Analytic feminists are philosophers who believe that both philosophy and feminism are well served by using some of the concepts, theories, and methods of analytic philosophy modified by feminist values and insights. By using “analytic feminist” to characterize their style of feminist philosophizing, these philosophers acknowledge their dual feminist and analytic roots and their intention to participate in the ongoing conversations within both traditions. In addition, the use of “analytic feminist” attempts to rebut two frequently made presumptions: that feminist philosophy rejects all the assumptions of modernism and that analytic philosophy is irredeemably male-biased. Thus by naming themselves analytic feminists, these philosophers affirm the existence and political value of their work.
Readers with a strong desire to “cut to the chase” may jump to the fourth section, on characteristics of analytic feminism. The first three sections set the context for analytic feminism by explaining the relationships between analytic feminists and the various traditions they share.
- 1. The Tradition Analytic Feminists Share with Other Analytic Philosophers
- 2. What Analytic Feminists Share with Other Feminist Philosophers
- 3. Various Ways to Characterize Differences Among Feminist Philosophers
- 4. Characteristics of Analytic Feminism
- 5. Twentieth Century Feminist Criticism of Analytic Philosophy
- 6. Analytic Feminists’ Responses to Critiques
- 7. Analytic Feminism: Limitations and Challenges
- 8. Is it Important to Identify Feminists by Their Philosophical Methods?
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1. The Tradition Analytic Feminists Share with Other Analytic Philosophers
Contemporary analytic philosophers, feminist and nonfeminist, can be characterized roughly as follows: they consider (some of) Frege, Russell, Moore, Wittgenstein, and the Logical Positivists to be their intellectual ancestors; they tend to prize explicit argumentation and the literal, precise, and clear use of language; they often value the roles of philosophy of language, epistemology, and logic; and they typically view their stock of philosophical concepts, methods, and assumptions to be a) consistent with their Modern European heritage, and b) in contrast with methods originating in continental Europe since 1900, from phenomenology and existentialism through poststructuralism and new materialism.
Of course, each strand of mid-twentieth-century, “classic” analytic philosophy has changed greatly. Many central dogmas have been undermined, and nonfeminists and feminists alike have “naturalized”, “socialized”, and otherwise modulated the earlier, more abstract and highly normative enterprises and doctrines. However, regardless of the extent of the evolution of “analytic philosophy”, the degree to which methodological boundaries are blurred today, and the fruitfulness of intersections among methods, a number of feminist and nonfeminist philosophers continue to think of themselves in the historical trajectory of analytic philosophy and find the tradition valuable. They claim the term “analytic philosopher” for themselves, even if others might prefer the term “post-analytic”.
2. What Analytic Feminists Share with Other Feminist Philosophers
One way to encapsulate the agreement in positions and values among feminist philosophers, regardless of their methodological inclinations, is to say that for feminist philosophers, both philosophy and gender matter—both are important to the lives of human beings. Feminists recognize that philosophy and philosophers are part of the wider set of institutions of culture in which human beings live, understand themselves, and, only sometimes, flourish. Among the many functions of philosophy are the following: to help us to understand ourselves and our relations to each other, to our communities, and to the state; to appreciate the extent to which we are counted as knowers and moral agents; to uncover the assumptions and methods of various bodies of knowledge, and so on. These kinds of philosophical insights—ones that concern our methods, assumptions, theories, and concepts—can contribute to the oppression of human beings as well as to their liberation (see, for example, Langton 2000 and Vogler 1995). Given the current imbalances of power and privilege with which people live, philosophy has social effects when it “leaves everything as it is”. When feminist philosophers say that traditional philosophy is already political, they are calling attention to these social effects. Feminists seek “engaged” philosophy that is potentially useful to empower human beings rather than contribute to the perpetuation of a status quo in which people are subordinated by gender, race/ethnicity, class, sexual orientation, and so on. Of course, feminist philosophers disagree about the appropriate ways to work this out, but they do agree that philosophy can influence lives and should influence them for the better.
A second area of agreement among feminist philosophers is that gender affects not only our lives, but also philosophy itself. Feminists criticize the misogyny of philosophers and the overt and covert sexism, androcentrism, and related forms of male bias in philosophy. For example, philosophers have through the centuries made a variety of false and demeaning claims about “the nature of woman”; they have defined central concepts such as reason in ways that excluded women of their cultures; they have made allegedly universal claims about human nature, desire, or motivation that were, in fact, claims more likely to be true of men of their own social class; and they have believed methods and positions to be “value-neutral” and “objective” that were instead promoting the interests of only the privileged groups. Once again, while feminist philosophers agree on the existence of such kinds of male bias, they differ over the best ways to criticize it, the extent to which various philosophical approaches can be reconstructed for feminist use, and so on. We turn to examples in sections five through seven below.
Feminist philosophers argue that the kinds of male-biased views just noted limit and distort philosophy on many levels—from individual concepts such as reason or autonomy to entire fields such as philosophy of mind. The remedy for these distortions and limitations is not to substitute “female bias” for “male bias”, but to understand the variety of roles that gender plays in the construction of philosophy. Feminists believe that even as philosophers pursue their traditional goals, the likelihood of progress toward them is increased by heeding feminists’ more inclusive and self-reflexive approach.
It is important to be clear that feminist philosophers realize that traditional philosophy has been written largely by men who are privileged in ways that go far beyond their gender. Feminists today maintain that gender is only one facet of a complex nexus of mutually influencing axes of oppression and privilege that structure society and the social identities of human beings; other facets include race/ethnicity, sexual orientation, disability, class, and so on. Feminist philosophers doing “intersectional analysis” try to attend to this complexity. Although gender is only one facet, it is nevertheless an important one with a wide variety of implications for the way we should do philosophy. Most feminists share points in common as they continue to critique other philosophers as well as try to reconstruct philosophy that is neither male-biased nor oppressive in any other respect. Let’s briefly note a few of these points before moving on to disagreements.
- Since many traditional philosophers believe that their own theories or methods have universal applicability, feminists find it appropriate to hold these philosophers’ feet to the fire. Feminists explain that part of what it means for a moral theory or an epistemology to be universal is that it must be applicable to and usable by a full range of human beings, not just to and by members of a dominant social group. For example, a moral theory should allow for moral agency for any person regardless of social status and specific complex identity. An epistemological theory should be able to analyze fairly a full range of cognitive situations of a wide variety of human beings. A good philosophical theory or method would systematically disadvantage no one: men, women—whether cis or transgender—as well as nonbinary individuals from any social group. For example, it would disparage no one’s experiences, no one’s authority as a knower, and no one’s goals as a moral or political agent. Such an approach postulates neither the “sameness” of everyone nor the existence of “group differences”. Instead, it asks that philosophers attend to the full range of human beings, including their wide variety of experiences, interests and situations, when purporting to construct “universally applicable” theories.
- It is dangerous to stop paying attention to gender too soon. Even if a feminist philosopher has a long-term goal of minimizing the importance of gender, there is a risk of leaving too much unanalyzed if one leaps immediately from male-biased philosophy to gender-neutral philosophy. Attention to the influence of gender implies a recognition that philosophy is embedded in social structures and practices, so feminist philosophers tend to use “naturalized” or “socialized” methods to explain the “located” or “situated” character of the subject who does philosophy as well as the objects of philosophical reflection. Of course, the details here vary widely among feminists. A related notion, “nonideal” philosophy (Mills 2005), is embraced by many feminists who express the desire to produce philosophy that is grounded in the material world full of human beings and institutions, all of which are flawed in very complex ways.
- Philosophy must be normative at the same time it includes a naturalized or socialized component. Feminist philosophers, like many nonfeminist philosophers, struggle to maintain the level of normativity that they require in order to serve their philosophical and political goals. Again, details will vary concerning what level or kind of normativity is necessary.
