Feminist Social Epistemology
Many of the significant contributors to the fast-developing field of social epistemology have been feminist epistemologists, theorists who investigate the role of gender in knowledge production. Motivated by the political project of eliminating the oppression of women, feminist epistemologists are interested in how the norms and practices of knowledge production affect the lives of women and are implicated in systems of oppression. Feminist epistemologists seek to understand not only how our social relations of gender have shaped our knowledge practices, but also whether and how these relations should play a role in good knowing. Feminists have distinguished between the categories of gender and (anatomical) sex, and for decades have focused much of their attention on gender, the analytical category capturing the cultural and social aspects of sexed bodies. As a category of social relations then, gender is a significant area of investigation for social epistemology. Additionally, feminist epistemologists have increasingly attended to the interrelations between gender and other social categories such as race and ethnicity, class, sexuality, ability status, and global location, investigating their significance for knowledge.
Elizabeth Anderson characterizes feminist epistemology as properly belonging within social epistemology, describing it as “the branch of social epistemology that investigates the influence of socially constructed conceptions and norms of gender and gender-specific interests and experiences on the production of knowledge”(1995a, 54). It may be too strong a claim to suggest that all projects of feminist epistemology fall within the realm of social epistemology; it could be argued that some projects of feminist epistemology, such as Louise Antony’s defense of epistemological individualism (1995), resist at least certain elements of a social epistemology. Similarly, theorists who argue that there are epistemically valuable feminine ways of knowing integral to women, without providing a social analysis, could also be viewed as resisting certain elements of a social epistemology. Nevertheless, by far the majority of work in feminist epistemology is best understood as a form of social epistemology.
Feminist social epistemology represents more than just a small subset of social epistemology, however. The significant body of work of feminist social epistemologists has provided key theoretical resources for understanding the breadth and depth of the social dimensions of knowing. The interest of feminist social epistemologists in how gender plays out in knowledge practices is generalizable to an interest in how power relations play out epistemically, especially systematic relations of power. Their focus on power relations has led some to characterize feminist social epistemologists as falling on the radical end of the social epistemology spectrum (Goldman 2001; Kitcher 1994). Radical or not, few feminist epistemologists reduce knowledge to power politics, even as they draw attention to them. One of the key features of feminist epistemologies responsible for some of their significant contributions within social epistemology has been their serious commitment to developing normative epistemological accounts.
Social epistemology distinguishes itself from sociology of knowledge in its goal of providing a normative analysis of knowledge (Fuller 1988; Schmitt 1994a), seeking not only to describe our current social practices of knowledge production, but also to understand how we ought to know and how we can improve our knowledge practices. There is little agreement among social epistemologists on the scope or form of such normativity. However, feminist social epistemologists have felt this need to incorporate a normative dimension to their social analyses in a particularly pressing way: feminist political demands for the elimination of oppression are normative in a moral sense, but they also depend on epistemically normative claims for their justification. Their force depends on the ability to distinguish between better and worse claims to knowledge, for example by criticizing sexist knowledge claims and supporting non-sexist knowledge claims. Feminists can ill afford to simply describe the ways in which social relations such as gender currently shape knowledge practices if they are to defend their claims for social change. Thus, feminist social epistemologists have a particularly strong motivation to develop rich accounts that tease epistemic normativity out of a power-sensitive social understanding of knowledge production.
As is true of social epistemology as a whole, there is a great deal of variation in the theories and approaches constituting feminist epistemology and few generalizations can be made across the field. Acknowledging such variety, some theorists refer only to “feminist epistemologies” in the plural, fearing that characterizing a single field of feminist epistemology implies a greater unity than exists. Others have argued that feminist epistemology should best be identified not by its specific theoretical content, but rather by what “doing epistemology as a feminist” amounts to (Longino 1999). Doing epistemology as a feminist involves bringing one’s feminist concerns and sensibilities to the epistemological table. As a result of bringing such concerns to epistemological work, significant feminist contributions to social epistemology have included extensive critiques of the individualism of contemporary analytic epistemology, the development of alternative models of knowers as social beings, defenses of the appropriate role of values and other culturally relative factors in knowing, the development of socially informed conceptions of objectivity, analyses of the challenges of knowing under social conditions of oppression, and analyses of the epistemic benefits of social justice and democratic institutions.
- 1. Historical Development
- 2. Social Models of Knowers
- 3. Social Models of Knowledge and Objectivity
- 4. Epistemic Values, Ethics, and Democracy
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
As the second wave of feminism progressed throughout the 1970s, feminist philosophical work began to appear, first in ethics and political philosophy. At the same time, feminists working in other disciplines such as the social sciences were documenting the sexism and androcentrism in their fields. These theorists increasingly found the methodologies of their disciplines incapable of accounting for their feminist insights. Their interests turned to epistemological issues when it became apparent that alternative accounts of knowledge and of justification were required “in order to overthrow presuppositions in their disciplines which functioned as obstacles to necessary change” (Longino 1999, 330).
Two of the earliest pieces clearly identifiable as feminist epistemology were Lorraine Code’s “Is the Sex of the Knower Epistemically Significant?” appearing in 1981 in Metaphilosophy and Sandra Harding’s “Is Gender a Variable in Conceptions of Rationality: A Survey of Issues” appearing in 1982 in Dialectica. The first significant collection of articles in feminist epistemology appeared in 1983 with Sandra Harding and Merrill Hintikka’s Discovering Reality: Feminist Perspectives on Epistemology, Metaphysics, Methodology and Philosophy of Science. Soon after the Harding and Hintikka volume, rates of publication in feminist epistemology picked up significantly. By contrast, although there are clear historical roots to the current form of the field (Goldman 2001), social epistemology didn’t make its presence felt on the terrain of contemporary epistemology until the late 1980s and early 1990s. Steve Fuller’s book Social Epistemology appeared in 1988 and in 1994 Schmitt’s volume Socializing Epistemology appeared, the first significant collection of work in contemporary social epistemology (1994b). Though few articles in this collection make specific reference to feminist epistemology, in his introduction Schmitt acknowledges feminist philosophers of science, along with sociology of science, and naturalistic epistemology as the major inspirations for social epistemology since 1980 (Schmitt 1994a, 3–4).
The Harding and Hintikka volume represented several angles of research, and set the stage for future discussions within feminist epistemology. Several pieces undertook deconstructive projects, demonstrating how masculinist perspectives and assumptions infiltrate the philosophies of particular historical figures. Other selections focused on science studies, offering illustrations of the congruence between specific scientific theories and the social and political ideologies of the day, including patriarchal ideologies. Still others represented reconstructive epistemological projects in response to such findings, arguing for a requisite role of values in scientific theorizing, or arguing that rational investigation requires a critical assessment of the metaphysical (and sometimes gendered) assumptions underlying a field of study. Additionally, Nancy Hartsock’s contribution to the volume outlined her version of feminist standpoint theory, invoking the Marxist idea that social position is inversely related to epistemic position. Standpoint theory offered an extensive argument for the grounding of epistemic perspective in one’s social position, and would soon form one of the most fruitful and heavily debated areas of theorizing for feminist epistemologists.
As feminists turned to the reconstructive projects of developing new epistemologies, one of their major tasks was to explain the connection between the rise of the feminist movement and the recognition of sexism and androcentrism in what had previously been taken to be excellent cases of objective knowledge production. Why was it only with the rise of the feminist movement that critiques of the role of gendered assumptions in canonical figures such as Aristotle and Descartes began to appear? Why did primatology begin to question research based on male dominance schemas and begin to develop alternative models involving closer observation of female primate behavior at the same time that there was an increase in the number of women in the field? Why did it take feminist psychologists to point out the androcentrism involved in drawing conclusions about human beings based on all-male studies? In her contribution to the Discovering Reality volume, Sandra Harding phrased the question as “Why has the Sex/Gender System Become Visible Only Now?” To answer it, feminists very clearly needed to develop social epistemologies. They needed to show not only how feminist interests might motivate such knowledge production, but also how such feminist motivated work could offer what many (feminists and nonfeminists alike) considered improved knowledge production, not just alternative knowledge production.
