First published Thu Dec 20, 2001; substantive revision Tue Aug 16, 2016

To exploit someone is to take unfair advantage of them. It is to use another person’s vulnerability for one’s own benefit. Of course, benefitting from another’s vulnerability is not always morally wrong—we do not condemn a chess player for exploiting a weakness in his opponent’s defense, for instance. But some forms of advantage-taking do seem to be clearly wrong, and it is this normative sense of exploitation that is of primary interest to moral and political philosophers.

Exploitation can be transactional or structural. In the former case, the unfairness is a property of a discrete transaction between two or more individuals. A sweatshop that pays low wages, for example, or a pharmaceutical research firm that tests drugs on poor subjects in the developing world, might be said to exploit others in this sense. But exploitation can also be structural—a property of institutions or systems in which the “rules of the game” unfairly benefit one group of people to the detriment of another. As we will see below, Karl Marx believed that the economic and political institutions of capitalism were exploitative in this sense. And some contemporary feminists have argued that the institution of traditional marriage is exploitative insofar as it preys upon and reinforces pernicious forms of inequality between men and women (Sample 2003: Ch. 4).

Exploitation can also be harmful or mutually beneficial. Harmful exploitation involves an interaction that leaves the victim worse off than she was, and than she was entitled to be. The sort of exploitation involved in coercive sex trafficking, for instance, is harmful in this sense. But as we will see below, not all exploitation is harmful. Exploitation can also be mutually beneficial, where both parties walk away better off than they were ex ante. What makes such mutually beneficial interactions nevertheless exploitative is that they are, in some way, unfair.

It is relatively easy to come up with intuitively compelling cases of unfair, exploitative behavior. Providing a philosophical analysis to support and develop those intuitions, however, has proven more difficult. The most obvious difficulty is specifying the conditions under which a transaction or institution may be said to be unfair. Does the unfairness involved in exploitation necessarily involve some kind of harm to its victim? Or a violation of her moral rights? Is the unfairness involved in exploitation a matter of procedure, substance, or both? And how, if at all, are facts about the history of the agents involved or the background conditions against which they operate relevant to assessing charges of exploitation?

1. Historical Accounts of Exploitation

Although the term “exploitation” appears not to have been used to describe unfair advantage-taking prior to the 19th century, there are nevertheless extensive discussions of the themes and problems that characterize contemporary discussions of exploitation in the history of philosophy. Those themes include the notion of justice and injustice in economic exchange, the role of labor in the creation of value, and the justification and abuse of private property, especially in capital and land.

1.1 Pre-Marxian Accounts of Exploitation and Unjust Trade

Concerns about exploitation often take the form of unfair economic exchange. Attempts to specify the principles that render an exchange fair or unfair can be traced back at least as far as Aristotle, who argued that a just exchange will embody a kind of reciprocity such that the values of the goods exchanged are proportional (Nicomachean Ethics, Book V, Part V). But while the notion of proportionality is intuitively appealing, it is somewhat unclear precisely what Aristotle had in mind by it, or what the most defensible explication of the idea would be. To borrow Aristotle’s own example, if a shoemaker and a builder trade, how many pairs of shoes is proportional to a single house?

In the writings of St. Thomas Aquinas, we find the beginnings of a much more sophisticated and promising approach to questions such as this. In his Summa Theologiae, Aquinas sought to answer the question of “whether a man may lawfully sell a thing for more than it is worth?” The “worth” of a thing, for Aquinas, was its just price. And the just price, according to Aquinas, appears to have been simply the prevailing market price (Summa Theologiae, part 2, second part, question 77; see also de Roover 1958 and Friedman 1980). Rather than relying on some fixed notion of proportionality, Aquinas’ just price will be responsive to considerations of supply and demand. But not just any price that two individuals mutually agree upon will be deemed just on Aquinas’ standard. Thus, a seller who takes advantage of fraud, or a temporary monopoly, to charge an excessive price for an item would be acting unjustly, insofar as his price is in excess of the price at which similar goods typically sell in the relevant market. But Aquinas saw nothing inherently sinful in selling a good for more than one paid for it, or with charging enough to earn a profit, or to compensate for risks involved in the productive process. Seeking profit for its own sake may involve a certain sort of “debasement”, but profit can also be sought in order to fulfill necessary or even virtuous ends.

Later Scholastics would devote considerable attention to developing and refining the notion of the just price. Of special concern was the price attached to the lending of money, or interest. Since the founding of the Catholic church, it was widely regarded as sinful for lenders to charge interest on their loans, and so-called “usury” was prohibited by canon and often by secular law. Much of the concern regarding usury seems to have been driven by the idea that the charging of interest involves an inequitable exchange—lenders give something to borrowers, but demand back more than they have given. But Aquinas seems to have been particularly concerned that borrowers would often be driven to take out loans out of necessity, and thus that their consent to the exchange is not fully voluntary (Summa Theologiae, part 2, second part, question 78).

The much later natural law theorist John Locke also took up questions regarding just and unjust prices, not in either of his well-known treatises on government but in a lesser known tract titled, Venditio. Locke, even more explicitly than Aquinas, saw the just price as being equivalent to “the market price at the place where he sells” (Locke 1661: 340). The relativity of the just price to the particular market in which the transaction takes place is important. For Locke argued that if two ships sailed laden with corn, one to Dunkirk where there is a near famine taking place, and the other to Ostend where normal conditions obtain, it would not be unjust for the merchant to sell at a significantly higher price in the former location than in the latter (so long as the higher price is one that the buyers can afford). If the merchant did not charge a higher price, Locke argued, then two problems would result. First, it is likely that the merchant’s goods would simply be bought by speculators and resold on a secondary market, thereby simply redirecting the profit into somebody else’s hands without doing anything to improve the situation of buyers. And second, if merchants cannot charge a high price in “good” markets to cover their losses in “bad” ones, they will soon operate at a net loss and this will, Locke claims, “quickly put an end to merchandising” (Locke 1661: 342).

What would be unjust would be for the merchant to sell an item to a particular individual for a price higher than the general market rate as might happen, for instance, if that individual is in particular distress. Thus, Locke holds, if anchors typically sell for a certain price, say 100 pounds, then it would be unjust (exploitative) to charge the captain of a distressed ship 5000 pounds for an anchor, simply because one knows he will be compelled to pay it. The just price is the going market rate, where that rate is determined by the general features of supply and demand, and not the particular needs or vulnerabilities of any particular buyer or seller.

Interest in exploitation as a feature of economic exchange is thus almost as old as philosophy itself. It was not until the 19th century, however, that exploitation as a feature of employment relationships came to be a subject of philosophical and political concern. In a sense, of course, the employment relationship is simply another instance of economic exchange, with the laborer selling his or her work in exchange for money in the form of wages. But two ideas led many people to think that there was something special about labor. The first was a belief that labor is the ultimate source of all economic value. The second was the belief that labor morally entitles the laborer to the full value of that which he or she has produced.

More will be said about the first of these ideas in the discussion of Marx’s theory of exploitation, below. The second idea, and its connection to the idea of labor exploitation, is perhaps best illustrated by the theory put forth by the 19th century liberal Thomas Hodgskin. For Hodgskin, as for Locke from whose ideas he drew heavily, the right of private property is a natural, pre-political right. That right consists in

the right of individuals, to have and to own, for their own separate use and enjoyment, the produce of their own industry, with power freely to dispose of the whole of that in the manner most agreeable to themselves. (Hodgkin 1832: 24)

But while the natural right of property is based on labor, there is also an artificial right of property that is based on nothing more than legislative force. That artificial right cements in place, through the machinery of government, property claims that had their origins not in labor but in violence, conquest, and theft. And it thereby enables capitalists to profit without labor, simply by virtue of their (illegitimate) control of the means of production (Reeve 1987b).

