First published Thu Dec 20, 2001; substantive revision Mon Oct 3, 2022

To exploit someone is to take unfair advantage of them. It is to use another person’s vulnerability for one’s own benefit. Of course, benefitting from another’s vulnerability is not always morally wrong—we do not condemn a chess player for exploiting a weakness in his opponent’s defence, for instance. But some forms of advantage-taking do seem to be clearly wrong, and it is this normative sense of exploitation that is of primary interest to moral and political philosophers.

Exploitation can be transactional or structural. In the former case, the unfairness is a property of a discrete transaction between two or more individuals. A sweatshop that pays low wages, for example, or a pharmaceutical research firm that tests drugs on poor subjects in the developing world, might be said to exploit others in this sense. But exploitation can also be structural—a property of institutions or systems in which the “rules of the game” unfairly benefit one group of people to the detriment of another. As we will see below, Karl Marx believed that the economic and political institutions of capitalism were exploitative in this sense. And some contemporary feminists have argued that the institution of traditional marriage is exploitative insofar as it preys upon and reinforces pernicious forms of inequality between men and women (Sample 2003: Ch. 4).

Exploitation can also be harmful or mutually beneficial. Harmful exploitation involves an interaction that leaves the victim worse off than she was, and than she was entitled to be. The sort of exploitation involved in coercive sex trafficking, for instance, is harmful in this sense. But as we will see below, not all exploitation is harmful. Exploitation can also be mutually beneficial, where both parties walk away better off than they were ex ante. Most philosophers think that what makes such mutually beneficial interactions nevertheless exploitative is that they are, in some way, unfair.

It is relatively easy to come up with intuitively compelling cases of unfair, exploitative behavior. Providing a philosophical analysis to support and develop those intuitions, however, has proven more difficult. The most obvious difficulty is specifying the conditions under which a transaction or institution may be said to be unfair. Does the unfairness involved in exploitation relate to the distribution of resources? Or a violation of her moral rights? Is the unfairness involved in exploitation a matter of procedure, substance, or both? And how, if at all, are the attitudes and motives of the would-be exploiter relevant to assessing charges of exploitation?

1. Historical Accounts of Exploitation

Although the term “exploitation” appears not to have been used to describe unfair advantage-taking prior to the 19th century, there are nevertheless extensive discussions of the themes and problems that characterize contemporary discussions of exploitation in the history of philosophy. Those themes include the notion of justice and injustice in economic exchange, the role of labor in the creation of value, and the justification and abuse of private property, especially in capital and land.

1.1 Pre-Marxian Accounts of Exploitation and Unjust Trade

Concerns about exploitation often take the form of unfair economic exchange. Attempts to specify the principles that render an exchange fair or unfair can be traced back at least as far as Aristotle, who argued that a just exchange will embody a kind of reciprocity such that the values of the goods exchanged are proportional (Nicomachean Ethics, Book V, Part V). But while the notion of proportionality is intuitively appealing, it is somewhat unclear precisely what Aristotle had in mind by it, or what the most defensible explication of the idea would be. To borrow Aristotle’s own example, if a shoemaker and a builder trade, how many pairs of shoes is proportional to a single house?

In the writings of St. Thomas Aquinas, we find the beginnings of a much more sophisticated and promising approach to questions such as this. In his Summa Theologiae, Aquinas sought to answer the question of “whether a man may lawfully sell a thing for more than it is worth?” The “worth” of a thing, for Aquinas, was its just price. And the just price, according to Aquinas, appears to have been simply the prevailing market price (Summa Theologiae, part 2, second part, question 77; see also de Roover 1958 and Friedman 1980). Rather than relying on some fixed notion of proportionality, Aquinas’ just price will be responsive to considerations of supply and demand. But not just any price that two individuals mutually agree upon will be deemed just on Aquinas’ standard. Thus, a seller who takes advantage of fraud, or a temporary monopoly, to charge an excessive price for an item would be acting unjustly, insofar as his price is in excess of the price at which similar goods typically sell in the relevant market. But Aquinas saw nothing inherently sinful in selling a good for more than one paid for it, or with charging enough to earn a profit, or to compensate for risks involved in the productive process. Seeking profit for its own sake may involve a certain sort of “debasement”, but profit can also be sought in order to fulfill necessary or even virtuous ends.

Later Scholastics would devote considerable attention to developing and refining the notion of the just price. Of special concern was the price attached to the lending of money, or interest. Since the founding of the Catholic church, it was widely regarded as sinful for lenders to charge interest on their loans, and so-called “usury” was prohibited by canon and often by secular law. Much of the concern regarding usury seems to have been driven by the idea that the charging of interest involves an inequitable exchange—lenders give something to borrowers, but demand back more than they have given. But Aquinas seems to have been particularly concerned that borrowers would often be driven to take out loans out of necessity, and thus that their consent to the exchange is not fully voluntary (Summa Theologiae, part 2, second part, question 78).

The much later natural law theorist John Locke also took up questions regarding just and unjust prices, not in either of his well-known treatises on government but in a lesser known tract titled, Venditio. Locke, even more explicitly than Aquinas, saw the just price as being equivalent to “the market price at the place where he sells” (Locke 1661: 340). The relativity of the just price to the particular market in which the transaction takes place is important. For Locke argued that if two ships sailed laden with corn, one to Dunkirk where there is a near famine taking place, and the other to Ostend where normal conditions obtain, it would not be unjust for the merchant to sell at a significantly higher price in the former location than in the latter (so long as the higher price is one that the buyers can afford). If the merchant did not charge a higher price, Locke argued, then two problems would result. First, it is likely that the merchant’s goods would simply be bought by speculators and resold on a secondary market, thereby simply redirecting the profit into somebody else’s hands without doing anything to improve the situation of buyers. And second, if merchants cannot charge a high price in “good” markets to cover their losses in “bad” ones, they will soon operate at a net loss and this will, Locke claims, “quickly put an end to merchandising” (Locke 1661: 342).

What would be unjust would be for the merchant to sell an item to a particular individual for a price higher than the general market rate as might happen, for instance, if that individual is in particular distress. Thus, Locke holds, if anchors typically sell for a certain price, say 100 pounds, then it would be unjust (exploitative) to charge the captain of a distressed ship 5000 pounds for an anchor, simply because one knows he will be compelled to pay it. The just price is the going market rate, where that rate is determined by the general features of supply and demand, and not the particular needs or vulnerabilities of any particular buyer or seller.

Interest in exploitation as a feature of economic exchange is thus almost as old as philosophy itself. It was not until the 19th century, however, that exploitation as a feature of employment relationships came to be a subject of philosophical and political concern. In a sense, of course, the employment relationship is simply another instance of economic exchange, with the laborer selling his or her work in exchange for money in the form of wages. But two ideas led many people to think that there was something special about labor. The first was a belief that labor is the ultimate source of all economic value. The second was the belief that labor morally entitles the laborer to the full value of that which he or she has produced.

More will be said about the first of these ideas in the discussion of Marx’s theory of exploitation, below. The second idea, and its connection to the idea of labor exploitation, is perhaps best illustrated by the theory put forth by the 19th century liberal Thomas Hodgskin. For Hodgskin, as for Locke from whose ideas he drew heavily, the right of private property is a natural, pre-political right. That right consists in

the right of individuals, to have and to own, for their own separate use and enjoyment, the produce of their own industry, with power freely to dispose of the whole of that in the manner most agreeable to themselves. (Hodgskin 1832: 24)

But while the natural right of property is based on labor, there is also an artificial right of property that is based on nothing more than legislative force. That artificial right cements in place, through the machinery of government, property claims that had their origins not in labor but in violence, conquest, and theft. And it thereby enables capitalists to profit without labor, simply by virtue of their (illegitimate) control of the means of production (Reeve 1987b).

For Hodgskin, capitalists exploit workers in precisely the same way that landlords exploit their tenants. In both cases, one person is entitled to a stream of revenue simply by virtue of their legal claim of ownership (Hodgskin 1832: 97). The money the landlord earns as rent comes from the wages the tenant earns as a laborer, just as the money the capitalist earns as profit comes from the sale of products produced by his laborers. In both cases, one person is able to live as a parasite off the productive activities of others, all because the state actively suppresses the natural right of laborers to the full product of their labor, in favor of the artificial right of property established by violence. One finds echos of Hodgskin’s concern about harmful parasitism in contemporary discussions of exploitation as well (van Donselaar 2009).

Even before Marx, then, we see in the 19th century a tight connection between theories of exploitation and theories of class and of class conflict. Marx himself credited the “bourgeois economists” of the French Industrialist school with having pioneered the economic analysis of class struggle (Marx & Engels 1965: 69). For members of that school, the two great classes into which society was divided were productive laborers and unproductive social parasites. The class of productive laborers was understood broadly to encompass not only those who exerted physical labor to create tangible goods and services, but anyone who worked to make goods more useful than they would otherwise be—so laborers, yes, but also entrepreneurs, arbitrageurs, and even capitalists in their role as managers and overseers of investments. The unproductive classes, in contrast, consisted of those who consume value but do not produce it, such as the army, the government, and the state-supported clergy (Raico 1977: 395).

According to Industrialists such as Charles Comte and Jean-Baptiste Say, the unproductive classes are able to maintain themselves by using the coercive power of government to forcibly extract resources from the productive. Taxes and tariffs were the most obvious forms such “plunder” could take, but the same goal could also be achieved by special protections for favored industries including the limited conferral of monopoly power (Say 1964: 146–147).

For both Hodgskin and for the Industrialists, then, the state was a key agent in facilitating the exploitation of one class of individuals by another, and the most certain way to end exploitation was therefore to sharply limit the power of the state and to strengthen the “natural” right of private property. But not all theorists of the 19th century saw things this way. For Ricardian Socialists such as John Bray, ending exploitation would require ensuring that all persons have equal access to the means of production, and thereby guaranteeing a system of equal exchange based on the labor theory of value (Bray 1839). While Hodgskin and the Industrialists sought to purify capitalism from statist interference, Bray and his fellow socialists sought to eliminate it altogether.

1.2 Marx’s Theory of Exploitation

By far the most influential theory of exploitation ever set forth is that of Karl Marx, who held that workers in a capitalist society are exploited insofar as they are forced to sell their labor power to capitalists for less than the full value of the commodities they produce with their labor.

For Marx, however, exploitation was a phenomenon that characterized all class-based societies, not only capitalism. Indeed, it is feudal society, not capitalism, where the exploitative nature of class relations is clearest. Under feudalism, it is readily apparent that serfs use some of their labor power for their own benefit, while another part (the corvée) is used for the benefit of the feudal lord. In contrast, under slavery workers appear to work entirely for the benefit of their masters (though in reality a part of their labor goes toward providing for their own subsistence). And under capitalism workers appear to work entirely for the benefit of themselves, selling their labor to capitalists as free independent contractors (Cohen 1978: 332–3).

