Fitting Attitude Theories of Value

First published Thu Mar 17, 2011

Fitting attitude (FA) theories propose to analyze value, or some limited range of values, in terms of evaluative attitudes endorsed as fitting—or, alternatively, as appropriate, correct, merited, proper, rational, or warranted. (FA theories come in both cognitivist and noncognitivist versions, and can be given either a realist or a quasi-realist gloss. For discussion of this point, see (D'Arms and Jacobson 2006a)). Contrast this view with its two main realist alternatives, robust realism and dispositionalism. According to robust realism, values exist independently of human responses to them, like such primary qualities as shape and size. A yellow tennis ball looks spherical because it is (roughly) a sphere; and shapes can be defined without recourse to anything about our responses to them. By contrast, colors depend, in some way, both on the qualities of things and on our perceptual capacities. Even if yellow is defined in terms of certain physical properties of yellow objects, the reason we conceive of colors as we do—which makes yellow a useful concept to us—is because of the way our color vision happens to work. According to a simple dispositionalist view of color, yellowness just is whatever has the power to arouse yellow appearances to normal human observers in standard conditions. Similarly, a dispositionalist view of value understands funniness, for instance, in terms of whatever amuses normal humans in standard conditions; whereas robust realism about the comic holds that amusement, when correct, is a perception of some mind-independent quality of funniness.

An FA theory of humor agrees with dispositionalism that the funny can only be characterized in terms of a human response (amusement); but it also holds, with robust realism, that the amusement of even normal humans in standard conditions can be mistaken: it can be unfitting. To call something funny is in some way to endorse amusement at it, not to report or predict it. The attraction of FA theory is that it purports to capture the sense that we ought to be amused at certain things because they are funny, as robust realism has it, while agreeing with dispositionalism that funny cannot be understood except by way of human response and sensibility: our sense of humor.

Although terms such as ‘fitting’, ‘appropriate’, and the like are often used interchangeably, there are several distinct forms of endorsement one can give to evaluative attitudes (such as emotions and desires), and the failure to differentiate adequately between them gives rise to the central outstanding problem facing FA theory: the wrong kind of reason problem. Consider the simplest form of FA theory, which analyzes goodness in terms of what it is fitting to desire: the desirable. Not all considerations in favor of desiring something manifest its desirability; for instance, incentives and sanctions attached to desire do not. Perhaps desiring certain good things (such as happiness) makes one less likely to succeed in getting them. If so, then that seems a good reason not to desire happiness, but it clearly does not show that happiness isn't desirable. Thus FA theories must explicate a notion of fittingness that can distinguish reasons of the right kind: those relevant to evaluative judgment of the object. Moreover, the evaluative attitudes used by the theory must not already involve the value concept it attempts to explicate, on pain of circularity. If to desire something involves thinking it good, for example, then an FA theory of goodness in terms of fitting desire seems circular. However, certain FA accounts claim, at least with respect to more fine-grained attitudes and specific values, that such circularity is not vicious because it does real explanatory work.

The class of FA theories includes some quite disparate views, which differ importantly in their fundamental motivation as well as in their scope and ambition. Although the renewed interest in FA theories arose from a dispute between quasi-realist expressivism (Blackburn 1993, Gibbard 1990) and anthropocentric, less-than-robust realism (McDowell 1998, Wiggins 1987), the metaethical differences between these two approaches seem less significant than their similarities (D'Arms and Jacobson 2006a). Rather, the most significant differences among FA theories concern the range of values they seek to analyze, the specific evaluative attitudes they adduce to do so, and whether or not they give explanatory priority to those evaluative attitudes. Three distinct varieties of FA theory are generic attitude theories, which aspire to give a general and non-circular theory of value in terms of some capacious notion such as desire or approval; sentimentalist theories that focus specifically on the sentiments and those values most intimately related to them, such as shame and the shameful; and sensibility theories, which deny the priority of evaluative attitudes in favor of an overtly circular account of value properties and evaluative responses.

1. Generic Fitting Attitude Theories of Value

According to the most straightforward and ambitious form of the fitting attitude theory of value, to be valuable is to be the fitting object of some evaluative attitude. Since FA theories seek to analyze both value and disvalue, they must include both forms of approval and disapproval. Thus A. C. Ewing (1948: 168) writes: “if we analyse good as ‘fitting object of a pro attitude’, it will be easy enough to analyse bad as ‘fitting object of an anti attitude’, this term covering dislike, disapproval, avoidance, etc.” For the sake of simplicity, I will use ‘value’ here to refer both to positive and negative features, except when it is important to differentiate between them. Along with Ewing, Franz Brentano is usually cited as among the first proponents of an FA theory of value. Brentano (1969: 18) states his view this way: “In the broadest sense of the term, the good is that which is worthy of love, that which can be loved with a love that is correct.” Despite his use of the emotion terms ‘love’ and ‘hate’, Brentano does not have specific emotions in mind; rather, he includes as forms of love all desiderative attitudes, and as forms of hate all aversive ones.

Brentano is typically credited with holding an FA theory of value. This interpretation requires him to be read as understanding the correctness of love and other evaluative attitudes as something other than the truth of some proposition on which they are founded. Fear, for example, cannot be even partly constituted by the belief that the feared object is dangerous, such that fear is correct whenever that proposition is true. Otherwise the value of an object—its goodness or badness—would make it worthy of love or hate, respectively, thus reversing the order of explanation definitive of FA accounts, as opposed to robust realism. All sides grant that it is fitting to approve of the good and disapprove of the bad; what differentiates FA theory is its ambition to explicate value by way of (fitting) evaluative attitudes. Thus when Brentano (1969: 75) writes, “One loves or hates correctly provided that one's feelings are adequate to their object—adequate in the sense of being appropriate, suitable, or fitting”—this is commonly taken as an injunction so to direct one's love and hate (Chisholm 1986). If so then both Brentano and Ewing seek to analyze all value in terms of the whole array of positive and negative evaluative attitudes. I will term these broadest and most ambitious forms of the view generic fitting attitude theories of value.