Harding’s 1986 book The Science Question in Feminism examined various epistemological options for feminists seeking to explain such political-epistemic connections within science. She set out what was to become a classic tripartite taxonomy of feminist epistemologies: feminist empiricism, feminist standpoint theory and feminist postmodernism. Harding characterized feminist empiricism as arguing that the sexist and androcentric biases present in science are the result of “bad” science and can be corrected by stricter adherence to traditional norms of science, as represented by the feminist critiques identifying such biases (for example Bleier 1984; Hubbard 1983; Longino and Doell 1983). Feminist standpoint theory, according to Harding, argues that the political engagement of feminists and their corresponding focus on the lives of women leads to an epistemically privileged “standpoint” on social reality (for example Hartsock 1983; Rose 1983; Smith 1974), with the political engagement requirement distinguishing the idea of a standpoint from the more generic idea of a “perspective”. In contrast, feminist postmodernism, skeptical of universal claims of reason and the progress of science, argues that only political solidarity across social locations can ground feminist findings, there being no independent epistemological groundings (for example Flax 1990; Haraway 1991).
Feminist epistemologies continued to multiply throughout the 1980s and early 1990s, quickly cross-fertilizing and in the process undermining Harding’s classification system. Few current works in feminist epistemology fall unequivocally into a single category given Harding’s three original definitions. For example, the leading theories of feminist empiricism from the 1990s on have very little in common with Harding’s characterization of feminist empiricism, given that they do not explain past instances of sexism and androcentrism as simply “bad science” and they do not accept traditional norms of science as appropriate correctives (Longino 1990, 2002; Nelson 1990, 1993). Even Harding has developed her own position as a blend of standpoint theory and feminist postmodernism (Harding 1991). In spite of their significant limitations, however, Harding’s divisions are still often cited, and remain useful in characterizing some of the main directions of the literature.
Much of the early work in feminist social epistemology was highly critical of many mainstream epistemological approaches. As feminists turned to their reconstructive projects in the early 1990s, however, they focused their criticisms on particular versions of epistemology, recognizing that not all existing epistemologies were equally difficult to work with. In particular, post-Kuhnian historically-oriented philosophies of science as well as naturalized epistemology proved to be very important resources. Besides the fact that many feminists have been particularly interested in the workings of science as a dominant force in society, they have also found many forms of philosophy of science comparatively open to social analyses. This openness stems from a recognition of the historically dynamic nature of knowledge not often evident in analytic epistemologies that focus on the general conditions of knowledge rather than the specific methodologies and activities of the sciences. Even more prominently, naturalized epistemology has proven to be very conducive to analyses of the role of gender in knowing. It demands that we look and see, turning to empirical evidence of how in fact we do know rather than making a priori announcements concerning how we know. Thus, where it has been easy for certain forms of analytical epistemology to dismiss feminist empirical findings of the role of gender in knowledge as irrelevant to questions of serious epistemological import, naturalized epistemology insists that such empirical findings must have something important to tell us about knowledge production, or at a minimum, must be accounted for. Hence naturalized epistemology cannot consistently dismiss such findings of the role of gender. Despite the individualism of many naturalized epistemologies, a naturalized approach can operate as a very strong argument for a social epistemology: looking at how human beings know leaves little doubt that the vast majority of our knowing takes place socially. Even if the “socially” is understood in the minimal sense of individuals interacting with each other by exchanging information, this social interaction has the potential to be infused with the dynamics of gender, opening the door for analyses of how gender affects knowledge exchanges. While rejecting his individualism, many feminist epistemologists have relied heavily on the resources of Quine, from his overall naturalized approach to the specifics of his holistic theory of evidence (Antony 1993; Campbell 1998; Nelson 1990, 1996). Other feminists have followed by adopting a strongly pragmatic model, encouraging an empirical process of decision making in which truth is assigned locally and fallibly, and issues of skepticism that have plagued epistemology are demoted (Clough 2003).
Throughout the 1990s, the output of works in feminist social epistemology was rich and varied. Early in the decade substantive works appeared in feminist philosophy of science (Harding 1991; Longino 1990; Nelson 1990) along with significant developments in standpoint theory (Collins 1990; Harding 1991), postmodern feminist epistemology (Haraway 1991) and analyses of the role of subjectivity in knowing (Code 1991). By the mid-1990s, articles of feminist social epistemology were making appearances in numerous mainstream analytic philosophical journals, with special issues devoted to feminist epistemology in The Monist (1994), Philosophical Topics (1995) and Synthese (1995). Throughout the decade, the work of feminist social epistemologists addressed many issues being taken up by other social epistemologists as well: the dynamics of testimony and relations of cognitive authority, communal analyses of evidence and epistemic agency, the social structure of scientific knowledge, social conceptions of objectivity, and understandings of knowledge as social practice. In 2002, Social Epistemology devoted a special issue to “Feminist Epistemology as Social Epistemology” in which it was noted that social epistemology and feminist epistemology shared many challenges and were similarly positioned against “a dominant epistemological tradition of hypernormative and individualistic analysis” (Grasswick and Webb 2002). The journal Episteme, which began in 2004 as a journal of social epistemology (though it later broadened its scope to cover both individual and social epistemology) devoted two issues in 2006 to questions of the epistemic relevance of diversity. Yet despite feminist epistemology’s shared interests with others in the developing field of social epistemology, there has been perhaps less cross-pollination over the years than one might expect. A partial explanation for this lies in the different intellectual agendas that drive the development of the respective fields, including the fact that nonfeminist social epistemologists have generally had a less political agenda than feminist social epistemologists. For example, feminist social epistemologies have been driven by, and focused on, epistemological questions directly pertinent to knowing under conditions of oppression, conditions that are very significant for feminists to come to understand. Ultimately, the direction of feminist social epistemology as a field has been guided by the needs and challenges of feminist theory and activism. A good example of this is evident in the shift to a broadening of social identity categories taken to be epistemically relevant. As feminist theory in all its guises developed throughout the 1980s and early 1990s, it became apparent that gender was not the only significant social category, and more importantly that gender could not be properly understood in isolation from other social categories such as race and ethnicity, class, sexuality, ability status, and global location. Many feminist theorists were criticized on the grounds that their focus on gender had assumed a commonality across women and paid inadequate attention to the ways in which one person’s gendered experience is simultaneously shaped by their other social positions. The feminist commitment to investigating the role of power relations in epistemic matters (whatever form they took) soon revealed that the relevant power relations were complex and dynamic. As a result, feminist social epistemology began to attend more closely to the intersections between various social categories. By 1993, Alcoff and Potter noted that feminist epistemology should no longer be taken “as involving a commitment to gender as the primary axis of oppression, in any sense of ‘primary,’ or positing that gender is a theoretical variable separable from other axes of oppression and susceptible to a unique analysis” (Alcoff and Potter 1993, 3–4). Nevertheless, they suggested the continued use of the term “feminist epistemologies” as marking the body of work that has historically evolved out of a concern with the relations between gender and knowledge (Alcoff and Potter 1993, 4).
