Folk Psychology as a Theory
Folk psychology is a name traditionally used to denote our everyday way of understanding, or rationalizing, intentional actions in mentalistic terms. This quotidian competence is known by other names in the philosophical literature: commonsense psychology; naïve psychology; Homo sapiens psychology; the person theory of humans; the intentional stance; propositional attitude psychology; belief-desire psychology (see, e.g., Churchland 1979; Dennett 1987; Goldman 2006; Bogdan 2009). As some entries on this list suggest, folk psychology can be conceived of in wider or more narrow terms, picking out different extensions accordingly.
There is great interest in folk psychology not only because of its status as a familiar way of making sense of our actions and those of others but also because it is thought to underwrite a range of moral, legal, educational, clinical, and therapeutic practices (Fodor 1987; Baker 1988). For this reason, a great deal of work in analytic philosophy has been devoted to better understanding folk psychology and its cognitive basis.
This entry reviews reasons for and against thinking that folk psychological competence entails or is best explained by having some kind of theory of mind—a view known as theory theory.
The first two sections of this entry seek mainly to explicate theory theory and its possible variations. Section 1 describes the core commitments of theory theory, and the traditional reasons offered for believing in it—noting the assumptions that theory theorists traditionally embrace about the primary function of folk psychology, and the various, heavier or lighter, options they have for construing its ontological commitments. Section 2 details three varieties of theory theory, looking at where they disagree about such things as: what kind of theory folk psychology is; whether it is concept-based or model-based; whether and how it is acquired; and whether and how it develops.
Section 3 discusses a body of noteworthy empirical findings—from comparative psychology, developmental psychology, neuroscience, and cross-cultural psychology—which must be accommodated or dealt with by any credible account of folk psychology.
Section 4 focuses on philosophical challenges that have been raised against theory theory. This section sketches eliminativist arguments for thinking that folk psychology is a theory, but one that the mature sciences of the mind should supersede, rejecting its central posits. It considers the challenge raised by the main rival to theory theory—the simulation theory, which assumes the core processes by which we understand others in mentalistic terms are not grounded in any kind of theory. It explicates the concerns of phenomenological critics of theory theory, who argue that to characterize folk psychology as any kind of theory systematically misconstrues the target explanandum. It reviews pluralist reasons for thinking that folk psychology has many varied uses—a possibility that, on the most extreme renderings, casts doubt on folk psychology’s being primarily theoretical in nature. Finally, the concluding section introduces the hypothesis that core structural and other features of folk psychological competence are best understood and explained by thinking of that competence as being rooted in special kinds of narrative practice as opposed to being grounded in theory.
- 1. Theory Theory
- 2. Varieties of Theory Theory
- 3. Empirical Findings
- 4. Philosophical Challenges to Theory Theory
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Theory Theory
A mainstream view in analytic philosophy is that folk psychology, or FP, is a theory and that FP abilities centrally involving theorizing in some sense or at some level. These ideas have deep roots in the analytic tradition and have shaped much received thinking on the topic. The general view is known as theory-theory, or TT, in philosophical and psychological circles—a name first introduced by Morton (1980) to highlight the fact that the thesis that “FP is a theory” is itself a theory, and not obviously a true one. Others, such as Rosenberg, maintain that FP
is so simple and mind-numbingly obvious, it seems almost preposterous to call it a “theory”. (2018: 36)
Many of today’s philosophers and psychologists maintain that FP abilities simply constitute, or are otherwise sponsored by, a Theory of Mind, or ToM (see Baron-Cohen, Lombardo, & Tager-Flusberg 2013). This thesis is usually coupled with a familiar explanatory hypothesis about how FP understanding is achieved, namely, FP understanding is underwritten by capacities to mentalize or “mindread”. On the standard interpretation, mindreading minimally requires:
- Representing and attributing mental state attitudes (minimally belief and desire, but possibly other mental states too);
- Representing and attributing the contents of such attitudes;
- Appreciating how such attitudes structurally interrelate.
Conditions 1–3 can be weakened in various ways, allowing for the possibility of mindreaders with less than fully-fledged folk psychological capacities. For example, it is possible to represent and attribute mental state concepts and contents other than only those of, say, beliefs and desires, and still qualify as a mindreader.