It will prove most perspicuous to hold two related but distinct claims as constitutive of fitting attitude accounts. First, FA theories reduce values to a fundamentally different sort of normative notion, involving what one ought, or has reason, to feel. The first tenet of the view, then, is the reduction of the evaluative to the deontic, or normative reduction for short. This is to say that values such as the good and the funny are to be understood in terms of what one ought, or has most reason, to feel. This point is explicitly noted by Chisholm (1986: 53): “This way of defining intrinsic value, then, makes use of the concept of requirement,” in order to provide “a way of reducing the concepts of the theory of value (‘axiology’) to those of ethics (‘deontology’).” It is important not to understand ‘deontic’ to refer specifically to moral obligation. As Ewing (1948: 132) observes, when we speak loosely of what we ought to feel, this “‘ought’ really covers two different concepts, the concept of fittingness and the concept of moral obligation.” It is the former notion with which FA analysis is primarily concerned. I will follow the recent trend of explicating fittingness in terms of what we have reason to feel rather than what we ought to feel. But the crucial point is that fittingness, the fundamental normative notion of FA theory, is distinct from other forms of endorsement of an attitude, for instance as prudent or morally obligatory. This is no minor point since—as we shall see in discussing the wrong kind of reason problem—the theory is doomed to failure unless it can draw this distinction (D'Arms and Jacobson 2000b).

The second tenet of FA theory is its response-dependent account of value, on which values are partly determined by human responses and attitudes. As David Wiggins (1987: 206) describes the view, considered as a general theory of value, it holds: “x is good if and only if x is the sort of thing that calls forth or makes appropriate a certain sentiment of approbation given the range of propensities we have to respond in this or that way.” Notice that Wiggins's formulation is deliberately equivocal on the crucial point of whether the sentiment must be merited or merely caused. It allows for both response-dependent views that embrace normative reduction (by using a notion of “appropriate” sentiments) and views that instead reduce value to natural facts (about what sentiments are “called forth”). This illustrates why it is not trivial to characterize fitting attitude theories of value in terms of attitudes deemed to be fitting—that is, via response-dependency and normative reduction. This way of articulating the two tenets of FA theory has the significant implication of ruling out those theories of value that hold one tenet but not the other, which helps settle some outstanding taxonomic issues. Certain “buck-passing” accounts hold the normative reduction claim without response-dependency, whereas dispositional theories, including certain forms of sentimentalism, hold response-dependency without reducing value to another normative notion. This will be discussed further in the sections on buck-passing and sentimentalism.

Consider first the normative reduction claim. Here FA theories conflict with the commonsense view of value, which derives reasons from values (cf. Stratton-Lake and Hooker 2006). Take the simplest case: an innocent pleasure granted to be intrinsically good. Many philosophers hold such pleasure to be good independently of anything about human desire or approval. Of course people typically do want pleasure, and should want it; but such desire is fitting because pleasure is good. Similarly, we typically approve of people getting pleasure, and should do so; but approval is fitting because this is a good state of affairs. According to generic FA theory, by contrast, what it is for something to be good is for it to be a fitting object of some pro-attitude such as desire or approval. In this view, what makes pleasure good is something about our attitudes—albeit not about our actual attitudes (which may be unfitting). But the central question remains. Why derive value from the fittingness of attitudes, rather than understanding evaluative attitudes as being sensitive to values that exist independently of them, which are fitting whenever this apprehension is veridical?

The motivation for adopting an FA theory becomes clearer when one moves from a single case, especially the paradigmatic good of pleasure, to other good things. Consider a plausible list of intrinsic values: pleasure, beauty, friendship, and knowledge. Though this isn't monistic hedonism, it's a very modest pluralism on which there are four distinct goods instead of one. Someone might wonder what these things have in common, in virtue of which they are good. Of course there may be no answer, if it is just a brute fact that there are four intrinsic goods, which resemble each other simply in having the property of goodness. But another sort of response suggests itself. Perhaps what unifies these goods is something about human attitudes. Maybe pleasure, knowledge, beauty, and friendship are all desirable or admirable things, where this means not that we can desire or admire them but that we should (ought, have reason to) do so, in virtue of facts about human nature, the inherent qualities of those attitudes, and natural facts about the objects. Were we lone but rational wolves, we would have no use—and hence no fitting desire—for the friendship of other wolves, and no reason to admire lupine loyalty or the other traits requisite for friendship. Hence the response-dependency thesis makes values anthropocentric, in that they depend on human capacities and dispositions, and would be of no inherent interest to rational beings who lacked those propensities. If this seems problematic with respect to good and bad, it may seem much more plausible when it comes to the funny and the shameful.

The notion that value, or at least some range of values, depends essentially on human responses has been championed by philosophers who draw an analogy between values and secondary qualities. McDowell (1985: 143) puts the point this way:

To press the analogy is to stress that evaluative “attitudes,” or states of will are like (say) colour experience in being unintelligible except as modifications of a sensibility like ours. The idea of value experience involves taking admiration, say, to represent its object as having a property that (although there in the object) is essentially subjective in much the same way as the property that an object is represented as having by an experience of redness—that is, understood adequately only in terms of the appropriate modification of human (or similar) sensibility.

Notwithstanding the anthropocentric nature of colors, some things really are red and others not, and propositions about colors are knowable. Response-dependency is thus compatible with evaluative truth and knowledge, although these are not basic facts about the universe. Both anthropocentrism and the rejection of skepticism are held in common between sensibility theory, which holds the normative reduction thesis and thus counts as an FA account, and dispositional theories of value which do not.

Although the response-dependency thesis provides grounds for giving priority to the deontic notions, it also presents a challenge to FA theory. Advocates of the commonsense view object that the relevant evaluative responses already invoke the value concepts they are supposed to explicate. W. D. Ross (1939: 278–9) formulates this challenge with respect to admiration, but it can be posed for any pro-attitude:

Admiration is not a mere emotion; it is an emotion accompanied by the thought that that which is admired is good. And if we ask on what ground a thing is worthy of being thought to be good, only one answer is possible, namely that it is good. It would be absurd to say that a thing is good only in the sense that it is worthy of being thought to be good, for our definition of ‘good’ would then include the very word ‘good’ which we were seeking to define.