For Hodgskin, capitalists exploit workers in precisely the same way that landlords exploit their tenants. In both cases, one person is entitled to a stream of revenue simply by virtue of their legal claim of ownership (Hodgskin 1832: 97). The money the landlord earns as rent comes from the wages the tenant earns as a laborer, just as the money the capitalist earns as profit comes from the sale of products produced by his laborers. In both cases, one person is able to live as a parasite off the productive activities of others, all because the state actively suppresses the natural right of laborers to the full product of their labor, in favor of the artificial right of property established by violence.

Even before Marx, then, we see in the 19th century a tight connection between theories of exploitation and theories of class and of class conflict. Marx himself credited the “bourgeois economists” of the French Industrialist school with having pioneered the economic analysis of class struggle (Marx & Engels 1965: 69). For members of that school, the two great classes into which society was divided were productive laborers and unproductive social parasites. The class of productive laborers was understood broadly to encompass not only those who exerted physical labor to create tangible goods and services, but anyone who worked to make goods more useful than they would otherwise be—so laborers, yes, but also entrepreneurs, arbitrageurs, and even capitalists in their role as managers and overseers of investments. The unproductive classes, in contrast, consisted of those who consume value but do not produce it, such as the army, the government, and the state-supported clergy (Raico 1977: 395).

According to Industrialists such as Charles Comte and Jean-Baptiste Say, the unproductive classes are able to maintain themselves by using the coercive power of government to forcibly extract resources from the productive. Taxes and tariffs were the most obvious forms such “plunder” could take, but the same goal could also be achieved by special protections for favored industries including the limited conferral of monopoly power (Say 1964: 146–147).

For both Hodgskin and for the Industrialists, then, the state was a key agent in facilitating the exploitation of one class of individuals by another, and the most certain way to end exploitation was therefore to sharply limit the power of the state and to strengthen the “natural” right of private property. But not all theorists of the 19th century saw things this way. For Ricardian Socialists such as John Bray, ending exploitation would require ensuring that all persons have equal access to the means of production, and thereby guaranteeing a system of equal exchange based on the labor theory of value (Bray 1839). While Hodgskin and the Industrialists sought to purify capitalism from statist interference, Bray and his fellow socialists sought to eliminate it altogether.

1.2 Marx’s Theory of Exploitation

By far the most influential theory of exploitation ever set forth is that of Karl Marx, who held that workers in a capitalist society are exploited insofar as they are forced to sell their labor power to capitalists for less than the full value of the commodities they produce with their labor.

For Marx, however, exploitation was a phenomenon that characterized all class-based societies, not only capitalism. Indeed, it is feudal society, not capitalism, where the exploitative nature of class relations is clearest. Under feudalism, it is readily apparent that serfs use some of their labor power for their own benefit, while another part (the corvée) is used for the benefit of the feudal lord. In contrast, under slavery workers appear to work entirely for the benefit of their masters (though in reality a part of their labor goes toward providing for their own subsistence). And under capitalism workers appear to work entirely for the benefit of themselves, selling their labor to capitalists as free independent contractors (Cohen 1978: 332–3).

In reality, Marx thought, workers’ labor under capitalism is neither truly voluntary nor entirely for the benefit of the workers themselves. It is not truly voluntary because workers are forced by their lack of ownership of the means of production to sell their labor power to capitalists or else starve. And workers are not laboring entirely for their own benefit because capitalists use their privileged position to exploit workers, appropriating for themselves some of the value created by workers’ labor.

To understand Marx’s charge of exploitation, it is first necessary to understand Marx’s analysis of market prices, which he largely inherited from earlier classical economists such as Adam Smith and David Ricardo. Under capitalism, Marx argued, workers’ labor power is treated as a commodity. And because Marx subscribed to a labor theory of value, this means that just like any other commodity such as butter or corn, the price (or wage) of labor power is determined by its cost of production—specifically, by the quantity of socially necessary labor required to produce it. The cost of producing labor power is the value or labor-cost required for the conservation and reproduction of a worker’s labor power. In other words, Marx thought that workers under capitalism will therefore be paid just enough to cover the bare necessities of living. They will be paid subsistence wages.

But while labor power is just like any other commodity in terms of how its price is determined, it is unique in one very importance respect. Labor, and labor alone, according to Marx, has the capacity to produce value beyond that which is necessary for its own reproduction. In other words, the value that goes into the commodities that sustain a worker for a twelve-hour work day is less than the value of the commodities that worker can produce during those twelve hours. This difference between the value a worker produces in a given period of time and the value of the consumption goods necessary to sustain the worker for that period is what Marx called surplus value.

According to Marx, then, it is as though the worker’s day is split into two parts. During the first part, the laborer works for himself, producing commodities the value of which is equal to the value of the wages he receives. During the second part, the laborer works for the capitalist, producing surplus value for the capitalist for which he receives no equivalent wages. During this second part of the day, the laborer’s work is, in effect, unpaid, in precisely the same way (though not as visibly) as a feudal serf’s corvée is unpaid (Marx 1867).

Capitalist exploitation thus consists in the forced appropriation by capitalists of the surplus value produced by workers. Workers under capitalism are compelled by their lack of ownership of the means of production to sell their labor power to capitalists for less than the full value of the goods they produce. Capitalists, in turn, need not produce anything themselves but are able to live instead off the productive energies of workers. And the surplus value that capitalists are thereby able to appropriate from workers becomes the source of capitalist profit, thereby “strengthening that very power whose slave it is” (Marx 1847: 40).

In the first volume of Capital, Marx presents a series of formulas representing a tight relationship between labor, exploitation, and capitalist profit. According to Marx, the value of a commodity is a function of three factors: constant capital (\(C\), the labor value of nonlabor means of production such as machines, buildings, and raw materials), variable capital (\(V\), the labor value of the labor power of workers involved in production), and surplus value (\(S\)). Since surplus value comes from the exploitation of labor (rather than machines or land), Marx defined the rate of exploitation as the ratio of surplus value over variable capital \((S/V)\). Of course, different industries will employ different mixes of labor and other factors of production—of variable and constant capital. Marx referred to this mixture as the organic composition of capital, and defined it as \(C/V\). But since capitalist profit is generated by the exploitation of labor, it seems to follow that industries that employ a greater proportion of labor (of variable over constant capital) should therefore earn a higher rate of profit. Thus, Marx defined the rate of profit as \((S/(C+V))\), which is equivalent to the rate of exploitation divided by the organic composition of \(\textrm{capital} + 1\). This last proposition has been referred to by Jon Elster as the “fundamental equation of Marxian economics” (Elster 1986: 67).

Marx’s analysis of the rate of profit seems to entail that labor-intensive industries will be more profitable than industries that rely to a greater extent on constant capital. But this conclusion is clearly empirically false (Böhm-Bawerk 1898), and moreover incompatible with Marx’s assumption of a competitive economy in which investments will adjust so as to equalize the rate of profit between industries (Arnold 1990: Ch. 3; Buchanan 1985: Ch. 3). Marx himself recognized this fact, and sought to address it in the third volume of Capital by dropping the assumption of volume 1 that value and price are equivalent, and showing instead how value can be transformed into price through some more complicated process. Whether Marx’s attempted solution to this “transformation problem” was successful, however, is a matter of great controversy (Arnold 1990: Ch. 3; Samuelson 1971; Kliman 2007).