In reality, Marx thought, workers’ labor under capitalism is neither truly voluntary nor entirely for the benefit of the workers themselves. It is not truly voluntary because workers are forced by their lack of ownership of the means of production to sell their labor power to capitalists or else starve. And workers are not laboring entirely for their own benefit because capitalists use their privileged position to exploit workers, appropriating for themselves some of the value created by workers’ labor.

To understand Marx’s charge of exploitation, it is first necessary to understand Marx’s analysis of market prices, which he largely inherited from earlier classical economists such as Adam Smith and David Ricardo. Under capitalism, Marx argued, workers’ labor power is treated as a commodity. And because Marx subscribed to a labor theory of value, this means that just like any other commodity such as butter or corn, the price (or wage) of labor power is determined by its cost of production—specifically, by the quantity of socially necessary labor required to produce it. The cost of producing labor power is the value or labor-cost required for the conservation and reproduction of a worker’s labor power. In other words, Marx thought that workers under capitalism will therefore be paid just enough to cover the bare necessities of living. They will be paid subsistence wages.

But while labor power is just like any other commodity in terms of how its price is determined, it is unique in one very importance respect. Labor, and labor alone, according to Marx, has the capacity to produce value beyond that which is necessary for its own reproduction. In other words, the value that goes into the commodities that sustain a worker for a twelve-hour work day is less than the value of the commodities that worker can produce during those twelve hours. This difference between the value a worker produces in a given period of time and the value of the consumption goods necessary to sustain the worker for that period is what Marx called surplus value.

According to Marx, then, it is as though the worker’s day is split into two parts. During the first part, the laborer works for himself, producing commodities the value of which is equal to the value of the wages he receives. During the second part, the laborer works for the capitalist, producing surplus value for the capitalist for which he receives no equivalent wages. During this second part of the day, the laborer’s work is, in effect, unpaid, in precisely the same way (though not as visibly) as a feudal serf’s corvée is unpaid (Marx 1867).

Capitalist exploitation thus consists in the forced appropriation by capitalists of the surplus value produced by workers. Workers under capitalism are compelled by their lack of ownership of the means of production to sell their labor power to capitalists for less than the full value of the goods they produce. Capitalists, in turn, need not produce anything themselves but are able to live instead off the productive energies of workers. And the surplus value that capitalists are thereby able to appropriate from workers becomes the source of capitalist profit, thereby “strengthening that very power whose slave it is” (Marx 1847: 40).

In the first volume of Capital, Marx presents a series of formulas representing a tight relationship between labor, exploitation, and capitalist profit. According to Marx, the value of a commodity is a function of three factors: constant capital (\(C\)), i.e., the labor value of nonlabor means of production such as machines, buildings, and raw materials; variable capital (\(V\)), i.e., the labor value of the labor power of workers involved in production), and surplus value (\(S\)). Since surplus value comes from the exploitation of labor (rather than machines or land), Marx defined the rate of exploitation as the ratio of surplus value over variable capital \((S/V)\). Of course, different industries will employ different mixes of labor and other factors of production—of variable and constant capital. Marx referred to this mixture as the organic composition of capital, and defined it as \(C/V\). But since capitalist profit is generated by the exploitation of labor, it seems to follow that industries that employ a greater proportion of labor (of variable over constant capital) should therefore earn a higher rate of profit. Thus, Marx defined the rate of profit as \((S/(C+V))\), which is equivalent to the rate of exploitation divided by the organic composition of \(\textrm{capital} + 1\). This last proposition has been referred to by Jon Elster as the “fundamental equation of Marxian economics” (Elster 1986a: 67).

Marx’s analysis of the rate of profit seems to entail that labor-intensive industries will be more profitable than industries that rely to a greater extent on constant capital. But this conclusion is clearly empirically false (Böhm-Bawerk 1898), and moreover incompatible with Marx’s assumption of a competitive economy in which investments will adjust so as to equalize the rate of profit between industries (Arnold 1990: Ch. 3; Buchanan 1985: Ch. 3). Marx himself recognized this fact, and sought to address it in the third volume of Capital by dropping the assumption of volume 1 that value and price are equivalent, and showing instead how value can be transformed into price through some more complicated process. Whether Marx’s attempted solution to this “transformation problem” was successful, however, is a matter of great controversy (Arnold 1990: Ch. 3; Samuelson 1971; Kliman 2007).

Marx’s theory of exploitation appears to presuppose that labor is the source of all value. But the labor theory of value to which Marx and early classical economists subscribed is subject to a number of apparently insurmountable difficulties, and has largely been abandoned by economists in the wake of the marginalist revolution of the 1870s. The most obvious difficulty stems from the fact that labor is heterogeneous. Some labor is skilled, some labor is unskilled, and there does not appear to be any satisfactory way of reducing the former to the latter and thereby establishing a single standard of measure for the value of commodities. Moreover, the labor theory of value appears to be unable to account for the economic value of commodities such as land and raw materials that are not and could not be produced by any human labor. Finally, and perhaps most fatally, Marx’s assumption that labor has the unique power to create surplus value is entirely ungrounded. As Robert Paul Wolff has argued, Marx’s focus on labor appears to be entirely arbitrary. A formally identical theory of value could be constructed with any commodity taking the place of labor, and thus a “corn theory of value” would be just as legitimate, and just as unhelpful, as Marx’s labor theory of value (Wolff 1981). Therefore, if, as some have alleged, Marx’s theory of exploitation is dependent on the truth of the labor theory of value, then a rejection of the labor theory of value should entail a rejection of Marx’s theory of exploitation as well (Nozick 1974; Arnold 1990).

Not everyone agrees, however, that Marx’s theory is dependent on the labor theory of value in this way. G.A. Cohen, for instance, argues that Marx’s theory of exploitation is not only independent of the labor theory of value, but incompatible with it (Cohen 1979: 345–6). Marx’s account of exploitation is premised on the claim that value created by workers is appropriated by capitalists. But the labor theory of value holds that the value of an object is a function of the labor that would be currently required to produce it, regardless of how much labor actually went into producing it. Paradoxical as it may seem, the labor theory of value is incompatible with the claim that labor alone creates value.

The real problem with exploitation, on Cohen’s view, is not that capitalists appropriate value that is created by labor. It is, rather, that capitalists appropriate some of the value of the products that are created by labor. Labor may not produce value, but it is the only thing that produces what has value, and this is all Marx needs to get his account of exploitation off the ground (Cohen 1979: 354).

But even if Cohen’s account of exploitation avoids commitment to the labor theory of value, it nevertheless remains committed to the Marxian idea that exploitation should be understood as the forced appropriation of surplus value. And there are at least two respects in which this commitment is problematic. First, it is unclear whether exploitation necessarily involves the forced transfer of surplus value. Marx’s account asserts that the laborer is forced to work for capitalists because the only alternative is starvation. But suppose the government provides a safety net sufficient to ensure that workers’ subsistence needs are met. If someone chooses to work in order to earn discretionary income, it still seems possible that they could be exploited by a capitalist who appropriates some of the value of the product the laborer creates (Kymlicka 2002: 179). A laborer can be exploited, we might think, by being paid an unfair wage even if that laborer is not forced to work.

Second, it is unclear whether all cases involving the forced transfer of surplus value are necessarily exploitative, at least in the ordinary sense of involving a moral wrong. Suppose that governments tax workers and use some of the proceeds to provide support for children or the infirm. If it is exploitative for capitalists to appropriate some of the value of the objects produced by workers, is it not also exploitative for government to do so through the mechanism of taxation? Some libertarians have argued that this is precisely how we should understand the coercive power of government. For Cohen, however, the fact that Marx’s account of exploitation appears to be committed to the libertarian idea of that workers own their labor and the products they produce with that labor—that is, to the libertarian idea of self-ownership—is deeply problematic (Cohen 1995: Ch. 6).

1.3 Neoclassical Accounts

The idea that workers have rights to the contributions their labour makes to the production of a social surplus is, we noted, common to both Marxist and Libertarian theories. Yet, the widespread rejection of the labour theory of value apparently undermines (Cohen’s arguments notwithstanding) of Marx’s classical account of exploitation. Neoclassical economists subsequently developed an account of exploitation that incorporates this concern for an input’s contribution to the productive surplus that is compatible with the subjective theory of value that replaced labour theories in mainstream economic thinking. This account claims “a factor of production is exploited if it is employed at a price which is less than its marginal net productivity” (Robinson 1933: 281).

The neoclassical account was first fully developed by A. C. Pigou in The Economics of Welfare (1920) and was refined by Joan Robinson in The Economics of Perfect Competition (1933), though Reiff (2013) identifies both Alfred Marshall and John Bates Clark as influences on Pigou’s approach. Neoclassical accounts are, in many ways, precursors to contemporary market-based accounts of exploitation. Their move away from the labour theory of value allows them to escape some of the technical problems that the classical Marxist definition encounters. However, they face their own technical and moral objections. Here we discuss three.

First, according to the neoclassical account, exploitation is impossible under perfect competition. Whether this aspect of the neoclassical account is a bug or feature depends on whether one thinks that competitive markets and the pressures they can place on individuals—or the capitalist system, for Marxists—can be exploitative. A point against the neoclassical account is that it seems that conclusions about whether or not competitive markets can be exploitative should be the result of substantive moral argument and not merely settled by stipulative definition. On the other hand, the idea that market competition precludes at least certain causes of exploitation is compelling. Perfectly competitive markets exclude abuses of power by monopolists and monopsonists and the abuse of informational asymmetries (Wertheimer 1996). A competitive market is a context in which the price that one pays for goods and services is shaped by the availability of these resources (supply) and the degree to which others need or want them (demand).

Second, the neoclassical account does not limit exploitation to labour. The account also allows for the exploitation of other factors of production. Factors of production—which classically comprise land, labour and capital—are those resources used to produced outputs. The returns to any of these factors can be less than their marginal product and when they are, on the neoclassical account, they are exploited. As with views about whether markets are exploitative, whether capital can be exploited should be the conclusion of substantive moral argument and not settled by a definition. One might argue that the neoclassical account provides a technical and nonmoralised account of exploitation and further, that only the exploitation of labour is morally important. In this case, the neoclassical account would be an incomplete account of wrongful exploitation that requires supplemental arguments about the moral importance of labour (like those advanced in Cohen 1979).

Finally, and arguably most problematic, associating fair pay with workers’ marginal productivity means giving different workers different pay for the same work. Decreasing marginal productivity means that the productivity associated with each additional laborer decreases as more workers are added. Early hires will be associated with greater marginal productivity than those who join later, even if they all perform identical tasks. This also means that if an ‘early’ employee quits, the nonexploitative wage of an employee hired later increases (because their marginal contribution has increased). Thus, the neoclassical account cannot satisfy the intuition that fair employment requires equal remuneration for equal work. This problem can be avoided by modifying the neoclassical account so that exploitation consists in paying labour less than its average product. Yet the average product approach still cannot accurately track the contributions to output of individual workers if some are more productive than others.