TT about FP is distinctive in assuming that when we understand minds in daily life we use the same sorts of tools that we use to understand other non-mental phenomena, specifically, we use the same sort of tools we use in the sciences—namely, theories that aim to tell us about the unobservable, hidden causal structure of the world.
ToM is a particular kind of theory: it is assumed to have a distinctive sort of content. A ToM operates with mental state concepts that feature in theoretical postulates that comprise the core general principles of a theory of everyday psychology. The content of the ToM that normally developing humans use is, for TTists, what enables most of us to navigate our everyday social world fluidly and with ease. TT holds that we succeed in understanding ourselves and others if we manage to infer the mental states responsible for particular actions correctly by applying a ToM, thereby bringing the laws of everyday psychology to bear on particular cases. As such, TTists hold that, for most of us, the heavy lifting in daily social cognition is done by our acquaintance with, and use of, laws of a folk ToM.
According to TTists, engaging in FP involves the deployment of the relevant mentalistic concepts by making use of a distinctive set of principles—a network of laws or propositions about mentalistic attitudes and their relations to other states of mind. This system of inferences allegedly constitutes the core framework for making sense of and rationalizing actions in terms of reasons, even though it must be supported by further auxiliary generalizations about what people typically do in a range of circumstances.
Several philosophical considerations conspire to make TT a compelling view of FP. In his seminal “Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind” (1956), Wilfrid Sellars aired the idea that our understanding of mental states is, essentially, theoretical. In an engaging bit of philosophical anthropological fiction, he famously mused about how our Rylean ancestors, who were as yet behaviorists, might have first fashioned an understanding of thoughts as inner episodes. He invented a mythical Jones who modeled inner thoughts on overt speech acts, imagining that the former could, just like the latter, be cited in the explanation of action. Assuming that reasons are the inferred causes of action, it is but a short step to thinking that explaining action using a schema that goes beyond what is merely given in another’s outward responses is necessarily a kind of theoretical activity.
This way of understanding is a natural partner for the idea that genuinely intelligent engagements with aspects of the world are mediated by representations of one sort or another. It is a small step from accepting a representational theory of mind to assuming that our FP understanding of minds requires representing the representations of intelligent creatures—thus taking a theoretical, or spectator’s, stance towards them. Understanding and interacting with other minds, according to this view, requires formulating hypotheses as to what exactly is “going on in” those minds since those workings are not directly open to view.
Some philosophers are attracted to TT because they maintain that the meanings of FP mental state concepts show signs of being theoretical in character—namely, that such meanings are fixed by their having appropriate links or relations to other concepts in a structured theory. On this view, the meaning of mental states terms is defined holistically by the special roles the entities such terms denote play within a wider inferential network. Accordingly, the very meaning of a mental concept is taken to be determined by the distinctive role it plays within a network of principles. In this respect, our familiar mentalistic vocabulary (viz. our talk of thoughts, feelings, and expectations) would be similar in important respects to other theoretically embedded vocabularies (e.g., talk of electrons, atoms, and gravity).
In a series of influential papers, David Lewis (1970, 1972) defended a particular approach to the semantics of theoretical terms. He applied that same approach to everyday psychological vocabulary (e.g., “belief” and “desire”), and thereby obtained a functionalist theory of mental states. Accordingly, when thinking about the semantics of everyday psychological vocabulary, Lewis treats the conjunction of commonsense platitudes about mental states as a term-introducing theory. It is possible to identify folk psychology with that conjunction. Alternatively, we could think of folk psychology as a systematization of a set of platitudes. Either way, Lewis’s approach lends credence to the idea that FP is structured in the same way as other kinds of theory.
Lewis also held that claims about the platitudes are empirical claims—they are claims about what is commonly believed about mental states. However, Lewis’s intuitions about mental states were likely influenced by his theoretical stance. Consequently, there is little reason to think that Lewis’s own intuitions are a good guide to what people typically believe about the mind.
