we invoke this argument across the whole range of problem sets that humans face and solve, we arrive at a huge set of innate mechanisms that subserve our problem solving abilities, which is another way of saying that we have a massively modular mind.

There are numerous responses to the many versions of each of these types of arguments and many take on the massive modularity thesis head on without considering a specific argument for it. I will defer consideration of responses to the first argument type until section 4 below, which focuses on issues of the nature of evolution and natural selection – topics in philosophy of biology.

The second type of argument is one side of a perennial debate in the philosophy of cognitive science. Fodor (2000, 68) takes this argument to rest on the unwarranted assumption that there is no domain-independent criterion of cognitive success, which he thinks requires an argument that evolutionary psychologists do not provide. Samuels (see esp. Samuels 1998) responds to evolutionary psychologists that arguments of this type do not sufficiently discriminate between a conclusion about domain specific processing mechanisms and domain specific knowledge or information. Samuels articulates what he calls the “library model of cognition” in which there is domain specific information or knowledge but domain general processing. The library model of cognition is not massively modular in the relevant sense but type two arguments support it. According to Samuels, evolutionary psychologists need something more than this type of argument to warrant their specific kind of conclusion about massive modularity. Buller (2005) introduces further worries for this type of argument by tackling the assumption that there can be no such thing as a domain general problem solving mechanism. Buller worries that in their attempt to support this claim, evolutionary psychologists fail to adequately characterize a domain general problem solver. For example, they fail to distinguish between a domain general problem solver and a domain specific problem solver that is over generalized. He offers the example of social learning as a domain general mechanism that would produce domain specific solutions to problems. He uses a nice biological analogy to drive this point home: the immune system is a domain general system in that it allows the body to respond to a wide variety of pathogens. While it is true that the immune system produces domain specific responses to pathogens in the form of specific antibodies, the antibodies are produced by one domain general system. These and many other respondents conclude that type two arguments do not adequately support the massive modularity thesis.

Fodor (2000) and Kim Sterelny (2003) provide different responses to type three arguments. Fodor’s response is that poverty of the stimulus type arguments support conclusions about innateness but not modularity and so these arguments can not be used to support the massive modularity thesis. He argues that the domain specificity and encapsulation of a mechanism and its innateness pull apart quite clearly, allowing for “perfectly general learning mechanisms” that are innate and “fully encapsulated mechanisms” that are single stimulus specific and everything in between. Sterelny responds to the generalizing move in type three arguments. He takes language to be the exception rather than the rule in the sense that while the postulation of an innate, domain specific module may be warranted to account for our language abilities, much of our other problem solving behavior can be accounted for without postulating such modules (Sterelny 2003, 200).[5] Sterelny’s counter requires invoking alternate explanations for our behavioral repertoire. For example, he accounts for folk psychology and folk biology by appealing to environmental factors, some of which are constructed by our forebears, that allow us to perform sophisticated cognitive tasks. If we can account for our success at various complex problem solving tasks, without appealing to modules, then the massive modularity thesis is undercut. Sterelny sharpens his response to massive modularity by adding more detail to his accounts of how many of our uniquely human traits may have evolved (see, e.g., Sterelny 2012). Sterelny introduces his “evolved apprentice” model to account for the evolution of many human traits that many assume require explanation in terms of massive modularity, for example, forming moral judgments. Cecilia Heyes adopts a similar approach to Sterenly in attacking massive modularity. Rather than presenting arguments against massive modularity, she offers alternative explanations of the development of folk psychology that do not rely on the massive modularity thesis (Heyes 2014a; Heyes 2014b).

Heyes and Sterelny not only reject massive modularity but also have little expectation that any modularity theses will bear fruit but there are many critics of the massive modularity thesis who allow for the possibility of some modularity of mind. Such critics of evolutionary psychology do not reject the possibility of any kind of modularity, they just reject the massive modularity thesis. There is considerable debate about the status of the massive modularity thesis and some of this debate centers around the characterization of modules. If modules have all the characteristics that Fodor (1983) first presented, then he may be right that central systems are not modular. Both Carruthers (2006) and Barrett and Kurzban (2006) present modified characterizations of modules, which they argue better serve the massive modularity thesis. There is no agreement on a workable characterization of modules for evolutionary psychology but there is agreement on the somewhat benign thesis that “the language of modularity affords useful conceptual groundwork in which productive debates surrounding cognitive systems can be framed” (Barrett and Kurzban 2006, 644).