One of the major contributions of feminist social epistemologies has been their thorough critique of the individualism of modern epistemology, and their corresponding reconstructions of epistemic subjects as situated knowers. Elizabeth Anderson argues that it is feminist epistemologies’ investigation into “how the social location of the knower affects what and how she knows” that properly place them within the realm of social epistemologies (Anderson 2011). Along with other social epistemologists, feminists have found themselves at least initially presenting their work as responses to a dominantly individualistic tradition. From the Cartesian beginnings of modern epistemology where knowledge was thought to result from the careful exercise of an individual’s mental faculties, to the dominant contemporary epistemological frameworks resting on “S knows that p” formulations where “S” can be any epistemic subject, feminist social epistemologists have drawn attention to the inadequacies of the abstract individualism prevalent in epistemology (Code 1991; Jaggar 1983; Scheman 1995). The problems, feminists have argued, lie not simply in the claim that knowers are primarily individuals, but rather that these individual knowers are themselves conceptualized as generic (or interchangeable) and self-sufficient (or capable of self-sufficiency) in knowing (Code 1991; Grasswick 2004). The conjunction of these three features forms what has been called the atomistic model of knowers. The model does not deny that knowers have identities and social locations, but it does deny that these are relevant features to include in epistemic assessments. Though not a full-fledged solipsism, the atomistic view puts forth a methodological solipsism for epistemological purposes (Potter 1993), and is antithetical to social analyses of knowledge. For example, if one’s epistemology begins with the assumption that all knowers are interchangeable, then any differences in individuals based on social location, including gender, will be deemed epistemically irrelevant from the start. Similarly, if one’s epistemology begins with the assumption that knowers are or can be self-sufficient, analyses will focus on the types of knowledge that might be attainable in solitude, such as simple observational expressions as “The cat is on the mat”, ignoring more complex knowledge, such as “the economy is in a recession”, or “our society suffers from patriarchy”, and leaving out of the analysis the social interactions that make many forms of knowledge possible. Many feminists have identified the prevalence of the atomistic model within epistemology as an obstacle to the development of an accurate understanding of the epistemic roles of gender and other features of identity that track systematic power relations, arguing that alternative, more social models of knowers are necessary.
In the early 1990s, feminist attention to the identity of the epistemic subject abounded in such titles as Who Knows? (Nelson 1990), What Can She Know? (Code 1991) and Whose Science? Whose Knowledge? (Harding 1991). “Situated knowers” became a key term in feminist epistemologies, though theorists varied significantly on the specifics of the concept. Some focused on the socially differentiated nature of knowers (in contrast to the generic nature of knowers in the atomistic model), while others focused on their social interactive nature (in contrast to the self-sufficiency of knowers in the atomistic model). Still others argued for the adoption of the community as primary knower (in contrast to the individual as primary knower in the atomistic model). Many of these arguments intersect with each other. For example, by emphasizing the differentiated nature of knowers one strengthens the argument for the epistemic interdependence of knowers; interaction between knowers becomes crucial so that individuals can access knowledge beyond the reach of their specific social location. Since conceptions of knowers carry normative weight, making distinctions between those who know and those who don’t, or between those who know more or less well, feminist discussions of situated knowers are very much integrated with their discussions of the objectivity and justification of knowledge claims (see Section 3: Social Models of Knowledge and Objectivity).
At the core of many the feminist discussions of knowers is the idea that experiential differences lead to differences in perspective, and these perspectival differences carry epistemic consequences. At first, this suggestion may appear epistemically innocuous. Even a staunch supporter of the atomistic view can acknowledge that we don’t all share the same experiences, and if one is an empiricist, holding that one obtains knowledge primarily through experience, one can acknowledge that different experiences will lead to different knowledge bases. But for the atomist, this point is not epistemically interesting, because a different knower could know the same thing as another if she were to have the particular experience in question. In this sense, knowers are interchangeable for the atomist. Feminists who argue for the epistemic relevance of the identity of knowers, however, are interested in forms of knowing for which it is questionable whether a differently located knower could have the same experience. To give an obvious example, sex-specific bodily experiences, such as knowing pain during childbirth, cannot be accessed by members of the other sex. Feminists arguing for differentiated knowers expand this idea, suggesting that there is a vast range of experiences differentiated along the lines of social location. In a gender-structured society, for example, a girl’s experience in math class might differ significantly from her male counterpart’s experience. The differences in knowers that feminists attend to are not random or idiosyncratic, but are socially structured and systematic, with the potential to be major influences on people’s lives. The feminist arguments that gender is an epistemically relevant category of social location apply only as long as the society under consideration is structured along the lines of gender.
What makes these feminist arguments interesting is that they do more than argue for a direct link between having a certain experience and obtaining a certain piece of knowledge (though they include such cases in their analyses too). The intervening concept is that of perspective. If social location shapes one’s perspective on the world (through differential experiences) and we can only interact with the world and know it through that perspective, then the areas of knowledge for which one’s social location is relevant may be very broad indeed, and may include areas of knowledge not obviously connected to the experiences of a particular social location. According to these arguments, one’s perspective both shapes and sets limits on how a particularly located individual can know, at least through her own achievements. Such arguments also suggest that institutions of knowledge production that are dominated by a particular group may be influenced by the perspective of that group, without that perspective being recognized. For example, many who argue that the underrepresentation of women in science is a concern do so not simply from the belief that women should be afforded equal opportunities, but also out of a worry that the science might be shaped by a dominant masculine perspective (Addelson 1983; Keller 1985; Lloyd 1984), making the underrepresentation of women an epistemic issue as well as a justice issue.
Feminist standpoint theory has done the most to articulate the importance of perspectival differences stemming from social location. Adopted from elements of Marxist theory, feminist standpoint theory also represents one of the more thorough attempts to ground epistemology and, correspondingly, a view of knowers in a social theory. It ties social location very closely to epistemic position, arguing that social locations not only vary from an epistemological point of view, but that some social locations offer the potential to be more epistemically reliable than others. According to strands of Marxist materialism developed by Georg Lukács, one’s social position with respect to material labor is inversely related to one’s epistemic position. Society is structured primarily along the lines of two classes, the working class (proletariat) and the capitalists (the bourgeoisie) who own the means of production. As the privileged class, the capitalists have a motivation to maintain the status quo, and this interest interferes in their ability to understand the exploitation of the working class upon which their capitalist privilege depends. The working class, however, as the socially underprivileged, can achieve a richer understanding of social relations; they not only have a motivation to understand the true nature of the exploitation to which they are subject (in order to be able to end to the exploitation), but their position offers the potential for a dual vision. Since they are subject to the rules of the capitalists who wield social power, the working class has an understanding of the capitalists’ view of the world. But additionally, they have an experiential understanding of their own lives as the exploited. Thus, their position as socially underprivileged affords them the possibility of an epistemic privilege stemming from this dual vision.
Early feminist standpoint theory draws on these ideas, but rests on a sexual division of labor rather than class divisions. Sociologist Dorothy Smith argues for the epistemic advantage women sociologists have over male sociologists in their experience of a “bifurcated consciousness”, caught as they are between the conceptual world of sociology and the material world of their lives as women (Smith 1974). Nancy Hartsock’s 1983 articulation of the theory argues that women’s contributions to subsistence and childrearing result in a systematic difference of experience across the genders. Accordingly, the activities of women that place them in a socially underprivileged position can form the basis of a privileged epistemic standpoint, through which a deeper understanding of patriarchal institutions and ideologies can be reached (Hartsock 1983). For most feminist standpoint theorists, including Hartsock, a standpoint is understood as an “achieved stance” and is not just a synonym for a “perspective”. The achievement of an epistemically privileged standpoint involves a political engagement that makes clear to the socially underprivileged the shared nature of their experiences of oppression and reveals the systematic structure of power relations.
Feminist standpoint theories have developed substantially over the years, especially in response to feminist theorists’ recognition that gender cannot be understood in isolation from other social categories. For example, the highly influential work of Patricia Hill Collins puts forth the idea of a black women’s standpoint, identifying specific epistemic resources in black women’s experience that are important to the development of black feminist thought (Collins 1990). Recognizing the intersection of many axes of oppression, feminist standpoint theorists have had to reconceptualize the idea of the margins and move away from the original Marxian standpoint premise of a bifurcated society. As bell hooks has articulated, the margins must be recognized as both sites of oppression and resistance (hooks 1990). If this is the case, then the Marxian requirement that the epistemic privilege of the oppressed must stem from their being positioned as the inverse of the dominant in a bifurcated system, is mistaken. The oppressed can gain epistemic privilege through their resistance, without relying on the idea that they complete the system of power by being positioned as both marginal and central the system’s functioning (Tanesini 1999).