Marx’s theory of exploitation appears to presuppose that labor is the source of all value. But the labor theory of value to which Marx and early classical economists subscribed is subject to a number of apparently insurmountable difficulties, and has largely been abandoned by economists in the wake of the marginalist revolution of the 1870s. The most obvious difficulty stems from the fact that labor is heterogeneous. Some labor is skilled, some labor is unskilled, and there does not appear to be any satisfactory way of reducing the former to the latter and thereby establishing a single standard of measure for the value of commodities. Moreover, the labor theory of value appears to be unable to account for the economic value of commodities such as land and raw materials that are not and could not be produced by any human labor. Finally, and perhaps most fatally, Marx’s assumption that labor has the unique power to create surplus value is entirely ungrounded. As Robert Paul Wolff has argued, Marx’s focus on labor appears to be entirely arbitrary. A formally identical theory of value could be constructed with any commodity taking the place of labor, and thus a “corn theory of value” would be just as legitimate, and just as unhelpful, as Marx’s labor theory of value (Wolff 1981). Therefore, if, as some have alleged, Marx’s theory of exploitation is dependent on the truth of the labor theory of value, then a rejection of the labor theory of value should entail a rejection of Marx’s theory of exploitation as well (Nozick 1974; Arnold 1990).

Not everyone agrees, however, that Marx’s theory is dependent on the labor theory of value in this way. G.A. Cohen, for instance, argues that Marx’s theory of exploitation is not only independent of the labor theory of value, but incompatible with it (Cohen 1979: 345–6). Marx’s account of exploitation is premised on the claim that value created by workers is appropriated by capitalists. But the labor theory of value holds that the value of an object is a function of the labor that would be currently required to produce it, regardless of how much labor actually went into producing it. Paradoxical as it may seem, the labor theory of value is incompatible with the claim that labor alone creates value.

The real problem with exploitation, on Cohen’s view, is not that capitalists appropriate value that is created by labor. It is, rather, that capitalists appropriate some of the value of the products that are created by labor. Labor may not produce value, but it is the only thing that produces what has value, and this is all Marx needs to get his account of exploitation off the ground (Cohen 1979: 354).

But even if Cohen’s account of exploitation avoids commitment to the labor theory of value, it nevertheless remains committed to the Marxian idea that exploitation should be understood as the forced appropriation of surplus value. And there are at least two respects in which this commitment is problematic. First, it is unclear whether exploitation necessarily involves the forced transfer of surplus value. Marx’s account asserts that the laborer is forced to work for capitalists because the only alternative is starvation. But suppose the government provides a safety net sufficient to ensure that workers’ subsistence needs are met. If someone chooses to work in order to earn discretionary income, it still seems possible that they could be exploited by a capitalist who appropriates some of the value of the product the laborer creates (Kymlicka 2002: 179). A laborer can be exploited, we might think, by being paid an unfair wage even if that laborer is not forced to work.

Second, it is unclear whether all cases involving the forced transfer of surplus value are necessarily exploitative, at least in the ordinary sense of involving a moral wrong. Suppose that governments tax workers and use some of the proceeds to provide support for children or the infirm. If it is exploitative for capitalists to appropriate some of the value of the objects produced by workers, is it not also exploitative for government to do so through the mechanism of taxation? Some libertarians have argued that this is precisely how we should understand the coercive power of government. For Cohen, however, the fact that Marx’s account of exploitation appears to be committed to the libertarian idea of that workers own their labor and the products they produce with that labor—that is, to the libertarian idea of self-ownership—is deeply problematic (Cohen 1995: Ch. 6).

2. The Concept of Exploitation

In its broadest sense, transactional/micro-level exploitation involves an agent, A, taking unfair advantage of another agent, B. Taking unfair advantage, in turn, can be understood in two ways. First, it can refer to some dimension of the outcome of the exploitative act or transaction. In this case, we say that the transaction is substantively unfair. Second, to say that A takes unfair advantage of B may imply that there is some sort of defect in the process by which the unfair outcome has come about, for example, that A has coerced B or defrauded B or has manipulated B. In this case, we say that the transaction is procedurally unfair.

This section examines several elements or possible elements of transactional exploitation: the benefit that exploitative transactions confer upon A, the harm they cause to B, various notions of substantive and procedural unfairness, and the unjust background conditions against which exploitative transactions may take place.

2.1 Exploitation and Benefit

When A exploits B, A gains some benefit from interacting with B. We can see the relevance of the “benefit to A” by contrasting exploitation with other forms of wrongdoing, such as discrimination, abuse, and oppression. Let us say that A discriminates against B when A wrongly deprives B of some opportunity or benefit because of some characteristic of B that is not relevant to A’s action. There was a period in American history in which many women became public school teachers because they were denied the opportunity to enter other professions such as law and medicine. To the extent that society benefitted (in one way) from the pool of highly qualified public school teachers, the discrimination may have been exploitative, even if unintentionally so. But if A refuses to hire B solely because of B’s race, then it would be odd to say that A exploits B, for A does not gain from the wrong to B.

Consider abuse. It has been alleged that medical students are frequently abused by verbal insults and denigration and that this abuse may leave long-lasting emotional scars. It is also sometimes claimed that medical interns are exploited, that they work long hours for low pay. The contrast is just right. There is no reason to think that anyone gains (in any normal sense) from abuse, but it is at least plausible to think that the hospitals or patients gain from the exploitation of interns.

Let us say that A oppresses B when A deprives B of freedoms or opportunities to which B is entitled. If A gains from the oppressive relationship, as when A enslaves B, then A may both oppress and exploit B. But if A does not gain from the oppression, the oppression is wrong but not exploitative. We might say that the unemployed are oppressed, but unless we could specify the ways in which some gain from their lack of employment, the unemployed are not exploited. Marxists would claim that capitalists pay exploitative wages to the employed precisely because there is a “reserve army” of the unemployed with whom the employed must compete. But that merely confirms that they are exploited because the oppression generates a gain to the capitalist class, and it is the employed who are exploited and not the unemployed that make such exploitation possible.

Clearly, an exchange still counts as exploitative even if A does not benefit on net. If A derives unfair benefit from his interaction with B, but suffers unforeseen costs such that she ends up worse-off after the interaction than she was before, then A has still exploited B. Less clear is the question of whether A must derive any actual benefit at all, or whether it is enough that A merely intend to benefit. Suppose a sweatshop owner works his employees ruthlessly in order to extract as much profit as he can from the workers’ labor, but that the product the laborers produce turns out, due to an unforeseen turn of events, to have zero market value. Have the sweatshop workers nevertheless been exploited?

Related to the question of whether A’s intent to benefit is sufficient for exploitation is the question of whether A’s intent to benefit unfairly is necessary for exploitation. Is it possible to exploit someone by mistake? Can one foresee that one’s interaction will be exploitative without intending it to be so? If so, is A still culpable? (Ferguson 2016b)

2.2 Exploitation and Harm

Exploitation thus involves A unfairly benefitting from an interaction with B. But what exactly does it mean to benefit unfairly? One natural response to this question is to conceive of unfairness as benefitting A at B’s expense. Perhaps exploitation advances the interests of A while harming B. Exploitation, thus understood, is a kind of parasitism. Or, as Allen Buchanan defines it, exploitation is “the harmful, merely instrumental utilization of him or his capacities, for one’s own advantage or for the sake of one’s own ends” (Buchanan 1985: 87).