4. Philosophy of biology vs. Evolutionary Psychology

Many philosophers have criticized evolutionary psychology. Most of these critics are philosophers of biology who argue that the research tradition suffers from an overly zealous form of adaptationism (Griffiths 1996; Richardson 1996; Grantham & Nichols 1999; Lloyd 1999; Richardson 2007), an untenable reductionism (Dupré 1999, 2001), a “bad empirical bet” about modules (Sterelny 1995; Sterelny & Griffiths 1999; Sterelny 2003), a fast and loose conception of fitness (Lloyd 1999; Lloyd & Feldman 2002); and most of the above and much more (Buller 2005). (See also Downes 2005.)[6] All of these philosophers share one version or other of Buller’s view: “I am unabashedly enthusiastic about efforts to apply evolutionary theory to human psychology” (2005, x).[7] But if philosophers of biology are not skeptical of the fundamental idea behind the project, as Buller’s quote indicates, what are they so critical of? What is at stake are differing views about how to best characterize evolution and hence how to generate evolutionary hypotheses and how to test evolutionary hypotheses. For evolutionary psychologists, the most interesting contribution that evolutionary theory makes is the explanation of apparent design in nature or the explanation of the production of complex organs by appeal to natural selection. Evolutionary psychologists generate evolutionary hypotheses by first finding apparent design in the world, say in our psychological make up, and then presenting a selective scenario that would have led to the production of the trait that exhibits apparent design. The hypotheses evolutionary psychologists generate, given that they are usually hypotheses about our psychological capacities, are tested by standard psychological methods. Philosophers of biology challenge evolutionary psychologists on both of these points. I introduce a few examples of criticisms in each of these two areas below and then look at some responses to philosophical criticisms of evolutionary psychology.

Adaptation is the one biological concept that is central to most debates over evolutionary psychology. Every theoretical work on evolutionary psychology presents the research tradition as being primarily focused on psychological adaptations and goes on to give an account of what adaptations are (see, e.g., Tooby & Cosmides 1992; Buss et al. 1998; Simpson & Campbell 2005; Tooby & Cosmides 2005). Much of the philosophical criticism of evolutionary psychology addresses its approach to adaptation or its form of adaptationism. Let us quickly review the basics from the perspective of philosophy of biology.

Here is how Elliott Sober defines an adaptation: “characteristic c is an adaptation for doing task t in a population if and only if members of the population now have c because, ancestrally, there was selection for having c and c conferred a fitness advantage because it performed task t” (Sober 2000, 85). Sober makes a few further clarifications of the notion of adaptation that are helpful. First, we should distinguish between a trait that is adaptive and a trait that is an adaptation. Any number of traits can be adaptive without those traits being adaptations. A sea turtle’s forelegs are useful for digging in the sand to bury eggs but they are not adaptations for nest building (Sober 2000, 85). Also, traits can be adaptations without being currently adaptive for a given organism. Vestigial organs such as our appendix or vestigial eyes in cave dwelling organisms are examples of such traits (Sterelny and Griffiths 1999). Second, we should distinguish between ontogenic and phylogenetic adaptations (Sober 2000, 86). The adaptations of interest to evolutionary biologists are phylogenetic adaptations, which arise over evolutionary time and impact the fitness of the organism. Ontogenetic adaptations, including any behavior we learn in our lifetimes, can be adaptive to the extent that an organism benefits from them but they are not adaptations in the relevant sense. Finally, adaptation and function are closely related terms. On one of the prominent views of function—the etiological view of functions—adaptation and function are more or less coextensive; to ask for the function of an organ is to ask why it is present. On the Cummins view of functions adaptation and function are not coextensive, as on the Cummins view, to ask what an organ’s function is, is to ask what it does (Sober 2000, 86–87). (See also Sterelny & Griffiths 1999, 220–224.)