Although we return later to controversial aspects of these points, feminist consensus is that although philosophy is a discipline that purports to be about and for all humanity, it has not been. Philosophers have not appreciated the extent to which their theories and methods have underwritten and perpetuated cultures that have prevented the flourishing of at least half of their populations. Philosophy that reflects a feminist sensibility would take account of the relevance of philosophy to the lives of all human beings and promote the flourishing of every person. At the same time it would help philosophy to more nearly approximate its own ideals.
3. Various Ways to Characterize Differences Among Feminist Philosophers
Although an essay on analytic feminism focuses our attention on differences among philosophical methods that feminists favor, these distinctions were not salient in the early days of contemporary feminist philosophy in the 1970s. Even during the 1980s and 1990s when methodological and other differences came under more scrutiny, the question of whether a feminist philosopher finds more valuable resources in analytic philosophy or in pragmatism, poststructuralism, phenomenology, Marxism, critical theory, or hermeneutics was of more concern to certain academic feminist philosophers than it was to the wider feminist scholarly or political communities. In fact, academic feminist philosophers in many parts of the world report taking less note of feminists’ methodological distinctions than do feminist philosophers in North America.
Today, although many feminist philosophers’ mainstream philosophical education still often focuses on one philosophical method or tradition, one can find “analytic feminists” discussing Beauvoir, Foucault, or Butler without hesitation. It is fair to say that because of feminist philosophers’ political values and desire to communicate with other feminists, they are more motivated to search for methodological cross-fertilization than are many nonfeminist philosophers. (See the entries on intersections between pragmatist and Continental feminism and intersections between analytic and Continental feminism.)
The categories of feminist philosophies/theories most widely known outside academic philosophy since the 1970s are those developed by Alison Jaggar based on political values, goals, and assumptions. Jaggar distinguishes liberal, radical, classical Marxist, and socialist feminism. Each kind of feminism identifies the principal sources of women’s oppression and encompasses an epistemology and a theory of human nature as well as political theory and strategies for social change (1983) It is very important to note that some women of color have long objected to the widespread and hegemonic use of these categories (see Sandoval 1991, 2000). In addition, because the categories are based in political theories, it is not surprising that they function better in social/political theorizing both in and outside of philosophy than for philosophers doing metaphysics, philosophy of science, aesthetics, and so on.
Sandra Harding developed a different widely used set of categories of feminist philosophies in the context of philosophy of science and epistemology (1986). Harding distinguishes feminist empiricists (practicing natural and social scientists who tended to rely on logical positivist theories), feminist standpoint theorists who drew from Marxist epistemology, and feminist postmodernists. Although Harding is distinguishing feminists by philosophical methodology, it is important to emphasize that her category of “feminist empiricist” captures a trend among pathbreaking women scientists who aimed to hold scientific practice to alleged standards of scientific objectivity and neutrality; however, the assumptions behind this trend are not what philosophers today have in mind when speaking of feminist empiricism. Contemporary analytic feminist empiricist philosophers tend to be post-Wittgensteinian-Quinean-Davidsonian empiricists, so not subject to the principal objections Harding raised of the scientists. See, for example, Longino (1990, 2002), Nelson (1990), Solomon (2001), E. Lloyd (2008), as well as essays collected in Scheman and O’Connor (2002), Nelson and Nelson (2003), Clough (2003), Superson and Brennan (2005), Grasswick (2011), Crasnow and Superson (2012), and Garavaso (2018).
As we will see in more detail below, analytic feminists are among those who argue that they are not captured by either Jaggar’s or Harding’s sets of categories. The analytic feminists who distinguish their philosophical method from their political values and assumptions would reject, for example, a necessary connection between being either an analytic philosopher or an empiricist and being a liberal.
4. Characteristics of Analytic Feminism
Although there had been feminist philosophers using analytic methods since the late 1960s, as feminist philosophy developed in the areas of epistemology, philosophy of science, and metaphysics there were clusters of controversies over the compatibility of feminist politics with a preference for analytic philosophical methods. Panels at American Philosophical Association meetings and discussions at the Society for Women in Philosophy generated essays that explored these matters. See, for example, issues of The APA Newsletter on Feminism and Philosophy (Tuana 1992; Meyers & Antony 1993).
The term “analytic feminist” came into use in the early 1990s in North America. Virginia Klenk proposed a Society for Analytical Feminism (see Other Internet Resources) in 1991 and was its first president (Cudd & Norlock 2018 recount the story). Ann Cudd characterized analytic feminism on the organization’s website (see Cudd 1996 [2006) and in a special issue of Hypatia on Analytic Feminism (Cudd & Klenk 1995). She notes that there is at best a family resemblance among analytic feminists. Among the characteristics she cites are the following:
Analytic feminism holds that the best way for scholars to counter sexism and androcentrism is through forming a clear conception of and pursuing truth, logical consistency, objectivity, rationality, justice, and the good while recognizing that these notions have often been perverted by androcentrism throughout the history of philosophy …. Analytic feminism holds that many traditional philosophical notions are not only normatively compelling, but also in some ways empowering and liberating for women. While postmodern feminism rejects the universality of truth, justice and objectivity and the univocality of “women”, analytic feminism defends these notions. (Cudd 1996 [2006: 158])
As we flesh out the family resemblances among analytic feminists it is important to remember that these resemblances include not only substantive positions, but also styles of presentation and other practices. Further, as we have already noted in the first two sections, analytic feminists share resemblances with others in their even larger “family” that includes both non-analytic feminists and nonfeminist analytic philosophers. A large and diverse family indeed!
4.1 Doctrines, Desires, and Tools
Although Cudd lists a few traditional concepts that analytic feminists want to retain, she makes clear that this is no manifesto. Many who consider themselves feminists in the analytic tradition hold that there are no doctrines required of analytic feminists; indeed, there is even a spirit of contrarianism about such matters, including over “the univocality of ‘women.’” Nevertheless, analytic feminists share something that we might call a core desire rather than a core doctrine, namely, the desire to retain enough of the central normative concepts of the modern European tradition to support the kind of normativity required by both feminist politics and philosophy. For example, they believe that feminist politics requires that claims about oppression or denial of rights be true or false and able to be justified and that philosophy requires much the same thing.
This “core desire” finds its expression, for example, in the ways analytic feminists use some of what we might call the “core concepts” that Cudd mentions above: truth, logical consistency, objectivity, rationality and justice. Although, as noted in the section 1 above, analytic feminists agree with other feminist philosophers that important facets of these concepts are male-biased, analytic feminists defend the concepts in ways that other feminists do not. At the same time analytic feminists disagree among themselves about a number of matters, for example, what kinds of accounts of truth or objectivity should prevail or whether scientific realism or anti-realism is a better strategy. We will spell out some of these details later as we discuss analytic feminists’ defense of analytic philosophy in the sixth section, on analytic feminists’ responses to critiques.
Pieranna Garavaso’s 2018 characterization of analytic feminism recasts core concepts or desires in terms of toolkits and ways of reading:
Analytic feminists are philosophers who use methodological approaches often learned while training in analytic philosophy—that is, the ever-expanding toolkit that may include such instruments as conceptual and logical analysis, use of argumentation, thought experiments, counterexamples, and so forth—and who read classical and contemporary philosophical texts through a filter that highlights the existence and the effects of various systems of social inequality such as gender, race, class, physical and mental abilities, and sexual orientation. (Garavaso 2018: 8)
4.2 Bridge Building
Analytic feminists’ use of these toolkits and concepts and their feminist reading of the work of traditional analytic philosophers allow them to converse with and build bridges among different groups of scholars, for example, traditional analytic philosophers, other feminist philosophers, and, in some cases, scientists or scholars in social studies of science. This is sometimes an explicit goal of their work (see Fricker and Hornsby 2000, 4–5 and Superson 2011), but is more often implied. Two analytic feminist philosophers of science for whom this is an explicit goal are Lynn Hankinson Nelson and Helen Longino. Nelson sees her work in feminist empiricism that builds upon Quine as a way to engage philosophers of science, scientists and feminists in constructive conversation (Nelson 1990 and subsequent essays, e.g., 1996). Longino, in The Fate of Knowledge (2002) takes bold steps to dissolve the rational-social dichotomy by untangling the assumptions made by social and cultural studies of science scholars, historians and philosophers of science, and scientists. Interestingly, Longino’s 2002 and 2013 books are not cast in “feminist” terms, but build on her overtly feminist work from the 1980s and 1990s and are informed by many decades of feminist philosophy conversations.