Certain paradigmatic cases of exploitation clearly fit this analysis. Slavery is an exploitative relationship, and one that clearly harms slaves for the benefit of their masters. But as Alan Wertheimer has noted, some exploitation appears to be mutually advantageous rather than harmful (Wertheimer 1996: 14). Someone who charges a hiker lost in the desert $1,000 for a bottle of water takes unfair advantage of her. Nevertheless, the transaction is one from which both parties emerge better off relative to how they would have been, had the transaction not taken place. The seller has traded away something she values less (the bottle of water) for something she values more ($1,000). But so has the buyer. If the water is necessary to save her life, and if she values her life more than the $1,000 she gives up to save it, then she too is better off with the transaction than without it.

In this way, exploitation is importantly different from coercion, even though both coercion and exploitation can involve individuals accepting proposals that appear to make them better off relative to some baseline. In a paradigmatic case of coercion—a mugger who demands “your money or your life”—the victim is better off handing over the money than losing her life. But she would be better off still if the mugger had never showed up to make her proposal at all. In contrast, the stranded hiker would be considerably worse off if her exploiter never showed up. Coercion characteristically involves threats by which the coercer proposes to make her victim worse off unless she does as the coercer demands. Exploitation, in contrast, often involves offers by which the exploiter proposes to make her victim better off if she does as the exploiter proposes.

There is, however, one important sense in which even an exploiter could be said to harm her victim. Relative to a baseline of no transaction at all, exploitation often makes its victim better off. But relative to a baseline of a fair transaction, exploitation leaves its victim worse off. In this sense, an exploiter’s gain does, contra Joel Feinberg, come at the victim’s expense (Feinberg 1988: 178). For even when both parties gain from the transaction, the victim of exploitation gains less than she should because some of the “cooperative surplus” to which she is by fairness entitled has been captured by the exploiter.

Exploitation therefore does not necessarily harm its victim in the sense of making her worse off than she would have been, had the exploiter never interacted with her at all. Rather, it makes its victim worse off than she should have been, had she been treated fairly. As with similar cases involving coercion, the precise details of our analysis thus depend on the relevant baseline against which we choose to compare B’s situation after the interaction. But these details probably do not matter much as far as our all-things-considered moral evaluation is concerned. Whether we choose to say that exploitation involves A making B better off, but not as much better off as A should have made B; or whether we say that it involves making B worse off than B should have been, the final verdict is the same (Wertheimer 1996: 22–23).

2.3 Exploitation and Fairness

In the sense in which we are using the term, exploitation necessarily (conceptually) involves unfairness. Our sense of exploitation is thus a moralized term. To judge that someone is engaged in exploitation is already to pass a moral judgment on them—to say that they are acting wrongly (at least in a pro tanto sense). Not all uses of “exploitation” are moralized in this way. As we noted at the beginning of this entry, some ordinary language use of the term implies no moral judgment whatsoever. And it is possible to develop a philosophically sophisticated account of exploitation that is relevant to moral judgment, without being moralized (Goodin 1987).

Still, even if exploitation is not conceptually unfair, it is characteristically so. In some cases, this unfairness is the result of some procedural defect in the transaction—call this procedural unfairness. In other cases, the unfairness is a feature of what is agreed to, rather than how the agreement is reached—call this substantive unfairness.

2.3.1 Procedural Fairness

A transaction will be exploitative due to procedural unfairness when A unfairly utilizes or creates a defect in the process of the transaction with B in way that benefits A at B’s expense (though see the previous section for an analysis of “at B’s expense”). So, for instance, if A deceives B regarding the nature of the good A is selling, in a way that leads B to pay more for that good than B otherwise would have, we can say that A has taken unfair advantage of B—that A has exploited B. Or if A unfairly pressures B to agree to A’s proposed terms—threatening to physically hurt B or someone B loves, for instance—we can again say that A has exploited B.

But while we can (correctly) say that A has exploited B in these situations, we could also say, more directly and more clearly, that A has defrauded or coerced B. That is, we already have a rich set of more narrowly-tailored terms for identifying the ways in which A might undermine the validity of B’s consent to the terms of their agreement. For this reason, it seems superfluous—and indeed, it is rare—to describe these sorts of procedural defects as “exploitative”. At least when A creates the defect from which he benefits, we usually have a better term available to describe the specific form of his wrongdoing.

The label “exploitation” seems more appropriate when A unfairly takes advantage of an existing defect (Jansen and Wall 2013). A teenage boy who trades five pennies for his 5 year-old brother’s single quarter exploits his brother insofar as he takes unfair advantage of his ignorance of monetary units. But he does not coerce him, nor does he necessarily deceive him. Similarly, a psychotherapist who takes advantage of his patient’s therapy-induced romantic feelings to engage in sexual relations can be said to exploit his patient, even if there is no outright fraud or deception in the interaction (and even if the substantive “terms” of their relationship are in no way unfair). In these cases, exploitation seems to be the most apt description for the wrongdoing.

2.3.2 Substantive Fairness

There is widespread agreement among philosophers and legal theorists on the broad categories of behavior that render a transaction procedurally unfair, even if there is (as always) persistent disagreement about borderline cases of coercion, fraud, etc. In contrast, there is much less agreement regarding those conditions that render a transaction substantively unfair. Equality

One of the most intuitively appealing criteria of fairness in exchange is equality. A fair exchange, it is tempting to say, is an equal exchange. But equal in terms of what?

Although Marx took pains to deny he was giving an account of justice (let alone fairness), much of the intuitive force of his account of labor exploitation seems to rely on the idea that a fair exchange will embody equal transfers of socially necessary labor. It is because the objects produced by the worker embody more socially necessary labor than the wages he receives in exchange for producing those objects that the laborer is exploited. And other late-19th century theorists such as Josiah Warren and Stephen Pearl Andrews made this moral claim explicit. “It is clear”, wrote Andrews,

if [an] exchange is not equal, if one party gives more of his own labor—either in the form of labor or product—than he gets of the labor of the other…that he is oppressed, and becomes, so far as this inequality goes, the slave or subject of the other. (Andrews 1852: 52–53)

But even though a theory of labor-time as the basis of fair exchange is in principle distinguishable from a labor theory of economic value, the former is subject to many of the same problems as the latter. How, for instance, should the difference between skilled and unskilled labor time be accounted for in determining a fair exchange? Between easy and difficult labor? Labor is not homogenous, and this makes it ill-suited to serve as a currency of fair exchange.

If labor is the wrong place to look for a criterion of fair exchange, perhaps economic value would be better. A fair trade, on this view, involves the exchange of equally valuable goods or services. And an unfair trade involves the exchange of goods or services of unequal value. To return to an earlier example, someone who sells a bottle of water to a hiker stranded in the desert for $1,000 takes unfair advantage of her. And part of what makes the exchange unfair is that the bottle of water simply isn’t worth nearly $1,000. B is giving up far more than she gains in exchange.