Each of the historical approaches surveyed here—Pre-Marxian accounts, Marx’s account, and neoclassical accounts—have influenced and, to some degree, been incorporated into the contemporary accounts that we cover in the following section.

2. The Concept of Exploitation

Philosophical analyses of exploitation are broad and varied. As is often the case with such analyses, there is no widespread agreement about what, precisely, exploitation is. However, consensus has emerged around some of the domain conditions for exploitation. Most— though not all—philosophers agree that exploitation involves taking unfair advantage, though, of course, they disagree about what exactly this involves. And most, but not all, philosophers also agree that in order to be an exploiter, \(A\) must benefit and this benefit must come at \(B\)’s expense. We think few philosophers would deny that exploitations can be all- things-considered harmful. However, much more philosophical attention has been given to mutually beneficial exploitations, in which the exploited benefits from the interaction, albeit in a morally problematic way. The reason for this focus is that harmful exploitations are less ethically puzzling than mutually beneficial exploitations. The wrongs of harmful exploitation are more familiar, often over determined, and usually coextensive with fraud and coercion. Harmful exploitations are also likely to be non-consensual and, of course, the harm itself may also be sufficient to explain the wrongfulness of these cases.

There is far less consensus about another domain condition: whether exploitation is a structural feature of social systems, a property of discrete individual transactions, or both. Philosophers also disagree about more substantive features of exploitation, such as how we should understand the unfairness present in exploitations, about whether exploitation also requires something more than unfairness, such as morally problematic motives or attitudes on the part of the exploiter, and about what Alan Wertheimer (1996: 279) has called the ‘moral weight’ (exploitation’s permissibility or impermissibility) and ‘moral force’ of exploitation (whether third parties should intervene in exploitations).

In the rest of this section, we discuss exploitation’s various domain conditions before surveying debates about unfairness, and other possible necessary conditions. Exploitation’s moral status is covered in section three.

2.1 Domain Conditions

This section examines three possible components of exploitation: differences between transactional and structural accounts of exploitation, the benefit that exploitative transactions confer upon A, the harm they cause to B.

2.1.1 Structural and Transactional Exploitation

Many authors have pointed out that exploitation can be a structural phenomenon. What it means for exploitation to be ‘structural’ differs from account to account. For Matt Zwolinski (2012: 155) exploitation is structural when it is brought about by unjust “conditions that lie in the background of the exchange”. For Maeve McKeowan (2016) exploitation is structural when social systems structure and limit the options of disadvantaged groups to the advantage of more powerful groups. Gabriel Wollner (2019: 157) argues that structures exploit by making an individual’s “position within the structure... such that in order to optimize or maximize economic revenue she has to take unfair advantage of others.” Finally, Marxists often point out that although Marx’s technical definition of exploitation (outlined in section 1) can be stated in transactional terms, Marx also conceived of exploitation “as a property of the economy as a whole, not just individuals” (Elster 1986b: 176). Indeed, in Roemer’s (1982a) unequal exchange account and later work by Roberto Veneziani (2007) and Naoki Yoshihara and Veneziani (2018) exploitation is not defined as a relational predicate at all. Instead, only the predicates ‘…is exploited’ and ‘…is exploiter’ are defined. On these non-relational accounts, whether agents are exploited depends on whether the total labour they perform in the economy is greater than the labour embodied in the total bundle of goods they consume.

Structural exploitation in Zwolinski’s, McKeowan’s, and Wollner’s senses and transactional exploitation are not mutually exclusive. This is quite clear in Zwolinski’s definition, which directly references an exchange. But both McKeowan and Wollner’s accounts are also compatible with exploitation being a relational property of transactions. One distinction that is sometimes elided in these discussions is between the sources of exploitable vulnerability and those who benefit from this vulnerability. That social systems, norms and institutions make certain groups vulnerable while advancing the interests of others does not entail that these systems themselves benefit from the vulnerability (a feature of exploitations we discuss in the next section). By structuring interactions in such a way that group or individual \(A\) can take unfair advantage of \(B\), they create the conditions that allow \(A\) to exploit \(B\). However, to say that the systems themselves gain from, and thereby exploit \(B\) involves a different (and less plausible) claim.

In contrast, non-relational forms of structural exploitation are conceptually distinct from transactional accounts. We surmise that ‘exploitation’ in ordinary use hews closer to the transactional model because accusations of exploitation often target discrete interactions between groups, such as the exploitation of sweatshop workers by multinational corporations; the exploitation of the elderly by con artists; or the exploitation of children by parents. However, note that the common use does not undermine the value of the non-relational conception as a tool for making moral and political critiques of social systems. Our point is merely that two different conceptions exist and should not be confused. The transactional model has, arguably received a greater amount of attention in contemporary moral and political philosophy and we will focus primarily on it in the sections that follow.

2.1.2 Exploitation and Benefit

When \(A\) exploits \(B\), \(A\) gains some benefit from interacting with \(B\). We can see the relevance of the “benefit to \(A\)” by contrasting exploitation with other forms of wrongdoing, such as discrimination, abuse, and oppression. Let us say that \(A\) discriminates against \(B\) when \(A\) wrongly deprives \(B\) of some opportunity or benefit because of some characteristic of \(B\) that is not relevant to \(A\)’s action. There was a period in American history in which many women became public school teachers because they were denied the opportunity to enter other professions such as law and medicine. To the extent that society benefitted (in one way) from the pool of highly qualified public school teachers, the discrimination may have been exploitative, even if unintentionally so. But if \(A\) refuses to hire \(B\) solely because of \(B\)’s race, then it would be odd to say that \(A\) exploits \(B,\) for \(A\) does not gain resources from the wrong to \(B\).

Consider abuse. It has been alleged that medical students are frequently abused by verbal insults and denigration and that this abuse may leave long-lasting emotional scars. It is also sometimes claimed that medical interns are exploited, that they work long hours for low pay. The contrast is just right. There is no reason to think that anyone gains (in any normal sense) from abuse, but it is at least plausible to think that the hospitals or patients gain from the exploitation of interns.

Let us say that \(A\) oppresses \(B\) when \(A\) deprives \(B\) of freedoms or opportunities to which \(B\) is entitled. If \(A\) gains from the oppressive relationship, as when \(A\) enslaves \(B\), then \(A\) may both oppress and exploit \(B\). But if \(A\) does not gain from the oppression, the oppression is wrong but not exploitative. We might say that the unemployed are oppressed, but unless we could specify the ways in which some gain from their lack of employment, the unemployed are not exploited. Marxists would claim that capitalists pay exploitative wages to the employed precisely because there is a “reserve army” of the unemployed with whom the employed must compete. But that merely confirms that they are exploited because the oppression generates a gain to the capitalist class, and it is the employed who are exploited and not the unemployed that make such exploitation possible.

Clearly, an exchange still counts as exploitative even if \(A\) does not benefit on net. If \(A\) derives unfair benefit from his interaction with \(B\), but suffers unforeseen costs such that she ends up worse-off after the interaction than she was before, then \(A\) has still exploited \(B\). Less clear is the question of whether \(A\) must derive any actual benefit at all, or whether it is enough that \(A\) merely intend to benefit. Suppose a sweatshop owner works his employees ruthlessly in order to extract as much profit as he can from the workers’ labor, but that the product the laborers produce turns out, due to an unforeseen turn of events, to have zero market value. Have the sweatshop workers nevertheless been exploited?

Related to the question of whether \(A\)’s intent to benefit is sufficient for exploitation is the question of whether \(A\)’s intent to benefit unfairly is necessary for exploitation. Is it possible to exploit someone by mistake? Can one foresee that one’s interaction will be exploitative without intending it to be so? If so, is \(A\) still culpable? (Ferguson 2016b)

2.1.3 Exploitation and Harm

Exploitation thus involves \(A\) unfairly benefitting from an interaction with B. But what exactly does it mean to benefit unfairly? One natural response to this question is to conceive of unfairness as benefitting \(A\) at \(B\)’s expense. Perhaps exploitation advances the interests of \(A\) while harming \(B\). Exploitation, thus understood, is a kind of parasitism. Or, as Allen Buchanan defines it, exploitation is “the harmful, merely instrumental utilization of him or his capacities, for one’s own advantage or for the sake of one’s own ends” (Buchanan 1985: 87).

Certain paradigmatic cases of exploitation clearly fit this analysis. Slavery is an exploitative relationship, and one that clearly harms slaves for the benefit of their masters. But as Alan Wertheimer has noted, some exploitation appears to be mutually advantageous rather than harmful (Wertheimer 1996: 14). Someone who charges a hiker lost in the desert $1,000 for a bottle of water takes unfair advantage of her. Nevertheless, the transaction is one from which both parties emerge better off relative to how they would have been, had the transaction not taken place. The seller has traded away something she values less (the bottle of water) for something she values more ($1,000). But so has the buyer. If the water is necessary to save her life, and if she values her life more than the $1,000 she gives up to save it, then she too is better off with the transaction than without it.

There is, however, one important sense in which even an exploiter could be said to harm her victim. Even if relative to a baseline of no transaction at all, exploitation often makes its victim better off, relative to a baseline of a fair transaction, exploitation leaves its victim worse off. In this sense, an exploiter’s gain does, contra Joel Feinberg, come at the victim’s expense (Feinberg 1988: 178). For even when both parties gain from the transaction, the victim of exploitation gains less than she should because some of the “cooperative surplus” (to which she is by fairness entitled) has been captured by the exploiter.

Exploitation therefore does not necessarily harm its victim in the sense of making her worse off than she would have been, had the exploiter never interacted with her at all. Rather, it makes its victim worse off than she should have been, had she been treated fairly. As with similar cases involving coercion, the precise details of our analysis thus depend on the relevant baseline against which we choose to compare \(B\)’s situation after the interaction. But these details probably do not matter much as far as our all-things-considered moral evaluation is concerned. Whether we choose to say that exploitation involves \(A\) making \(B\) better off, but not as much better off as \(A\) should have made \(B\); or whether we say that it involves making \(B\) worse off than \(B\) should have been, the final verdict is the same (Wertheimer 1996: 22–23).

2.2 Unfairness

In the sense in which most philosophers use the term, exploitation necessarily (conceptually) involves unfairness. This sense of exploitation is thus a moralized term. To judge that someone is engaged in exploitation is already to pass a moral judgment on them—to say that they are acting wrongly (at least in a pro tanto sense). Not all uses of “exploitation” are moralized in this way. As we noted at the beginning of this entry, some ordinary language use of the term implies no moral judgment whatsoever. And it is possible to develop a philosophically sophisticated account of exploitation that is relevant to moral judgment, without being moralized (Goodin 1987), and indeed without referencing fairness (Vrousalis 2013).