Lewis simply assumes that common sense is resolutely committed to the idea that mental states are characterized by causal role; as a result, his functionalist conclusion drives his characterization of the platitudes. No doubt Lewis has philosophical arguments for denying that mental states are substances that possess their causal powers non-essentially or substances that lack causal powers altogether. But that is beside the present point. Lewis aimed to capture what the folk think about mental states, not what the philosophical literati think.
A unifying idea that motivates all TT proposals is that the primary job or function of folk psychology is that of third-personal prediction and explanation. The standard TT assumption is that prediction and explanation are symmetrical: predicting how another creature might act or, on the flip side, explaining why it acted, requires representing its complex state of mind—namely, the way certain of its mental states relate to one another. Putting all of this together can promote the appearance that FP is in the same general line of business as scientific theories that are used to understand other phenomena.
An important question for proponents of TT is: What are FP’s precise ontological commitments? Putatively, FP theorizes about what goes on inside our heads—in the black box that lies between perceptual stimuli and behavioral responses. If so, FP posits inner entities that causally explain outward behavior. Taken at face value, FP would appear to be theoretically committed to the entities and properties that it speaks of as being causally responsible for our actions. Those who understand FP as having these transparent commitments assume that it is committed to explaining actions by appeal to causally efficacious contentful mental items, such as beliefs and desires (see, e.g., Fodor 1987, see also Rosenberg 2018). TTists of a realist bent assume that FP is committed to an unqualified realism about the entities and their properties that it quantifies over.
So construed, FP comes with built-in “heavy-duty”, as opposed to “light-duty”, ontological commitments (Langland-Hassan 2020). Light duty TTists actively eschew or are otherwise agnostic about whether FP is committed to the existence of entities with the properties that are referred to in our everyday FP attributions. Several variants of TT, including instrumentalist and fictionalist variants, that assume our everyday sense-making practice has only light-duty ontological commitments (Egan 1995; Graham & Horgan 1988; Schwitzgebel 2002, 2013; Demeter 2013).
One of the best known “light duty” versions of TT proposes that FP should be understood as nothing more than an intentional stance or heuristic we employ for quick and dirty predictions of the behavior of a wide variety of systems (Dennett 1985, 1987). FP ascriptions are, on the intentional stance view, irredeemably indeterminate. As such, we have no grounds for taking FP attributions ontologically seriously above and beyond the limited practical leverage they give us in enabling us to make such predictions and explanations.
Dennett (1985, 1987) assumes that, in principle, an ideal physics trades in non-probabilistic laws capable of yielding perfect forward-facing predictions and perfect backward-looking explanations. By comparison, FP, though of great practical value, can never come close to the predictive and explanatory successes of the hard sciences: hence we have no reason to take FP’s posits as ontologically seriously as we take those found in the hard sciences. Thus, for Dennett, FP constructs can be treated as only capturing mildly real patterns: they are to be regarded as no more and no less real than numbers, centers of gravity, or other “calculation-bound” entities (Dennett 1991).
To adopt a light-duty TT view of FP’s ontological commitments is to hold that, however useful FP is in everyday contexts, the crude predictions and explanations it sponsors are not the sort that can seriously predict or explain the behavior of others. If we wish to get at the underlying mechanics and drivers of behavior—its true causes—we must look to mature cognitive science, not FP.
2. Varieties of Theory Theory
2.1 Modular Theory Theory
A popular explanatory proposal in cognitive science is that ToM laws or principles are instantiated or contained in a mental module, which is understood to be a special kind of cognitive device, gadget, or mechanism. A ToM module is solely dedicated to the special work of enabling us to predict and explain the actions of others by accurately attributing mental state contents to them. The common denominator in all TT modularist accounts is that ToM abilities, and by extension our FP competence, are best explained by a cognitive architecture with a particular design and a dedicated, domain-specific function (Fodor 1995; Segal 1996; Leslie, Friedman, & German 2004; Carruthers 2006; Heyes 2018).