Or is she? Once we give up on the 19th century notion that economic value is an objective property of commodities, and embrace instead that value is a function of the subjective preferences of economic agents, the problem with this analysis becomes readily apparent. Economic exchange is only possible precisely because different agents assign different values to the same object. I sell you my old television for $75 because I’ve bought a new set, and to me, the old television is worth less than the $75. You pay the $75 because you just moved into a new place and, to you, the $75 is worth less than the television. Neither of our valuations is the “right” one. Our preferences simply differ, and so it is possible for us to both walk away from the deal believing—correctly!—that we have gotten more than we have given up.

Cooperative exchanges create what economists call a “social surplus”. Suppose, to continue the television example, that I’d be willing to take anything equal to or greater than $50 in exchange for my television, and that you’d be willing to pay anything equal to or less than $100 for it. If, after bargaining, we arrive at a sale price of $75, then I give up something I value at $50 in exchange for $75, and come away $25 richer, and you give up $75 in exchange for something you value at $100 and walk away $25 richer. All together, we’re $50 richer. That’s the social surplus.

This suggests one final possible egalitarian analysis of fair exchange. Perhaps what makes an exchange is fair is not that the objects traded have equal economic value, but rather the equal division of the social surplus created by the exchange of objects of unequal subjective value. Exploitative exchanges, in contrast, are those in which one party commands a disproportionately large share of the social surplus, leaving the other party with an unfairly small share. For example, suppose that an employer gains $10 per hour worth of value from an employee’s labor. An employer like that could afford to pay its workers $9 per hour and still make a profit. But if potential employees have nowhere else to go, why should the employer pay that much? Why not pay employees as little as she can get away with—maybe $3 an hour, just barely over the subsistence level of $2? In this case the employment relationship would generate a social surplus of $8. But $7 of that surplus would go into the pocket of the employer, while only $1 goes to the laborer. Might not that lopsided division of the social surplus be precisely what’s unfair, and thus exploitative, about this kind of labor?

Perhaps. But the unequal division of the social surplus cannot explain all cases of exploitation—including some of the most paradigmatic. To see this, let us return once more to the case of the lost desert hiker. A offers to sell B a bottle of water for $1,000. This would appear to be a clear instance of an exploitative proposal. But it is not, as suggested above, because the water bottle is worth less than $1,000 to B. Indeed, it is probably worth far more! Most people put a fairly high value on their continued existence. So, suppose B values not dying at $1 million. In that case, B gives up something he values at $1,000 in exchange for something he values at $1 million. A, in turn, gives up something he values at close to $0 in exchange for something he values at $1,000. The exchange creates a social surplus of $1 million, but fully 99.9% of that surplus goes to B, leaving A with a mere .1%. If exploitation consists of grabbing the lion’s share of the social surplus of an exchange, then we are forced to conclude that thirsty B is actually exploiting water-selling A—an unlikely result! Respect for Persons and Basic Needs

It is thus difficult to specify an egalitarian criterion of fairness that explains the wrongfulness of exploitation across a range of cases. For this reason, most current theories of exploitation are not fundamentally egalitarian in nature. Some, like those put forward by Allen Wood, Ruth Sample, and Jeremy Snyder, are based in the Kantian idea of respect for persons. Sample, for instance, defines exploitation as “interacting with another being for the sake of advantage in a way that fails to respect the inherent value in that being” (Sample 2003: 57). According to Sample, one can fail to respect the inherent value of others in several distinct ways. One way involves failing to respond appropriately to the unmet basic needs of others. Respect for others imposes upon us an imperfect duty of beneficence, a duty that Jeremy Snyder argues is “specified” when we come face to face with particular others and thereby takes on a perfect, strict form (Snyder 2008: 390). When we encounter others whose basic needs are unmet, we should help them because of the inherent value they possess as a human being. But the exploiter sees in the unmet basic needs of others not a cry for help but as an opportunity for profit.

Sample’s and Snyder’s respect-based accounts are simultaneously more narrow and more broad than fairness-based accounts of exploitation. They are broader insofar as they will condemn as exploitative transactions that might pass as non-exploitative on a fairness approach. Selling a bottle of water at a normal market price to the hiker lost in the desert, for instance, might be fair but still insufficiently responsive to the hiker’s unmet basic need for drink. But the accounts are also considerably narrower than fairness-based accounts insofar as the range of goods or transactions to which they apply is more circumscribed. On both Sample’s and Snyder’s accounts, for instance, it is not wrongfully exploitative for a seller to use his knowledge of a buyer’s unusually strong desire for a painting to charge that buyer an extremely high price. Because the buyer’s basic needs are not implicated, charging a high price in this sort of cases does not signal disrespect for persons, even if the price is one that would otherwise appear to be unfairly high.

Sample’s account, like Goodin’s, holds that taking advantage of certain kinds of vulnerability is wrongfully exploitative regardless of how those vulnerabilities came about. But as Benjamin Ferguson has noted, this has the potential to create a certain kind of moral hazard problem (Ferguson 2016b). Suppose that A knows that, should he become vulnerable for whatever reason, B will be obligated to constrain B’s advantage over A—perhaps by selling B goods for less than the normal market price. Given this knowledge, A might be tempted to take a risky gamble, knowing that if it doesn’t turn out well, B will be obligated to partly subsidize A’s loss. In effect, B’s obligation toward A puts B in a position of vulnerability, a vulnerability that A has the potential to unfairly take advantage of. In other words, A’s obligation not to exploit B renders A vulnerable to exploitation by B! In order to avoid this difficulty, it seems necessary to limit the kinds of vulnerabilities that trigger the obligation to constrain one’s advantage, perhaps by ruling out vulnerabilities for which the agent is morally responsible. Unjust Property Relations

Many have found plausible Marx’s claim that employment relationships under capitalism are exploitative. But perhaps Marx was wrong to locate that exploitation in the particular details of the capitalist-employee relationship. After all, what makes exploitation possible at all on Marx’s view is a feature of the macro level distribution of property in society—specifically capitalists’ monopoly over the means of production. Marx’s formal theory of exploitation, however, makes no explicit mention of this property relation, focusing instead entirely on the interaction between capitalists and laborers at the point of production. The result, according to John Roemer, is a theory that is focused too much on the micro level of particular employment relationships and not enough on the macro level background of inegalitarian property distribution against which those relationships take place (Roemer 1982).

On Roemer’s analysis, capitalist exploitation is essentially a form of social parasitism. One group (the capitalists) are made better off by the existence of a second group (workers), but that second group is made worse off by the existence of the first. More formally, according to Roemer’s account, we may say that a group \(S\) is exploited by \(S'\) if and only if all of the following three conditions are satisfied:

  1. If \(S\) were to withdraw from the society, endowed with its per capita share of society’s alienable property (that is, produced and nonproduced goods), and with its own labor and skills, then \(S\) would be better off (in terms of income and leisure) than it is at the present allocation.[1]
  2. If \(S'\) were to withdraw under the same conditions, then \(S'\) would be worse off (in terms of income and leisure) than it is at present.
  3. If \(S\) were to withdraw from society with its own endowments (not its per capita share), then \(S'\) would be worse off than at present.