Evolutionary psychologists focus on psychological adaptations. One consistent theme in the theoretical work of evolutionary psychologists is that “adaptations, the functional components of organisms, are identified […] by […] evidence of their design: the exquisite match between organism structure and environment” (Hagen 2005, 148). The way in which psychological adaptations are identified is by evolutionary functional analysis, which is a type of reverse engineering.[8] “Reverse engineering is a process of figuring out the design of a mechanism on the basis of an analysis of the tasks it performs. Evolutionary functional analysis is a form of reverse engineering in that it attempts to reconstruct the mind’s design from an analysis of the problems the mind must have evolved to solve” (Buller 2005, 92). Many philosophers object to evolutionary psychologists’ over attribution of adaptations on the basis of apparent design. Here some are following Gould and Lewontin’s (1979) lead when they worry that accounting for apparent design in nature in terms of adaptation amounts to telling just-so stories but they could just as easily cite Williams (1966), who also cautioned against the over attribution of adaptation as an explanation for biological traits. While it is true that evolutionary functional analysis can lend itself to just-so story telling, this is not the most interesting problem that confronts evolutionary psychology, several other interesting problems have been identified. For example, Elisabeth Lloyd (1999) derives a criticism of evolutionary psychology from Gould and Lewontin’s criticism of sociobiology, emphasizing the point that evolutionary psychologists’ adaptationism leads them to ignore alternative evolutionary processes. Buller takes yet another approach to evolutionary psychologists’ adaptationism. What lies behind Buller’s criticisms of evolutionary psychologists’ adaptationism is a different view than theirs about what is important in evolutionary thinking (Buller 2005). Buller thinks that evolutionary psychologists overemphasize design and that they make the contentious assumption that with respect to the traits they are interested in, evolution is finished, rather than ongoing.

Sober’s definition of adaptation is not constrained only to apply to organs or other traits that exhibit apparent design. Rather, clutch size (in birds), schooling (in fish), leaf arrangement, foraging strategies and all manner of traits can be adaptations (Seger & Stubblefield 1996). Buller argues the more general point that phenotypic plasticity of various types can be an adaptation, because it arises in various organisms as a result of natural selection.[9] The difference here between Buller (and other philosophers and biologists) and evolutionary psychologists is a difference in the explanatory scope that they attribute to natural selection. For evolutionary psychologists, the hallmark of natural selection is a well functioning organ and for their critics, the results of natural selection can be seen in an enormous range of traits ranging from the specific apparent design features of organs to the most general response profiles in behavior. According to Buller, this latter approach opens up the range of possible evolutionary hypotheses that can account for human behavior. Rather than being restricted to accounting for our behavior in terms of the joint output of many specific modular mechanisms, we can account for our behavior by appealing to selection acting upon many different levels of traits. This difference in emphasis on what is important in evolutionary theory also is at the center of debates between evolutionary psychologists and behavioral ecologists, who argue that behaviors, rather than just the mechanisms that underlie them, can be adaptations (Downes 2001). Further, this difference in emphasis is what leads to the wide range of alternate evolutionary hypotheses that Sterelny (Sterelny 2003) presents to explain human behavior. Given that philosophers like Buller and Sterelny are adaptationists, they are not critical of evolutionary psychologists’ adaptationism. Rather, they are critical of the narrow explanatory scope of the type of adaptationism evolutionary psychologists adopt (see also Downes 2015).