Still, even if exploitation is not conceptually unfair, it is characteristically so. In some cases, this unfairness is the result of some procedural defect in the transaction—call this procedural unfairness. In other cases, the unfairness is a feature of what is agreed to, rather than how the agreement is reached—call this substantive unfairness.

2.2.1 Substantive Unfairness

Substantive accounts of (un)fairness specify how certain goods (the distribuenda) ought to be distributed by appealing to various distributive criteria. Accounts differ according to how they specify both the distribuendum and the distributive criterion. Equality

One of the most intuitively appealing criteria of fairness in exchange is equality. A fair exchange, it is tempting to say, is an equal exchange. But equal in terms of what?

Although Marx took pains to deny he was giving an account of justice (let alone fairness), much of the intuitive force of his account of labor exploitation seems to rely on the idea that a fair exchange will embody equal transfers of socially necessary labor. It is because the objects produced by the worker embody more socially necessary labor than the wages he receives in exchange for producing those objects that the laborer is exploited. And other late-19th century theorists such as Josiah Warren and Stephen Pearl Andrews made this moral claim explicit. “It is clear”, wrote Andrews,

if [an] exchange is not equal, if one party gives more of his own labor—either in the form of labor or product—than he gets of the labor of the other…that he is oppressed, and becomes, so far as this inequality goes, the slave or subject of the other. (Andrews 1852: 52–53)

But even though a theory of labor-time as the basis of fair exchange is in principle distinguishable from a labor theory of economic value, the former is subject to many of the same problems as the latter. How, for instance, should the difference between skilled and unskilled labor time be accounted for in determining a fair exchange? Between easy and difficult labor? Labor is not homogenous, and this makes it ill-suited to serve as a currency of fair exchange.

If labor is problematic as a distribuendum, perhaps economic value would work better. A fair trade, on this view, involves the exchange of equally valuable goods or services. And an unfair trade involves the exchange of goods or services of unequal value. To return to an earlier example, someone who sells a bottle of water to a hiker stranded in the desert for $1,000 takes unfair advantage of her. And part of what makes the exchange unfair is that the bottle of water simply isn’t worth nearly $1,000. \(B\) is giving up far more than she gains in exchange.

Or is she? Once we give up on the 19th century notion that economic value is an objective property of commodities, and embrace instead that value is a function of the subjective preferences of economic agents, the problem with this analysis becomes readily apparent. Economic exchange is only possible precisely because different agents assign different values to the same object. I sell you my old television for $75 because I’ve bought a new set, and to me, the old television is worth less than the $75. You pay the $75 because you just moved into a new place and, to you, the $75 is worth less than the television. Neither of our valuations is the “right” one. Our preferences simply differ, and so it is possible for us to both walk away from the deal believing—correctly!—that we have gotten more than we have given up.

Cooperative exchanges create what economists call a “social surplus”. Suppose, to continue the television example, that I’d be willing to take anything equal to or greater than $50 in exchange for my television, and that you’d be willing to pay anything equal to or less than $100 for it. If, after bargaining, we arrive at a sale price of $75, then I give up something I value at $50 in exchange for $75, and come away $25 richer, and you give up $75 in exchange for something you value at $100 and walk away $25 richer. All together, we’re $50 richer. That’s the social surplus.

This suggests one final possible distribuendum that could be paired with an egalitarian distributive criterion. Perhaps what makes an exchange is fair is not that the objects traded have equal economic value, but rather an exchange is fair when the social surplus created by the exchange is equally distributed. Exploitative exchanges, in contrast, are those in which one party commands a disproportionately large share of the social surplus, leaving the other party with an unfairly small share. For example, suppose that an employer gains $10 per hour worth of value from an employee’s labor. An employer like that could afford to pay its workers $9 per hour and still make a profit. But if potential employees have nowhere else to go, why should the employer pay that much? Why not pay employees as little as she can get away with—maybe $3 an hour, just barely over the subsistence level of $2? In this case the employment relationship would generate a social surplus of $8. But $7 of that surplus would go into the pocket of the employer, while only $1 goes to the laborer. Might not that lopsided division of the social surplus be precisely what’s unfair, and thus exploitative, about this kind of labor?

Perhaps. But the unequal division of the social surplus cannot explain all cases of exploitation—including some of the most paradigmatic. To see this, let us return once more to the case of the lost desert hiker. \(A\) offers to sell \(B\) a bottle of water for $1,000. This would appear to be a clear instance of an exploitative proposal. But it is not, as suggested above, because the water bottle is worth less than $1,000 to \(B\). Indeed, it is probably worth far more! Most people put a fairly high value on their continued existence. So, suppose \(B\) values not dying at $1 million. In that case, \(B\) gives up something he values at $1,000 in exchange for something he values at $1 million. \(A\), in turn, gives up something he values at close to $0 in exchange for something he values at $1,000. The exchange creates a social surplus of $1 million, but fully 99.9% of that surplus goes to \(B\), leaving \(A\) with a mere .1%. If exploitation consists of grabbing the lion’s share of the social surplus of an exchange, then we are forced to conclude that thirsty \(B\) is actually exploiting water-selling \(A\)—an unlikely result! Sufficiency and Basic Needs

It is thus difficult to specify an egalitarian criterion of fairness that explains the wrongfulness of exploitation across a range of cases. For this reason, few current theories of exploitation use an egalitarian distributive criterion. One alternative is a sufficiency-based criterion, according to which exchanges are fair when the parties gain sufficiently from them. The crucial question here is what qualifies as gaining ‘enough’?

The most common response, endorsed by both Ruth Sample (2003) and Jeremy Snyder (2008), is that parties gain enough when what they gain is sufficient to ensure their basic needs are met. More specifically, both authors argue that exploitation involves a failure to respect the value of those with who we transact. When we encounter others whose basic needs are unmet, we should help them because of the inherent value they possess as a human being. In contrast, exploiters see in the unmet basic needs of others not a cry for help but as an opportunity for profit. When they enrich themselves without ensuring these basic needs are met, they transact unfairly with them.

Although appeals to basic needs make sense intuitively, it is not clear that meeting basic needs is necessary or sufficient for an exchange to be fair. Two very poor persons who engage in an exchange are not necessarily exploiting each other even if they are incapable of meeting the other’s basic needs. Transactions can be fair despite basic needs being unmet. Conversely, two rich persons can still engage in a transaction in which the social surplus is unfairly distributed between them. \(A\) could buy \(B\)’s yacht for an unfairly low price. Such cases are certainly of less moral concern than unfair and exploitative exchanges between, say, a rich and a poor person, but this does not entail that the terms of the exchange are fair. Transactions can be unfair despite basic needs being met.

The basic needs account is relatively straightforward to interpret in the context of salary negotiations: it suggests that whatever the wage employers offer their employees, it should at least be sufficient to ensure the needs of these workers are met. But suppose \(A\) buys an apple from \(B\)’s stand: what, in this case, does the basic needs account identify as a fair price? Must \(A\) pay a price that meets \(B\)’s basic needs for a year? Surely not. A day? Perhaps, but what if \(B\) sells many apples? Does this mean \(A\) should pay less? The degree to which \(B\) is able to meet her needs via her apple stand depends on the market she finds herself in—the supply and demand for apples—as well as features about herself, such as how long or hard she works. One consequence of this observation is that the basic needs approach may be impossible to instrumentalize in discrete cases. A second consequence is that, since \(A\)’s meeting \(B\)’s basic needs depends, in part, on \(B\)’s own choices, a moral hazard problem arises (Ferguson 2016b). Indeed, this problem confronts all accounts of exploitation that are not responsibility sensitive.

Suppose that \(A\) knows that, should he become vulnerable for whatever reason, \(B\) will be obligated to constrain \(B\)’s advantage over \(A\)—perhaps by selling \(B\) goods for less than the normal market price. Given this knowledge, \(A\) might be tempted to take a risky gamble, knowing that if it doesn’t turn out well, \(B\) will be obligated to partly subsidize \(A\)’s loss. In effect, \(B\)’s obligation toward \(A\) puts \(B\) in a position of vulnerability, a vulnerability that \(A\) has the potential to unfairly take advantage of. In other words, \(A\)’s obligation not to exploit \(B\) renders \(A\) vulnerable to exploitation by B! To avoid this difficulty, it seems necessary to limit the kinds of vulnerabilities that trigger the obligation to constrain one’s advantage, perhaps by ruling out vulnerabilities for which agents are themselves morally responsible.

The moral hazard objection, problems with instrumentalising the approach and especially the insufficiency and non-necessity of the basic needs account suggest it is not very plausible as an account of fair exchange. However, this does not mean that basic needs and exploitation are unrelated. Exploitations that affect those who are very poor are, quite plausibly, morally worse than those affecting the rich. We can appeal to welfare levels to justify placing a greater concern on the exploitations of certain persons; those exploitations that leave persons unable to meet their basic needs are arguably the most pressing cases.

The basic needs approach is one of many possible accounts that appeal to sufficientarian distributive criteria. For the basic needs approach, the distribuendum is welfare and the distributive criterion requires that welfare is sufficient to meet basic needs. One could argue for an alternative version of a sufficiency-based distributive criterion, for example, by claiming that fairness requires greater levels of welfare than that which is sufficient to meet basic needs. Alternatively, one could argue for a different distribuendum, for example, by claiming that the social surplus, or embodied labour, or some other good must pass a certain threshold in order for the transaction to be fair. However, while these alternatives are conceptually possible, the basic needs approach remains the only widely defended sufficiency based account. Bargaining Solutions

A third family of substantive accounts of fairness are those that appeal to various rational bargaining solutions, such as the Nash (1950) solution. For these accounts, the distribuendum is the social surplus generated by exchange and the fairness criteria are those distributions that rational agents would agree upon.

Bargaining problems are a form of two person cooperative game, characterised by (i) the status quo point, that is, what bargainers would receive in the absence of an agreement; (ii) the feasible set of Pareto improving points, which is shaped by the transactors utility functions, and (iii) a solution concept, which selects a (usually unique and Pareto optimal) point in this set as the rational distribution. Nash’s solution is the unique point in the feasible set that maximises the product of the agents utility gain compared to the status quo point for a particular distribution. For example, suppose \(A\) wants to buy \(B\)’s phone and the two are bargaining over the price. \(B\)’s reservation price might be $100—she won’t sell her phone for less. \(A\)’s reservation price might be $200—he won’t pay any more than this for the phone. In this case, \(A\) and \(B\) are bargaining over a $100 surplus. For simplicity, let’s also make the (usually unrealistic) assumption that the transactors utility gains are linear with respect to money. In this case, \(A\) gains 100 utils if he gets the phone for $100 dollars and \(B\) gets 100 utils if she sells the phone for $200. The Nash solution is the price at which the value of multiplying \(A\)’s utils by \(B\)’s utils is maximised. As we can see in the following simplified table, in this case the Nash solution happens to also involve an equal split of the utility: when both gain 50 utils (which by our simplifying assumption is also $50) the product of the agents utilities is maximised.