FA theory must hold that attitudes such as admiration and approval have standards of fittingness that serve to make certain things, and not others, valuable. Furthermore, these evaluative attitudes must not already contain the thought that their object is good, on pain of circularity. This challenge forces FA theory to engage with the philosophy of emotion. Both Ross and Ewing seem implicitly to accept some version of the feeling theory of emotion, on which emotions—or at any rate “mere emotions”—are simply feelings with no essential cognitive component.

Ewing (1948: 154) responds to the circularity challenge by suggesting that admiration can be understood as an emotion without invoking the concept of good, which FA theory is attempting to analyze:

Nor must we use “admired” or “approved” here to stand for “judged good,” since in that case we should be guilty of a vicious circle. The word must, in the analysis given, stand for an emotion or a state of mind tinged with emotional qualities.

But Ewing's response does not seem adequate to meet the circularity objection. Ross grants that admiration is, in part, an emotion. His objection is that it also involves thought about the goodness of the object, as would Ewing's “state of mind tinged with emotional qualities.” In order to avoid circularity, it seems that FA theory has to make two claims. First, that such attitudes as admiration are not merely affectively tinged but simply emotions. Second, it must offer an account of the emotions on which they do not include thoughts about their object's value. In the section on sentimentalism, I will suggest that such a non-cognitive account of certain basic emotions might prove tenable. But if thoughts of the object's value are even partly constitutive of the attitudes FA theory uses to analyze value, then the theory is circular—whether viciously or not.

Three possibilities remain for the development of FA theory, which correspond to its main versions. First, generic FA theories aspire to give a non-circular account of value generally. They therefore need to claim that the broad pro and con attitudes utilized by the theory to explicate good and bad do not already involve those very concepts. Second, although sensibility theory too aspires to elucidate all value, it eschews the ambition to give a non-circular account. The question then becomes whether a circular account really can be informative and, hence, not vicious. Third, a sentimentalist theory can be more modest about how broadly the account applies, but it needs to give an account of the sentiments on which they do not contain those evaluative concepts analyzed—for instance, an account of amusement that can be characterized independently of thinking something funny. Finally, all FA theories have to solve the wrong kind of reason problem, in order to fix on those considerations for or against evaluative attitudes that are relevant to the value of their objects.

2. Contemporary Revival

The revival of interest in fitting attitude theory is largely due to several influential defenses of each of its constituent claims. In the first place, sensibility theories and neo-sentimentalist theories have recently received both favorable and critical attention. Despite their differences, both sensibility theory and these recent forms of sentimentalism are full-fledged versions of FA theory, which subscribe to both its central tenets. Secondly, though, each of these tenets has also been endorsed by philosophers who reject the other claim and therefore do not hold FA accounts. Since these two constitutive claims have not always been sharply differentiated, both these developments have increased the interest in FA theory. Several response-dependent theories of value have been developed, which make values prior to reasons and thus reject normative reduction (Lewis 1989). From the other direction, T. M. Scanlon (1998) has advanced what he calls the buck-passing account of value. Although I will contend that Scanlon's view is committed only to normative reduction, and hence is not an FA theory, the literature has tended to assimilate buck passing accounts with fitting attitude theories. This too has increased the visibility of the FA theory of value, however illicitly.

2.1 The Buck-Passing Account of Value

Fitting attitude theories of value are sometimes referred to as buck-passing accounts, and a burgeoning secondary literature concerns the viability of “passing the buck,” especially about the good. This identification of FA theories with buck passing is somewhat misleading, as they are distinct claims, but those interested in FA theories of value cannot overlook the literature on buck passing (see bibliography). Issues of semantics aside, it will be helpful to differentiate the buck-passing account from the fitting attitude theory of value.

In coining the buck-passing trope, Scanlon seems to combine two or three distinct ideas. First, the leading thought of buck passing, which inspires its name, is that goodness provides no reasons of its own, but serves merely to collect things that are valuable on other grounds. As Scanlon (1998: 97) writes:

[B]eing good, or valuable, is not a property that itself provides a reason to respond to a thing in certain ways. Rather, to be good or valuable is to have other properties that constitute such reasons. Since the claim that some property constitutes a reason is a normative claim, this account also takes goodness and value to be non-natural properties, namely the purely formal, higher-order properties of having some lower-order properties that provide reasons of the relevant kind. It differs from the first alternative simply in holding that it is not goodness or value itself that provides reasons but rather other properties that do so. For this reason I call it a buck-passing account.

In this famous passage, however, Scanlon adds two other thoughts to the core idea. He claims that “lower-order” properties of good things provide reasons to respond “in certain ways” to them. This resembles the normative reduction claim of FA theory; indeed, Scanlon endorses the strategy of explaining values in terms of reasons. Finally, although this is less clear, Scanlon seems to suggest that these lower-order, good-making features must be natural properties of objects. These three claims are compatible but distinct. One can pass the buck about goodness—that is, deny that the goodness of something adds any additional reason to want or get it—without holding normative reduction. Perhaps good things are always good in virtue of more specific good-makers, but these lower-order values determine our reasons. Moreover, even if goodness provides no reasons of its own, the properties that do provide reasons might be lower-order but still essentially evaluative properties of objects, not natural properties. Thus the question is not just whether to pass the buck, for instance from goodness to more specific properties, but where does the buck stop?

Let us consider the respects in which the details of Scanlon's account do and do not resemble FA theory, and then turn to what I take as the leading thought of the buck-passing metaphor. Because Scanlon refers to reasons to respond, and elsewhere to various attitudes one can take toward value, he can seem to be focusing on the evaluative attitudes at the heart of FA theories. But Scanlon's notion of response focuses primarily on action, and secondarily on such practical attitudes as respect, contemplation, and enjoyment, as opposed to emotions. While his discussion raises questions about evaluative attitudes that are left unanswered, two points are clear. First, Scanlon rejects what he calls the teleological conception of value, according to which value only provides reasons to promote the valuable (and minimize the disvaluable). Second, Scanlon (1998: 99) rejects any account of value as systematic as generic FA theory:

Once one recognizes the variety of things that can be valuable and the variety of reasons that their value calls for, it becomes highly implausible that there could be a systematic “theory of value.” Understanding the value of something is not just a matter of knowing how valuable it is, but rather a matter of knowing how to value it—knowing what kinds of actions and attitudes are called for.

Although it remains open to him to adopt a more limited FA theory of certain values, Scanlon seems committed to rejecting any generic FA theory, despite holding the buck-passing account of value quite generally.