Buller’s criticism that evolutionary psychologists assume that evolution is finished for the traits that they are interested in connects worries about the understanding of evolutionary theory with worries about the testing of evolutionary hypotheses. Here is Tooby & Cosmides’ clear statement of the assumption that Buller is worried about: “evolutionary psychologists primarily explore the design of the universal, evolved psychological and neural architecture that we all share by virtue of being human. Evolutionary psychologists are usually less interested in human characteristics that vary due to genetic differences because they recognize that these differences are unlikely to be evolved adaptations central to human nature. Of the three kinds of characteristics that are found in the design of organisms – adaptations, by-products, and noise – traits caused by genetic variants are predominantly evolutionary noise, with little adaptive significance, while complex adaptations are likely to be universal in the species” (Tooby & Cosmides 2005, 39). This line of thinking also captures evolutionary psychologists’ view of human nature: human nature is our collection of universally shared adaptations. (See Downes & Machery 2013 for more discussion of this and other, contrasting biologically based accounts of human nature.) The problem here is that it is false to assume that adaptations cannot be subject to variation. The underlying problem is the constrained notion of adaptation. Adaptations are traits that arise as a result of natural selection and not traits that exhibit design and are universal in a given species (Seger & Stubblefield 1996). As a result, it is quite consistent to argue, as Buller does, that many human traits may still be under selection and yet reasonably be called adaptations. Finally, philosophers of biology have articulated several different types of adaptationism (see, e.g., Godfrey-Smith 2001; Lewens 2009; Sober 2000). While some of these types of adaptationism can be reasonably seen placing constraints on how evolutionary research is carried out, Godfrey-Smith’s “explanatory adaptationism” is different in character (Godfrey-Smith 2001). Explanatory adaptationism is the view that apparent design is one of the big questions we face in explaining our natural world and natural selection is the big (and only supportable) answer to such a big question. Explanatory adaptationism is often adopted by those who want to distinguish evolutionary thinking from creationism or intelligent design and is the way evolutionary psychologists often couch their work to distinguish it from their colleagues in the broader social sciences. While explanatory adaptationism does serve to distinguish evolutionary psychology from such markedly different approaches to accounting for design in nature, it does not place many clear constraints on the way in which evolutionary explanations should be sought (Downes 2015). So far these are disagreements that are located in differing views about the nature and scope of evolutionary explanation but they have ramifications in the discussion about hypothesis testing.

If the traits of interest to evolutionary psychologists are universally distributed, then we should expect to find them in all humans. This partly explains the stock that evolutionary psychologists put in cross cultural psychological tests (see, e.g., Buss 1990). If we find evidence for the trait in a huge cross section of humans, then this supports our view that the trait is an adaptation —on the assumption that adaptations are organ-like traits that are products of natural selection but not subject to variation. But given the wider scope view of evolution defended by philosophers of biology, this method of testing seems wrong-headed as a test of an evolutionary hypothesis. Certainly such testing can result in the very interesting results that certain preference profiles are widely shared cross culturally but the test does not speak to the evolutionary hypothesis that the preferences are adaptations (Lloyd 1999; Buller 2005).

Another worry that critics have about evolutionary psychologists’ approach to hypothesis testing is that they give insufficient weight to serious alternate hypotheses that fit the relevant data. Buller dedicates several chapters of his book on evolutionary psychology to an examination of hypothesis testing and many of his criticisms center around the introduction of alternate hypotheses that do as good a job, or a better job, of accounting for the data. For example, he argues that the hypothesis of assortative mating by status does a better job of accounting for some of evolutionary psychologists’ mate selection data than their preferred high status preference hypothesis. This debate hangs on how the empirical tests come out. The previous debate is more closely connected to theoretical issues in philosophy of biology.

I said in my introduction that there is a broad consensus among philosophers of science that evolutionary psychology is a deeply flawed enterprise and some philosophers of biology continue to remind us of this sentiment (see, e.g., Dupré 2012). However the relevant consensus is not complete, there are some proponents of evolutionary psychology among philosophers of science. One way of defending evolutionary psychology is to rebut criticism. Edouard Machery and Clark Barrett (2007) do just that in their sharply critical review of Buller’s book. Another way to defend evolutionary psychology is to practice it (at least to the extent that philosophers can, i.e. theoretically). This is what Robert Arp (2006) does in a recent article. I briefly review both responses below.

Machery and Barrett (2007) argue that Buller has no clear critical target as there is nothing to the idea that there is a research tradition of evolutionary psychology that is distinct from the broader enterprise of the evolutionary understanding of human behavior. They argue that theoretical tenets and methods are shared by many in the biology of human behavior. For example, many are adaptationists. But as we saw above, evolutionary psychologists and behavioral ecologists can both call themselves adaptationist but their particular approach to adaptationism dictates the range of hypotheses that they can generate, the range of traits that can be counted as adaptations and impacts upon the way in which hypotheses are tested. Research traditions can share some broad theoretical commitments and yet still be distinct research traditions. Secondly, they argue against Buller’s view that past environments are not stable enough to produce the kind of psychological adaptations that evolutionary psychologists propose. They take this to be a claim that no adaptations can arise from an evolutionary arms race situation, for example, between predators and prey. But again, I think that the disagreement here is over what counts as an adaptation. Buller does not deny that adaptations— traits that arise as a product of natural selection—arise from all kinds of unstable environments. What he denies is that organ-like, special purpose adaptations are the likely result of such evolutionary scenarios.

