Notes to Exploitation

1. The definition given here is drawn from Roemer’s 1982 book, A General Theory of Exploitation and Class. However, he offers summaries and commentaries on this work in two journal articles published in the same year (Roemer 1982b, Roemer 1982c). The definitions provided in these articles differ from the one found in the book (and included above). In Roemer 1982b, he defines capitalist exploitation (which is narrower in scope than his general definition) as follows:

Consider a coalition \(S\), and call its complement \(S'\). Then, at the allocation or distribution of income in question, \(S\) will be said to be capitalistically exploited if the following three conditions hold:

  1. If \(S\) were to withdraw from the society, endowed with its per capita share of society’s alienable property (that is, produced and nonproduced goods), and with its own labor and skills, then \(S\) would be worse off (in terms of income and leisure) than it is at the present allocation;
  2. If \(S'\) were to withdraw under the same conditions, then \(S'\) would be worse off (in terms of income and leisure) than it is at present;
  3. If \(S\) were to withdraw from society with its own endowments (not its per capita share), then \(S'\) would be worse off than at present (285).

His presentation of (the more general form of) exploitation in his 1982c (276–77) is:

Under the conditions hypothesised, call this payoff to coalition \(S\) in game \(v\) the amount \(v(S)\). Now, in the economy as it exists, there is a certain distribution of income (or utility or whatever). We say that a coalition \(S\) is exploited if its payoff \(v(S)\) is greater than what it currently receives in the actual income distribution. The core of a game is that set of income distributions for which no coalition is exploited; that is, an income distribution is in the core of game \(v\) if each coalition \(S\), by taking its payoff \(v(s)\), can do no better than it is currently doing. In game theory, we say \(S\) can “block” a distribution of income if it does better with payoff \(v(S)\) than with its current income. A blocking coalition is an exploited coalition.

In both of these articles, and in the book, he emphasises that exploiting and exploited coalitions are always complements of each other. Apart from the fact that the 1982b definition is of capitalist exploitation and not the general definition, the main difference between these presentations and the definition in the book is that in the book the conditions are presented as necessary and sufficient for exploitation (“if and only if”), whereas the articles are framed only in terms of sufficent conditions (“if”).

After 1982 Roemer’s definition changed somewhat to address issues related to dominance and the requirement that exploiters gain “at the expense of” the exploited. However, here we have chosen to present the first and most well known definition found in his book.

Copyright © 2022 by
Matt Zwolinski <>
Benjamin Ferguson <>
Alan Wertheimer

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