In order to differentiate buck passing from fitting attitude theory, we need to discriminate between the aspect of Scanlon's view that is part of an FA theory, the aspect amenable but not essential to FA theory, and the aspect that seems orthogonal to it. The analysis of value in terms of reasons, which we've called normative reduction, is one of the two constitutive claims of FA theory. (Even here a caveat is needed, however, since those FA theories that aspire merely to capture some values may not accept normative reduction as a general thesis.) One might hold an FA theory specifically for those values that seem response-dependent, while thinking that certain other values—including perhaps the good or moral worth—are autonomous from human response and attitudes. (I take this complex view to have considerable plausibility.) Since Scanlon does not adopt the response-dependency thesis, he rejects generic FA analysis on its own terms, not merely because of his skepticism toward all systematic theories of value.

Moreover, various theories that reject normative reduction, such as simple hedonism, pass the buck with respect to goodness. (I will here ignore tangential issues about the metaethical grounding of hedonism.) According to the hedonist, good things all have some natural property, namely pleasure, which grounds all practical reasons. No additional reasons are provided by the fact that some state is good, beyond those given by its pleasure. It would be a mistake of double-counting to claim that I have two reasons to take a warm bath: that it is pleasurable, and that it is good. The goodness of pleasurable things does not add another reason to that given by its pleasantness. Hence the claims of FA theory and buck-passing are distinct. One can pass the buck about goodness without holding an FA theory.

Can one hold an FA theory of some value without passing the buck with respect to it? This is less clear, but it seems so. Consider the delicious, for example. Does the fact that something is delicious provide any reason to desire or consume it, or does the delicious pass the buck to still lower-order natural properties that are the real reason givers? Surely what makes things delicious are various natural properties, specifically those to which our taste is sensitive such as saltiness. Yet saltiness isn't intrinsically reason-giving; something can be too salty or not salty enough, nor is there a perfect amount of saltiness. Rather, it seems that the deliciousness of any particular flavor depends on the other tastes accompanying it. Hence deliciousness is a holistic property of how something tastes, dependent on human sensibilities. I cannot see why one should be tempted to pass the buck from the delicious to those complex natural properties that, along with features of human taste, make certain things delicious. On the contrary, it seems better to hold that the fact that something is delicious gives one reasons: reasons to praise the dish, to admire the chef, and of course to eat it.

Suppose that values such as the delicious are most readily identified by way of human tendencies to respond. This seems a significant difference between pleasure and deliciousness, which might make buck passing about the good—at least on certain conceptions of goodness—more promising than it is for the delicious. For the hedonist, there is a reasonably satisfying explanation of the goodness of things that simply adverts to a (putatively) natural property: pleasure. No such explanation is likely to be available about the delicious, because it's so implausible to think we can always pick out the natural properties in virtue of which something is delicious. (The same point holds of the beautiful and other aesthetic properties.) Talk about deliciousness usefully groups things together—usefully for us humans, that is—by explaining what they have in common, at a level that can be widely understood despite our ignorance of the ultimate delicious-making properties. This motivates the claim of FA theory that for something to be delicious is for it to merit gustatory pleasure. Despite the fact that the deliciousness of food is in some way a matter of its (and our) natural properties, this does not imply that deliciousness fails to be reason-giving or that we must take lower-order properties to provide our reasons to enjoy some taste. In other words, the buck stops here: at what merits gustatory pleasure.

Hence the issue at the core of buck-passing, about whether the highest-order evaluative concepts provide reasons, seems orthogonal to FA theory except in one respect. Like FA theory, Scanlon's account reduces values to reasons and thereby adopts the normative reduction thesis. While there may be something about FA theories that make them especially amenable to passing the buck with respect to goodness, this point has not yet been adequately established. And if we do not pass the buck all the way down to natural properties, then such evaluative concepts as the funny and the beautiful might provide reasons of their own. Thus some of the values for which FA theory seems most plausible are also those least amenable to a buck-passing account. Once we move from generic FA theories to analogous accounts of more specific values, the motivation for further buck-passing becomes more elusive.

2.2 Sensibility Theory

The term sensibility theory was coined to refer to a collection of similar views put forward most notably by John McDowell (1985, 1987, 1996) and David Wiggins (1976, 1987), which claim values to be anthropocentric and use perceptual metaphors to describe evaluative thought and experience (Darwall, Gibbard, and Railton 1992). According to this view, value properties cannot be reduced to natural properties in a way that supports useful generalizations or explanations. Rather, as Wiggins (1987: 193) puts it: “Our subjective reactions to objects or events will often impose groupings upon them that have no purely naturalistic rationale.” Sensibility theory therefore adopts the response dependency thesis quite broadly, holding it of all values.

This is one of two respects in which values resemble secondary qualities. Although redness might be identified with a messy disjunction of physical properties, there would be no point in grouping that disjunction together were it not for human color vision. The other analogy is that this anthropocentrism does not lead (most) philosophers to deny that there are facts about what is and isn't red, or to be generally skeptical of claims about knowledge of color facts. Sensibility theory insists that the same is true of values. Yet there are also two crucial disanalogies between values and color acknowledged by these theories. The first is that sensibility theory explicates value in terms of the responses it merits, not just those it normally causes (McDowell 1985: 143). (To say that an object merits some response is equivalent to saying that the response is fittingly directed at the object.) And an evaluative response to an object is fitting—pending a caveat to be discussed in the final section on right and wrong kinds of reason—when there is sufficient reason to feel it toward that object. Thus sensibility theory explicates values in terms of reasons: it adopts normative reduction. Since it holds both response dependency and normative reduction, sensibility theory is a version of the FA theory of value.

The other disanalogy concerns the disparity between color vision, which is very similar among humans, and our senses of humor, shame, and the like, where people have quite different sensibilities. The merit schema makes it essentially contestable what counts as funny, good, or honorable, whereas what counts as red is not essentially contestable or often contested. “There is, of course, a striking disanalogy in the contentiousness that is typical of values;” McDowell (1985: 144) grants, “but I think it would be a mistake to suppose this spoils the point.” Instead, he concludes that this contentiousness allows for further criticism of actual responses, and precludes their simply bootstrapping themselves into correctness. “The aspiration to understand oneself is an aspiration to change one's responses, if that is necessary for them to become intelligible otherwise than as defective,” he writes (1985: 145). By contrast, there can be no sensible aspiration to change one's color vision through criticism and regulation, though one can conclude that it is defective and, hence, reserve judgment about certain colors based on one's experience.