Suppose workers form the coalition \(S\), and capitalists form the coalition \(S'\). Workers are exploited, on Roemer’s view, because property rights in the means of production are monopolized by capitalists. If workers were to withdraw from society with a per capita share of society’s alienable assets, including the means of production, they would be better off than they are right now (condition 1 is satisfied). If capitalists were to withdraw with only their per capita share of society’s alienable assets, they would be worse off since some of their currently held share would go to workers (condition 2 is satisfied). Finally, if workers to withdraw from society with only the assets to which they are entitled under their existing legal regime—their bodies and their labor—then capitalists would be worse off, since they would no longer be able to profit by exploiting workers labor (condition 3 is satisfied). What this shows is that the existing distribution of property makes capitalists better off at workers’ expense. It is a parasitic, exploitative arrangement.

Roemer’s account coheres well with the intuitive sense of exploitation as unfair treatment over a wide range of cases. In cases where we think that an inegalitarian distribution of property has been unjustly produced, then a system that puts that distribution to use to benefit one class at the expense of another will seem wrongfully exploitative. This, presumably, is the point of Marx’s account of the “primitive accumulation” of capital, which aims to show that capitalists’ monopoly over the means of production is the product of violence and theft rather than hard work and thrift (Marx 1867: Ch. 26).

But even if actually existing capitalism’s history is tainted in this way, it is possible to imagine an inegalitarian distribution of property emerging, in Robert Nozick’s language, “from a just situation by just steps” (Nozick 1974: 151). Suppose a society begins with an egalitarian distribution and evolves, through a mix of voluntary choices and luck—but no procedural injustices such as force or fraud—into a society with significant inequalities. Such a society might contain a relatively poor coalition \(S\) that would do better if it appropriated some of the alienable property belonging to relatively wealthy \(S'\) and withdrew with a per capita share of society’s alienable assets (condition 1). And \(S'\) would, in turn, be worse off if it was able to withdraw with only a per capita share of those assets (condition 2). Finally, if \(S\) and \(S'\) are engaged in mutually beneficial exchange in the present society, then \(S'\) might well be worse off if \(S\) were to withdraw from society, even if \(S\) took only its own assets (condition 3). A society such as this satisfies all of Roemer’s conditions for exploitation. But it is far from clear that there is anything wrongful or unjust in it.

Roemer’s account also runs into the same difficulty as those Marxist accounts that view the forced transfer of surplus value as necessarily exploitative. It seems forced to condemn a society in which the able-bodied and well-off are taxed to support children and the infirm as exploitative, since the able-bodied would be better off if they withdrew with their own resources, while children and the inform would be worse off (Elster 1982). Roemer attempts to grapple with this problem by stipulating that exploitation involves something more than the satisfaction of conditions 1 through 3, and suggests that the missing condition might be a relationship of “dominance” of the exploiter over the exploited. But as Will Kymlicka has noted, this stipulation seems

ad hoc, since [it is] disconnected from the ‘ethical imperative’ that [Roemer] identifies as the basis of exploitation theory (Kymlicka 2002: 204 n. 13). And Roemer himself admits that lack of clarity regarding the concept of dominance prevents his account from being a “satisfactory analytical account of exploitation. (Roemer 1982: 304 n. 12).

Even if Roemer’s account were entirely satisfactory on its own terms, however, it would still seem to leave a large, important class of questions about exploitation unanswered. Precisely because Roemer’s account is focused on “macro” issues pertaining to the distribution of property in society, it has little to say about “micro” issues regarding how individuals treat each other within the framework created by that distribution (Ferguson and Steiner 2016: 13–14). Intuitively, it seems possible for individuals to treat each other exploitatively even within a just distribution of property; and it likewise seems possible for individuals to treat each other fairly within an unjust distribution of property. That Roemer’s account does not address these issues of micro-level treatment is not necessarily a flaw in the theory. But it does suggest, at the very least, that a different or more comprehensive theory of exploitation is necessary to supplement Roemer’s exclusively macro-level approach. Harmful Parasitism

Giijs van Donselaar’s account of exploitation is based on the idea that exploitation is a form of harmful parasitism. An exploitative relationship, for Donselaar, is one that involves “worsening the position of others in bettering one’s own” (van Donselaar 2009: 7). In such a relationship, A uses and benefits from B, but B would be better off if A had never existed or never interacted with him at all. So, for example, if A homesteads a plot of land by mixing his labor with it only because he knows B wants the land and will be willing to pay him a large sum of money for it, then A exploits B in the Donselaarian sense. Or, similarly, if A proposes to build a second story to his home only because his neighbor B will be willing to pay him not to do it in order to preserve his view, then A exploits B. In cases like these, A acts within his rights, but he “abuses” his rights to extract benefits from B.

Intuitively, there seems to be something unfair about the kinds of activities van Donselaar has identified as exploitative. But there are also activities that satisfy his criteria for exploitation that do not seem intuitively unfair. Many cases of ordinary market competition, for instance, involve situations of this sort. Suppose that A and B compete for a job and that A, being the more highly qualified candidate, is offered the position. A accepts, and then offers B a job as her secretary. In this situation, A gains by interacting with B, but B would be better off if A never existed at all. Likewise, if B is a disabled citizen who is offered a taxpayer-financed stipend by the government, then B benefits from the existence of taxpayer A, while A is worse off than she would be if B had never existed. As Richard Arneson notes, “one man’s parasitism is another man’s distributive justice” (Arneson 2013: 9). Domination

The second challenge faced by van Donselaar is nearly identical to a difficulty we discussed above with John Roemer’s property-relations account of exploitation. And as we have seen, Roemer himself suggested one way of avoiding the difficulty—namely, adding a dominance condition to his account of exploitation. Intuitively, capitalists at least have the capacity to dominate their employees, but disabled people living on a pension do not dominate taxpayers, nor do they have the capacity to do so.

Nicholas Vrousalis elaborates on what he sees as a tight connection between the concepts of exploitation and domination (Vrousalis 2013). According to Vrousalis, A exploits B if and only if A and B are embedded in a systematic relationship in which A instrumentalizes B’s vulnerability to extract a net benefit from B. And A dominates B if A and B are embedded in a systematic relationship in which A takes advantage of his power over B, or the power of a coalition of agents A belongs to, in a way that is disrespectful to B. Exploitation, then, is a particular form of domination—domination for self-enrichment. Capitalists exploit workers insofar as they treat workers as objects, using their power and workers’ vulnerability to extract value from workers, all embedded in the systematic relationships of a capitalist economy.

Vrousalis’s focus on systems is intended to rehabilitate the most defensible elements of a broadly Marxian theory of exploitation, and to establish exploitation as a concept distinct from mere unfairness (Vrousalis 2014). But divorcing exploitation from unfairness has its cost, for there are examples that fit Vrousalis’s schema for exploitation that do not seem unfair, and because they do not seem unfair, do not seem wrongful. If A is a monopoly provider of heating oil, and B lives in a cold climate, A has power over B and B is vulnerable. But, intuitively, A does not have to take advantage of that vulnerability. A could sell to B at a fair price—i.e., a price lower than the maximum price that B would, if necessary, be willing to pay. If she does so, A will still extract a net benefit from B, thereby satisfying Vrousalis’s definition of exploitation. But it is far from obvious that A will have acted in any way wrongly (Arneson 2013: 4).

2.4 Exploitation and Background Conditions

In addition to failing to respond appropriately to others’ basic needs, Sample also argues that exploitation can take the form of taking advantage of past injustice (Sample 2003: 74). If A uses the fact that B is disadvantaged as a result of past injustice for his own profit then, Sample argues, A has failed to treat B with respect and has exploited him for his own gain.