Feminist standpoint theories have been controversial because by connecting epistemic perspective so closely to one’s material and social location, they appear to posit chasms between knowers, suggesting knowers are unable to share knowledge across social locations (Nelson 1990; Walby 2001). Versions of standpoint theory have also been criticized for failing to adequately account for phenomenon such as internalized oppression, in which the perspective of the oppressed is damaged by the forces of oppression and is unreliable. For example, feminists have argued that many women who blame themselves for their rapes have internalized damaging false beliefs about their responsibilities and the causes of their rapes, making it problematic to consider their perspective epistemically advantageous or reliable. Some versions of feminist standpoint theory have had difficulty accounting for the coherence of a feminist standpoint while acknowledging that women are variously situated and do not experience gender oppression (or any particular form of oppression) in the same way. Standpoint theories have also been criticized for valorizing the agency of those in the margins, and the same time as falsely theorizing a single central power in society (Bar On 1993). It has also been important for standpoint theories to specify the scope of their claims. Claims concerning the epistemic significance of social location have seemed most plausible for understanding social relations, and this is certainly the focus of the original contributions of standpoint theories. But there may be additional realms of knowledge for which social location is significant, and social location may not play out in the same way in all realms. Alison Wylie has argued that it is a contingent matter, open to empirical investigation, how certain subdominant standpoints offer epistemic advantages in particular fields of knowledge (2003).
Looking back on the developments of standpoint theories, Sandra Harding has argued that while they have been the most controversial of feminist epistemologies, they have also been the most productive with respect to their application in research projects across the disciplines (Harding 2009). Harding argues that they offer an incredibly effective methodology in the production of sound knowledge about marginalized groups. As a methodology, standpoint theories insist that researchers focus their attention on the standpoints of the underprivileged, striving to understand the world from these vantage points, and successfully uncovering a good deal of knowledge about the lives of the underprivileged in the process.
Ultimately, the plausibility of standpoint theories as epistemologies depends on their specific details, and many versions have developed significantly since their first articulations. Additionally, many feminist social epistemologists who ultimately reject standpoint theory have adopted some form of the idea that social location is connected to epistemic perspective in significant ways, and hence that knowers are differentiated. The controversies evoked by standpoint theories and their criticisms also have stimulated important discussions concerning how feminist social epistemologists are to understand the exact nature of the relationship between social location and epistemic perspective. With such developments, some feminist empiricists such as Kristen Intemann have become interested in drawing on the strengths of both empiricism and standpoint theory, proposing a merger of the two approaches (Intemann 2010).
Feminist social epistemologists also stress the socially interactive nature of knowers, arguing that epistemically, human beings are deeply dependent on one another. At least three strains of argument support a recognition of our epistemic dependence and correspondingly, the interactive nature of knowers.
First, feminist social epistemologists who focus on institutional forms of knowing such as scientific research, medical practice, and legal systems understand that in these contexts we are highly reliant on others to produce knowledge for us. Not only do laypersons rely on experts for knowledge, but even within epistemic communities such as in research teams there are cognitive divisions of labor that result in a dependence on other experts for knowledge relevant to one’s own research. More than many other social epistemologists interested in cognitive divisions of labor, feminist social epistemologists develop analyses that attend to the power dynamics within epistemic communities, examining correlations between structures of cognitive and social authority, and demonstrating their influence on the direction of research.
Kathryn Pyne Addelson (1983), for example, argues that in order to increase the rationality of scientific research, we need to include in our assessments criticism of the social arrangements within the scientific communities. For example, if social relations are such that men disproportionately hold the most significant positions of social and cognitive authority within scientific communities, the direction of research as well as the choice of methods and metaphysical assumptions underlying research may disproportionately reflect men’s experiences and perspectives. Understanding the workings of such social arrangements can help us better assess the overall rationality and quality of scientific research. Feminists have also stressed the particular vulnerabilities of the oppressed that stem from their reliance on experts, when lines of credibility and expertise are woven into an oppressive set of social arrangements (Code 1991, 2006; Sherwin 1992). Whereas some social epistemologists take the presence of cognitive divisions of labor to offer support for a view of communities as knowers, those feminist social epistemologists who focus on cognitive divisions of labor (as opposed to other dimensions of knowing that might point in the direction of communities as knowers) tend to focus instead on the epistemic role of trust, allowing that individuals can know beyond their personal grasp of the evidence, but insisting on philosophical analysis of the vulnerabilities and negotiations that play out through such dependence on others (Scheman 2001; Code 2006).
Second, arguments to the effect that knowers are differentiated from each other along the lines of social location suggest that in many cases knowers must rely on others differently situated from themselves in order to attain certain forms of knowledge. If perspectives differ along the lines of social location, then one cannot necessarily trust one’s own perspective as epistemically reliable in a particular area of knowledge and one will need to interact with others differently socially located in order to increase the reliability of one’s knowing. For example, a white male department chair may need to consult with professors who have experienced sexism and racism in the classroom in order to determine whether a white male student complaint about a young Chicana professor is legitimate or not (Alcoff 2001). Many feminist social epistemologists who focus on socially differentiated knowers argue that the necessary interaction cannot just be epistemic in nature; when categories of social location are hierarchically structured as they are in oppressive societies, social and political alliances must be built between groups in order to develop the trust necessary to share knowledge across social locations. Others have argued that in some cases the distrust across social locations is so strong that only relationships of friendship are sufficiently deep to allow for the sharing of knowledge and understanding across locations (Lugones 1987).
Third, recognizing that as children we are highly dependent on others both for our care and for the development of our epistemic skills, some feminist social epistemologists have argued that our epistemic dependence runs as deep as the conditions of epistemic agency itself. Building on the work of Annette Baier (1985), Lorraine Code has argued that epistemically, knowers are best thought of as “second persons”, who acquire epistemic skills through others, and who are dependent on others’ acknowledgment of them as an epistemic agent in order to develop and exercise epistemic agency (Code 1991). It is through our interactions with others and our development as children that we learn the skills of knowing, learn what constitutes knowing, and come to be counted among others as knowers. An implication of Code’s view is that if one is systematically denied acknowledgment as a knower and credibility is consistently withheld, as can happen in systems of oppression, then one’s epistemic agency and capacity to know will be diminished. Her arguments support a relational view of epistemic agency, one that still recognizes individuals as knowers, but conceptualizes them as socially constituted and epistemically dependent on their interactions with others. Similarly Miranda Fricker takes our role as testifiers to be central to epistemic agency, such that if credibility is consistently denied, one’s epistemic agency is undermined (Fricker 2007).
While some feminist social epistemologists such as Code and Fricker focus on interpersonal relations within a community, others draw attention to the importance of a knower’s relations with multiple communities. They argue that many of the insights of feminist critics of science were made possible by bridge knowers, individual feminist scientists interacting with both scientific communities and feminist communities (Fehr 2011). Such cases suggest the need for a model of knowers that accounts for an individual’s dynamic relations with multiple communities (Tuana 1995). The idea of knowers as individuals-in-communities has been suggested as a model that both captures the importance of interrelations with multiple communities and, by keeping individual knowers in the foreground, is capable of attending to the power relations that individual knowers must negotiate within those communities (Grasswick 2004).
Acknowledgment of the various forms of our epistemic interdependence has motivated investigations of the dynamics of social interaction and their effects on knowledge production. For example, recognizing that we frequently rely on the testimony of others, yet also make judgments on the worth of the testimony, feminist social epistemologists have investigated the complex links between assignments of credibility and social position (Alcoff 2001; Code 1995; Jones 2002). Many conclude that because of our epistemic interdependence, adequate epistemic analysis must attend to the political and moral dimensions of our social-epistemic interactions (Code 1995). For example, Miranda Fricker argues that there is social pressure to grant greater than warranted degrees of credibility to those with social power, with the effect that we do less well at attaining truths and avoiding falsehoods. Her conclusion is that an adequate social epistemology must acknowledge and assess the epistemic effects of power relations. As she writes, “epistemology will not be truly socialized until it has been appropriately politicized” (Fricker 1998, 174). Feminist arguments for the importance of trust in knowing (Code 1991, 1995; Scheman 2001) coupled with their analyses of the moral and affective dimensions of trust (Baier 1986; Jones 1996, 2002) also suggest that the moral quality of social relations is important to assess as part of one’s epistemic analysis. Attention to the links between the moral and the epistemic have developed in detail with recent developments on the topic of epistemic injustice (see Section 4: Epistemic Values, Ethics, and Democracy).