Analytic feminists’ styles of writing also have implications for bridge building. Because analytic feminists value explicit argumentation and clear, literal, and precise uses of language their work “looks like philosophy” to nonfeminist analytic philosophers; it makes nonfeminist philosophers feel more comfortable engaging in feminist discussion. At the same time, feminist philosophers from various philosophical traditions often engage with each other’s work outside their own “preferred method” because of feminists’ shared values and goals. Thus non-analytic feminists who might find an analytic writing style tediously overqualified or otherwise confining still engage—along with nonfeminist analytic philosophers—in fruitful bridge-building conversations. Editors of analytic feminist anthologies and special issues of journals often have explicit bridge-building intentions that rest both on authors’ style and content. Examples of anthologies and journal issues that tie well with traditional analytic philosophy are Antony and Witt (1993 ), Cudd and Klenk (1995), Haslanger (1995a), Fricker and Hornsby (2000), Superson and Brennan (2005), Crasnow and Superson (2012), and Garavaso (2018); examples of books or symposia that intentionally build bridges across feminist methods include Superson (2003), Witt (2011b), Garry, Khader, and Stone (2017).
4.3 Style and Aggression
Although arguing explicitly is not to be equated with arguing aggressively or in an adversarial manner, analytic feminists have addressed the issue of stylistic aggressiveness. We must distinguish two related issues on this subject: first, an aggressive manner of arguing in general, and second, Janice Moulton’s critique of the “adversary method” as a paradigm in philosophy—and specifically in analytic philosophy (1983). Moulton’s point is not simply that the socially constructed belief that aggression is an unladylike/unfeminine characteristic puts women at a disadvantage (indeed, in a double bind) in careers such as philosophy that equate aggression with competence. She also focuses on the ways in which the use of the adversary method as a paradigm of philosophy limits and distorts the work of philosophers.
Moulton uses “the adversary method” to refer to the view of philosophy in which the philosopher’s task is to develop general claims, produce counterexamples to each other’s general claims, and use only deductive reasoning (1983: 152–153). If this is the paradigm of philosophy rather than simply one strategy among many, then the discipline excludes many fruitful kinds of exploration and development, distorts the history of philosophy, and (because it works best in well-defined areas, even isolated arguments) greatly narrows the scope of philosophical concerns. Moulton also sees integrated into this paradigm several ideals of which she is critical, for example, “value-free” reasoning and objectivity. Interestingly, she does not draw illustrations from the obvious examples in analytic philosophy such as Edmund Gettier’s analysis of “S knows that p” and the decades of responses to it. Instead she uses an early feminist essay, Judith Thomson’s “A Defense of Abortion” (1971), to show ways in which important facets of a substantive issue can be set aside because of restrictions imposed by the adversary method.
I know of no feminist who has argued in print against Moulton’s specific argument opposing the adversary method, although some have made further distinctions (for example, Govier 1999 and Rooney 2010). Nevertheless, some analytic feminists have pointed to the value of arguing aggressively in general. For example, Louise Antony values the gender transgression and feelings of empowerment and freedom that can stem from a woman’s using an aggressive analytic style of writing and argument (Antony 2003, see also Baber 1993). More recent treatments of aggressive or adversarial styles have arisen in discussions of the persistently low number of women in philosophy, compared with other humanistic disciplines (see, for example, Burrow 2010, Rooney 2010, Beebee 2014, and for a differing view that centers Black women, see Henning 2018, 2020). This issue is not one that finds analytic feminists (or any others) in unanimity. Underlying the disagreement over style are important shared goals: to offer clear, rational support for feminist positions and to remain respectful of the other person while disagreeing. Feminist philosophers find the latter to be especially important, but peculiarly elusive, when they are disagreeing among themselves. The parameters of respectful disagreement have engendered interesting debate.
4.4 Reconstructing Philosophy
We noted in the second section that feminist philosophers with a variety of methodological and political backgrounds would agree that if a philosopher claims universal applicability for a theory or method, it must be usable by people of any gender from a variety of complex social locations. Many analytic feminists use a similar approach to the construction of feminist philosophy. They tend to be wary of creating specialized fields/types of philosophy that are relevant only to (some or all) women or feminists, for example, ethics or epistemology that is only for lesbians or is “gynocentric”. Analytic feminists tend to propose that feminist ethics or feminist metaphysics would instead establish new criteria of adequacy for ethics or metaphysics. The authors in The Cambridge Companion to Feminism in Philosophy provide excellent examples of this approach (Fricker & Hornsby 2000). This approach can be spelled out in terms similar to some used in Section 2: An adequate philosophical theory, method or concept is one that “works” for women as well as everyone else. “Works” is very inclusive here: it cannot be enmeshed in a philosophical system that has oppressive consequences large or small; its theories and concepts must reflect and be applicable to the full range of experiences, interests, and situations of all sorts of women, men, and nonbinary people. Note that this view requires no commitment to claims about feminist standpoints, nor does it treat women as a uniform class of any kind. It is obvious that experiences vary according to a number of different axes—not only along the commonly cited axes of social class, sexual orientation, race/ethnicity, physical or mental abilities, and gender—but also in terms of individual variation as well as other general factors. This approach leaves open many substantive questions about the long-term interests of different individuals and groups. It also permits one to point out the importance of having a variety of perspectives without maintaining that there is something “essential” about these perspectives.
As analytic feminism has become an increasingly developed field, its practitioners have expanded the range of resources upon which they draw as they reconstruct philosophy. Some analytic feminists alongside others pursuing engaged scholarship, have argued that traditional philosophy and feminist philosophy alike need to reflect the complexities of intersectional analyses of gender, race/ethnicity, sexuality, disability, class, and so on (Bailey 2010 and Garry 2012 took particular aim at analytic feminists in their arguments for intersectionality). Philosophers need to draw on feminist critical race theory, critical disability studies, and queer and trans theory to enrich their understanding of the ways in which various axes of oppression and privilege intermesh.
Reconstructing philosophy also requires understanding the roles that privilege and oppression play in the widespread construction of epistemic ignorance and in practices that result in epistemic injustice and epistemic oppression. A rapidly growing body of literature in the twenty-first century, for example, Miranda Fricker (2007) and Kristie Dotson (2011, 2014) as well as multiple authors in Nancy Tuana and Shannon Sullivan (2006),in Sullivan and Tuana (2007), and in Ian Kidd, José Medina, and Gaile Pohlhaus (2017) call to our attention both the depth with which privilege has been constructed and the ways its tentacles reach into multiple facets of our epistemic and moral lives.See entry on feminist social epistemology for more detailed discussion.
5. Twentieth Century Feminist Criticism of Analytic Philosophy
Although every philosophical method is subject to feminist critique, “classic” analytic philosophy might seem to be a paradigm case of “male-biased philosophy”—a kind of philosophy least hospitable to feminist values. Among the features that feminists have criticized are that it is committed to pure objectivity and value-neutrality, and uses an unlocated, disembodied, disinterested, autonomous individual reasoner, knower, and agent. Having stated it this boldly, let us look briefly at examples of late twentieth-century arguments offered by feminists who themselves had analytic training that became classic critiques of analytic philosophy. In Section 6 we will turn to the responses of other analytic feminists to understand why they nevertheless find valuable resources in the analytic tradition.