For some, the most important feature of modules, which separates them from other humdrum psychological mechanisms, is that they are assumed to be cognitive through and through. Fodor (1983), for example, maintains that the knowledge base of ToM modules is conceptually based and has the structure and content of a set of semantically connected propositionally articulated principles. In line with this view, Fodor (1994, 1998) proposes that the core mentalistic concepts get their meaning denotationally by means of special mechanisms that “lock on” to the relevant extensions. These concepts each play distinctive roles in constituting the principles that make up the network of laws comprising our folk theory of mind.
A defining feature of mental modules, as per Fodor’s (1983) original formulation, is that they are informationally encapsulated. Information contained in each module is encapsulated from other modules and encapsulated from the information available in the cognitive system. Modules have limited cognitive interests and concerns: they operate on a strictly need-to-know basis. Because of their informationally encapsulated limited interests, ToM modules are not informed and updated by the subject’s wider set of background knowledge. It is assumed that modules work better and faster by restricting their concerns to specialized dealings with only certain topics.
Accordingly, each type of mental module is assumed to be restricted to dealing only with the subject matter of its specialist concern. Modules are domain-specific in the sense that only a circumscribed class of inputs will activate them. Because they are thought to do such specialized work, ToM modules are dissociable: they can be selectively impaired, damaged, or disabled without affecting the operation of other systems and vice versa. Some argue that this feature of ToM modules makes them particularly well suited to explain impaired mindreading abilities exhibited by those with specific conditions. Such atypical cognitive profiles are hypothesized to be rooted in the damaged or malfunctioning neurocognitive machinery of a ToM module. It has been hypothesized that impaired ToM modules are responsible for the specific profiles of FP abilities displayed by cognitively diverse individuals — those with specific psychopathologies such as autism spectrum disorder, schizophrenia, and borderline personality disorder (e.g., Baron-Cohen, Leslie, & Frith 1985; Ozonoff, Pennington, & Rogers 1991; Frith 1992; Baron-Cohen 1995, 2000; Corcoran 2000; Brüne 2005; Sprong et al. 2007, Fonagy & Luyten 2009; Arntz et al. 2009; Franzen et al. 2011).
Several practitioners and theorists question the explanatory value of attempts to explain various psychological conditions in terms of impaired ToM modules (see, e.g., Hobson 1991, 2002; Williams 2004; Shanker 2004; Belmonte 2009). Neurodiversity advocates argue that the entire framework of appealing to ToM deficits to explain putative psychopathological disorders is offensive. They hold that the atypical cognitive differences which are designated as psychopathologies should not be characterized as cognitive deficits or disorders at all. Instead, we should merely recognize that there are diverse cognitive styles associated with particular atypical cognitive profiles and that some of these profiles have special advantages (see Yergeau 2013, and also Rosqvist, Chown, & Stenning [eds] 2020 for a set of critical papers along these lines).
A common denominator for those who posit the existence of ToM modules is that they assume that these mental devices are the means by which everyday social cognition is normally conducted by unimpaired members of our species. Beyond this point of agreement, advocates of Modularist TT propose importantly different theories about the origins of ToM modules and how they are acquired.
Some TT modularists are nativists. They assume that a ToM is a species universal, biologically inherited device forged in our pre-history. Such modularists hold that a ToM comes with core concepts built-in as standard for all normally developing members of our species (Fodor 1983, Baron-Cohen 1999, Mithen 1996, 2000—see Fenici & Garofoli 2017 for an alternative reading of the pre-historic evidence).
ToM nativism is compatible with the possibility that the development of ToM modules is shaped by environmental input. There are versions of modular ToM theory that emphasize the role of the developmental environment in shaping children’s ToMs. However, such versions of modularism hold that children are pre-set to acquire mentalistic concepts automatically through a process of triggering and tuning when appropriately stimulated (Segal 1996; Scholl & Leslie 1999).
Other TT modularists hold that ToM modules are acquired during ontogeny, proposing that FP is enabled by an “acquired module”—one that forms through the interaction of various in-built abilities with the social environment during development (Karmiloff-Smith 1995; Garfield, Peterson, & Perry 2001).