In setting forth this claim, Sample builds a certain historical element into her account of exploitation. What matters, on her view, is not merely whether a person in a position of vulnerability is taken advantage of, but how it came about that such advantage-taking was possible.

Other exploitation theorists have made similar claims. Hillel Steiner’s account of exploitation, for example, holds that exploitation occurs when A gains more from an interaction, and B gains less, than they would have were it not for the existence of a prior injustice (Steiner 1984). So, for example, if A hires B as a laborer and is able to pay B a low wage of $2 per hour only because A (or someone else) has previously unjustly deprived B of alternative sources of labor, then A has exploited B. If, on the other hand, the explanation for B’s earning only $2 does not involve injustice—if B simply does not have very valuable skills, or if there is a large supply of (not unjustly) unemployed laborers, then a $2 wage, no matter how insufficient it might be to meet B’s needs, and no matter how much more A could afford to pay, is not exploitative.

On the other hand, some theorists have argued that the source of vulnerability is irrelevant to the exploitative nature of a transaction. Robert Goodin, for instance, argues that exploitation consists in “playing for advantage in situations where it is inappropriate to do so”, and involves a violation of the moral norm of “protecting the vulnerable”. Importantly, Goodin holds that this norm applies “regardless of the particular source of their vulnerability” (Goodin 1987: 187). Thus, whether a worker is economically vulnerable because of a past injustice or whether her vulnerability derives from a normal fluctuation of the business cycle is irrelevant. To use that vulnerability to press one’s own advantage is exploitative.

Similarly, Matt Zwolinski argues that whether an exchange is exploitative or not depends on the terms of the transaction itself, not on how the parties came to be in their respective ex ante positions. Cases like the desert hiker, Zwolinski argues, show that exploitation can occur in the absence of past injustice and thus that taking advantage of past injustice is not a necessary component of exploitation. And neither is it a sufficient condition, for we can imagine cases where parties gain from past injustice without thereby engaging in exploitation. If B’s home is unjustly burned to the ground by an arsonist, and a contractor A charges B a normal market price to rebuild it, then A has not exploited B, despite the fact that A has profited from the injustice suffered by B (Zwolinski 2012: 172).

3. The Moral Weight and Force of Exploitation

The primary task of a theory of exploitation is to set forward the truth conditions for the claim, “A exploits B”. Beyond this purely conceptual project, however, there remain two more straightforwardly normative tasks. Adopting terminology from Alan Wertheimer, we can describe the first of these tasks as providing an account of the moral weight of exploitation, where moral weight refers to the intensity of exploitation’s wrongness. The second task is to provide an account of the moral force of exploitation, where moral force is understood to refer to “the various moral upshots of reasons for action that exploitation might or might not involve for parties to the transaction or for society” (Wertheimer 1996: 28).

When exploitation is harmful and nonconsensual, issues of both moral weight and force are relatively unproblematic. Whatever the added moral importance of the gain to A from the harm to B, it is certainly at least prima facie wrong for A to harm B and it seems that the state is at least prima facie justified in prohibiting or refusing to enforce such transactions. But exploitation that takes place in the context of mutually advantageous and consensual transactions presents a more difficult set of problems. First, regarding the issue of moral weight, it might be thought that even if a transaction between A and B is unfair, there can be nothing seriously wrong about an agreement from which both parties benefit, particularly if A has no obligation to enter into any transaction with B. At the very least, it seems difficult to show how a mutually advantageous (but unfair) interaction can be morally worse than no-interaction at all since, ex hypothesi, there is no party to the transaction for whom it is worse. In the recent literature on exploitation, this thought has been formulated more precisely as the “non-worseness claim”:

NWC: Interaction between A and B cannot be worse than non-interaction when A has a right not to interact with B at all, and when the interaction is mutually advantageous, consensual, and free from negative externalities (Wertheimer 1996, 2011; Zwolinski 2009; Powell and Zwolinski 2012).

Most exploitation theorists are skeptical that the NWC is correct (Wertheimer 1996; Bailey 2010; Arneson 2013; Barnes 2013; Malmqvist 2016). For if it were, then it would seem to be a mistake to blame individuals who engage in certain forms of mutually beneficial exploitation—for example, those who engage in “price gouging” by selling electrical generators to victims of natural disasters at inflated prices. (Zwolinski 2008). After all, we usually would not blame those individuals if they stayed home and did nothing. But, so long as people are willing to pay the high prices (and no coercion or fraud is involved), both parties are better off with the transaction than without it. So how could it be morally worse to provide those customers with some benefit than it is to provide them with no benefit at all?

Of course, the NWC need not lead to a deflationary account of the wrongness of exploitation. It could, instead, lead to an inflationary account of the wrongness of non-interaction. In other words, we can account for the NWC’s claim that mutually beneficial exploitation is not worse than non-interaction either by saying that mutually beneficial exploitation is less wrong than we thought it was, or by saying that non-interaction is worse than we thought it was: by saying that price gougers are less blameworthy than we thought, or by saying that those who stay home and do nothing to help victims of disaster are more blameworthy than we thought.

Even if mutually beneficial exploitation really is a serious moral wrong, however, it might not be a kind of wrong that can justify state intervention (Wertheimer 1996: Ch. 9). In other words, the question of the moral force of exploitation cannot be settled entirely by reference to its moral weight. Suppose A is a price gouger who sells bottles of water to disaster victims for $12 each. Even if A acts wrongly or fails to act virtuously, it is arguable that A does not harm anyone or violate anyone’s rights, and only harm or rights violations justify state intervention. If the state cannot force A to sell the water to B, it might be thought completely irrational for the state to prohibit A and B from entering into a consensual and mutually advantageous transaction.

Moreover, there is a real danger that preventing mutually beneficial but exploitative transactions will wind up “consigning the vulnerable person to an even worse fate than being exploited” (Wood 1995: 156). After all, persons who are exploited are taken advantage of because of some antecedent vulnerability—a lack of access to clean drinking water, in the example above. Preventing exploitative transactions by itself does nothing to alleviate this vulnerability. Indeed, by depriving vulnerable parties of one possibility for improving their situation by engaging in a mutually beneficial transaction, such interference might actually exacerbate it.

Perhaps this view is correct. Bracketing arguments based on externalities, it seems perfectly plausible to maintain that the state is justified in interfering with transactions only if one party is violating the other’s rights. That said, those who invoke the concept of exploitation frequently maintain that such exploitation provides a reason for state intervention. For example, when it is claimed that commercial surrogacy exploits the birth mothers, the critics typically argue that surrogacy contracts should be unenforceable or entirely prohibited. Similar things are said about the sale of bodily organs. Those who make such arguments do frequently claim that the transactions are nonconsensual or harmful, but they seem prepared to make such arguments even if the transactions are consensual and mutually advantageous.

On what grounds might we justify interfering with consensual and mutually advantageous exploitative transactions? It might be thought that we could interfere on paternalistic grounds. A paternalistic argument could not justify interfering with exploitative transactions if the exploitative transaction is advantageous to B and if interference is not likely to result in a transaction that is more beneficial to B. For paternalism justifies interfering for someone’s good, and this interference would not be to the target’s benefit. But there might be situations in which B knows enough to agree only to those exploitative transactions that are beneficial (as compared with no transaction), but does not know that less exploitative transactions are available. And so there may be a “soft paternalist” justification for interference with some mutually advantageous exploitative transactions.