While the advocates of sensibility theory can be elusive about crucial details of their program, they seem to hold that their view can capture all value. Wiggins (1976: 95) adopts a generic FA theory that aims to include all evaluations—as good or bad, beautiful or ugly, ignoble, brave, just, disgusting, amusing, etc. (He excludes what he calls directive judgments, such as “this is to be done.”) But he also conceives each of these value properties as being associated with a specific response or reaction, as the funny is associated with amusement. Through a process of refinement, some value properties eventually become detached from independently identifiable responses, but they will still be paired with something worth calling a reaction. Although these “further properties that lie at a progressively greater distance from specific kinds of affect” (Wiggins 1987: 196–7) cannot be paired with distinct sentiments, they will still be constrained by human emotional capacities. It seems strange that the sensibility theorists say so little about the disparity between these various evaluative properties—between, say, the funny and the just. All such values are claimed to be coeval with responses, in that the response is not logically or psychologically prior to the property. But the plausibility of this claim varies depending on the “distance” of the value from the sentiment, and the differences among sentiments.

Sensibility theory embraces circularity because it holds a view about the emotions on which they cannot be identified without invoking the very concepts FA analysis attempts to analyze. As McDowell (1987: 160) writes: “If there is no comprehending the right sentiments independently of the concepts of the relevant [evaluative] features, a no-priority view is surely indicated.” Wiggins (1987: 195) holds such a no-priority view even of the relation between amusement and the funny, but his argument on this point is less than compelling (cf. D'Arms and Jacobson 2006a). However, a more compelling case for a no-priority view might be found for resentment. Perhaps resentment is best understood as a specific form of anger, restricted conceptually to cases founded on moral reasons. Then wrongness might be explicated in terms of fitting resentment, while resentment is understood partly in terms of wrongness.

The circularity implied by such a no-priority view is claimed not be vicious because it helps elucidate values. Thus Wiggins (1987: 189) writes that sensibility theory “hopes to elucidate the concept of value by displaying it in its actual involvement with the sentiments. One would not, according to [this view], have sufficiently elucidated what value is without that detour.” But this claim can be attacked from both sides. According to forms of sentimentalism that limit their FA theory to a core class of emotions, sensibility theory exaggerates the interdependence of these responses (such as fear, amusement, disgust, shame, and the like) with their associated value properties (the fearsome, funny, disgusting, shameful, etc.). Here the sentiments are plausibly prior to the values, and circularity can be avoided by giving an account of these emotions that does not advert to the evaluative concepts at issue. Yet with respect to good and bad, it is hard to see how much is elucidated by the detour through the sentiments. Sensibility theory does not seem to improve upon generic FA theories, with their vague references to pro-attitudes, in this respect. What is it to approve of something other than to think it good—perhaps with a charge of positive affect? Here the circularity seems vicious precisely because the detour is so brief and uninformative.

2.3 Sentimentalism

Sentimentalism can be understood broadly, so as to include sensibility theory despite its no-priority claim, or more narrowly as the thesis that a given value “depends on some internal sense or feeling which nature has made universal in the species” (Hume 1740/1975: 172). Note that sentimentalism must claim, in either case, that those emotions on which it focuses are not merely epistemic routes to independently existing values. For instance, amusement cannot merely be a sensitivity to the funny, in order to be amenable to a sentimentalist theory of humor in terms of (fitting) amusement. I will here adopt the narrow usage, which makes sensibility theory not a form of sentimentalism but a close relation to it. The crucial difference is that a Humean sentimentalist view gives priority to those universal human feelings: certain basic or pan-cultural emotions I'm referring to as sentiments. These will not include all the various states commonly called emotions, and a sentimentalist might well accept a no-priority account of the relation between certain values and “cognitively sharpened” emotions such as resentment, as opposed to simple anger (D'Arms and Jacobson 2003).

Although response-dependency is an essential aspect of sentimentalism, not all such theories accept normative reduction. On one reading of Adam Smith's prototypical sentimentalism, although he holds that evaluative judgments concern what emotional response is proper, he then defines that notion dispositionally, in terms of actual rather than merited responses and endorsements. “To be the proper and approved object” of a sentiment, he writes, “can mean nothing but to be the object [of that sentiment] which naturally seems proper, and is approved of (1982: 69). Another reading of Smith, which attributes a sentimentalist FA theory to him, has his standard of propriety determined by an essentially normative notion of an impartial spectator.

Although sentimentalism can adopt dispositionalism rather than FA theory, those versions that embrace normative reduction reduce the values on which the theory focuses to a primitive normative notion of fittingness or merit. Thus the shameful is understood as what merits shame, the funny as what merits amusement, and so forth. Moreover, sentimentalism can aspire to give a non-circular account of those sentiments that are claimed to be part of basic human nature, despite having (somewhat) different elicitors in different cultures and individuals. How many such sentiments there are, and which ones, is a matter of dispute that need not be entered into here. The important point is that even these forms of sentimentalism need not adopt an FA theory of all values; they can focus on those values that seem most intimately tied to specific human sentiments, such as the shameful, funny, fearsome, and pride-worthy. This modest sentimentalism holds an FA theory only of certain values, those most amenable to response-dependency and normative reduction. It must deny response-independent accounts of these values, such as the incongruity theory of humor, on which the funny is analyzed as the incongruous. Sentimentalists will hold that such theories are either open to manifold counterexamples or are only speciously response-independent (Scruton 1987).