The idea of an acquired module opens up the possibility that our everyday ToM is a specialized neurocognitive mechanism, a cognitive gadget, that is embedded in our nervous systems through culturally inherited processes rather than by processes of natural selection (Heyes & Frith 2014; Heyes 2018). This proposal builds on the niche construction hypothesis that sociocultural practices construct and modify our environments in ways that are cognitively consequential. To understand ToM as a culturally acquired module is to think of it as akin to our culturally inherited capacities for print reading or literacy. These too cannot be explained by direct appeal to cognitive devices that may have been forged in the Pleistocene by natural selection. Thinking of ToMs as culturally acquired cognitive gadgets opens up the possibilities that FP may not be pan-cultural, and that Lewis’s platitudes may not be species universal.
2.2 Scientific Theory Theory
Scientific TT, henceforth STT, holds that folk psychology is the result of evidence-driven scientific theorizing on the part of young children (Gopnik & Wellman 1992; Gopnik 1996; Gopnik & Meltzoff 1997). It proposes that each normally developing child forges and revises their own theory of mind using the same rational theory-construction methods that adults use when forging and revising mature scientific theories.
Advocates of STT acknowledge that children’s theories have the characteristic static features of mature scientific theories—e.g., internal coherence, causal implication, and ontological import. Yet, their proposal focuses on the possibility that children, like adult scientists, engage in the dynamic activity of theorizing to produce their ToM through processes of collecting, evaluating, and responding to evidence in a rational, truth-seeking manner (Gopnik & Meltzoff 1997). Ex hypothesi, ToMs are the hard-won products of sustained observation, statistical analyses, experimental trial-and-error, and learning from others (Gopnik 2003, 2004; Gopnik & Meltzoff 1997). For these reasons, this brand of TT has sometimes been dubbed the “child as little scientist view”, although Gopnik came to prefer the slogan “scientist as big child view” (Gopnik 1996).
Emphasizing the dynamic character of theorizing, STT maintains that we start life with a basic theory of mind which we actively develop throughout our childhood and adolescence. In particular, the concept of belief is thought to be constructed by each child, individually, during ontogeny (Gopink 1988, 1990). In most cases, children who follow a typical developmental pattern succeed in adding the concept of a false belief to their ToMs by around the age of four and they continue to enhance their understanding of belief even beyond this stage—making further, less radical, changes to their ToM as they become young adults (Gopnik 2004). Empirical findings arising from false belief studies and methodological questions about such protocols are extensively discussed in Section 3.2.
Supporters of STT take the appearance of conceptual development in ontogeny at face value; they claim that genuine conceptual change occurs as children fashion their ToMs. In particular, they hold that the conceptual change this theory development putatively involves is driven by their activities of theory construction. On this version of TT, our FP understanding of minds is theoretical in the strongest possible sense—both in its nature and its mode of acquisition.
2.3 Model Theory Theory
The core TT assumption that FP is a kind of theory leaves open whether our everyday ToM is a set of conceptually articulated, propositional representations that detail the core FP laws or whether it takes the form of a more flexible dynamic modeling of worldly structures. Several TTists, inspired by Giere (1988), maintain that our FP abilities are best explained by the tacit or unconscious processes of building and utilizing models at the subpersonal level rather than by appeal to the use of an inherited and fixed set of FP laws (Maibom 2003, 2007, 2009; Godfrey-Smith 2005).
Godfrey-Smith (2005) proposes that elements of models of a given domain have structural similarities with items in their target domain and that the modeling of specific domains exploits aspects of those structural similarities for particular purposes. Going by this definition, if theorizing is understood as modeling then a ToM may, but need not be, thought of as intrinsically propositional, representational, or contentful (e.g., Maibom 2009; see also Egan 2014, 2018).
To think of FP as best explained by the use of subpersonal models assumes the existence of a set of structures targeting specific mentalistic elements—beliefs, desires, actions, emotions, and so forth. The Model TTist assumes that FP models can be elaborated in various ways to serve different purposes in different circumstances. FP models can be thought of as prediction devices: What will Fred do when he discovers the cafe is closed? Or a model might be used to arrive at FP explanations of action: Why did Fred go to the cafe? Or the model might be elaborated upon to yield explanations seeking to detail both proximate and distal causes of behavior. Models also admit other kinds of elaboration. For example, a distinction between degrees of belief and desire might be introduced, and rationality constraints imposed.