We might also justify interfering with exploitative transactions on strategic grounds. Suppose that A enjoys a monopoly position, say, as a potential rescuer of B. If we prohibit A from charging an exorbitant price for his services, then A might offer his services for a reasonable price. This argument would not justify interfering in a highly competitive market, for, under such conditions, A would not and could not offer his services for a better price. But there may be numerous situations in which such strategic arguments can work (Wertheimer 1996).

It is worth noting, however, that prohibiting exploitative transactions is not the only way in which the state or other moral agents might attempt to respond to its wrongful nature. Prohibition is an example of what Allen Wood describes as “interference”. But in addition to interference, Wood suggests that we can think of redistribution as a way in which third parties such as the state might attempt to prevent exploitation (Wood 1995: 154). After all, exploitation is only possible because B is in a position of vulnerability relative to A. One way to prevent exploitation, then, is to address this vulnerability directly—to channel resources to B so as to remove the hardship that makes him vulnerable to exploitation in the first place. If workers in the developing world had an adequate social safety net to fall back on, for instance, they would be less inclined to accept a job with the harsh conditions of a sweatshop, and therefore less vulnerable to exploitation by their employers.

4. Applied Issues in Exploitation Theory

Questions about exploitation arise in a wide variety of different contexts, not just in the domain of political philosophy but in various areas of applied ethics as well such as business ethics, biomedical ethics, and environmental ethics. In addition to the topics discussed briefly below, the concept of exploitation has played a central role in debates over payday lending (Mayer 2003), clinical research in the developing world (Hawkins and Emanuel 2008), markets for human organs (Hughes 1998; Taylor 2005), guest worker programs (Mayer 2005), and price gouging (Zwolinski 2008).

4.1 Universal Basic Income

Some theorists, such as Philippe van Pairjs, have argued that justice requires that the state institute a universal basic income (UBI). A UBI is a cash transfer, funded by taxes, that would be paid to all citizens regardless of need, and regardless of whether they are working, or even willing to work (van Parijs 1995). Against this, some critics have charged that a basic income would facilitate a form of exploitation. As Stuart White argues,

where others bear some cost in order to contribute to a scheme of cooperation, then it is unfair for one to willingly enjoy the intended benefits of their cooperative efforts unless one is willing to bear the cost of making a relevantly proportionate contribution to this scheme of cooperation in return. (White 1997: 317–318)

As is so often the case in dealing with exploitation claims, assessing this objection requires us to grapple with a complicated mix of empirical and normative claims. On the empirical side, for instance, we might ask whether a basic income really would lead to a net increase in reciprocity-violating transfers. Some theorists have argued that a basic income would actually increase incentives to work relative to currently existing welfare programs, by lowering the effective marginal tax rate faced by low-wage workers (Tobin 1966). Others have emphasized the role of unpaid labor in the economy, such as domestic labor, and argued that a basic income would lead to a fairer application of the reciprocity principle than welfare systems that condition benefits on doing paid work (Pateman 2004). Normatively, the objection challenges us to think about both what the ideal of reciprocity requires and how it fits within a system of broader distributive justice. Some advocates of basic income have argued that a liberal-egalitarian theory of justice is correct and requires an equal distribution of scarce resources such as land rent and the rent component of wages (van Parijs 1997: 329). Reciprocity may be an important political value, such theorists argue, but it is one that is to be applied only after people have been given what they are due at the basic level of justice.

4.2 Sweatshop Labor

The term “sweatshop” is usually used to refer places of employment that utilize low-skill workers, often in the developing world, and that are characterized by low wages, long hours, and unsafe working conditions. In many cases, sweatshops produce goods on contract for large, multinational enterprises, who then sell those goods to customers in wealthier societies.

Many critics see sweatshop labor as highly exploitative. A large part of the debate over this claim has focused on the issue of wages. Critics claim that sweatshops have a moral obligation to pay a living wage to their workers. This duty is grounded in the extreme need of sweatshop workers, the fact that sweatshops and the multinational enterprises with which they contract rely on them to produce the goods that they sell, and the fact that the multinational enterprises are profitable enough that they can afford to increase workers’ wages without jeopardizing the health of their business (Meyers 2004; Snyder 2008). Some critics, however, see sweatshops’ low wages as merely one symptom of a broader failure to respect workers as persons who are ends in themselves. That failure of respect manifests itself in sweatshops violation of legal labor standards, their exposure of workers to physically dangerous conditions, and their abuse and coercion of workers on the job (Arnold and Bowie 2003: 227–233).

Once again, a number of difficult empirical and normative issues come out in this debate. The empirical issues include not only questions about what conditions in sweatshops are actually like—how low wages actually are relative to other firms in the developing economy, for instance—but what effects various attempts to remedy sweatshop conditions would actually have. Would a higher legal minimum wage improve workers’ overall well-being, or would it instead lead to layoffs and plant relocations (Powell and Zwolinski 2012)? On the normative side, the Non-Worseness Condition seems to pose an especially significant challenge to critics of sweatshop labor. If sweatshops, by providing jobs and capital infusion in the developing world, provide some benefit to workers there, how can they be acting in a morally worse way than wealthy firms that do not outsource their production at all, and thus provide no benefit to needy workers abroad (Zwolinski 2007; Preiss 2014)? Another question: even if we grant that sweatshops exploit their workers, and that exploitation is a significant moral wrong, might it be a wrong that is all-things-considered justifiable if sweatshop labor nevertheless confers considerable benefits on current workers, and plays an important role in economic growth? In other words, how much weight should a valid claim of exploitation have in our overall judgment of the justice of a practice or of a set of institutions that permit that practice?

4.3 Commercial Surrogacy

Commercial surrogacy is a practice in which a woman is paid to become pregnant as a result of either artificial insemination or the implantation of an already fertilized egg, and to surrender her parental rights to the intended parent(s). In the United States, most surrogacy arrangements are purely domestic affairs (with both the intended parents and the surrogate being citizens of the United States), but a significant number are international, in which the surrogate mother is often a citizen of a much poorer country.

Both types of surrogacy arrangement have been subjected to criticism on a number of distinct grounds. Some have argued that surrogacy involves an objectionable form of “commodification”, while others have argued that the practice is harmful to children, or to women as a class. But many have also argued that the practice exploits the women who serve as surrogates. In the case of international surrogacy, this charge is usually based on the bad circumstances and low pay of the women who serve as surrogates. The lack of alternative sources of employment has been said to undermine women’s consent, and the compensation they receive is often extremely low compared to the pay received by American surrogates for the same service—sometimes as low as 10%.

In the case of domestic surrogacy, critics charge that surrogate mothers are young and do not fully understand the physical and psychological risks that attend the services they are agreeing to provide. As a result, the arrangement might be harmful on net to them despite the fact that they consent to it. Or, even if it is not harmful on net, the payment they receive might be inadequate compensation for the costs they incur, thus rendering surrogacy a case of mutually beneficial but unfair and exploitative exchange (Tong 1990).

Questions of fair compensation for surrogates raise many of the same issues, and give rise to many of the same debates, as are found in the literature on sweatshop labor (Wilkinson 2003). But unlike the sort of labor that takes place in sweatshops, some critics believe that commercial surrogacy arrangements are intrinsically wrong. If women’s reproductive labor is not the sort of service that should be sold at any price, then commercial surrogacy may involve a kind of exploitation insofar as it entices women to engage in an activity that is harmful to their moral character (Anderson 1990; Wertheimer 1996: Ch. 4).


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Alan Wertheimer

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