In some respects it is hard to disentangle feminist philosophers’ critiques of analytic philosophy from their broader critiques of Western thought because sometimes their critique of analytic philosophy is supported by their critiques of either its antecedents in modern philosophy or its sister scientific disciplines. For example, when Jaggar criticized abstract individualism and other concepts of modern liberal political theory her critique was also relevant to the disinterested, detached investigator prized by the logical positivists. Jaggar faults liberalism for
- its normative dualism that arises when the mental capacity for rationality is “what is especially valuable about human beings” (1983: 40),
- abstract individualism—“the assumption that the essential human characteristics are properties of individuals and are given independently of any particular social context” (1983: 42), and
- its assumption that rationality is instrumental, value-neutral, and detached.
Jaggar did not claim that her critique applied to analytic philosophy beyond positivism, but notes that neopositivist values are held in normative theories even in the late twentieth century. She is thinking, for example, of political or moral theorists’ characterization of objectivity as impartiality and lack of bias (1983: 357).
Among Sandra Harding’s analyses of the discourses upon which feminists draw, the most relevant to analytic philosophy is her account of empiricism as practiced by natural and social scientists. Although Harding is speaking about scientists rather than philosophers, her critique of the limitations of the empiricist view—especially its assumed account of “value-free” objectivity—is also applicable to philosophers who utilize this concept of objectivity. Harding advocates that feminists retain a notion of objectivity that incorporates appropriate values (her “strong objectivity”) and criticizes the empiricists’ alleged “value-free” objectivity by the use of the arguments below.
- It perpetuates the values of the researchers, and is, in differing ways, both too narrow and too broad. It is too narrow because it can detect only values that differ between researchers and “competent” critics, and too broad because it purports to eliminate all social values, when it may well be that some values benefit science while others undermine it (Harding 1991: 143–4).
- It is politically and morally regressive; for example, it constructs science in a way that permits scientists to be “fast guns for hire” rather than individuals who attend to the moral and political values that support and are implied by their actions. (Harding 1991: 158–9)
- It is linked to other implausible views. Examples include, first,
that only false beliefs have social causes while true beliefs have
natural ones, and, second, that the ideal agent must create and
constantly police the borders of a gulf, a no-man’s-land,
between himself as the subject and the object of his research,
knowledge, or action
in order to be “a self whose mind would perfectly reflect the world” (1991: 158). Harding utilizes Nancy Hartsock’s term “abstract masculinity” for this last idea (Harding 1991: 158).
Nancy Holland utilizes the overlapping critiques of Harding and Jaggar, particularly that of abstract individualism, and takes them to be telling of Anglo-American philosophy in general (she considers Locke and Hume as well as contemporary analytic philosophers to exemplify Anglo-American philosophy). Holland focuses on the metaphysical assumptions of empiricism that exclude women from philosophy. She writes that contemporary analytic philosophy,
by remaining within the Empiricist tradition, inherits not only the problems of that tradition, but also a self-definition that identifies it as necessarily men’s philosophy…. [Men’s] philosophy defines itself throughout its history in such a way as to exclude what our culture defines as women’s experience from what is considered to be properly philosophical. (1990: 3)
Although Jane Duran values the rigor of analytic philosophy and wants to incorporate it into feminist epistemology, she sees analytic epistemology (“pure epistemology”) as a recent incarnation of “a masculinist, androcentric tradition that yields a hypernormative, idealized, and stylistically aggressive mode of thought” (1991: 8). She appeals not only to Harding, but also to Evelyn Fox Keller (1985) and Susan Bordo (1987) as well as to Janice Moulton’s (1983) critique of the adversary paradigm discussed above in Section 4. Duran’s examples of traits that have been seen as androcentric include,
analysis in terms of logically necessary and sufficient conditions, lack of allusion to descriptively adequate models, the importance of counterexampling, putative universalization of the conditions, and so forth. (1991: 44)
Naomi Scheman refers to herself as an “analytic philosopher semi-manqué”—one who has left the analytic neighborhood of her philosophical training. She has made several kinds of arguments that bear on the adequacy of analytic philosophy: the impact of individualism in philosophy of mind, the nature of the self, and the nature of the normative philosophical subject (see her papers collected in 1993 and 2011). For example, Scheman argues that it is the ideology of liberal individualism rather than sound argument that underlies the widespread belief that psychological objects such as “emotions, beliefs, intentions, virtues, and vices” are properties of individuals (1993: 37). In fact, part of Jaggar’s argument against abstract individualism relies on Scheman’s conceptual point that questions of identifying and interpreting psychological states must be answered in a social context, not in abstraction from it. Scheman acknowledges her debt to Wittgenstein in making this point, but goes beyond his views by arguing that women’s experiences and psychosexual development do not bear out this kind of individualistic assumption.
In other essays Scheman argues that the philosophical “we”—the subject who has philosophical problems—is a normative subject, one that bears the markings of various kinds of privilege. Her examples of normative subjects are the ideally rational scientist or the citizen of a liberal state (1993: 7). In this way she shifts her argument away from the experiences and developmental differences between actual men and women (or between white people/people of color, or other actual differences of privilege/marginality) in order to focus on the connection between privilege and normativity. If one were to take a Freudian-tinted view that philosophical problems are “intellectual sublimations of the neuroses of privilege”, then their resolution would come, à la Wittgenstein, through changes in our forms of life (1993: 8).
Lorraine Code is among those who have criticized analytic philosophy for use of a moral-epistemic individual who is “abstract, ‘generalized,’ and disengaged” and a tradition that is more concerned with what an ideal agent or knower would do than with a real one (1995: xi). Code uses the example of an “S knows that p” epistemology to focus one of her most widely known critiques. The knowing subject S, in what Code hyphenates as the “positivist-empiricist” epistemology, is an individual—a detached, neutral, interchangeable spectator whose knowledge is most reliable when his or her sensory observations occur in ideal conditions, not real, everyday ones. Code argues that “S knows that p” models of knowledge work only in a prescribed area; indeed, they favor a narrow kind of scientific knowledge. A more adequate characterization of knowing must be applicable to a broad range of examples in the lives of real people. In order to do so, it cannot use the interchangeable subject, S, but must include subjective features of S such as the person’s identity, interests or circumstances. For without these features we cannot explain complex, relational knowing, for example, knowing a person. In addition, an adequate account of knowledge should uncover ways in which political interests are used to determine who is allowed to be a standard knower, that is, an S (Code 1991, 1995, 1998). This is only one of Code’s early lines of argument against analytic philosophy. In Section 7 we will discuss her arguments that point to the limitations of naturalized epistemology in the analytic style as well.
As we close our discussion of some of the important classic feminist critiques of analytic philosophy, recall that another criticism was discussed in Section 4: Janice Moulton’s critique of the adversary method as a paradigm of philosophy. Although use of the adversary method need not be limited to analytic philosophers, Moulton’s critique is clearly applicable to widespread practices in twentieth century analytic philosophy.
6. Analytic Feminists’ Responses to Critiques
The most frequent kinds of responses by analytic feminists to feminist critiques of analytic philosophy are variations of the following arguments and claims:
- Feminist critiques may have been legitimate for some kinds of analytic philosophy, especially logical positivism, but because analytic philosophy has changed, the objections do not hold for most contemporary work. The analytic feminist then develops a strand of analytic philosophy that is not subject to a particular kind of objection, for example, that knowers are unlocated.
- There were errors of interpretation in feminists’ critiques, for example, concerning the extent to which analytic philosophy incorporated empiricism. After correction, analytic philosophy will not be vulnerable to this particular kind of criticism.
- Critics have gone too far in undermining fields of philosophy such as metaphysics and central concepts such as rationality. Such fields and concepts are needed both on philosophical and feminist grounds.
All three kinds of responses allow analytic feminists to engage in activities on which they thrive—disentangling strands of argument from each other, making distinctions among concepts, searching for kernels of truth among points with which they disagree, and so on.