Maibom (2009) argues that Model TT is well-placed to explain how we manage to apply a ToM sensitively by adjusting to supporting, context-sensitive knowledge that cannot be supplied by a core ToM itself. In her view, Model TT can explain how it is possible to apply our ToM sensitively in ways that address the particularities of specific cases.
The idea that our everyday ToM abilities depend on the use of a set of adjustable subpersonal models, as opposed to a fixed set of propositions describing FP laws, fits well with predictive processing accounts of cognition (Gopnik & Glymour 2002). Predictive processing accounts of perception hold that—at its core—such cognitive activity always takes the form of making inferences concerning the hidden causes of sensory phenomena (Hohwy 2013; Clark 2016). Advocates of the predictive processing variants of TT hold that the processes used in FP are of the same basic kind used elsewhere in every other variety of cognition, including acts of basic perception; the only difference is that in the case of FP the target of the activity is to infer how other minds cause actions (see, e.g., Gopnik & Wellman 2012; Bowers & Davis 2012; Koster-Hale & Saxe 2013; Hohwy & Palmer 2014; Palmer, Seth, & Hohwy 2015; Pezzulo 2017; Zednik & Jäkel 2016; Jara-Ettinger et al. 2016; Jara-Ettinger 2019).
Making inferences about other minds can be understood as a matter of solving an inverse problem, that of using observable evidence, in this case, behaviors, to infer the invisible causal structure that produces it, in this case, presumably, mental states. Proponents of Model TT are free to assume that the models used in this process are complex, operating simultaneously on multiple scales and levels. In line with predictive processing assumptions, it is assumed that models improve over time through the sustained effort of minimizing prediction error by adjusting predictions in response to mismatches between the content of top-down hypotheses and bottom-up information.
Like all other versions of TT, an animating idea behind Model TT is that the subpersonal work of brains is roughly analogous to what scientists do when making inferences in their efforts to best explain phenomena. The assumption is that brains develop generative models that enable them to advance hypotheses—and those hypotheses are further developed, refined, and improved by being tested against what the world has to offer.
For all their promise, Model TT raises important questions that need further attention. These include: What is the evidential support for such accounts (Stuhlmüller & Goodman 2014)? What should we make of their metaphysics? How seriously should we take the idea that brains actually advance hypotheses and perform subpersonal modeling operations?
Slors (2012), for example, warns of a tendency to think that ToM attributions are ubiquitous even in the face of challenges posed by those who believe that the best explanations of our FP abilities do not involve theorizing of any kind, at any level (see section 4.3). According to Slors’s diagnosis, those who fall foul of this temptation commit the model-model fallacy. He holds, the model-model fallacy occurs when a theorist systematically uses ToM models to describe what are, in fact, non-mentalizing social-cognitive processes. Though doing so may be valuable for various useful theoretical or practical purposes, those who fall foul of this fallacy systematically conflate features of the ToM models themselves with what goes on subpersonally when exercising our FP competence.
3. Empirical Findings
3.1 Comparative Psychology
An important topic that has been hotly investigated is whether FP is an exclusively human ability or one shared with other non-human animal species. Empirical studies investigating ToM capacities have been conducted with many species, including bottlenose dolphins, corvids—ravens, scrub jays—and dogs (Dally, Emery & Clayton 2006; Tomonaga et al. 2010, Bugnyar & Heinrich 2006; Bugnyar, Reber, & Buckner 2016; Whiten 2013; Maginnity & Grace 2014; see Lurz (2011) for a book-length overview of mindreading in animals). The most sustained experimental work on animal FP capacities has centered on the social intelligence of non-human primates. In 1978, when the debate was just kicking off, Premack and Woodruff launched a small industry by asking in their seminal paper, “Does the Chimpanzee have a theory of mind?”.