Arp (2006) defends a hypothesis about a kind of module—scenario visualization—a psychological adaptation that arose in our hominid history in response to the demands of tool making, such as constructing spear throwing devices for hunting. Arp presents his hypothesis in the context of demonstrating the superiority of his approach to evolutionary psychology, which he calls “Narrow Evolutionary Psychology,” over “Broad Evolutionary Psychology,” with respect to accounting for archaeological evidence and facts about our psychology. While Arp’s hypothesis is innovative and interesting, he by no means defends it conclusively. This is partly because his strategy is to compare his hypothesis with archaeologist Steven Mithen’s (1996) non-modular “cognitive fluidity” hypothesis that is proposed to account for the same data. The problem here is that Mithen’s view is only one of the many alternative, evolutionary explanations of human tool making behavior. While Arp’s modular thesis may be superior to Mithen’s, he has not compared it to Sterelny’s (2003; 2012) account of tool making and tool use or to Boyd and Richerson’s (see, e.g., 2005) account and hence not ruled these accounts out as plausible alternatives. As neither of these alternative accounts rely on the postulation of psychological modules, evolutionary psychology is not adequately defended.

5. Moral Psychology and Evolutionary Psychology

Many philosophers who work on moral psychology understand that their topic is empirically constrained. Philosophers take two main approaches to using empirical results in moral psychology. One is to use empirical results (and empirically based theories from psychology) to criticize philosophical accounts of moral psychology (see, e.g., Doris 2002) and one is to generate (and, in the experimental philosophy tradition, to test) hypotheses about our moral psychology (see, e.g., Nichols 2004). For those who think that some (or all) of our moral psychology is based in innate capacities, evolutionary psychology is a good source of empirical results and empirically based theory. One account of the make-up of our moral psychology follows from the massive modularity account of the architecture of the mind. Our moral judgments are a product of domain specific psychological modules that are adaptations and arose in our hominid forebears in response to contingencies in our (mostly) social environments. This position is currently widely discussed by philosophers working in moral psychology. An example of this discussion follows.

Cosmides (see, e.g., 1989) defends a hypothesis in evolutionary psychology that we have a cheater-detection module.[10] This module is hypothesized to underlie important components of our behavior in moral domains and fits with the massively modular view of our psychology in general. Cosmides (along with Tooby) argues that cheating is a violation of a particular kind of conditional rule that goes along with a social contract. Social exchange is a system of cooperation for mutual benefit and cheaters violate the social contract that governs social exchange (Cosmides & Tooby 2005). The selection pressure for a dedicated cheater-detection module is the presence of cheaters in the social world. The cheater-detection module is an adaptation that arose in response to cheaters. The cheater-detection hypothesis has been the focus of a huge amount of critical discussion. Cosmides and Tooby (2008) defend the idea that cheat detection is modular over hypotheses that more general rules of inference are involved in the kind of reasoning behind cheater detection against critics Ron Mallon (2008) and Fodor (2008). Some criticism of the cheater-detection hypothesis involves rehashing criticisms of massive modularity in general and some treats the hypothesis as a contribution to moral psychology and invokes different considerations. For example, Mallon (2008) worries about the coherence of abandoning a domain general conception of ought in our conception of our moral psychology. This discussion is also ongoing. (See, e.g., Sterelny 2012 for a selection of alternate, non-modular explanations of aspects of our moral psychology.)