Response (1). Regardless of the precise characterization of contemporary analytic philosophy, it clearly cannot to be equated with logical positivism. So to the degree that feminist critiques focus on logical positivism rather than current analytic work, they will likely be off the mark. As analytic feminists respond to other feminists’ critiques, they try to decipher which strands of analytic philosophy might be most useful and the degree to which old assumptions and concepts that are male-biased still linger. Although some feminists have defended facets of the work of Neurath (Okrulik 2004) and Carnap (Yap 2010) as useful for feminism, most analytic feminists find resources in philosophers who themselves reject central dogmas and methods of classical analytic philosophy, for example, Wittgenstein, J.L. Austin, Quine, Davidson, and others.
Let’s take as examples of argument (1) feminists who believe that useful strands of analytic philosophy will be naturalized in some way. We need to cast a wide, permissive net here for what counts as “naturalized” and to acknowledge some controversies over its relation to analytic philosophy and to feminism. As used here, “naturalized philosophy” includes philosophy that is explicitly informed by, rather than replaced by, empirical information about knowers, agents, and social structures from psychology/cognitive science, sociology, anthropology, and elsewhere. Although most analytic feminists favor “naturalizing” philosophy (with a strong preference for its subcategory of social epistemology), they are critical of many nonfeminist ways of doing it.
For example, the focus in traditional naturalized epistemology on “individual” rather than “social” sciences neglects the “situatedness” of our thinking. A final caveat about terminology: since there is disagreement over the proper scope of both “naturalized” and “analytic”, some will object that naturalized philosophy is not a strand of analytic philosophy at all. For example, Quine, who might be considered the father of naturalized epistemology, fits squarely into our characterization of analytic philosophy; however, Lynn Hankinson Nelson considers him post-analytic (Nelson and Nelson 2003). And, of course, there is no necessary link between naturalized philosophy and analytic philosophy in any case; one need only think of Foucault or Dewey to sever that connection.
Keeping in mind all these caveats and controversies, let’s turn to the example of naturalized epistemology to consider what “naturalizing” can do to help feminists overcome difficulties with analytic philosophy. Feminists criticize analytic philosophy for its concepts of a knower (and an agent), for example, that it is an individual who is abstract, idealized, interchangeable, unlocated, disconnected, disembodied, disinterested, etc. The first thing that naturalized epistemology can do is to shift the focus from the abstract or idealized knower to the concrete facets of the person who has beliefs and knowledge. Although this move is not in itself feminist, Jane Duran finds it a positive step toward “gynocentric”, i.e., woman-centered, epistemology. She believes that naturalized epistemology—by its descriptive character and its concern with the context and details of knowing—is capable of including features valued by feminist standpoint epistemology, for example, the relational aspects of knowing and the grounding that knowledge has in the body and in activities of daily life (1991: 112, 246). Duran is one of the first feminists who explicitly combined feminist standpoint theory with analytically oriented naturalized epistemology, and is an exception to the widespread tendency of analytic feminists to stay clear of gynocentrism. Of course, one need not agree with the specifics of Duran’s analysis to appreciate the importance of naturalized epistemology’s descriptive attention to context and concrete details: this descriptive attention allows gender into epistemology as facets of the knower and the context become relevant. One can then debate what kinds of social structures, individual variations, and their interactions are fruitful avenues of exploration.
A second naturalized approach is Louise Antony’s argument concerning a different aspect of the knower—neutrality. Antony maintains that naturalized epistemology resolves the “paradox of bias” (how one can consistently critique male bias and at the same time object to the notion of unbiased, neutral, objective, or impartial knowledge). Naturalized epistemology rejects the ideal of neutrality and instead gives us empirical norms by which to differentiate good from bad biases, that is, biases that lead us toward rather than away from truth (1993 [2002: 113–116, 134–144]). Antony also engages in many other facets of the debate between analytic and non-analytic feminists to which we will return later.
A third strategy, still within the context of a naturalized epistemology/philosophy of science, is to change the relationship between empiricism and the individual. Lynn Hankinson Nelson and Helen Longino are empiricists not in the style of Locke or Hume, but in their positions that evidence comes from the senses, from experience (Nelson 1990: 21; Longino 1990: 215). This is encapsulated by saying that empiricism is a theory of evidence. Using different lines of argument, they both shift the focus from the individual to communities. Nelson argues that communities rather than individuals “‘acquire’ and possess knowledge” (Nelson 1990: 14). She wants to use both Quinian and feminist resources to forge an empiricism sufficiently rich and sophisticated to overcome critiques of earlier feminist empiricism offered, for example, by Harding as well as to avoid feminist objections to individualism (whether to Jaggar’s “abstract individualism” or the other forms discussed above). Nelson maintains that Quine—while remaining an empiricist—had already undermined or abandoned many of the postpositivist characteristics to which Jaggar and Harding object. Thus empiricism, tempered by Nelson’s focus on communities as knowers, can adequately take into account the social identities of knowers and the complex dependencies of individuals on epistemological communities.
Helen Longino’s approach in Science as Social Knowledge (1990) is to argue that among the many ways in which science is social is that epistemological norms apply to practices of communities, not just to individuals. In The Fate of Knowledge (2002), she further develops her contextual empiricist argument along lines that break down the dichotomy between the rational and the social (and many other dichotomies along the way). Although her argument has a wide scope, we are now concerned only with the ways in which her view breaks the connection between individualism and empiricism. Longino distinguishes between individualism as a philosophical position (that, among other things, tends to consider knowers interchangeable) and whether individuals, in fact, have knowledge (2002: 14–48). She does not deny that epistemic norms apply to the practices of individuals or that Einstein had an “extraordinary intellect, but what made [Einstein’s] brilliant ideas knowledge were the processes of critical reception” (2002: 122). Knowledge requires social interaction, not a dichotomy between the rational and the social; it also integrates values—some of them social—at both the constitutive and contextual levels.
The responses of Longino, Nelson, Antony, and Duran to feminist critiques of earlier stages of analytic philosophy all illustrate variations on theme (1): they agree with certain facets of the feminist critique, but draw on resources within particular strands of analytic philosophy (in their cases naturalized epistemology/philosophy of science) as well as other feminist resources to produce epistemologies that overcome the objections to analytic epistemology. Their strategies vary: Longino and Nelson de-emphasize the individual in favor of communities; Antony and Duran keep the focus on individuals, but make them more concrete; in addition, Antony tries to resolve the paradox of bias.
Let us turn much more briefly to strategies (2) and (3). The claim in (2) is that there were errors of interpretation in the feminist analyses of analytic philosophy and its antecedents that weaken the feminist critiques. In (3) it is that critics have gone too far in undermining fields of philosophy such as metaphysics or central notions such as rationality that we need to retain. Examples of both approaches (sometimes even in one paper) can be found in Louise Antony and Charlotte Witt’s A Mind of One’s Own, a collection of papers that focused on reason and objectivity in both the history of Western philosophy and various fields of contemporary philosophy (1993 ). Those who propound claim (2) include Margaret Atherton and Louise Antony. Atherton (1993 ) criticizes both Genevieve Lloyd (1984) and Susan Bordo (1987) for their interpretations of Descartes. Although Atherton’s piece is purely historical, it is relevant to our discussion because feminists of all persuasions who debate the merit of analytic philosophy acknowledge historical analyses, especially Lloyd’s extensive work on “the man of reason”. Louise Antony argues that Jaggar (1983) and Jane Flax (1987) mischaracterize the rationalist or empiricist traditions, and so miss the extent to which analytic philosophers have already rejected aspects of them. This leads feminists to misidentify analytic epistemology with empiricism and overlook more rationalistic possibilities (Antony 1993 ).