FA-style sentimentalists also must argue against dispositional theories of these values, which analyze the funny and the shameful in terms of what typically elicits amusement or shame, or what would elicit them under naturalistically specifiable conditions. They will insist that since the funny is a normative concept, for instance, it must be possible to insist that something granted to amuse most people (even oneself) nevertheless fails to be funny. Idiosyncratic senses of humor are not guaranteed to be inaccurate simply because they are unusual; on the contrary, some people might be better judges of what is and isn't funny. Whereas the simplest form of sentimentalism would analyze the funny as whatever amuses, it is more promising for a sentimentalist theory of humor to hold that what it is for something to be funny is for amusement at it to be fitting. More generally, sentimentalists may choose to sacrifice the ambition of giving an overarching account of value in favor of focusing more narrowly on those values for which the two tenets of FA theory are most plausible: the values most intimately connected to specific sentiments. Proponents of this view hold it to be uniquely well positioned to solve the wrong kind of reason problem in a non-circular manner precisely because it can mobilize accounts of the sentiments that do not already involve the evaluative concepts it would analyze. If we can hope to understand shame without making recourse to the shameful, for instance, then we might use an FA theory to analyze the shameful in terms of fitting shame without circularity.

3. Outstanding Problems

3.1 Circularity

The circularity challenge appears most trenchant when wielded against generic FA theories, since the broad pro-attitudes they require, in order to capture all value, seem already to involve the thought that something is valuable. What is it to approve of some outcome except to think it good, perhaps with a tinge of positive affect? Perhaps desire can be understood more plausibly than approval as an independently identifiable state, which can be characterized without invoking the concept good. But it is less clear that the good is its object, as it would have to be for an FA theory to analyze the desirable in terms of fitting desire. It seems equally plausible that desire aims at what is good for the agent. Suppose some outcome would be extremely beneficial to me, though indifferent (or worse) when considered impartially. Why think that fitting desires must always take as their object things that are good from the point of view of the universe, rather than good for the person who desires them? It is hard to see why such a desire would be unfitting, not just selfish. Yet one can also desire something contrary to one's interests when it is sufficiently good for others. Such a desire could also be fitting, it seems. Perhaps this problem can be circumvented by distinguishing reasons to desire something for some individual's sake (such as the agent), but this shows at least that generic FA theories need to draw a further distinction between reasons to desire. Moreover, any account of desire that involves the notion of either good or good-for seems already to involve the concept it proposes to analyze, and similar problems attend accounts in terms of other generic attitudes such as approval or preference. Although other accounts of desire or pro-attitudes are possible, the circularity worry threatens generic FA theories of value because they cannot appeal to more specific attitudes that seem more amenable to characterization without reference to an evaluative concept.

Sensibility theory embraces circularity by holding that values and evaluative responses are “made for each other” through a process of mutual adjustment. This circularity is claimed not to be vicious because it has explanatory power. Such an account, on which specific sentiments (e.g., anger) can be refined into emotional responses (resentment) shaped by the property with which they're associated (wrongness), seems to work in some cases. Maybe this isn't a vicious circle insofar as it connects wrongness with anger (and guilt), thereby elucidating the nature of its motivational force, but this argument is considerably less plausible in other cases. It is hard to see how an analysis of the funny in terms of amusement, which is then characterized in terms of seeing something as funny, elucidates anything.

The challenge for sentimentalism, by contrast, is to produce a theory of the sentiments on which they can be understood independently of the evaluative concepts that the theory uses them to analyze. Suggestions about how to do so have been given (Gibbard 1990), but no fully developed account has yet been offered. Moreover, sentimentalists who hold even a limited FA theory must give an account of the sentiments on which they are amenable to judgments of when they are and aren't fitting—unlike mere feelings—yet do not essentially involve the very concepts that they are meant to elucidate. The theory must avoid circularity while maintaining the resources to solve the wrong kind of reason problem.

3.2 The Wrong Kind of Reason Problem

Fitting attitude theories hold that for something to be valuable is for it to merit some relevant evaluative attitude. Whether framed in terms of reasons or some other normative notion, the fundamental issue concerns when there is sufficient reason to have some particular evaluative attitude or sentiment such as approval or contempt. These are questions over which people can intelligibly disagree; moreover, FA theories seem capable of making sense of fundamental evaluative disagreement. As long as parties to the debate understand the attitude in question—which is especially likely when it is part of a shared human repertoire of sentiments—they can sensibly disagree about when such reasons obtain, even if they hold very different standards of fittingness. This seems to be just what is at stake in disputes of taste or sensibility: fundamental disagreement over whether something is funny, disgusting, shameful, and so forth.

However, the wrong kind of reason problem poses a challenge to this central aspiration of FA analysis. The problem is that there seem to be reasons for having various attitudes that do not bear directly on the evaluative questions that the analyses seek to analyze. Take for example Roger Crisp's (2000) demon who threatens to punish you unless you desire a cup of mud. While this seems like a reason to desire the mud, it obviously doesn't make the mud any more desirable. As a result, the question of whether there is reason to desire the mud appears to deviate from the question of whether the mud is good. Someone who holds that there is sufficient reason to desire it, given by the advantages of having that desire, does not have an evaluative disagreement (about desirability) with someone who denies there to be reason to desire such garden-variety mud. Rather, they are addressing different questions. Any genuine difference of opinion over the value of the mud requires disagreement over whether there are reasons of the right kind for desiring it: the sort of reasons that bear on evaluative judgment, as opposed to reasons to have or forbear from having the evaluative attitude (Rabinowicz and Rönnow-Rasmussen 2004).

Of course, no misunderstanding would arise in this case, as the claim that there are strategic reasons to desire the mud is unlikely to be confused with an evaluation of the mud itself. In this respect Crisp's case is typical of those discussed in the literature, most of which pose no real danger of conflation. As a result, the WKR problem has come to be treated simply as a technical objection to FA analysis, which yields apparent counterexamples to the theory. These cases are designed precisely to be obviously WKRs, because they are put forward to show that to be valuable isn't simply to be something that there is just any sort of reason to value. The criticism suggests that an FA analysis must be more precise: it must equate value with reasons of the right kind for having attitudes, while finding some way to distinguish just these reasons. The obvious cases on which most of the literature focuses pose no such challenge, since everyone agrees that they are not relevant to the evaluative judgment at issue.