Utility Gain \(B\)’s Utility Gain Product \((A\times B)\)
0 100 0
10 90 900
20 80 1600
30 70 2100
40 60 2400
50 50 2500
60 40 2400
70 30 2100
80 20 1600
90 10 900
100 0 0

Note that the Nash solution does not always select an equal distribution. If \(A\)’s utility increased linearly with his monetary gain, while \(B\) placed greater weight on the first $10 than she did on the next $10, a different distribution would result.

Nash argued that his solution was the rational solution to bargaining problems because it is the only solution that satisfies four axioms that, he argued, any agents not involved in a bargain would select as desiderata for a bargaining problem: Pareto optimality, utility invariance, symmetry, and independence. An alternative justification is provided by Brian Barry who argued that if the bargaininers were to hire an independent arbitrator to determine how gains should be distributed, “each side will refuse to accept any arbitrator whose decision it expects to be less favourable than the outcome of direct bargaining ...[A]n arbitrator who is acceptable to both sides must be one whose decisions approximate the Nash solution” (Barry 1991: 26—27).

Bargaining solutions, such as Nash’s, might identify outcomes that agents would be rational to agree upon, but are these distributions also fair? One concern is that they take the pre-bargaining status quo as given. Yet, the context that leads up to a transaction might play some role in what kinds of outcomes are fair. For example, suppose in our phone sale case that \(B\) is selling her phone because her hotel room was burgled while on holiday. \(B\) needs money now and the only item of value remaining in her possession is her phone. So, while \(B\) might, if given more time, be able to sell her phone for much as much as $1000, \(A\) is the only buyer she can find on short notice. \(B\)’s desperation lowers her reservation price and, consequently, alters the Nash solution as well. It isn’t necessarily the case that the outcomes of bargains resulting from circumstantial pressures are unfair, but when these pressures result from identifiable injustices, as in \(B\)’s case, the bargaining outcome appears unfair. This contextual insensitivity to the sources of bargaining power undermines the sufficiency of bargaining solutions as criteria for fair transaction.

There are also reasons to think that bargaining solutions are unnecessary as criteria for fair transaction. Suppose that the transactors’ status quo points are morally acceptable (so that there is nothing morally suspect about the Nash solution itself), but the transactors (irrationally) agree to an outcome that is not Pareto optimal. For example, it might be that 100 utils are up for grabs and the Nash solution dictates both receive 50% of the gains but both transactors irrationally ‘burn’ the same portion of their gains, each taking only 40 utils. This behaviour would be odd and, by definition, against each agent’s interests, but it does not seem that the distribution would be unfair. The point is that rationality may require optimisation, but fairness does not. Non-optimal distributions that preserve the proportionality of the Nash solution remain fair. If this is the case, arriving at the Nash solution is not strictly necessary for a fair transaction.

2.2.2 Procedural Unfairness

Problems with substantive accounts of fairness in transactions have led many philosophers to adopt procedural accounts, which, recall, identify unfairness with some procedural flaw in the transaction rather than with a particular transactional outcome. Here we survey three: Wertheimer’s (1996) fair market value account, Roemer’s (1982a,b) property relations account and Steiner’s (1984, 1987) historical rights-based account. Fair Market Value

There are good reasons to think that markets can tell us something about fair prices. A fair price, it seems should reflect how rare something is and how much others would like to have it. There are some goods, such as air or water, that are—at least in high-income countries—in abundant supply. Even though our demand for these goods is high, the supply of these goods is also considerable, meaning that they command relatively low prices on the market. In contrast, goods like a particular child’s primary school artwork may have low supply (perhaps only a few of little Jane’s or Tom’s Turkey-hand-collages exist in the world), but since demand for these goods is limited to the child’s parents, the price these goods would fetch on the market is low. Those goods that are both rare (low in supply) and popular (high in demand), like prime real estate, are expensive. Acquiring them requires giving up a greater amount of those resources we already have. And since there are many others who would like to have these rare goods, it is, intuitively, fair that one should have to give up more to obtain them.

However, fair prices cannot be associated with actual market prices because we often want to claim that actual market prices are unfair. Thus, while markets’ ability to make prices reflect goods’ scarcity and others demand for them may take us some way towards a procedure for generating a fair price, it seems that the conditions in which markets operate must also be fair themselves. Alan Wertheimer (1996) has argued that the fair price is the price that goods would fetch in a hypothetical competitive market that excludes asymmetries of information and undue pressure. Wertheimer argues that “fair market value” prices are prices at which neither party takes special unfair advantage of the other party’s decision-making capacity or special vulnerabilities in the other party’s situation (232). Such a price, he notes, “may or may not be a ‘just price’, all things considered, but it may well be a non-exploitative price” (232). Although the fair market value approach enjoys some intuitive appeal, it is unclear that Wertheimer’s conditions of pressure and full information are required for fair prices.

Consider full information. Information is a good that can be traded on the market itself. Obtaining information can be costly and time consuming. Indeed, information is the main commodity that universities trade in: students pay tuition in order to obtain information about their topics of study. The fair price for a university education may indeed differ from that which we find in current markets, but this does not mean that professors’ cannot profit from their own informational endowments. Of course, some informational asymmetries are indeed unfair. Asymmetries introduced by deception, for example, are characteristic of fraudulent transactions. There may also be moral limits on the returns one can enjoy from informational asymmetries. But the point is that mere asymmetries of information are not always unfair.

Now consider pressure. Suppose \(B\) forgot her lunch at home. Her willingness to buy a sandwich from \(A\) is now greater than it would have been had she not forgotten her lunch; she’ll pay more for a sandwich given than she’s forgotten her lunch than she would had she remembered it. In this case, \(B\)’s hunger exerts a pressure on her that causes her to pay \(A\) a higher price for a sandwich. But there’s nothing unfair about having to pay for (or pay more for) lunch because you forgot your lunch. Pressure does not necessarily make a transaction unfair. Yet, like asymmetries of information, pressure can lead to transactions that are, intuitively, unfair. If \(B\) is drowning and \(A\) offers to save her only if she pays him $100,000, many would say \(A\)’s offer takes unfair advantage of the undue pressure that the threat of drowning places on \(B\).

In situations involving informational asymmetries and pressure both the degree and source of these factors influences our willingness to say that effects they have on the terms of a transaction are unfair. We are less willing to say that \(B\) paying \(A\) more for a sandwich is unfair if the source of the pressure is such that it arises from \(B\)’s own choices. It is more plausible to say that \(B\)’s paying \(A\) more is unfair if the reason she is hungry is that \(C\) has stolen her sandwich. Similarly, the degree of pressure or asymmetric information also influences whether we are willing to say these factors give rise to unfair terms. The higher price \(B\) might pay given that she forgot her lunch might be fair while the price she might be willing to pay if she were starving might not be fair.

One way to capture these rough intuitions about the degree and source of factors that influence prices is to appeal to antecedent notions of justice. In other words, whether influence of pressure, information and other factors on price is fair depends on whether the distributions of information and pressure among the parties are just. In this case, the fair price would not be that which excludes all influence from pressure or informational asymmetries, but instead the price that we would find in a just market. Of course, there are many competing conceptions of justice. However, the next procedural account offers structural conditions that are, in principle, compatible with a wide range of approaches to justice. Unjust Property Relations and Historical Injustice

Many have found plausible Marx’s claim that employment relationships under capitalism are exploitative. But perhaps Marx was wrong to locate that exploitation in the particular details of the capitalist-employee relationship. After all, what makes exploitation possible at all on Marx’s view is a feature of the macro level distribution of property in society—specifically capitalists’ monopoly over the means of production. Marx’s formal theory of exploitation, however, makes no explicit mention of this property relation, focusing instead entirely on the interaction between capitalists and laborers at the point of production. The result, according to John Roemer, is a theory that is focused too much on the micro level of particular employment relationships and not enough on the macro level background of inegalitarian property distribution against which those relationships take place (Roemer 1982a,b).

On Roemer’s analysis, capitalist exploitation is essentially a form of social parasitism. One group (the capitalists) are made better off by the existence of a second group (workers), but that second group is made worse off by the existence of the first. More formally, according to Roemer’s account (1982b, 194—95), we may say that a group \(S\) in a larger society \(N\) is exploited by its complement group \(S'\) (relative to \(N\)) if and only if:[1]

  1. There is an alternative, which we may conceive of as hypothetically feasible, in which \(S\) would be better off than in its present situation [by withdrawing from society].
  2. Under this alternative, the complement group \(S'\) relative to \(N\) (i.e., \(S' = N - S\)), would be worse off than at present.
  3. \(S'\) is in a relationship of dominance to \(S\).

Later, in order to ensure that \(S'\) gained at the expense of \(S\), Roemer added the condition,

  1. If \(S'\) were to withdraw from society with its own endowments, then \(S'\) would be worse off than at present.

Roemer’s account clearly separates the structure of exploitation from the particular content that gives rise to exploitation claims. Different specifications of the withdrawal conditions in (1) yield different accounts of exploitation. For example, a relation that Roemer terms ‘feudal exploitation’ occurs when \(S\) would be better off withdrawing with their own endowments. Historically, feudal serfs were required to perform corvée labour on lords’ lands and/or required to pay rents in exchange for ‘protection’. Under the assumption that such ‘protection’ was not of real value, this arrangement was exploitative. Serfs would be better off withdrawing with their own labour and land and not paying the lords. Having lost the value of this labour or rent, lords would be worse off. Roemer identifies capitalist exploitation as a situation in which \(S\) is allowed to withdraw with their per capita alienable assets and socialist exploitation as a situation in which they withdraw with their per capita alienable and inalienable assets (such as skills and talents). Many other forms of exploitation are possible under the Roemerian structure. For example, \(S\) might be ‘Rawls Exploited’ if they would be better off withdrawing with the basic liberties and primary goods required by Rawls’s two principles of justice.

The separation of the structure of exploitation from its ethical content helps to clarify disagreement about whether a particular situation is exploitative. Two parties might disagree about whether capitalism is exploitative, for example, because they disagree about whether productive assets ought to be distributed in an egalitarian manner, while agreeing that exploitation does require something like the conditions Roemer outlines. On the other hand, parties might agree about the theory just distributions that informs Roemer’s forms of exploitation while disagreeing about whether Roemer’s conditions are necessary and sufficient for exploitation.