6. Human Nature

Evolutionary psychology is well suited to providing an account of human nature. As noted above (Section 1), evolutionary psychology owes a theoretical debt to human sociobiology. E.O. Wilson took human sociobiology to provide us with an account of human nature (1978). For Wilson human nature is the collection of universal human behavioral repertoires and these behavioral repertoires are best understood as being products of natural selection. Evolutionary psychologists argue that human nature is not a collection of universal human behavioral repertoires but rather the universal psychological mechanisms underlying these behaviors (Tooby & Cosmides 1990). These universal psychological mechanisms are products of natural selection, as we saw in Section 2. above. Tooby and Cosmides put this claim as follows: “the concept of human nature is based on a species-typical collection of complex psychological adaptations” (1990, 17). So, for evolutionary psychologists, “human nature consists of a set of psychological adaptations that are presumed to be universal among, and unique to, human beings” (Buller 2005, 423). Machery’s (2008) nomological account of human nature is based on, and very similar to, the evolutionary psychologists’ account. Machery says that “human nature is the set of properties that humans tend to possess as a result of the evolution of their species” (2008, 323). While Machery’s account appeals to traits that have evolved and are universal (common to all humans), it is not limited to psychological mechanisms. For example, he thinks of bi-pedalism as part of the human nature trait cluster. Machery’s view captures elements of both the sociobiological view and the evolutionary psychology view of human nature. He shares the idea that a trait must be a product of evolution, rather than say social learning or enculturation, with both these accounts.

Some critical challenges to evolutionary psychological accounts of human nature (and the nomological account) derive from similar concerns as those driving criticism of evolutionary psychology in general. In Section 4. we see that discussions of evolutionary psychology are founded on disagreements about how adaptation should be characterized and disagreements about the role of variation in evolution. Some critics charge evolutionary psychologists of assuming that adaptation cannot sustain variation. Buller’s (2005) criticism of evolutionary psychologists’ account of human nature also invokes variation (Here he follows Hull 1986 and Sober 1980). The idea here is that humans, like all organisms, exhibit a great deal of variation, including morphological, physiological, behavioral and cultural variation (see also Amundson 2000). Buller argues that the evolutionary psychology account of human nature either ignores or fails to account for all of this variation (see also Lewens 2015 and Ramsey 2013). Any account that restricts human nature to just those traits we have in common and which also are not subject to change, cannot account for human variation.

Buller’s (2005) criticism of evolutionary psychologists’ notion of human nature (or the nomological account) is based on the idea that we vary across many dimensions and an account of human nature based on fixed, universal traits cannot account for any of this variation. The idea that to account for human nature, we must account for human variation is presented and defended by evolutionary psychologists (see, e.g., Barrett 2015), anthropologists (see e.g. Cashdan 2013) and philosophers (see, e.g., Griffiths 2011 and Ramsey 2013). Barrett agrees with Buller (and others) that evolutionary psychologists have failed to account for human variation in their account of human nature. Rather than seeing this challenge as a knock down of the whole enterprise of accounting for human nature, Barrett sees this as a challenge for an account of human nature. Barrett says “Whatever human nature is, it’s a biological phenomenon with all that implies” (2015, 321). So, human nature is “a big wobbly cloud that is different from the population clouds of squirrels and palm trees. To understand human minds and behaviors, we need to understand the properties of our own cloud, as messy as it might be” (2015, 232). Rather than human nature being a collection of shared fixed universal psychological traits, for Barrett, human nature is the whole human trait cluster, including all of the variation in all of our traits. This approach to human nature is sharply different than the approach defended by either Wilson, Tooby and Cosmides or Machery but is also subject to a number of criticisms. The main thrust of the criticisms is that such a view cannot be explanatory and is instead merely a big list of all the properties that humans have had and can have (see, e.g., Buller 2005; Downes 2016; Futuyma 1998; and Lewens 2015). Discussion over the tension between evolutionary psychologists’ views and the manifest variation in human traits continues in many areas that evolutionary psychologists focus on. Another example of this broader discussion is included in Section 7. below.