Statements pointing to communities as knowers can be found in a wide variety of feminist epistemologists (Harding 1993; Longino 2002; Nelson 1990; Potter 1993), though they do not all embrace the same arguments.
Some arguments to the effect that it is communities rather than individuals who are properly thought of as knowers build on the arguments for the interactive nature of knowers. For example, Helen Longino argues that claims and theories can only achieve the status of knowledge by going through a public process of critical scrutiny, in which individual knowers engage with each other epistemically in joint endeavors. She allows that individuals can know particular claims, but it is communities who are the knowledge producers, since it takes social processes of critical engagement to transform beliefs and theories into knowledge (2002). The norms that must be satisfied to achieve knowledge are communal norms, requiring certain social interactions to occur.
Other feminist social epistemologists who embrace a community model of knowers do so based on arguments that there are crucial public and shared elements of knowing that cannot be understood by viewing individuals in isolation (Webb 1995). Along these lines, communities can be understood as knowers in the sense that a communal context is required for knowing. Individuals know only within communities. Arguments for such a view are supported by claims that language and conceptual schemas are required for knowledge, which are themselves community specific and acquired by individuals through participation in communities. A great deal of work in feminist social epistemology and feminist science studies has documented how gendered assumptions that stem from features of our social organization make their way into the metaphors and conceptual schemas of knowledge production (for example, Bleier 1984; Haraway 1991; Hubbard 1983; Keller 1985, 1992; Lloyd 1984; Martin 1991). Many feminist social epistemologists have found it necessary to turn to the level of the communally-shared concepts and assumptions in order to explain why gendered work has been accepted and gone unnoticed within science for so long.
An argument advocating an even stronger model of communities as primary knowers comes from Lynn Hankinson Nelson (1990, 1993). Nelson’s work is inspired by Quine and his holistic theory of evidence in which there are no firm boundaries between evidence and theory. What Nelson includes in her conception of evidence that Quine did not is the larger social and political context within which science is produced. She couples this with arguments for the historically dynamic nature of the category of evidence; changes in public and communal standards of evidence will result in changes to the evidence itself. According to Nelson it is communities who construct and share knowledge and standards of evidence, and thus it must be communities who are the primary agents of knowledge (Nelson 1990, 256). Nelson’s point is that if we are to understand why a particular theory is supported at a particular time, we must examine communities, not just isolated individuals. Her arguments allow her to explain how androcentric science has lost its evidential support: although androcentric science may have enjoyed considerable evidential support at one time, changes in the social and political context of particular communities resulted in feminist work both revealing and resisting the influence of androcentric assumptions. This shift in the communal standards of evidence has diminished evidential support for androcentric research.
Feminist social epistemologists who argue for a community model of knowers do not deny that individuals also know. However, their accounts challenge the possibility of understanding individuals as knowers in isolation from their communities, and press for a better understanding of the relative roles of individuals and communities in knowing. For example, communal accounts of knowing suggest that the epistemic responsibilities of individuals will need to be understood in relation to their communal memberships, which set limits on the conceptual resources and epistemic tools individuals have available to them. Cynthia Townley has also argued that understanding our relationships within communities is crucial to understanding epistemic practices, since those practices involve us in far more than simply generating knowledge for ourselves; each of us negotiates instead a variety of epistemic roles and dependencies beyond generating knowledge and being reliable testifiers (Townley 2011).
With much of their work drawing attention to the perspectival nature of knowing and community-specific elements of knowing, feminist social epistemologists also need to articulate how we are to distinguish between better and worse knowing, or how we are able to identify objective knowledge. In a 1988 article, Donna Haraway first introduced the term situated knowledges to feminist epistemology, as a way of expressing a form of objectivity that takes seriously the social construction of knowledge and the perspectival nature of knowledge demonstrated by feminists. By invoking situated knowledges, Haraway suggests that all knowledge is local and limited, denying the possibility of the impartial view-from-nowhere that has often been associated with the perspective of objective knowledge. What Haraway suggests instead is an embodied objectivity (recognizing our material locations) that consists in partial connection across perspectives or locations: given the limited and perspectival nature of all knowing, the most we can hope for is forms of knowledge that are objective in the sense that they are translatable across particular subjective locations. For Haraway, it is through building political solidarities and engaging in epistemic conversations across our positionings that we come to agreement on how to know certain aspects of the world, but these agreements will never completely erase the differences in our perspectives. Other feminist social epistemologists offer different analyses of how to attain such partial connection.
Standpoint theorists, and many who are inspired by standpoint theory, not only maintain Haraway’s situated knowledge thesis, conceptualizing all knowledge as perspectival, but also hold a stronger thesis that some of those perspectives are epistemically more valuable than others. In other words, some perspectives lead to objectivity in a way that others do not. While the privileging of some epistemic perspectives ensures that standpoint theory bears normative content, it remains to be explained how one attains a privileged epistemic standpoint that will lead to objective knowledge, and how one can identify such a standpoint.
Although a few standpoint theorists argue for a women’s standpoint stemming directly from women’s experience, most influential standpoint theorists including Hartsock (1983) and Harding (1986) insist that the Marxist-inspired arguments imply that although the feminist standpoint is deeply connected to the lives of women, the epistemically privileged nature of the feminist standpoint stems from active political engagement in the feminist cause, and does not just represent the perspective of women. Thus, a certain kind of political activity is required in order to appreciate the situation of women or other oppressed groups. This sense of standpoint goes beyond the idea of perspective, and refers to the capacity to develop “a critical consciousness about the nature of our social location and the difference it makes epistemically”. The idea of a standpoint builds upon, but is distinctive from the situated knowledge thesis that recognizes the importance of social location in shaping epistemic perspective (Wylie 2003, 31). A standpoint does not naturally or automatically arise from a particular social location, although the experiences of an oppressed social location can make the achievement of a standpoint more likely.
Harding has developed this idea further in her call for researchers to start their research from the lives of women and, more generally, the lives of marginalized groups, regardless of their own social location (Harding 1991). This line of reasoning weakens the connection between social or material location and epistemic perspective, since presumably a researcher can access a privileged epistemic perspective without occupying the relevant social location through the appropriate critical work. Yet it maintains the situated knowledge thesis that perspectives are differentiated according to social location, and it calls on researchers to engage in reflexive analysis of how their own social location shapes their research. Harding argues that such reflexive analysis, coupled with an active attempt to engage in research from the perspectives of the oppressed will result in a stronger form of objectivity than the “weak objectivity” available through a neutral approach to knowing that ignores the role of social location and cultural assumptions in shaping one’s perspective. Harding’s strong objectivity results from an acknowledgment of the perspectival nature of all knowing, and a determined effort to examine the world from the positions of the socially underprivileged rather than the privileged. The result, according to standpoint theorists such as Harding, will be knowledge that is less partial and distorted, and hence, more objective.
Numerous feminist social epistemologists, particularly those working in philosophy of science, have employed the underdetermination thesis to argue for the necessary role of background assumptions in theory choice (Anderson 1995b; Longino 1990, 2002; Nelson 1990; Potter 1996). If theory is underdetermined by the data, and multiple theories can always explain the data equally well, then data alone cannot determine the best theory. Background assumptions must be employed as well. The problem is that background assumptions, which may include methodological assumptions, assumptions with empirical content, metaphysical assumptions, and value-laden assumptions, are rarely articulated. They may also be gendered, or otherwise shaped by culturally salient social identity categories. Drawing attention to the necessary role of these often unarticulated assumptions has allowed feminist philosophers of science to explain both how androcentric and sexist assumptions have managed to persevere for so long in science, as well as why feminist values do not have to be eliminated from scientific research in order for it to constitute good science. But in order to make epistemic distinctions and continue to claim that some theory choices are better than others, they must explain how we are to sort through and select those background assumptions we are willing to rely on.