Finally, strategy (3). When analytic feminists defend a field or a concept from critiques of other feminists who have “gone too far”, they might be fending off poststructuralist critics who do not want to do traditional metaphysics at all or they might be arguing about which aspects of the field are male-biased (for example, foundationalist styles of metaphysics or the tendency to see selected categories as natural). Both Charlotte Witt and Sally Haslanger argue that there is no specifically feminist reason for rejecting metaphysics in general. Witt considers the particular case of “what it is to be human”. She argues that feminists, in fact, need assumptions and theories about what it is to be human even in order to criticize traditional metaphysical theories (1993 ). Haslanger discusses a range of issues concerning social construction, realism, and natural and social kinds. In the course of her discussion of feminists such as Catharine MacKinnon and Judith Butler, Haslanger makes many distinctions among kinds and functions of social constructions, sorts out ways in which metaphysics and politics are related, and, in general, provides an example of feminist metaphysical debate that distinguishes male-biased facets of metaphysics from facets useful for feminists (1995b, 1996, 2000, 2012). One way of characterizing this approach is that it goes for the “kernels of truth” within larger, more problematic (or at least more polemical) discussions, and thereby performs a service for readers who might be sympathetic with some aspects of the views of MacKinnon or Butler, but who are not willing to accept the body of work that encompasses them.
A more controversial analytic feminist response that fits into (3) is Martha Nussbaum’s defense of concepts and standards of objectivity and reason. She argues forcefully that it is in feminists’ interests, both theoretically and practically, to retain fairly traditional ideals of objectivity and rationality while acknowledging their abusive use. This position, in itself, would not have generated great controversy, even if not universally accepted. However, because Nussbaum sees certain critics of the male-biased aspects of objectivity and reason as part of a “feminist assault on reason” (1994: 59), her essay and her interpretation of other feminists’ views generated wide and heated discussion among feminist philosophers at the time.
As we close the discussion of analytic feminists’ responses to critiques of analytic philosophy, it is important to restate the obvious: not every analytic feminist would agree with the responses articulated in the few examples chosen here. Indeed, in spite of the desire that analytic feminist philosophy be sufficiently normative, there is disagreement over issues such as the attitude to take toward concepts that have typically embodied that normativity. Consider traditional ideals of objectivity: views range from the claim that although the ideals of rationality and objectivity are “both unattainable and undesirable”, we nevertheless ought to embrace them as “regulative norms” or “heuristics” (Antony 1995: 87) to a number of different understandings of objectivity that would make them not so subject to distortion or misuse (for example, E. Lloyd 1995a, 1995b; Haslanger 1993 ; Scheman 2001a; Heldke 2001; Janack 2002).
Finally, we need to remember that what feminists expect of a philosophical method—their own preferred method(s) or others—will influence their critique of it. It is important to be realistic in considering what any particular method might offer a feminist. For example, an analytic method is likely to provide a feminist with much more assistance in clarifying concepts, making distinctions, and evaluating arguments than with creating her “vision” or defining the goals of her work (see Garry 1995).
7. Analytic Feminism: Limitations and Challenges
Although traditional analytic philosophy seemed to many to be the least hospitable philosophical method for feminism, analytic feminists’ work over the decades has greatly increased the method’s hospitality and showed its promise. Let’s now consider some limitations and challenges that remain for analytic feminism.
The strengths and limitations of various kinds of feminist philosophies can grow from the same sources—if feminists are close to a mainstream tradition, they are subject to at least some of its limitations although they stand a better chance of influencing it and “building bridges” than do those who critique the tradition more deeply. Audre Lorde, addressing the racism and heterosexism of a feminist conference in 1979, pointed to one risk quite powerfully by saying, “The master’s tools will never dismantle the master’s house” (Lorde 1984: 112). Although over the decades Lorde’s claim sent chills down the spines of feminists across the disciplines, the very existence of feminist philosophy requires that neither the “tools” of the philosophical trade nor the house(s) are the sole property of the “master”. Feminist philosophers, analytic or not, build on the work not only of other feminists and other scholars doing engaged work, but also of some traditional philosophers sometimes. Because of the desire to utilize as well as modify traditional philosophy, feminists must always be alert for deeper levels of male or other kinds of bias that may become apparent in their work—possible unwanted baggage of traditional analytic philosophy.
Some potentially relevant “baggage” for analytic feminists include the deeper limitations of their concepts and methods and the level of abstraction at which they tend to work. For example, when any of these contribute to an inability to notice and center diverse experiences, analytic feminists do not attend to a full range of complex human lives that they hope to encompass; the impact and meaning of race/ethnicity, social class, religion, nationality, queer and trans lives, lives of people with disabilities, and others will be lost. Examples of such limitations as well as others are below.
- Kristie Dotson, while praising Fricker’s (2007) strong contribution to understanding epistemic injustice, argues that Fricker’s lack of an “open conceptual structure” about what constitutes epistemic injustice leads her work to perpetuate epistemic injustice. This has happened, Dotson argues, because Fricker contrasts epistemic injustice with epistemic bad luck (Dotson 2012: 25). Dotson explores epistemic oppression in more expansive ways that speak more directly to the different levels of systemic oppression and that encompass various important forms of epistemic exclusion and violence, including, for example, silencing and smothering (2011, 2012, 2014).
- Naomi Scheman and Linda Martín Alcoff point out ways in which analytic feminists may not fully appreciate all the political, metaphysical and epistemological baggage that has already been packed into their theories and concepts. Scheman thinks that Nussbaum stops listening too soon to attacks on rationality and fails to appreciate that openness to reasonable argument (advocated by Nussbaum) implies that we recognize when our own conception of reasonableness is being questioned (Scheman 2001b). Alcoff, maintaining that we need some concept of reason, makes a similar argument against Nussbaum and points out the dogmatic character of claiming that some particular concept of reason is the concept that cannot be given up (Alcoff 1995).
A closely related objection is that it is not always easy or even possible to detach one’s method from one’s politics. Because some analytic feminist work is liberal, for example, Nussbaum (2000a), Cudd (2006), and Bhandary (2020), other analytic feminists take pains to separate their method from their politics. Antony argues that her own socialist politics are compatible with an analytic method (2003). Although one can appreciate Antony’s point, if an analytic feminist is articulating a socialist feminism, rather than favoring some kind of socialism or other, then the facets of her position derived ultimately from Marx, from Quine, and from feminism need to be hammered out carefully in order to settle down together well.
Others raise more general questions about the relation between philosophical method and feminist and anti-racist politics. For example, Alice Crary, taking on the general relation between philosophical method and feminist politics, finds that Fricker’s neutral philosophical methods and concepts of reason (2007) are not sufficiently radical to support feminist politics (2018). Tina Fernandes Botts (2018) and Jana Cattien (2019) both criticize analytic feminists’ highly abstract level of analyzing race and gender as well as their use of similar models for both. Instead, specific lived experiences of marginalized people need to figure more centrally in our thinking (Botts 2018). Cattien argues that what is at stake politically is obscured by analytic feminist metaphysicians (including their normative assumptions) and that they need “to be able to take themselves as objects of a politically charged critique” (2019: 733). For example, she finds Haslanger’s (2012) analysis that places all races on one conceptual plane can’t do justice to “white complicities in perpetuating racist power relations” (2019: 720).
Clusters of separate objections focus around subjectivity and standpoints. Traditional analytic philosophy has been rightly criticized for its inability to handle subjectivity. In thinking about whether this criticism applies to analytic feminists as well, let’s consider it in the context of knowledge. Elizabeth Anderson calls the position that knowledge is “situated” the fundamental point of feminist epistemology (see feminist epistemology and philosophy of science). Can “situated” knowledge as developed by analytic feminists capture both the individual subjectivity of human beings and the ways in which material conditions and complex social institutions structure the standpoints of women and others in marginalized groups? There are obviously two separate questions here—asked together because they focus on whether analytic feminism has the resources to capture what is very important to other feminist methodological traditions: standpoint theory, psychoanalysis, and poststructuralism.