7. Applications of Evolutionary Psychology and Prospects for Further Debate

Evolutionary psychology is invoked in a wide range of areas of study, for example, in English Literature, Consumer Studies and Law. (See Buss 2005 for discussion of Literature and Law and Saad 2007 for a detailed presentation of evolutionary psychology and consumer studies.) In these contexts, evolutionary psychology is usually introduced as providing resources for practitioners, which will advance the relevant field. Philosophers have responded critically to some of these applications of evolutionary psychology. One concern is that often evolutionary psychology is conflated with evolution or evolutionary theory in general (see, e.g., Leiter & Weisberg 2009 and Downes 2013). The discussion reviewed in Section 4. above, reveals a good deal of disagreement between evolutionary theorists and evolutionary psychologists over the proper account of evolution. Evolutionary psychologists offer to enhance fields such as Law and Consumer Studies by introducing evolutionary ideas but what is in fact offered is a selection of theoretical resources championed only by proponents of a specific approach to evolutionary psychology. For example, Gad Saad (2007) argues that Consumer Studies will profit greatly from the addition of adaptive thinking, i.e. looking for apparent design, and by introducing hypothetical evolved modules to account for consumer behavior. However, this does not appear to be an effort to bring evolutionary theory, broadly construed, to bear on Consumer Studies (Downes 2013). Promoting disputed theoretical ideas is certainly problematic but bigger worries arise when thoroughly discredited work is promoted in the effort to apply evolutionary psychology. Owen Jones (see, e.g., 2000; 2005), who believes that Law will benefit from the application of evolutionary psychology, champions Randy Thornhill and Craig Palmer’s (2000) widely discredited view that rape is an adaptation as exemplary evolutionary work (see de Waal 2000, Coyne & Berry 2000, Coyne 2003, Lloyd 2003, Vickers & Kitcher 2003, and Kimmel 2003). Further, Jones (2000) claims that the critics of Thornhill and Palmer’s work have no credibility as scientists and evolutionary theorists. This claim indicates Jones’ serious disconnect with the wider scientific (and philosophical) literature on evolutionary theory (Leiter & Weisberg 2009).

Aside from monitoring the expansion efforts of evolutionary psychology, there are a number of other areas in which further philosophical work on evolutionary psychology will be fruitful. The examples given above of work in moral psychology barely scratch the surface of this rapidly developing field. There are huge numbers of empirical hypotheses that bear on our conception of our moral psychology that demand philosophical scrutiny. (Hauser 2006 includes a survey of a wide range of such hypotheses.) Also, work on moral psychology and the emotions can be drawn together via work on evolutionary psychology and related fields. Griffiths (1997) directed philosophical attention to evolution and the emotions and this kind of work has been brought into closer contact with moral psychology by Nichols (see, e.g., his 2004). In philosophy of mind there is still much that can be done on the topic of modules. Work on integrating biological and psychological concepts of modules is one avenue that is being pursued and could be fruitfully pursued further (see, e.g., Barrett & Kurzban 2006; Carruthers 2006) and work on connecting biology to psychology via genetics is another promising area (see e.g. Marcus 2004). In philosophy of science, I have no doubt that many more criticisms of evolutionary psychology will be presented but a relatively underdeveloped area of philosophical research is on the relations among all of the various, theoretically different, approaches to the biology of human behavior (but see Downes 2005; Griffiths 2008; and Brown et al. 2011). Evolutionary psychologists present their work alongside the work of behavioral ecologists, developmental psychobiologists and others (see, e.g., Buss 2005; Buss 2007) but do not adequately confront the theoretical difficulties that face an integrated enterprise in the biology of human behavior. Finally, while debate rages between biologically influenced and other social scientists, most philosophers have not paid much attention to potential integration of evolutionary psychology into the broader interdisciplinary study of society and culture (but see Mallon and Stich 2000 on evolutionary psychology and constructivism). In contrast, feminist philosophers have paid attention to this integration issue as well as offered feminist critiques of evolutionary psychology (see Fehr 2012, Meynell 2012 and the entry on feminist philosophy of biology). Gillian Barker (2015), shares some evolutionarily based criticisms of evolutionary psychology with philosophers of biology discussed in Section 4. but also assesses evolutionary psychology in relation to other social sciences. She also adds a novel critical appraisal of evolutionary psychology. She argues that, as currently practiced, evolutionary psychology is not a fruitful guide to social policy regarding human flourishing.