Helen Longino has developed a very influential theory of contextual empiricism that includes a social conception of objectivity. According to Longino, a theory is objective if it has undergone and survived a certain social process of critical scrutiny. Through public critical scrutiny, the background assumptions upon which particular theories depend for their support have the potential to be revealed, and idiosyncratic assumptions can be weeded out. In order to ensure that this system of public scrutiny is working well, Longino sets out four governing norms of interaction in an epistemic community: there must be publicly recognized forums for criticism, uptake of criticism, public standards, and tempered (to allow for differences in intellectual capacity) equality of intellectual authority (Longino 2002). To the extent that these norms of social interaction are fulfilled by an epistemic community, the theories they are considering will be subject to the appropriate kind of public critical scrutiny, and their results will be objective. Diverse representation within the community also becomes important, since “a diversity of perspectives is necessary for vigorous and epistemically effective critical discourse” (Longino 2002, 131). The greater the diversity in the community, the greater the opportunity for revealing background assumptions that may be shared by large segments of the membership. Once a background assumption is revealed, the process of critical scrutiny determines whether it is acceptable or problematic and in need of rejection. The resultant knowledge will not be aperspectival and will not be free of background assumptions. However, it will represent a perspective that is broader than any one individual can bring to the table; it will also have been found appropriate for the particular epistemic goals of the community.
Others describe the possibility of objectivity given the perspectival nature of knowledge in a slightly different way. Using the term “bias” to refer to interest or perspective, Louise Antony characterizes the challenge for feminist epistemologists who criticize the idea of objectivity as neutrality or impartiality as the “bias paradox”: such feminists both criticize neutrality and impartiality (arguing that such impartiality is impossible due to the situatedness of knowledge) at the same time as they must appeal to impartiality in criticizing male bias as “bad” (Antony 1993). Her solution is to adopt a naturalistic and empirical approach to biases, embracing the idea that biases are an inevitable component of knowing, but arguing that it is an empirical question to determine which biases are good in that they lead to the truth, and which are bad in that they lead us away from truth. Richmond Campbell develops these ideas further, arguing that armed with realist conceptions of truth and objective justification, we can explain (without circularity) how feminist biases can lead us closer to the truth within contexts of systematic gender bias in epistemic communities (Campbell 2001, 1998). Elizabeth Anderson uses the case study of feminist research on divorce to argue that the feminist values (which Campbell and Antony might consider biases) used in such research are both empirically testable and supported by the evidence (Anderson 2004). Sharyn Clough suggests that such a holistic relationship between descriptive facts and prescriptive values forms a core feature of feminist science studies (Clough 2004). Miriam Solomon characterizes such views described above as “feminist radical empiricism” because they adopt the view that not only are factual claims empirically testable (as do other feminist empiricists), but more radically they embrace the idea that the values or biases that inform our theory choices are also empirically testable themselves (Solomon 2012). Solomon herself argues for a more pluralistic understanding of the role of values in knowledge production, noting that values are sometimes relevant to the domain of inquiry and can be empirically tested, but not always. Still others such as Audrey Yap caution against any presumption that empirically testing our values will be useful in promoting social change, given deep sources of prejudice and stereotyping (Yap 2016).
With its turn to situated knowing, feminist epistemology can be described as having a pragmatic orientation, with a focus on how situated knowers can know well and inquire well in their particular social worlds. By prioritizing questions concerning good inquiry and knowing activities, and arguing that such activities involve dependencies on others and social interactions, many feminist epistemologists emphasize the ethical dimensions of epistemic pursuits, suggesting that the epistemic cannot be adequately understood if separated out from ethical analysis (Code 1991, 2006). Once feminists draw attention to the fact that knowing is something that we do and do through engagement with others, the ethical dimension of knowing becomes apparent. With their interest in how agents actively engage in practices of knowing, many feminists have developed versions of virtue epistemology that are agent-centered, articulating our epistemic responsibilities that often include an ethical dimension as we interact with and depend on each other in inquiry (Code 1991, 2006; Daukas 2006, 2011; Fricker 2007). Additionally, their focus on situated knowing directs feminist epistemologists to examine our knowing practices within particular contexts rather than providing abstract analyses of generalizable conditions of knowledge acquisition. Such requirements of pragmatic contextualization tend to result in integrative analyses that consider the intersection of traditional epistemic goals with other social values and goals, including those with an ethical dimension. For example, standards of evidence might rightly differ in various areas of knowledge production due to the differing risks of social harm that can come from the generation of certain forms of knowledge. Feminist analyses also draw attention to the different epistemic strategies required to address challenges that arise for situated knowers in specific social contexts. For example, many feminist analyses focus on the specific challenges that face the socially privileged and underprivileged when they try to know within contexts of oppression.
Feminists’ pragmatic orientation and interest in epistemic inquiry within social contexts has led to the development of several different paths of investigation that explicitly draw connections between traditional epistemic values and social and ethical values in our epistemic practices, and expand the range of epistemic values under consideration. Prominent topics of investigation include epistemic injustice, epistemologies of ignorance, and the role of democratic structures in knowledge production.
While testimony has emerged as a central topic in social epistemology generally, feminists have been major contributors to discussions of how social power plays out in the economies of credibility. Focusing on the power differentials characteristic of systematic oppression, Miranda Fricker’s 2007 book Epistemic Injustice identifies testimonial injustice as one of two important forms of epistemic injustice. Testimonial injustice occurs when a speaker is given less credibility than deserved (suffering a credibility deficit) because of an identity prejudice held by the hearer. So for example, a woman might be less likely to be believed because of a prejudice on the part of the hearer regarding her gender. Fricker argues that although it is correct to view testimonial injustice as an ethical wrong insofar as it is an injustice, it is important to recognize the wrong as specifically epistemic in nature in that it involves being wronged specifically in one’s capacity as a knower (2007, 20). Fricker considers our role as testifiers a core dimension of our epistemic lives, so to suffer a credibility deficit impedes one’s capacity as an epistemic agent, making it both an ethical and an epistemic wrong when one suffers a deficit due to an identity prejudice. Fricker also recommends a corrective to such injustice. She frames her work in terms of a virtue epistemology of a responsibilist form, and posits an epistemic virtue of testimonial justice. The virtue of testimonial justice involves an agent’s reflexive critical social awareness. Such an awareness allows a hearer to account for the likely impact of the identity power relation that mediates between himself and the speaker on his spontaneous perception, essentially correcting for the problems that can result in transactions of testimonial injustice (2007, 91). In a similar vein, Nancy Daukas argues for an explicitly social form of virtue epistemology that takes as its core epistemic virtue “epistemic trustworthiness” (2006, 2011). For Daukas, epistemic trustworthiness includes dispositions to both represent oneself as a credible testifier and reliably judge the credibility of others. In order to achieve the latter in contexts of oppression where there are social prejudices and epistemic practices that contribute to the maintenance of a culture of domination, one must develop an “oppositional epistemic agency” that involves a “critical acuity” through which one can recognize and resist “the values and theoretical commitments embedded in epistemic practices and products that maintain a culture of domination and oppression” (2011, 59).