Consider Longino as an example: she is dealing with situated knowledge in the context of the sciences. Her contextual empiricism and her more recent argument to dissolve completely the rational/social dichotomy and the dichotomies that underlie it allow her to delve into the right areas. Of course, science is not all of life or knowledge, so her argument would need to be extended into areas of everyday life that Code, among others, has discussed. Whatever the limitations of contextual empiricism, it is better at analyzing the structural and material features that construct subjectivity than it is at illuminating individual subjectivity. It is in the latter area that poststructuralist and psychoanalytic approaches flourish (see, for example, Butler 1990; Butler & Salih 2003; Irigaray 1991; Whitford 1991; Kristeva & Oliver 2002). Their focus on the opaque, fragmented, or unfinished character of human subjectivity may be a bit untidy for many analytic feminists. But given the importance of this topic for feminist philosophy, there is a need for fruitful dialogue about it.
Feminist standpoint theory, drawing originally from Marxist theory, raised a cluster of questions for analytic feminists: whether they can explain the political/material construction of standpoints in the production of knowledge, how they treat community-wide biases and assumptions, what criteria they use to distinguish “good” and “bad” biases, and so on. Harding advocates a pluralistic form of standpoint theory that focuses on the importance of starting research from the lives of marginalized people (1991). Doing so has many advantages, including an increased likelihood that we will be able to uncover community-wide biases and assumptions of the privileged as we produce knowledge in a number of fields. Although initially analytic feminist empiricists and standpoint theorists saw each other as embodying rival traditions and were often critical of each other, analytic feminist empiricists then developed significant interest in looking at the resources offered by standpoint theory as well as pursuing common themes or consensus in the two kinds of approaches (see, for example, Wylie 2004; Potter 2006; Crasnow 2008; Intemann 2010, 2016; Anderson 2020; and a 2009 Hypatia symposium that includes Crasnow, Harding, Rouse, Kourany, Rolin, and Solomon, all 2009). A range of possibilities include
- incorporating the insights of standpoint theory into empirical (and empiricist) work (Wylie 2004),
- maintaining that in a number of their forms they are compatible (Anderson 2020), or
- arguing that feminist empiricism and standpoint theory have significant overlaps but that their remaining differences show that they need each other (Intemann 2010).
Related objections arise concerning naturalized epistemology. As mentioned above, feminist social epistemology is the most typical form of naturalized feminist epistemology today. Social epistemologists have deep critiques of individually oriented and “scientistic” analytic naturalized epistemology. In addition to feminists already discussed above, Code and Phyllis Rooney have both argued that there is tension between typical naturalized epistemology and feminist epistemology; Rooney calls it an “uneasy alliance” (Rooney 2003). Code offers an ecological model that she maintains is preferable to analytically and individualistically oriented naturalism (1996, 2006). Rooney appeals to psychological studies of gender and cognition to provide evidence for her critique of assumptions of empirical studies (and of the epistemology that structures and then uses the empirical results). For example, Rooney wants to critique the assumption of the stability of the individual/social distinction, the stability of gender—or even that gender is either stable or situational, for there might be more choices (Rooney 2003). Although analytic feminist naturalized epistemologists might well agree with much of Rooney’s critique, Code’s 2006 ecological model would be a nearly impossible stretch. In any case, analytic feminists must be very careful as they choose their own models to reflect upon the kinds of assumptions to which they acquiesce, whether those just mentioned or others that might go under the label “scientism”.
The final cluster of challenges concerns language, images, and “rhetorical space”. These challenges are meant to call attention to other kinds of “baggage” of which analytic feminists need to be aware. Although both feminist and nonfeminist analytic philosophers are thought to favor literal uses of language, they also rely on metaphors, analogies, images and the like in the course of making their philosophical cases (think of the frequency of Neurath’s ship via Quine). Analytic feminists need to give attention to the assumptions and implications of their literal uses of language, their images and how they relate to what Lorraine Code calls the “rhetorical spaces” in which they function (or, in other cases, fail to function). In using “rhetorical spaces” Code is thinking of the ways in which our discourses are structured to limit what can count as meaningful, be taken seriously, yield insight, expect uptake, and so on (1995: ix–x; with continued discussion in Code 2006).
Marguerite La Caze, using methodology developed by Michèle Le Dœuff, argues that both feminist and nonfeminist analytic philosophers use images that can unwittingly perpetuate images that exclude women—think of mythical social contracts in political philosophy and visual and spatial metaphors about knowledge (La Caze 2002, Le Dœuff 1980 ; see also Gatens 1991). Analytic feminists are being called upon to widen the rhetorical spaces in analytic philosophy as well as to recognize and scrutinize the images that they, in fact, use in the course of their allegedly literal speech.
Most analytic feminists welcome challenges to their positions from other feminists of any background. For, after all, there is no easier way to be kept honest and to recognize one’s own collusion with male or other biases in philosophy than to have feminist colleagues point it out. It is part of any reasonable feminism to want to remain open to the ongoing possibility of collusion and self-deception. Candid, fair-minded conversation benefits all forms of feminism.
8. Is it Important to Identify Feminists by Their Philosophical Methods?
Although methodology is the focus in this entry, it is nevertheless important to ask to what extent there is value in identifying feminist philosophy by method (see Garry 2018). The field of academic feminist philosophy has developed, even flourished, across most all philosophical fields and topics since the 1970s—in spite of backlash and lingering resistance harbored in some quarters. Feminist philosophers have taught and mentored multiple generations of students who themselves generate new directions in feminist philosophy; feminist dissertations, publications, and organizations have increased; feminists drawing on many different philosophical methods learn from and cite each other; practitioners of fields such as feminism, critical race theory, trans and queer theory, critical disability theory, decolonial theory, and others, understand the importance of engaging across and integrating work in these fields. Many feminist philosophers, especially from more recent generations, simply go about their work without concerning themselves with labels of philosophical method. In this context there are reasons to downplay differences in method. In addition, it makes sense not to emphasize philosophical method if it unnecessarily limits the appeal of someone’s work, especially in interdisciplinary or transnational feminist contexts. Nor would one want a focus on method to be accompanied by a lack of open-mindedness or a sense of “superiority”.
At the same time, methodological labels can be useful. They can help us understand feminists’ framing of issues, terminology, probable toolboxes, and the feminist and traditional philosophers most likely to have influenced their work. After all, feminist philosophers often carry the methodological influence of their graduate philosophy departments for many decades thereafter, albeit with varying strengths of attachment. In addition, some feminists want to acknowledge explicitly their connection to analytic philosophy; for example, Cudd in Analyzing Oppression, makes a point to situate her work in and defend both the analytic and liberal traditions (2006: ix).
In fact, some discussions are best understood in an analytic context and are engaged in primarily by analytic feminists, for example, twenty-first century debates in philosophy of language and metaphysics concerning the categories of woman/man, sex, and gender. They have encompassed disagreements over the nature of social categories and social construction, the degree to which social categories have grounding in the material world or should be analyzed as dispositions to behave, the moral and political values assumed in metaphysical discussions, the meaning of the categories for trans, queer, and nonbinary people (including their legal implications), and so on (for example, see Witt 2011a; Haslanger 2012; Saul 2012; Bettcher 2013, 2017; Diaz-Leon 2016; Jenkins 2016, 2018; Mikkola 2016; Ásta 2018; Dembroff 2018, 2020; Barnes 2020; Antony 2020—among many others. More detailed discussion can also be found in the entries on feminist philosophy of language, feminist metaphysics, and feminist perspectives on sex and gender.)
Another reason to wonder about the importance of methodological labels is that methods can work in varied ways across philosophical subfields. Consider whether fields such as moral, social, and political philosophy frequently have separate analytic discussions or methodological identifications. Although feminist philosophers in these fields might prefer a particular writing or argumentative style or prefer to engage with Rawls rather than Levinas or Habermas, the fault lines or “sides” in major feminist controversies rarely fall neatly into divisions among analytic and non-analytic feminists. Instead, early typical feminist controversies in moral philosophy, for example, concerned whether one should favor an ethics of justice over an ethics of care or a virtue ethics, or whether one should prefer Kant over Hume or Aristotle as a starting point for moral thinking (see, for example, Held 1993, Herman 1993, Homiak 1993, Larrabee 1993, Baier 1994). Interestingly, the degree to which feminist moral philosophers—analytic or not—rely upon and integrate historical figures into their work seems to be greater than among analytic feminists doing epistemology and metaphysics.
