Notes to Existentialism

1. Beauvoir recounts the story of the introduction of the word “existentialism” in her memoir The Force of Circumstance, suggesting it stemmed initially from a dispute between Sartre and Marcel in which Sartre rejected the label because it conveyed the sense of a philosophical system. In response to Marcel, he claimed: “My philosophy is a philosophy of existence; I don’t even know what Existentialism is.” Beauvoir shared Sartre’s irritation as her recently published book Blood of Others was described by critics as an “Existentialist novel.” But the label stuck to them nonetheless, and the two came to embrace it. In Beauvoir words: “I had written my novel [Blood of Others] before I had ever encountered the term Existentialist; my inspiration came from my own experience, not from a system. But our protests were in vain. In the end, we took the epithet that everyone used for us and used it for our own purposes” (Beauvoir 1963 [1992, 38]).

2. This distinction between the object-body and the lived-body was first introduced and developed by Husserl in Ideas II. Here, he draws on two senses of the body in the German language, the “corporeal body” (Körper) and the “lived body” (Leib). Related to the words for “life” (Leben) and “experience” (Erlebnis), Leib is a reference to the first-person experience of my own body, and I cannot examine my body from a perspective of theoretical detachment because I am already living through it. Thus, as Husserl writes, “I do not have the possibility of distancing myself from my body, or my body from me… The same body that serves me as a means of all perception stands in my way in the perception of itself and is a remarkably incompletely constituted thing” (1912 [1989, 167]).

3. All references to Being and Time are to the German pagination.

4. Nietzsche is the exception here. He dismisses the traditional ideas of free will and responsibility, viewing them as historical fictions bound up in Christian morality. But he does offer an account of self-creation and mediated freedom grounded in the polymorphous drives and impulses of the body. In this way, he refers to the human being as both “creature and creator” (1886 [1998], §225).

5. Not all existentialists would support Dostoevsky’s account of freedom as the one (or “highest” value). Sartre and Beauvoir, for example, would argue that freedom is not just a value; it is the condition for the possibility of any value whatsoever. Freedom in this sense would be viewed as a meta-value. As Beauvoir writes in The Ethics of Ambiguity: “Freedom is the source from which all signification and all values spring. It is the original condition of all justification of existence.” (1947 [1948, 15, 17])

6. These Marxist critics included, among others, the influential French sociologist Henri Lefebvre and the Hungarian philosopher Georg Lukáks.

7. Here, in his journals, Kierkegaard is speaking in his own words. But it is often difficult to pin down Kierkegaard’s own views because he draws on pseudonyms to present philosophical positions and other pseudonyms, and sometimes Kierkegaard himself, to critique these same positions. Fear and Trembling, for instance, is “authored” by Johannes de Silentio and The Sickness unto Death by Anti-Climacus but “edited” by S. Kierkegaard.

8. For Heidegger, because it is structural to the human condition, the experience of death (as world-collapse) “is possible at any moment” (1927 [1962, 258]).

9. Thus, Heidegger claims: “Dasein ‘is’ its past in the way of its own Being.” (1927 [1962, 20]) For further analysis, see Aho (2007) and Vogel (1994).

10. As a compound of ent (“not”) and schliessen (“to close”), the German word Entschlossenheit contains the literal sense of “being open” or “unlocked.”

11. It is difficult to get a sense of what exactly Sartre means if we rely solely on Being and Nothingness because the reference to “self-recovery” is relegated to a footnote at the end of Part I, where he writes: “This self-recovery we shall call authenticity, the description of which has no place here” (1943 [1956, 116]).

12. Here Beauvoir offers a response to the charge of “decisionism” that is often levelled against existentialism, where it is not the moral content of one’s choices that matter but the level of personal passion and commitment that underlies them. In The Jargon of Authenticity, Theodore Adorno attacks the existentialists (Heidegger in particular) for creating a cult-like “aura” by employing obfuscating, quasi-religious terminology that has been stripped of its evaluative content, where “one needs only to be a believer—no matter what he believes in.” (1964 [1973, 21]) In this way, key terms like “engagement,” “decision,” and “commitment” are merely attitudinal; they provide no moral guidance, telling us nothing about what we should actually do. For an expanded discussion of the problem of “decisionism,” see Guignon and Aho (2019).

13. Here, I am indebted to Charles Guignon’s (1993) interpretation of Dostoevsky.

14. As Nietzsche writes in The Gay Science, “My thought is … that consciousness does not really belong to the individual existence of human beings, but rather to the social and herd nature in them; that, as a consequence, consciousness is subtly developed only in regard to social and herd usefulness” (1887 [1974], §354).

Copyright © 2023 by
Kevin Aho <>

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