But it has been suggested that in addition to the obvious cases, there are interestingly wrong kinds of reason as well (D'Arms and Jacobson 2000a). These are considerations in favor (or against) some attitude that fail to bear on the relevant evaluative judgment of something despite focusing on its properties. To use an example from Berys Gaut (2007: 241): “Imagine a comedy full of hilarious jokes, all of which were so vicious and cruel that audiences watched in stony silence, without being amused at all, since they correctly thought that it would be wrong to feel amusement.” Although viciousness and cruelty are properties of these jokes, they are supposed to make it the case that amusement at them is contrary to virtue. While some philosophers, such as Gaut himself, take the viciousness of a joke always to detract from its humor, others hold that it merely makes appreciating its humor morally problematic (Jacobson 2008). After all, the jokes are stipulated to be hilarious. As McDowell (1987: 161, fn. 18) notes: “Much of what is ordinarily appealed to in ranking objects for amusement is…not obviously relevant to this issue [of comic evaluation]; for instance jokes that one may deplore as being ‘in bad taste’ (usually on moralistic grounds) are not thereby shown not to be extremely funny.” Such interesting WKRs can be taken as reasons of the right kind and conflated with them, thus creating a form of spurious evaluative disagreement, analogous to the spurious evaluative disagreement created when a seemingly moral dispute rests on a factual disagreement.

Intuitively, reasons of the right kind are those that bear on the value of the object—for instance, reasons to desire the mud that bear on whether the mud is desirable. The challenge for FA analyses is how to capture this intuitive idea in a non-tautological fashion. There are two general strategies for solving the wrong kind of reason problem. The first is to draw a distinction between object-given and state-given considerations, where a state-given consideration is one that invokes some value of having the evaluative attitude toward an object (e.g., desiring the mud), whereas an object-given consideration focuses only on features of the object (Parfit 2001). Proponents of this distinction hold that state-given considerations can only provide reasons of the wrong kind, like the demonic incentive which attaches to the state of desiring the mud; whereas object-given considerations, such as the mud's foul taste, can provide the right kind of reason (not) to desire it. Various technical worries about this distinction have been raised, and attempts to answer them offered (Olson 2004, Rabinowicz and Rönnow-Rasmussen 2006). The larger worry is that certain features of an object, such as the cruelty of a joke or the fact that one is not responsible for some bad trait, do not make any overt reference to a state or attitude. Yet they might nevertheless bear on whether to have the state (because amusement is vicious or shame counterproductive) without bearing on the value of the object (whether the joke is hilarious or the trait shameful). The force of the thought that one should not feel contempt or shame at such traits might depend on the judgment that it would be unfair, or otherwise vicious, to feel contempt or shame at those traits for which the bearer is not responsible. Interestingly wrong kinds of reason do not wear their normative import on their sleeve, as do obviously wrong kinds of reason such as demonic incentives.

The second strategy asks what state a given consideration can bring about when taken up in deliberation. As Joseph Raz (2009: 40) puts it: “Standard reasons [RKRs] are those we can follow directly, that is have the attitude, or perform the action, for that reason. Non-standard reasons [WKRs] for an action or attitude are such that one can conform to them, but not follow them directly.” Raz and others hold that wrong kinds of reason can only be directly followed to wanting or trying to have that state. Thus thinking about the demonic incentive to desire mud will make you want to desire it, and try to inculcate that desire, but it won't bring that desire about. You would have better luck with hypnosis. By contrast, were you convinced that the mud is tasty and nutritious, you would presumably come to want the mud without having to make any effort to do so. Here too, though, if there are interestingly wrong kinds of reason, then perhaps they too can be followed. Consider again the fact that some joke is cruel. That may motivate you to try to become the sort of person who isn't amused by it, if you think amusement at cruel jokes contrary to virtue. But suppose you were habituated in this manner from early on, or that the cruelty of a joke angered you and thereby prevented you from being amused. In either of those cases, you might have followed the consideration about cruelty to not being amused by the joke, and thence have concluded that it isn't funny. Yet suppose that were you not angry, say because the joke ridiculed someone to whom you are hostile, you would have seen what is so funny about it. If so, then the joke should be considered funny according to your own sense of humor, notwithstanding the—perhaps decisive—reason of the wrong kind not to be amused at it (D'Arms and Jacobson 2009). Cases such as these suggest that the test of whether one can follow a consideration to the relevant evaluative attitude might not suffice to solve the wrong kind of reason problem.

In addition to the formal test given by the distinction between state-given and object-given reasons, and the psychological test given by asking to what attitude one can follow some consideration, there might be a more substantive solution to the problem. A modest form of sentimentalism will seek to determine considerations of fit, and thus reasons of the right kind, through consideration of the specific sentiment at issue. Perhaps it is something about guilt, such as the fact that it motivates reparation; and something about shame, such as the fact that it motivates concealment; that explains why lack of fault undermines the fittingness of guilt but not shame. If so then reasons of the right kind might be distinguished even in the most interesting and difficult cases. This will require no mere detour through the sentiments, but a more thoroughgoing investigation into them—particularly into the actions they typically motivate and the conditions that alleviate and exacerbate them. To make matters more challenging, this interpretive project must not help itself to evaluative concepts, such as the wrong and the shameful, in order to explicate the concerns of guilt and shame. At any rate, to do so would be to give up on the ambition of offering a non-circular theory of even those values most amenable to FA accounts.