Note that Roemer’s definition is a partition of \(N\) into two mutually exclusive and jointly exhaustive subset groups. As such, it precludes the possibility of a third group with neutral exploitation status. This feature might not be particularly odd if we think that society divides rather crudely into two groups: exploiting capitalists and exploited workers. However, Roemer himself allows for and theorises the existence of more than two classes. One explanation for this feature of the definition is that it simply arises from Roemer’s coalitional approach.

Here we outline two critiques that have been raised against Roemer’s structural conditions: first, that an antecedent unjust distribution is not necessary for exploitation; second, that Roemer’s appeal to domination in condition (3) is ad hoc and unsatisfactory. (Note that Roemer does not explicitly state that the difference between the actual and hypothetical alternative is an injustice. Rather, this is an implicit assumption based on one’s selection of the hypothetical baseline. Nevertheless, many of Roemer’s critics have attributed to Roemer the assumption that the actual distribution is unjust. See, for example, Vrousalis 2013: 131.)

Many theorists agree that an antecedent injustice is necessary for exploitation. For example, Hillel Steiner’s account of exploitation holds that exploitation occurs when \(A\) gains more from an interaction, and \(B\) gains less, than they would have were it not for the existence of a prior injustice (Steiner 1984). So, for example, if \(A\) hires \(B\) as a laborer and is able to pay \(B\) a low wage of $2 per hour only because \(A\) (or someone else) has previously unjustly deprived \(B\) of alternative sources of labor, then \(A\) has exploited \(B\). If, on the other hand, the explanation for \(B\)’s earning only $2 does not involve injustice—if \(B\) simply does not have very valuable skills, or if there is a large supply of (not unjustly) unemployed laborers, then a $2 wage, no matter how insufficient it might be to meet \(B\)’s needs, and no matter how much more \(A\) could afford to pay, is not exploitative. Like Roemer’s account, Steiner’s has the advantage of being a structural account. Indeed, the two bear much in common. Roemer’s account is focused on “macro” issues pertaining to the distribution of property in society, while Steiner’s focuses on “micro” issues regarding how individuals treat each other within the framework created by that distribution (Ferguson and Steiner 2016: 545–546).

Like Steiner and Roemer, Ruth Sample agrees that exploitation can take the form of taking advantage of past injustice (Sample 2003: 74). If \(A\) uses the fact that \(B\) is disadvantaged as a result of past injustice for his own profit then, Sample argues, \(A\) has failed to treat \(B\) with respect and has exploited him for his own gain.

On the other hand, some theorists have argued that the source of vulnerability is irrelevant to the exploitative nature of a transaction. Robert Goodin, for instance, argues that exploitation consists in “playing for advantage in situations where it is inappropriate to do so”, and involves a violation of the moral norm of “protecting the vulnerable”. Importantly, Goodin holds that this norm applies “regardless of the particular source of their vulnerability” (Goodin 1987: 187). Thus, whether a worker is economically vulnerable because of a past injustice or whether her vulnerability derives from a normal fluctuation of the business cycle is irrelevant. To use that vulnerability to press one’s own advantage is exploitative. Wertheimer claims that “even in a reasonably just society, people will find themselves in situations in which they can strike an agreement that will produce mutual gain, and some of these cases will give rise to allegations of exploitation” (Wertheimer 1996, 9). Similarly, Nicholas Vrousalis rejects the claim that “\(A\) exploits \(B\) if and only if the exchange in which they are engaged occurs against the background of an unjust distribution”, and he concludes that “asset injustice furnishes no necessary condition for exploitation” (Vrousalis 2013: 148—149). Matt Zwolinski echoes these concerns, arguing that the kinds of background injustice to which Roemer’s conditions appeal is not necessary. Zwolinski claims that, “Offering to rescue an individual who became stranded in the desert because of her own poor planning in exchange for her entire net worth is wrongfully exploitative because of the unfairness of the terms of the transaction, not because of the history or institutional background to that transaction” (Zwolinski 2012, 171) (Vrousalis uses as similar case to motivate his objection). Zwolinski also argues that historical injustice is also not a sufficient condition, for we can imagine cases where parties gain from past injustice without thereby engaging in exploitation. If \(B\)’s home is unjustly burned to the ground by an arsonist, and a contractor \(A\) charges \(B\) a normal market price to rebuild it, then \(A\) has not exploited \(B\), despite the fact that \(A\) has profited from the injustice suffered by \(B\) (Zwolinski 2012: 172).

There are two ways Roemer—and those theorists who appeal to antecedent injustice in ‘historical’ accounts of exploitation—might resist the objections advanced by Vrousalis, Zwolinski and others. First, one could expand the scope of injustice (Ferguson 2020); alternatively, one could bite the bullet and attempt to explain why such cases are not, in fact, instances of exploitation (Ferguson 2016a). Let’s examine each in turn.

It is natural to restrict ‘injustice’ to actions caused by other persons. So, we might think that if \(B\) is drowning because \(A\) pushed her overboard, \(B\) is the victim of injustice; whereas, if she accidentally fell overboard, \(B\) is the victim of natural misfortune. Some philosophers (such as libertarians) have argued that these natural misfortunes do not trigger duties of justice for others. However, this position is far from universally accepted. Others, like Goodin, argue vulnerability triggers duties of justice regardless of the source of the duress. So, even if \(A\) is not responsible for \(B\) being in the water, justice may require that he provide her with aid. If \(A\) has such a moral duty to aid \(B\), but threatens to withhold aid in order to induce \(A\) to pay him, he coerces her (according to many prominent analyses of coercion) and when \(A\) benefits from this coercion, he exploits \(B\).

The extension of duties of justice to duress or vulnerability caused by natural misfortune handles some cases that motive a rejection of the claim that antecedent injustice is not necessary for exploitation, but this move is less appealing for cases in which a person’s disadvantage is self-caused. Suppose that rather than \(A\) pushing her or the sea rocking her overboard, \(B\) jumped into the ocean on purpose. Suppose that she immediately regrets her decision and asks \(A\) for rescue. While we might accept that \(A\) may be permitted to charge her more for rescue in this case than in situations involving natural disadvantage, many still believe fairness places some limit on the gains \(A\) can extract. Consequently, as Wertheimer, Vrousalis, and Zwolinski have argued, it appears that \(A\) can still take unfair advantage of \(B\) despite the absence of any antecedent injustice. One might continue to resist by arguing that \(A\)’s self-harm constitutes an injustice to herself, yet such a position is difficult to maintain and would certainly stretch the ordinary understanding of the scope of justice.

At this point, defenders of historical accounts might opt for an alternative defence, arguing that if the disadvantage that B uses to exploit \(A\) is indeed one that she is responsible for bringing about, then \(B\) does not exploit her when he benefits from this disadvantage. Support for this position is provided by the moral hazard objection, mentioned above: if \(A\) knows the consequences of her actions will be subsidised by \(B\) (by placing a constraint on the advantage \(B\) can reap from his future interactions with \(A\)), then \(A\) has an incentive to take risks, the consequences of which are at least partly borne by \(A\) (Ferguson 2016b). There is also an intermediate position available here. We might acknowledge that if \(B\) is responsible for her plight, then \(A\) is permitted to gain from \(B\)’s disadvantage, while also placing limits on the amount of gain that \(A\) can extract in such circumstances. As Serena Olsaretti has argued, the grounds of responsibility, which concern “the features of people that we can … hold them responsible for” differ from the fairness of the ‘stakes’ of their choices, the costs “attach[ed] to whatever features constitute the justifiable grounds of responsibility” (Olsaretti 2009: 170). An account of just stakes may therefore be used to make space for this intermediate position, where \(A\) can gain from \(B\)’s self-caused vulnerability, but only within certain limits.

Whether historical injustice is necessary for exploitation remains an open debate amongst exploitation theorists, with the main points of contention centred around scope of justice and the plausibility of any proffered bullet biting response (possibly tempered by the intermediate position).

The second objection to Roemer’s account is that his domination condition is ad hoc and unsatisfactory. As Kymlicka points out, the condition is ad hoc since it is “disconnected from the ‘ethical imperative’ [the distribution of productive assets] that [Roemer] identifies as the basis of exploitation theory” (Kymlicka 2002: 204 n. 13). And Roemer himself admits that lack of clarity regarding the concept of dominance prevents his account from being a “satisfactory analytical account of exploitation” (Roemer 1982b: 304 n. 12).

The motivation for the addition of a domination condition comes from cases like the following, from Jon Elster:

Consider a hypothetical society in which there are two groups of people, of equal size and with equal assets. They do not interact economically, that is, they produce and consume in isolation from each other. But they interact ideologically in the following way. Group \(R\) has a puritan religion that makes the members work long hours and produce much, but the religion only motivates them to work if they have before their eyes the lazy group \(S\) whom they smugly believe to be condemned to eternal suffering. Group \(S\) members work short hours, because they wrongly think that the rigid and to them abhorrent life style of group \(R\) is due to the long working hours, not to the religion. (Elster 1982: 369)

As Elster points out, \(S\) would be better off if they withdrew with their per capita assets, and R would be worse off. Thus, group \(R\) exploits \(S\). Yet, this appears to be the wrong result. The intuitive result to such cases is that the interaction between the groups isn’t of the right sort for it to count as a case of exploitation. It appears that we need something like a domination condition to qualify the kinds of behaviour that are appropriately described as exploitation. If one assumes that exploitation is a purely distributive phenomenon, then Roemer’s account, sans domination fails. Indeed, it is unclear how cases like Elster’s could be handled by tweaking the distributive conditions alone.

Yet, we needn’t accept the assumption that exploitation is purely distributive. We might, instead, adopt a two-factor account, where exploitation requires both the presence of unfairness and the presence of something like domination.

Indeed, as Benjamin Ferguson has argued, the most prominent accounts of fair transaction make unfair transactions pervasive. If exploitation is tantamount to unfair transaction, then exploitations are pervasive too. Yet, as he argues, if nearly all transactions are exploitative, “then what is the point of singling out particular practices, such as commercial surrogacy, sweatshops, and price gouging as wrongfully exploitative?” (Ferguson 2020: 536). Furthermore, the problem isn’t merely that exploitation might be widespread—after all, he notes, many other wrongs might also be widespread. Rather, the pervasiveness of unfair transaction is such that we can have good evidence to believe that a transaction is unfair (and thus, for purely distributive accounts exploitative) without knowing which party benefits unfairly. In such cases it would be inappropriate to blame either of the transactors, which, he argues, “conflicts with the ordinary intuition that exploiters are morally responsible and blameworthy for exploiting” (Ferguson 2020: 537). Ferguson argues that these problems can be overcome by appending a second condition that refers to exploiters’ attitudes to the standard requirement that exploitations are unfair. In the next section we consider three ‘attitudinal conditions’ that might be appended to the unfairness requirement.

2.3 Attitudinal Conditions

Accounts of exploitation that depart from the traditional analysis that relies only on unfairness generally append one of three attitudinal conditions. They claim that in addition to, or in place of unfairness, exploitation involves either domination, disrespect, or an awareness of one’s unfair advantage. In this section we survey each of these approaches.