While Fricker and Daukas focus on the responses of individual agents as correctives to testimonial injustice, others have expanded on the breadth and depth of the problem. For example, Elizabeth Anderson argues for the need to develop large-scale structural remedies such as ensuring broadly inclusive epistemic institutions in order to fully correct for the systemic biases that result in testimonial injustices (Anderson 2012). Kristie Dotson points to the difficulties of even identifying such practices of silencing and distinguishes two different kinds of silencing practices: testimonial quieting and testimonial smothering. While testimonial quieting characterizes the failure to recognize the speaker as a knower and thus the failure to offer the speaker appropriate uptake, Dotson describes testimonial smothering as a coerced truncation of one’s testimony. Testimonial smothering occurs when a speaker recognizes her audience as unwilling or unable to give the appropriate uptake to her testimony, and in response, limits and shapes her testimony in order to “insure that the testimony contains only content for which one’s audience demonstrates testimonial competence” (2011, 244). Dotson characterizes both of these silencing practices as forms of epistemic violence, and both have dramatic epistemic effects for the epistemic pursuits of individuals and communities alike.
Fricker also discusses a second and related form of epistemic injustice that has generated substantial discussion: hermeneutical injustice. Hermeneutical injustice, involves a “structural prejudice in the economy of collective hermeneutical resources” (2007, 1). Hermeneutical injustice occurs when there exists a lack of collective interpretative resources required for a group to understand (and express) significant aspects of their social experience. Fricker offers the example of the situation of women who experienced episodes of what we now identify as sexual harassment, prior to it being named and recognized as such. Without the presence of a socially recognized concept of sexual harassment, women were ill-equipped to both understand and convey these significant experiences and their harms.
Many who have found hermeneutical injustice to be a powerful concept for articulating the challenges of the oppressed in gaining and expressing knowledge of their experiences have at the same time pointed out the limitations of Fricker’s analysis, and have diverged from her account accordingly. For example, some have argued that her analysis misrepresents hermeneutical resources as collective, failing to acknowledge the pluralism of interpretative communities and practices through which marginalized groups may have access to alternative interpretations of their experiences (Mason 2011; Medina 2012). Dotson, for example, argues that a third kind of epistemic injustice exists, contributory injustice, through which a dominant group refuses to employ the hermeneutical resources that marginalized communities have developed to aid in understanding their experiences (Dotson 2012). In this, Dotson builds on Pohlhaus’s conception of “willful hermeneutical ignorance” through which the dominant refuse to engage with those hermeneutical resources (of the marginalized) that would in effect challenge their ability to continue on in their (comfortable) misinterpretation and ignorance of the experiences of the marginalized (Pohlhaus 2012). Relatedly, such cases can lead to a kind of epistemic exploitation, where the dominant assume it is the responsibility of the marginalized to perform the labor necessary to educate them (the dominant) in the experiences of the oppressed (Berenstain 2016). Further, Medina analyses the performative dimension of hermeneutical injustice, noting that this features demonstrates its very close links with testimonial injustice. These forms of epistemic injustice do not operate independently. He argues that we must examine the communicative dynamics that perpetuate hermeneutical injustices, in order to understand how agents can exercise hermeneutical sensitivities and responsibilities that would help erode such injustices (Medina 2012).
Discussions of epistemic injustice offer an excellent example of work focusing on the challenges of knowing in contexts of oppression, analyzing how many of the wrongs that occur within such contexts have both epistemic and ethical dimensions. Framing epistemic matters in terms of “injustice” marks a significant development in social epistemology, through which attention is drawn to the complex network of epistemic relations between knowers. At the same time, as the discussions of epistemic injustice have broadened and attention has turned to the interaction between different forms of epistemic injustice and the inadequacy of transactional remedies between individual knowers, some have found the language of epistemic injustice and justice too limiting and have reached for different concepts. For example, Dotson frames many of these issues in terms of “epistemic oppression” that involves “persistent epistemic exclusion” (Dotson 2014), and Medina develops an “epistemology of resistance” in response to the epistemic dimensions of oppression (Medina 2013).
Feminist epistemologists alongside critical race theorists have played a prominent role in the development of epistemologies of ignorance, an area closely related to the work on epistemic injustice and epistemic oppression. They have argued that epistemologists need to attend to the role of ignorance as well as knowledge if they are to adequately understand the influence of power relations on epistemic matters. Hermeneutical injustice offers an obvious example of how some forms of knowledge important to marginalized groups may be difficult or even impossible to access as a result of systems of power relations that do not support the development of the necessary conceptual resources for that knowledge. Specific pockets of ignorance result from these systematic power relations. Epistemologies of ignorance maintain that ignorances are often not simply benign gaps in knowledge that have yet to be filled. Rather, ignorances can be actively constructed and can serve purposes of domination (Sullivan and Tuana 2007; Tuana and Sullivan 2006). On this line of reasoning, the production of ignorance needs to be understood as a substantive practice itself (Alcoff 2007).
One of the goals of epistemologies of ignorance is to understand the complexity of the relations of ignorance and knowledge, mapping out various kinds of ignorances and developing normative frameworks to help understand when ignorances are problematic, and when epistemic agents should be held epistemically responsible for their ignorances. Dotson notes that the ignorances to be concerned about are those that are both reliable and pernicious (harmful) (Dotson 2011). Clearly, not all forms of ignorance will be pernicious, nor will they all be avoidable. Cynthia Townley has also argued for the positive value of ignorance in our epistemic practices, recognizing that our rich relations of epistemic dependence require trust, which itself requires ignorance and a commitment to refrain from remedying it (2011, 23). Furthermore, the specific epistemic relationships we develop with others require that certain forms of knowledge be shared with some, but not others, calling into question any idea that the only epistemic value is the acquisition of knowledge for oneself and others (Townley 2003, 2011; Grasswick 2011). Feminists have also noted the importance of “strategic ignorance” through which the oppressed can use “dominant misconceptions as a basis for active creative responses to oppression” (Bailey 2007, 88). For example, the oppressed may act in ways that conform to the expectations of their dominators, pretending to lack intelligence perhaps, allowing access to information and resources that may help them either resist or at least survive. Or the oppressed may engage in strategic “refusals to understand” when such understanding would conform to dominant constructions of their experience that undermine their agency (Pohlhaus 2011). Such work that draws attention to the complex roles of ignorance in our epistemic practices broadens the range of epistemic values under consideration beyond the acquisition of truth to include consideration of how our ignorances can at times be well placed. At the same time, it emphasizes the ethical dimensions of the epistemic relationships with others that are so crucial to our knowing capacities.
While there are various forms of ignorance to be investigated (Townley 2011), one that has occupied a good deal of feminist attention is “invested ignorance” (Townley 2011) in which the ignorance is “systematically produced and sustained to misrepresent reality in ways that not coincidentally sustain patterns of… privilege” (Townley 2011, x). In their analyses of invested ignorance, many feminists have built upon Charles Mills’s work on racial ignorance, in which he argues that whites (or other dominant groups) have a positive interest in misrepresenting the world in ways that help support their dominant position (Mills 1997, 2007). Mills conceptualizes whites as engaged in a kind of cognitive dysfunction that serves their purposes by preventing them from understanding the social relations of domination in which they are engaged, making it easier to maintain that domination. His work connects closely with feminist standpoint theory in providing both an explanation of the patterns of belief-forming practices that can result in an ignorance of the social relations of domination on behalf of the privileged, and an explanation of the potential lack of motivation to correct such ignorance (Alcoff 2007).