The publication of Shackleford and Weekes-Shackleford’s (2017) huge collection of articles on issues arising in the evolutionary psychological sciences provides a great resource for philosophers looking for material to fuel critical discussion. Many evolutionary psychologists are aware of the difficulty variation presents for some established approaches in their field. This issue confronts those interested in developing accounts of human nature, as noted above (Section 6.), but also arises when confronting many of the varying human behaviors evolutionary psychologists seek to account for. For example, human aggression varies along many dimensions and confronting and accounting for each of these types of variation is a challenge for many evolutionary psychologists (Downes & Tabery 2017). Given that evolutionary psychology is just one, among many, evolutionarily based approaches to explaining human behavior, the most promising critical discussions of evolutionary psychology should continue to come from work that compares hypotheses drawn from evolutionary psychology with hypotheses drawn from other evolutionary approaches and other approaches in the social sciences more broadly construed. Stephan Linquist (2016) takes this approach to evolutionary psychologists’ work on cultures of honor. Linquist introduces hypotheses from cultural evolution that appear to offer more explanatory bite than those from evolutionary psychology. The broader issue of tension between evolutionary psychology and cultural evolution here will doubtless continue to attract the critical attention of philosophers. (See Lewens 2015 for a nice clear introduction to and discussion of alternative approaches to cultural evolution.)

Interest has re-emerged in the relation(s) between evolutionary psychology and the other social sciences (Buss 2020). Some time ago, John Dupré (1994) diagnosed evolutionary psychology as an exercise in scientific imperialism. Dupré later characterized scientific imperialism as “the tendency for a successful scientific idea to be applied far beyond its original home, and generally with decreasing success the more its application is expanded” (2001, 16). Dupré uses “scientific imperialism” in a pejorative sense and marshals this as a criticism of evolutionary psychology. (See Downes 2017 for further discussion of scientific imperialism and evolutionary psychology.) Buss (2020) does not cite Dupré but might well be responding to him when he proposes that evolutionary psychology constitutes a scientific revolution in Kuhn’s sense. Buss argues that evolutionary psychology is superior to other approaches in psychology, because it has supplanted them (or at least should supplant them) just as Einstein’s physics supplanted Newton’s or just as cognitive psychology supplanted behaviorism. (David Reich [2018] casts ancient DNA research in similarly Kuhnian terms and offers it up as superior to all previous approaches in archaeology.) Buss takes evolutionary psychology to be a meta-theoretical approach best fit for guiding all of psychology. This is one of the many ways in which his appeal to Kuhn is strained, as Buss is not looking back on the supplanting of one theoretical framework by another but rather arguing for the superiority of his approach to others available in psychology. A further, and quite specific way that Buss sees evolutionary psychology as superior to other approaches in psychology (and the social sciences in general, is that evolutionary psychology ignores (or should ignore) proximate explanations. For Buss, evolutionary psychology offers ultimate explanations and these are enough. However, many areas of biology, for example, physiology, trade in proximate explanations and are not likely to be cast aside because of this focus. This implies that there is still a place for proximate explanations in psychology. This brief discussion indicates that the relations between evolutionary psychology and the rest of psychology, and the social sciences, more broadly is a topic well worth pursuing by philosophers of science and Buss’ and Dupré’s accounts present interesting alternate starting points in this endeavor.

Finally, philosophers of science will doubtless continue to check the credentials of evolutionary ideas imported into other areas of philosophy. Philosophers of biology in particular, still voice suspicion if philosophers borrow their evolutionary ideas from evolutionary psychology rather than evolutionary biology. Philip Kitcher (2017) voices this concern with regards to Sharon Street’s (2006) appeals to evolution. Kitcher worries that Street does not rely on “what is known about human evolution” (2017, 187) to provide an account of how her traits of interest may have emerged. As noted above, Machery’s nomological notion of human nature (2008; 2017) is criticized on the grounds that he takes his idea of an evolved trait from evolutionary psychology as opposed to evolutionary biology. Barker (2015) also encourages philosophers, as well as social scientists, to draw from the huge range of theoretical resources evolutionary biologists have to offer, rather than just from those provided by evolutionary psychologists.


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Thanks to Austin Booth, David Buller, Marc Ereshefsky, Matt Haber, Ron Mallon, Shaun Nichols and the Stanford Encyclopedia referees for helpful comments on drafts of this entry.

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