2.3.1 Disrespect and Domination

Although many accounts of exploitation reference disrespect, relatively few characterise disrespect as an independent condition for exploitation. For example, Ruth Sample has argued that there are three ways we might fail to respect the value another person: “by neglecting what is necessary for their wellbeing…by taking advantage of an injustice…and by commodifying, or treating as a fungible object of market exchange, an aspect of that person’s being that ought not to be commodified” (2003:57). Later Sample acknowledges that, on its own, improper commodification does not lead to exploitation. Rather, improper commodification is one characteristic consequence of a prior vulnerability. Thus, her forms of disrespect reduce to taking advantage of past injustice and failing to meet basic needs.

While these two behaviours are no doubt disrespectful, they are also forms of transactional unfairness (discussed in section 2.2). In this case, an appeal to disrespect offers a deeper analysis by explaining what is wrong with the unfairness involved in exploitation, but it does not act as an additional necessary or sufficient condition for exploitation.

Similarly, Jonathan Wolff has argued that “to exploit someone is to make use of their circumstances in a way which fails properly to acknowledge their standing as an end in themself” (1999: 113). He then points out that the different traditions in moral philosophy—Kantian, Aristotelian, and Utilitarian—offer different accounts of what it means to treat others as ends in themselves. Yet, on Wolff’s analysis, each of these accounts ends up returning to fairness. For example, Wolff argues that “A Kantian interpretation of the baseline for exploitation—motivated by taking a Kantian interpretation of what it is to be an end in itself—leads us to a ‘fairness’ norm. Kantian exploitation … is to use another person’s vulnerable circumstances to obtain their actual compliance with a situation that violates norms of fairness” (1999: 114). Both Wolff’s and Sample’s analyses of the relationship between exploitation, unfairness, and disrespect are plausible, but neither characterizes disrespect as an additional condition that limits the scope of exploitation. If we want to avoid the problems for purely distributive accounts that Elster and Ferguson raise, we require conditions that do more than characterise exploitation as a distributively unfair transactional outcome.

An account that clearly distinguishes disrespect and unfairness is Nicholas Vrousalis’s domination-based account of exploitation. For Vrousalis, disrespect involves acting towards another in a way that is not “dialogically endorsable” that is, acting in a way that gives one “reason to feel shame or guilt for putting or allowing a particular form of justification for some putative act on the table of discourse” (2013: 140). Domination is a subset of disrespect that involves “\(A\) getting \(B\) to take [\(A\)’s] power over \(B\) as a reason for \(B\) to perform the power-directed act” (2021: 110). And exploitation is a subset of dominating acts that “obtains when the power-directed act, performed for the power-given reason, is geared towards \(A\)’s enrichment” (2021: 110). Thus, exploitations involve domination and domination disrespect. But crucially, for Vrousalis, unfairness is not a necessary condition for exploitation because fairness “is responsibility constrained equality”, but “exploitation can arise from any material inequality” (2013: 149, emphasis added). For Vrousalis, exploitation is a dividend of domination induced servitude, though not necessarily unfair.

Unlike Sample’s and Wolff’s appeals to disrespect, Vrousalis’s domination condition is distinct from the unfairness condition. However, it is unclear that Vrousalis’s account can do a better job of capturing intuitions about the scope of exploitation because, as Richard Arneson (2016) points out, it is difficult to see how the use of others’ vulnerabilities for self-enrichment is wrong if such use is not also unfair. He argues “One can readily identify examples in which people exploit the weaknesses of others—use these vulner- abilities to secure advantages for themselves—but in which there is no unfair division of advantages from the interaction and so nothing that qualifies as morally objectionable exploitation” (2016: 10). For example, suppose \(A\) is selling sandwiches and \(B\) is hungry. In such a case, \(B\) is vulnerable to \(A\): \(A\) controls a good that \(B\) desires and which contributes to her wellbeing. \(A\) can take advantage of this vulnerability to make a profit by selling \(B\) a sandwich. If \(B\) had her own sandwich with her she would not be willing to pay \(A\) for one of his, thus \(A\) can make use of \(B\)’s hunger to get her to pay him for the food. But unless the price \(A\) charges is also unfair—perhaps because \(A\) is the only seller, perhaps because \(B\) lacks a sandwich due to injustice, and so on—it is hard to see how \(A\)’s sandwich sale is wrong. Contrary to Vrousalis’s claims, it seems that unfairness is a necessary condition for exploitation.

2.3.2 Awareness

Although exploitation requires unfairness, it also seems to involve more than unfairness. As Wolff puts it, “somehow, there just seems to be more to exploitation than unequal exchange” (1999: 107). Benjamin Ferguson has argued that exploitation is best characterised by a two factor account, such that \(A\) exploits \(B\) in a transaction iff \(A\) gains unfairly from \(B\) in the transaction and \(A\) believes, or ought to have believed, that the gains he receives wrong \(B\) (2020: 535). Ferguson argues that this two-factor account solves two problems for existing accounts of exploitation. The first, which we have already seen, is the scope problem: if exploitation is merely tantamount to unfair transaction, then it seems that the scope of exploitation is too broad. The second problem is the blame problem. Ferguson argues that the best accounts of transactional fairness entail that unfair transactions are pervasive: the next transaction that you or I engage in is likely unfair. However, in most transactions we don’t know which party is gaining too much and which party is gaining too little. This epistemic consequence of pervasive unfairness means that we have no reason to blame either party of the transaction. Yet, blame typically accompanies charges of exploitation. To say that \(A\) exploits \(B\) is to say that \(A\) has done something for which he can be blamed.

Ferguson points out that in the subset of unfair transactions where \(A\) gains unfairly from \(B\) and \(A\) knows he gains unfairly from \(B\), we can blame \(A\) because \(A\) satisfies epistemic conditions for moral responsibility. And, of course, the scope of exploitation is constrained by the addition of this knowledge requirement. However, knowledge may be too restrictive for two reasons.

First, if knowledge requires something like justified true belief, \(A\) can believe he gains unfairly from \(B\) and his belief can be true, without \(A\) knowing he gains unfairly if \(A\)’s belief isn’t properly formed, that is, if his belief is unjustified. Suppose \(A\) thinks his transaction with \(B\) is unfair because he mistakenly accepts a false account of transactional fairness. Further, suppose that the true account of transactional fairness—whatever it may be—and the false account both entail that \(A\)’s transaction with \(B\) is unfair. If \(A\) believes the transaction is unfair on the basis of the false account, he lacks justification for this belief and so does not know that the transaction is unfair. If exploitation requires \(A\) to know the transaction is unfair, but \(A\) does not have this knowledge he does not exploit. Yet, intuitively, such cases still seem exploitative—indeed, it still seems appropriate to blame \(A\) for engaging in a transaction he believed was unfair (and that was unfair, albeit for different reasons than those \(A\) thought made it unfair).

Second, in some cases \(A\) may fail to form the belief that a transaction is unfair due to bias in his selection of evidence or how he weighs evidence. For example, consider slavery. If any kind of relation is exploitative, surely slavery is. Some slave holders surely knew slavery was unfair and yet continued to engage in the practice. But suppose some held false beliefs about a ‘natural’ hierarchy of races. In such a case they might fail to believe their interactions were unfair. Yet, their holding these false beliefs amounts to negligence: they were surely presented with evidence that contradicted them.

Changing the condition from knowledge to belief and making room for negligence addresses these problems, but even this relatively weak condition encounters problems, as Ferguson shows in the following case:

Suppose \(A\) believes exploitation does not involve unfairness, but only domination tout court. \(A\) believes he dominates \(B\), he believes transacting with her will exploit her, but as a domination theorist, he does not believe the transaction will be unfair. Suppose that \(A\) nevertheless transacts with \(B\) and his belief that it is a fair transaction is false. (2020: 542–43)

It is hard to deny that \(A\) exploits \(B\) in such a scenario, yet he does not believe the transaction is unfair, and so does not satisfy the belief-or-negligence condition. This counterexample can be addressed by modifying the proposition that \(A\) is required to believe. We needn’t require \(A\) to believe (or be negligent in failing to believe) ‘that the transaction is unfair’ but only the more general proposition ‘that the gains he receives wrong \(B\)’. Thus, Ferguson argues we can appropriately restrict the scope of purely distributive accounts and ascribe blame to exploiters if we understand exploitation as: \(A\) exploits \(B\) iff (1) \(A\) transacts unfairly with \(B\) and (2) \(A\) believes the gains he receives in the transaction wrong \(B\).

3. The Moral Weight and Force of Exploitation

The primary task of a theory of exploitation is to set forward the truth conditions for the claim, “\(A\) exploits \(B\)”. Beyond this purely conceptual project, however, there remain two more straightforwardly normative tasks. Adopting terminology from Alan Wertheimer, we can describe the first of these tasks as providing an account of the moral weight of exploitation, where moral weight refers to the intensity of exploitation’s wrongness. The second task is to provide an account of the moral force of exploitation, where moral force is understood to refer to “the various moral upshots of reasons for action that exploitation might or might not involve for parties to the transaction or for society” (Wertheimer 1996: 28).

When exploitation is harmful and nonconsensual, issues of both moral weight and force are relatively unproblematic. Whatever the added moral importance of the gain to \(A\) from the harm to \(B\), it is certainly at least prima facie wrong for \(A\) to harm \(B\) and it seems that the state is at least prima facie justified in prohibiting or refusing to enforce such transactions. But exploitation that takes place in the context of mutually advantageous and consensual transactions presents a more difficult set of problems. First, regarding the issue of moral weight, it might be thought that even if a transaction between \(A\) and \(B\) is unfair, there can be nothing seriously wrong about an agreement from which both parties benefit, particularly if \(A\) has no obligation to enter into any transaction with \(B\). At the very least, it seems difficult to show how a mutually advantageous (but unfair) interaction can be morally worse than no-interaction at all since, ex hypothesi, there is no party to the transaction for whom it is worse. In the recent literature on exploitation, this thought has been formulated more precisely as the “non-worseness claim”:

NWC: Interaction between \(A\) and \(B\) cannot be worse than non-interaction when \(A\) has a right not to interact with \(B\) at all, and when the interaction is mutually advantageous, consensual, and free from negative externalities (Wertheimer 1996, 2011; Zwolinski 2009; Powell and Zwolinski 2012).

Most exploitation theorists are skeptical that the NWC is correct (Wertheimer 1996; Bailey 2010; Arneson 2013; Barnes 2013; Malmqvist 2016). For if it were, then it would seem to be a mistake to blame individuals who engage in certain forms of mutually beneficial exploitation—for example, those who engage in “price gouging” by selling electrical generators to victims of natural disasters at inflated prices. (Zwolinski 2008). After all, we usually would not blame those individuals if they stayed home and did nothing. But, so long as people are willing to pay the high prices (and no coercion or fraud is involved), both parties are better off with the transaction than without it. So how could it be morally worse to provide those customers with some benefit than it is to provide them with no benefit at all?