Another persistently debated topic that does not divide neatly by methodological orientation is the extent to which liberalism is satisfactory for feminist politics and ethics. For example, Nussbaum defends her well known liberal “capabilities” approach as applicable across cultures against anti-liberal opponents (2000a, 2000b, entry on the capability approach). Asha Bhandary also supports liberalism and maintains that it can adequately support dependency care provided that we make sure that caregiving and caregivers do not remain invisible due to sexism and racism (2020). However, Serene Khader, argues that although feminism needs “universalist” opposition to sexism, it does not require Western liberalism, which itself can even perpetuate sexist oppression in some cultures (2019). Debates over liberalism are not likely to end soon, especially given the number of philosophers writing from decolonial perspectives.
As feminists explore a wide range of topics in moral, social, and political philosophy the salience of their methodological background often recedes, especially when their work draws on resources both outside and inside philosophy—sometimes including the authors’ own social locations and experiences. Their work also bears on urgent public issues. Let’s note briefly a few different kinds of examples. Serena Parekh combines multiple philosophical and empirical methods in writing on refugees and the ethics of forced displacement (2017). For many decades Anita Allen has combined law and philosophy in her work on privacy (1988, 2019). Myisha Cherry writes about rage and other emotions and attitudes in public life (2019, forthcoming). Ayanna De’Vante Spencer is among those writing about the missing narratives of Black women and girls who have been victims of police brutality (2018). Eva Feder Kittay has written for many years on the ethics of dependency and care, cognitive disabilities, and their impact on moral philosophy (for example, 1999, 2019). And, of course, there are entire fields of feminist ethics that cross many kinds of methodological lines, for example, feminist bioethics and feminist philosophy of disability, and the wider field of critical disability theory.
When philosophers’ own intersectional identities are reflected in their writing, their identities usually have more prominence than their choice of philosophical toolbox or a preference for an “analytic writing style”. For example, Alcoff and Naomi Zack have both written on race and mixed race for decades (Zack 1993, Alcoff 2006); some of their more recent work on mixed race has been collected along with other feminists and philosophers of race in Botts (2016). For other philosophers, writing as lesbian feminists and more recently as trans feminists is salient. For example, since the beginning of academic feminist philosophy Marilyn Frye, Claudia Card, and Sarah Hoagland have provided decades of lesbian feminist philosophy (see, for example, Frye 1983, 1992, 2001; Card 1995, 1996, 2002; Hoagland, 1988). Cheshire Calhoun’s Feminism, The Family, and the Politics of the Closet explores the structure of gay and lesbian subordination and its relation to feminism (2000). Trans feminist philosophers work on topics in moral and political philosophy as well as metaphysics and epistemology; they aim to make trans lives visible, livable, and valued, and understood (See, for example, Bettcher 2019, forthcoming; Kapusta 2016; McKinnon 2014; Zurn 2019).
As we draw this section to a close, it is important not to overstate the way differences in philosophical methods play out in generations of feminists or in subfields of feminist philosophy: the differences are matters of degree. It is even more important to remind ourselves that feminist philosophy, whatever its method, retains both feminist and philosophical roots. It is not to be subsumed solely under a patrilineal philosophical identity. In the context of discussing the importance of constructing a feminist genealogy of feminist thought by claiming and engaging with other feminist thinkers, Frye notes ironically how much “better placed in history” it seems to be when one is seen
in that august Oxbridge lineage [of Austin and Wittgenstein, rather] than in a lineage featuring dozens of mimeographed feminist pamphlets authored by collectives, … Kate Millett, Mary Daly, Andrea Dworkin, … [feminist philosophers such as] Claudia Card, Naomi Scheman, Maria Lugones, Sarah Hoagland, and troubadours like Alix Dobkin and Willie Tyson. (Frye 2001: 86–87)
In order to resist the comfort/erasure of the patrilineal heritage, analytic feminists, echoing Frye, can claim and engage other feminist thinkers, critical race theorists, trans and queer theorists, and more. Many already do so. This will not only help to sustain a feminist tradition, it will also increase the richness of feminist work and decrease the odds of feminists being held captive by male-biased philosophical methods, theories, concepts and images.
Analytic feminists have left barely any philosophical topic untouched. Readers who want to review the most recent work by analytic feminists in specific areas of philosophy should consult the entries listed here. A longer list that includes entries that broadly incorporate several methods or are simply hard to categorize appears as “Related Entries” after the Bibliography.
- Feminist Metaphysics
- Feminist Philosophy of Language
- Feminist Perspectives on Sex and Gender
- Feminist Epistemology and Philosophy of Science
- Feminist Social Epistemology
- Feminist Perspectives on Science
- Feminist Philosophy of Biology
- Liberal Feminism
- Feminist Moral Psychology
- Feminist Philosophy of Law
- Feminist Perspectives on Autonomy
- Feminist Perspectives on Bioethics
- Feminist Perspectives on Objectification
- Feminist Perspectives on Reproduction and the Family
- Alcoff, Linda Martín, 1995, “Is the Feminist Critique of Reason Rational?”, Philosophical Topics, 23(2): 1–26. doi:10.5840/philtopics19952323
- –––, 1996, Real Knowing: New Versions of the Coherence Theory, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
- –––, 2006, Visible Identities: Race, Gender, and the Self, New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/0195137345.001.0001
- Alcoff, Linda and Elizabeth Potter (eds.), 1993, Feminist Epistemologies, New York: Routledge.
- Allen, Anita L., 1988, Uneasy Access: Privacy for Women in a Free Society, Lanham, MD: Rowman and Littlefield.
- –––, 2019, “The Philosophy of Privacy and Digital Life”, Proceedings and Addresses of the American Philosophical Association, 93: 21–38.
- Anderson, Elizabeth, 1995a, “Feminist Epistemology: An Interpretation and a Defense”, Hypatia, 10(3): 50–84. doi:10.1111/j.1527-2001.1995.tb00737.x
- –––, 1995b, “Knowledge, Human Interests, and Objectivity in Feminist Epistemology”, Philosophical Topics, 23(2): 27–58. doi:10.5840/philtopics199523213
- –––, 2002, “Should Feminists Reject Rational Choice Theory?”, in Antony and Witt 2002: 369–397. Not in 1993 edition.
- –––, 2000 , “Feminist Epistemology and Philosophy of Science”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Spring 2020 edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/spr2020/entries/feminism-epistemology/>
- Antony, Louise M., 1993 , “Quine as Feminist: The Radical Import of Naturalized Epistemology”, in Antony and Witt 1993 [2002: 110–153].
- –––, 1995, “Sisters, Please, I’d Rather Do It Myself: A Defense of Individualism in Feminist Epistemology”, Philosophical Topics, 23(2): 59–94. doi:10.5840/philtopics19952322
- –––, 2003, “Fantasies for Empowerment and Entitlement: Analytic Philosophy and Feminism”, American Philosophical Association Newsletter on Feminism and Philosophy, 2(2): 126–129. [Antony 2003 available online]
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Other Internet Resources
- Hypatia: A Journal of Feminist Philosophy. Contains some open access articles.
- Feminist Philosophy Quarterly (FPQ). Online, open access, peer-reviewed journal.
- American Philosophical Association Newsletter on Feminism and Philosophy. Online issues start in 2001.
- American Philosophical Association Committee on the Status of Women, Publications page
- Association for Feminist Ethics and Social Theory
- Society for Analytical Feminism
- International Association for Women Philosophers
- Society for the Study of Women Philosophers
- Resources listed on websites of individual philosophers, for example, Sally Haslanger
- See also Other Internet Resources listed under Feminist Philosophy and Feminist Epistemology and Philosophy of Science.