Yet another line of investigation that has proved important for feminist epistemologists concerns the mapping of the ways in which particular culturally-embedded ignorances track the interests of marginalized groups. For example, Nancy Tuana has examined the history of the science of female sexuality, arguing that structures of power have played out in both constructing and maintaining the relative ignorance of female sexuality compared with the knowledge of male sexuality (Tuana 2004). She has also argued that the women’s health movement of the 1970s that sought to make available to women knowledge of their bodies and expose those sexist and androcentric practices that maintained an ignorance of their bodies is best understood as not only a political resistance movement but an epistemological resistance movement (Tuana 2006). Given the feminist theme of the situated nature of knowing, feminists have argued that whatever knowledge is produced, it is always both perspectival and limited. Work such as Tuana’s draws attention to the political forces that help direct the research and production of knowledge, shaping patterns of knowledge and ignorance. Rather than simply focusing on the production of knowledge itself, an obvious question posed by feminists on such a situated approach is: “knowledge for whom?” Issues of responsibility concerning what kind of knowledge communities undertake to produce, and correspondingly what ignorance those same communities actively produce are unavoidable (Code 1991, 2006; Heldke 2001). Whereas many epistemologists have noted that our epistemic goals are best characterized not as the generation of truths per se, but rather as the generation of significant truths (Kitcher 1993), feminists working from a situated approach recognize that “what is significant?” can only be answered with reference to the questions asked and the interests behind those questions (Anderson 1995b). Feminists further note that differently located persons may have quite different interests at stake concerning what questions need to be asked, what knowledge needs to be produced, and what ignorances matter (Grasswick 2010). Questions then arise concerning to whom knowers take themselves to be accountable with respect to their choices of knowledge and ignorance production (McHugh 2011; Code 2011). For many feminist social epistemologists, the goal is to develop epistemic practices that don’t simply generate an abundance of knowledge, but that generate sound and ethical patterns of knowledge and ignorance.
The development of epistemologies of ignorance has proved to be a fruitful framework through which feminists can articulate the complexities of the weaknesses of current (and past) epistemic practices and understand in detail the effects of power relations on those practices. Recognizing the role of ignorance reframes their conception of epistemic goals, broadening them to include not just the acquisition of truths, but the development of reliable and significant knowledge for differently located people, with patterns of knowledge and ignorance that support healthy epistemic relations between people.
Many of the recent feminist analyses of epistemic injustice and epistemic ignorance combine to draw attention to another important feature of our social epistemic relations: trust and trustworthiness. Because of our epistemic dependence on each other, inquirers need to trust others for knowledge, and often must trust across social locations. Structural features of epistemic injustice and invested ignorance create challenges for determining how to trust responsibly (Grasswick 2014), and how to be a trustworthy knower for those situated differently from oneself. Medina provides account of how racial ignorance produces systematic distrust across racial lines (through racial insensitivity) and considers how one could become aware of such insensitivities (Medina 2016). Recent work on implicit bias explores just how difficult it can be for a knower to become aware of how they are perpetuating epistemic injustices (Brownstein and Saul 2016). How are we to respond to such challenging epistemic conditions? Feminists have taken different approaches. Daukas argues that within social networks of inquiry, being trustworthy is a central virtue (and requires being trustworthy in one’s own inquiry, and being a good judge of others’ trustworthiness) (Daukas 2006). Yet Frost-Arnold argues that trustworthiness is more complex; in some cases, taking on the role of a trickster by betraying the trust of the dominant might be epistemically virtuous on the part of the marginalized, when doing so disrupts the networks of trust that exclude the oppressed (Frost-Arnold 2014). Turning to the world of social media, Frost-Arnold also argues for the epistemic potential of a strategy of “hopeful trust,” wherein, in spite of the odds of experiencing testimonial injustice and other wrongs, a marginalized person posts about her interpretation of her experiences, in hopes of challenging the ignorance of the dominant (Frost-Arnold 2016). These works offer examples of how feminists tend to approach the role of epistemic trust and trustworthiness differently from other social epistemologists: by attending explicitly to the relevance of social positions and existing networks of trust wrought as they are with problematic features of epistemic injustice and invested ignorance that infect epistemic processes, and must be grappled with.
A third area of discussion in which feminists have directly connected epistemic with social and ethical goals concerns the role of democratic structures in the production of knowledge. In part as a response to such challenges as epistemic injustice and the ways in which the production of ignorances helps support structures of domination, feminists have developed normative remedies that include more democratic epistemic institutions and practices. Several different lines of argument can be identified for why and how democratic practices can be epistemically beneficial.
Some feminists have focused squarely on the internal democratic conditions of epistemic communities required for objectivity. For example, Longino’s social process-based idea of objectivity requires a practice of open discussion and critical engagement between members of epistemic communities, in order to ensure that the knowledge produced is objective in the sense of having withstood appropriate critical scrutiny. Importantly, Longino includes conditions of tempered intellectual authority and uptake of criticism for the participants of epistemic communities (2002), arguing that objectivity can only be successfully pursued in situations where knowers are respected for their epistemic contributions and not ignored or assigned less credibility because of who they are. In a related vein, Elizabeth Anderson (1995c) argues explicitly that the aims of higher education demand that issues of justice and equality of respect within the academy be taken up as epistemic issues, securing the ability of all to contribute their ideas to the public discourse and have those ideas taken seriously. Kristina Rolin similarly points to the epistemic need for social and cultural norms within scientific communities that promote inclusive and responsive dialogue, and worries about the distorting effects on the credibility of women scientists operating within cultures of professional interaction that conflate masculine styles of presentation with competence (Rolin 2002). Many have also drawn attention to the fact that the critical engagement called for by the likes of Longino and Anderson will only be epistemically effective if a diversity of perspectives are represented within that particular epistemic community. Longino explicitly acknowledges the importance of diverse representation in order to expose questionable background assumptions that can be invisible when shared by a group of similarly situated knowers (Longino 2002). Others have examined in more detail the links between diversity in social situation and diversity in epistemic perspectives. For example, Kristen Intemann argues that the epistemic value of diversity comes from a diversity of experiences being represented at the table, not a diversity of values or interests per se (Intemann 2011). Still others have examined in detail the role of “chilly climate” issues within epistemic communities (Wylie 2011), and the structural and motivational barriers to change that are present within academic institutions (Fehr 2011), both factors which contribute to the difficulty of reaping the epistemic benefits of diversity within epistemic communities. These arguments suggest that our epistemic projects are harmed when social relations conspire to either exclude particular knowers from relevant epistemic communities, or more insidiously deny them the credibility and epistemic respect they deserve within those communities.
Others have argued that outside of specific epistemic communities themselves, society-wide improvements in social justice are required so that sexist and androcentric biases do not continue to weaken our scientific practices (Kourany 2010). Naomi Scheman has argued that insofar as scientific communities and institutions fail to be trustworthy from the perspective of marginalized groups who have experienced a poor historical relationship with them, those institutions fail in achieving objectivity, given that the function of objectivity is to rationally ground trust (Scheman 2001). According to such arguments, epistemic improvement requires improvement to the structure of our social relations understood more broadly than just inside the epistemic communities themselves. Situations of oppression, and the marginalization of groups within society damage the epistemic potential of both specific epistemic communities and society at large.
Finally, many feminist social epistemologists explicitly invoke democratic goals as guides for the direction of research. Arguments here build upon the idea that that knowledge is limited, and cannot be assumed to serve the interests of everyone equally. Sandra Harding, for example, calls for “the reinvention of sciences for the many to replace sciences that are often only for the elite few” (1991, 312). Heidi Grasswick builds upon Scheman’s line of reasoning concerning the need for scientific institutions to be trustworthy from particular social vantage points. She argues that among the requirements for such trustworthiness, there must be available evidence that scientific institutions are taking up at least some research questions that are significant for the social group in question and providing meaningful answers to those questions. Furthermore, she notes that engagement and sound communication between scientific and variously situated lay communities are required in order to establish the necessary trusting relations that would allow for particularly situated lay persons to responsibly rely on scientific institutions for their knowledge (Grasswick 2010). Broadening the scope beyond just scientific practices, Lorraine Code argues for a guiding ecological principle of cohabitability in epistemic decision-making (2006). Ultimately, she argues, we should select directions of research and methods of research that permit and foster our living well amongst one another, clearly bringing an ethical dimension into epistemic decision-making.
In various ways then, feminist social epistemologists have argued for deep connections between democracy and the success of epistemic practices. They have attended to the effects of social relations internal to epistemic communities, social relations external to those communities, and social relations between knowledge-producing communities and lay communities.
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- Feminist Epistemology, entry in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy
- Anderson, Elizabeth, How Not to Criticize Feminist Epistemology: A Review of Scrutinizing Feminist Epistemology, online manuscript
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