Of course, the NWC need not lead to a deflationary account of the wrongness of exploitation. It could, instead, lead to an inflationary account of the wrongness of non-interaction. In other words, we can account for the NWC’s claim that mutually beneficial exploitation is not worse than non-interaction either by saying that mutually beneficial exploitation is less wrong than we thought it was, or by saying that non-interaction is worse than we thought it was: by saying that price gougers are less blameworthy than we thought, or by saying that those who stay home and do nothing to help victims of disaster are more blameworthy than we thought.

Even if mutually beneficial exploitation really is a serious moral wrong, however, it might not be a kind of wrong that can justify state intervention (Wertheimer 1996: Ch. 9). In other words, the question of the moral force of exploitation cannot be settled entirely by reference to its moral weight. Suppose \(A\) is a price gouger who sells bottles of water to disaster victims for $12 each. Even if \(A\) acts wrongly or fails to act virtuously, it is arguable that \(A\) does not harm anyone or violate anyone’s rights, and only harm or rights violations justify state intervention. If the state cannot force \(A\) to sell the water to \(B\), it might be thought completely irrational for the state to prohibit \(A\) and \(B\) from entering into a consensual and mutually advantageous transaction.

Moreover, there is a real danger that preventing mutually beneficial but exploitative transactions will wind up “consigning the vulnerable person to an even worse fate than being exploited” (Wood 1995: 156). After all, persons who are exploited are taken advantage of because of some antecedent vulnerability—a lack of access to clean drinking water, in the example above. Preventing exploitative transactions by itself does nothing to alleviate this vulnerability. Indeed, by depriving vulnerable parties of one possibility for improving their situation by engaging in a mutually beneficial transaction, such interference might actually exacerbate it.

Perhaps this view is correct. Bracketing arguments based on externalities, it seems perfectly plausible to maintain that the state is justified in interfering with transactions only if one party is violating the other’s rights. That said, those who invoke the concept of exploitation frequently maintain that such exploitation provides a reason for state intervention. For example, when it is claimed that commercial surrogacy exploits the birth mothers, the critics typically argue that surrogacy contracts should be unenforceable or entirely prohibited. Similar things are said about the sale of bodily organs. Those who make such arguments do frequently claim that the transactions are nonconsensual or harmful, but they seem prepared to make such arguments even if the transactions are consensual and mutually advantageous.

On what grounds might we justify interfering with consensual and mutually advantageous exploitative transactions? It might be thought that we could interfere on paternalistic grounds. A paternalistic argument could not justify interfering with exploitative transactions if the exploitative transaction is advantageous to \(B\) and if interference is not likely to result in a transaction that is more beneficial to \(B\). For paternalism justifies interfering for someone’s good, and this interference would not be to the target’s benefit. But there might be situations in which \(B\) knows enough to agree only to those exploitative transactions that are beneficial (as compared with no transaction), but does not know that less exploitative transactions are available. And so there may be a “soft paternalist” justification for interference with some mutually advantageous exploitative transactions.

We might also justify interfering with exploitative transactions on strategic grounds. Suppose that \(A\) enjoys a monopoly position, say, as a potential rescuer of \(B\). If we prohibit \(A\) from charging an exorbitant price for his services, then \(A\) might offer his services for a reasonable price. This argument would not justify interfering in a highly competitive market, for, under such conditions, \(A\) would not and could not offer his services for a better price. But there may be numerous situations in which such strategic arguments can work (Wertheimer 1996).

It is worth noting, however, that prohibiting exploitative transactions is not the only way in which the state or other moral agents might attempt to respond to its wrongful nature. Prohibition is an example of what Allen Wood describes as “interference”. But in addition to interference, Wood suggests that we can think of redistribution as a way in which third parties such as the state might attempt to prevent exploitation (Wood 1995: 154). After all, exploitation is only possible because \(B\) is in a position of vulnerability relative to \(A\) . One way to prevent exploitation, then, is to address this vulnerability directly—to channel resources to \(B\) so as to remove the hardship that makes him vulnerable to exploitation in the first place. If workers in the developing world had an adequate social safety net to fall back on, for instance, they would be less inclined to accept a job with the harsh conditions of a sweatshop, and therefore less vulnerable to exploitation by their employers.

4. Applied Issues in Exploitation Theory

Questions about exploitation arise in a wide variety of different contexts, not just in the domain of political philosophy but in various areas of applied ethics as well such as business ethics, biomedical ethics, and environmental ethics. In addition to the topics discussed briefly below, the concept of exploitation has played a central role in debates over payday lending (Mayer 2003), clinical research in the developing world (Hawkins and Emanuel 2008), markets for human organs (Hughes 1998; Taylor 2005), guest worker programs (Mayer 2005), and price gouging (Zwolinski 2008).

4.1 Universal Basic Income

Some theorists, such as Philippe van Pairjs, have argued that justice requires that the state institute a universal basic income (UBI). A UBI is a cash transfer, funded by taxes, that would be paid to all citizens regardless of need, and regardless of whether they are working, or even willing to work (van Parijs 1995). Against this, some critics have charged that a basic income would facilitate a form of exploitation. As Stuart White argues,

where others bear some cost in order to contribute to a scheme of cooperation, then it is unfair for one to willingly enjoy the intended benefits of their cooperative efforts unless one is willing to bear the cost of making a relevantly proportionate contribution to this scheme of cooperation in return. (White 1997: 317–318)

As is so often the case in dealing with exploitation claims, assessing this objection requires us to grapple with a complicated mix of empirical and normative claims. On the empirical side, for instance, we might ask whether a basic income really would lead to a net increase in reciprocity-violating transfers. Some theorists have argued that a basic income would actually increase incentives to work relative to currently existing welfare programs, by lowering the effective marginal tax rate faced by low-wage workers (Tobin 1966). Others have emphasized the role of unpaid labor in the economy, such as domestic labor, and argued that a basic income would lead to a fairer application of the reciprocity principle than welfare systems that condition benefits on doing paid work (Pateman 2004). Normatively, the objection challenges us to think about both what the ideal of reciprocity requires and how it fits within a system of broader distributive justice. Some advocates of basic income have argued that a liberal-egalitarian theory of justice is correct and requires an equal distribution of scarce resources such as land rent and the rent component of wages (van Parijs 1997: 329). Reciprocity may be an important political value, such theorists argue, but it is one that is to be applied only after people have been given what they are due at the basic level of justice.

4.2 Sweatshop Labor

The term “sweatshop” is usually used to refer places of employment that utilize low-skill workers, often in the developing world, and that are characterized by low wages, long hours, and unsafe working conditions. In many cases, sweatshops produce goods on contract for large, multinational enterprises, who then sell those goods to customers in wealthier societies.

Many critics see sweatshop labor as highly exploitative. A large part of the debate over this claim has focused on the issue of wages. Critics claim that sweatshops have a moral obligation to pay a living wage to their workers. This duty is grounded in the extreme need of sweatshop workers, the fact that sweatshops and the multinational enterprises with which they contract rely on them to produce the goods that they sell, and the fact that the multinational enterprises are profitable enough that they can afford to increase workers’ wages without jeopardizing the health of their business (Meyers 2004; Snyder 2008). Some critics, however, see sweatshops’ low wages as merely one symptom of a broader failure to respect workers as persons who are ends in themselves. That failure of respect manifests itself in sweatshops violation of legal labor standards, their exposure of workers to physically dangerous conditions, and their abuse and coercion of workers on the job (Arnold and Bowie 2003: 227–233).

Once again, a number of difficult empirical and normative issues come out in this debate. The empirical issues include not only questions about what conditions in sweatshops are actually like—how low wages actually are relative to other firms in the developing economy, for instance—but what effects various attempts to remedy sweatshop conditions would actually have. Would a higher legal minimum wage improve workers’ overall well-being, or would it instead lead to layoffs and plant relocations (Powell and Zwolinski 2012)? On the normative side, the Non-Worseness Condition seems to pose an especially significant challenge to critics of sweatshop labor. If sweatshops, by providing jobs and capital infusion in the developing world, provide some benefit to workers there, how can they be acting in a morally worse way than wealthy firms that do not outsource their production at all, and thus provide no benefit to needy workers abroad (Zwolinski 2007; Preiss 2014)? Another question: even if we grant that sweatshops exploit their workers, and that exploitation is a significant moral wrong, might it be a wrong that is all-things-considered justifiable if sweatshop labor nevertheless confers considerable benefits on current workers, and plays an important role in economic growth? In other words, how much weight should a valid claim of exploitation have in our overall judgment of the justice of a practice or of a set of institutions that permit that practice?

4.3 Commercial Surrogacy

Commercial surrogacy is a practice in which a woman is paid to become pregnant as a result of either artificial insemination or the implantation of an already fertilized egg, and to surrender her parental rights to the intended parent(s). In the United States, most surrogacy arrangements are purely domestic affairs (with both the intended parents and the surrogate being citizens of the United States), but a significant number are international, in which the surrogate mother is often a citizen of a much poorer country.

Both types of surrogacy arrangement have been subjected to criticism on a number of distinct grounds. Some have argued that surrogacy involves an objectionable form of “commodification”, while others have argued that the practice is harmful to children, or to women as a class. But many have also argued that the practice exploits the women who serve as surrogates. In the case of international surrogacy, this charge is usually based on the bad circumstances and low pay of the women who serve as surrogates. The lack of alternative sources of employment has been said to undermine women’s consent, and the compensation they receive is often extremely low compared to the pay received by American surrogates for the same service—sometimes as low as 10%.

In the case of domestic surrogacy, critics charge that surrogate mothers are young and do not fully understand the physical and psychological risks that attend the services they are agreeing to provide. As a result, the arrangement might be harmful on net to them despite the fact that they consent to it. Or, even if it is not harmful on net, the payment they receive might be inadequate compensation for the costs they incur, thus rendering surrogacy a case of mutually beneficial but unfair and exploitative exchange (Tong 1990).

Questions of fair compensation for surrogates raise many of the same issues, and give rise to many of the same debates, as are found in the literature on sweatshop labor (Wilkinson 2003). But unlike the sort of labor that takes place in sweatshops, some critics believe that commercial surrogacy arrangements are intrinsically wrong. If women’s reproductive labor is not the sort of service that should be sold at any price, then commercial surrogacy may involve a kind of exploitation insofar as it entices women to engage in an activity that is harmful to their moral character (Anderson 1990; Wertheimer 1996: Ch. 4).


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Matt Zwolinski <mzwolinski@sandiego.edu>
Benjamin Ferguson <benjamin.ferguson@warwick.ac.uk>
Alan Wertheimer

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