  • Anderson, Elizabeth (1993). Value in Ethics and Economics. Cambridge, Mass: Harvard University Press.
  • Blackburn, Simon (1993). Essays in Quasi-Realism. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Blackburn, Simon (1998). Ruling Passions. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Brandt, Richard (1946). “Moral Valuation.” Ethics 56: 106–21.
  • Brentano, Franz (1969) [1889]. The Origin of our Knowledge of Right and Wrong, ed. Oskar Kraus and Roderick Chisholm, trans. Roderick Chisholm and Elizabeth Schneewind. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
  • Bykvist, Krister (2009). “No Good Fit: Why the Fitting Attitude Analysis of Value Fails.” Mind 118(469): 1–30.
  • Chisholm, Roderick (1986). Brentano and Intrinsic Value. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Crisp, Roger (2000). “Review of Jon Kupperman, Value…and What Follows.” Philosophy 75: 458–62.
  • Crisp, Roger (2005). “Value, Reasons and the Structure of Justification: How to Avoid Passing the Buck.” Analysis 65.1: 80–85.
  • Dancy, Jonathan (2000). “Should We Pass the Buck?” In Philosophy, the Good, the True and the Beautiful, ed. Anthony O'Hear. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Danielsson, Sven and Jonas Olson (2007). “Brentano and the Buck-Passers.” Mind 116: 511-522.
  • Darwall, Stephen (2006). The Second-Person Standpoint: Morality, Respect, and Accountability. Cambridge, Mass: Harvard University Press.
  • Darwall, Stephen, Allan Gibbard, and Peter Railton (1992). “Toward Fin de siècle Ethics: Some Trends.” The Philosophical Review 101: 115–89.
  • D'Arms, Justin and Daniel Jacobson (2000a). “The Moralistic Fallacy: On the ‘Appropriateness’ of Emotions.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 61: 65–90.
  • D'Arms, Justin and Daniel Jacobson (2000b). “Sentiment and Value.” Ethics 110: 722–748.
  • D'Arms, Justin and Daniel Jacobson (2003). “The Significance of Recalcitrant Emotions (or, Anti-Quasijudgmentalism).” Reprinted in Philosophy and the Emotions, ed. Anthony Hatzimoysis. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • D'Arms, Justin and Daniel Jacobson (2006a). “Sensibility Theory and Projectivism.” In The Oxford Handbook of Ethical Theory, ed. David Copp. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • D'Arms, Justin and Daniel Jacobson (2006b). “Anthropocentric Constraints on Human Value.” Oxford Studies in Metaethics, Vol. 1, ed. Russ Shafer-Landau. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • D'Arms, Justin and Daniel Jacobson (2009). “Demystifying Sensibilities: Sentimentalism and the Instability of Affect.” In The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy of Emotion, ed. Peter Goldie. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Ewing, A. C. (1948). The Definition of Good. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
  • Gaut, Berys (2007). Art, Emotion and Ethics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Gibbard, Allan (1990). Wise Choices, Apt Feelings: A Theory of Normative Judgment. Cambridge, Mass: Harvard University Press.
  • Heathwood, Chris (2008). “Fitting Attitudes and Welfare.” Oxford Studies in Metaethics 3:47–73.
  • Hieronymi, Pamela (2005). “The Wrong Kind of Reason.” The Journal of Philosophy 102: 437–457.
  • Hume, David (1740/1975). Treatise of Human Nature, ed. L. A. Selby-Bigge. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Jacobson, Daniel (2008). “Review of Berys Gaut, Art, Emotion and Ethics.” Notre Dame Philosophical Reviews. March 10, URL=<>
  • Lewis, David (1989). “Dispositional Theories of Value.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, supp. vol. 63: 113–37.
  • McDowell, John (1985). “Values and Secondary Qualities.” Reprinted in McDowell (1998).
  • McDowell, John (1987). “Projection and Truth in Ethics.” Reprinted in McDowell (1998).
  • McDowell, John (1996). “Two Sorts of Naturalism.” Reprinted in McDowell (1998).
  • McDowell, John (1998). Mind, Value, and Reality. Cambridge, Mass: Harvard University Press.
  • McNaughton, David (1988). Moral Vision: An Introduction to Ethics. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • McNaughton, David, and Piers Rawling (2003). “Can Scanlon Avoid Redundancy by Passing the Buck?” Analysis 63: 328–331.
  • Moore, G. E. (1903) Principia Ethica. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Mulligan, Kevin (1998). “From Appropriate Emotions to Values.” The Monist 81: 161–88.
  • Olson, Jonas (2004). “Buck-Passing and the Wrong Kind of Reasons.” The Philosophical Quarterly 54: 295–300.
  • Olson, Jonas (2009). “Fitting Attitude Analyses of Value and the Partiality Challenge.” Ethical Theory and Moral Practice 12(4):365–378.
  • Parfit, Derek (2001). “Rationality and Reasons.” In Exploring Practical Philosophy: From Action to Values, eds. D. Egonsson, B. Petersson, J. Josefsson, and T. Rönnow-Rasmussen. Aldershot.
  • Piller, Christian (2006). “Content-Related and Attitude-Related Reasons for Preferences.” Philosophy 81: 155–182.
  • Rabinowicz, Wlodek and Toni Rönnow-Rasmussen (2004). “The Strike of the Demon: On Fitting Pro-Attitudes and Value.” Ethics 114: 391–423.
  • Rabinowicz, Wlodek and Toni Rönnow-Rasmussen (2006). “Buck-Passing and the Right Kind of Reasons.” The Philosophical Quarterly 56: 114–120.
  • Raz, Joseph (2009). “Reasons: Practical and Adaptive.” In Reasons for Actions, eds. David Sobel and Steven Wall. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Ross, W. D. (1939). Foundations of Ethics. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Scanlon, T. M. (1998). What We Owe to Each Other. Cambridge, Mass: Harvard University Press.
  • Scruton, Roger (1987). “Laughter.” In The Philosophy of Laughter and Humor, ed. John Morreall. Albany: SUNY Press, 1987.
  • Skorupski, John (1997). “Reasons and Reason.” Reprinted in Ethical Explorations. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999.
  • Smith, Adam (1982) [1790]. The Theory of Moral Sentiments. Indianapolis: Liberty Fund.
  • Stratton-Lake, Philip (2005). “How to Deal with Evil Demons: Comment on Rabinowicz and Rönnow-Rasmussen.” Ethics 115: 788–798.
  • Stratton-Lake, Philip and Brad Hooker (2006). “Scanlon versus Moore on Goodness.” In Metaethics after Moore, eds. Terry Horgan and Mark Timmons. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Suikkanen, Jussi (2004). “Reasons and Value—In Defense of the Buck-Passing Account.” Ethical Theory and Moral Practice 7: 513–535.
  • Väyrynen, Pekka (2006). “Resisting the Buck-Passing Account of Value.” In Shafer-Landau, ed., Oxford Studies in Metaethics 1: 295–324.
  • Wiggins, David (1976). “Truth, Invention, and the Meaning of Life.” Reprinted in Needs, Values, Truth: Essays in the Philosophy of Value. Oxford: Blackwell, 1987.
  • Wiggins, David (1987). “A Sensible Subjectivism?” In Needs, Values, Truth: Essays in the Philosophy of Value. Oxford: Blackwell, 1987.

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]


I am grateful to Nicole Smith for her extremely helpful work as my research assistant on this project.

Copyright © 2011 by
Daniel Jacobson

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free