Early assessments gleaned from anecdotes of the behaviors of individual animals seemed to return a positive answer to the titular question (Byrne & Whiten 1991). Subsequent, more controlled, experiments raised questions about that verdict. In naturalistic settings, non-human great apes exhibit impressive social intelligence (Byrne & Whiten 1997, Suddendorf & Whiten 2003). Despite this, experimental findings are equivocal about whether, to what extent, and in what ways they are aware of other minds. Initially, there was only negative evidence that chimpanzees and orangutans understand the concept of belief, even when tested by simplified non-verbal versions of the “location change” false belief tasks (Povinelli & Eddy 1996; Povinelli 1996, 2003; Call & Tomasello 1999; Penn & Povinelli 2007).
Switching from a cooperative to a competitive design in their task protocols marked a turning point in the field (Hare, Call, & Tomasello 2001). This change of testing regime yielded evidence that apes may be aware of simpler mental states other than beliefs, such as seeing. Even so, that evidence is equivocal: the results are “decidedly mixed” (Call & Tomasello 2005: 61). A safer conclusion at this stage of inquiry is that simian capacities for engaging with other minds exhibit signature profiles that differ in important respects from that of adult human beings, and even that of human infants.
The dismal performance of chimpanzees on the standard human variants of non-verbal false belief tasks—which test the subject’s capacity to understand that beliefs can be false—galvanized a widespread agreement that the social cognition of great apes does not depend on a sophisticated capacity for FP, certainly not one based on their having an understanding of belief and inter-relations between that concept and other canonical mental states.
Call and Tomasello (2008) highlight this fact when revisiting Premack and Woodruff’s big question 30 years later. Concluding their review of the field, these authors tell us that while the evidence suggests that, in many respects, chimpanzees do have some grip on other minds in many other respects, it also tells us that they do not. Comparing the test results for apes with those of human children has all but secured the conviction that if apes do have any FP abilities then they are not of the same form or in the same degree as that of humans.
The live issue today is not whether chimpanzees or other non-human animals make use of a fully developed FP, but whether they have any degree of mindreading ability at all. Ethologists and primatologists have shifted their focus in this new direction. The main questions now occupying the field are: How do apes and other non-human animals manage their sophisticated social interactions without the capacity for full-blown human-style FP understanding? And, if so, what form does their everyday grip on other minds take?
The gap between evidence and theory generates a logical problem in the interpretation of empirical data which poses, some argue, an insurmountable challenge for anyone hoping to establish the truth of TT based on empirical findings (Whiten 1996; Povinelli & Vonk 2003; Lurz 2009, 2011; Buckner 2014). This problem arises because there is always logical room for characterizing and explaining evidence concerning FP capacities in deflationary non-TT terms. The logical problem reminds us that positing ToMs—of whatever number and type—is not the only live theoretical option for characterizing or explaining the relevant empirical data.
Not everyone is pessimistic about overcoming the logical problem by purely empirical means. Heyes (1998) suggested this might be done by finding evidence of subjects projecting first-person experiences onto others. Some researchers find this protocol promising and seek to develop it (see Southgate 2013, Kano et al. 2019; Lurz & Krachun 2019).
There is now a range of proposals about how best to characterize the apparently FP abilities of non-human apes and other animals. Within the TT camp—the axiomatic assumption is that an everyday understanding of minds essentially involves attributing mental states by employing some kind of ToM. It is accepted, however, that the ToMs in question need not be identical to the fully-fledged version of FP used by adult humans. Under the TT umbrella, it has been proposed that non-human animals may be using a naïve, weak, or minimal theory of mind (Bogdan 2009; Apperly & Butterfill 2009); perceptual mindreading (Bermúdez 2011); or an early mindreading system (Nichols & Stich 2003). Others favor the idea that animals only simulate the effects of mindreading. It has been proposed that certain feats of social cognition might be variously carried off by a sophisticated theory of, or special sensitivities to, behavior (Povinelli & Vonk 2004, Gallagher & Povinelli 2012); sub-mentalizing that utilizes domain-general non-ToM processes (Heyes 2018, though see Kano et al. 2017 for a challenge); mind-minding abilities that target but do not attribute mental states or contents (Fenici 2013, 2015, 2017; Hutto 2017; see Hutto, Herschbach, & Southgate 2011 for a discussion of non-mindreading proposals). Another interesting possibility is that non-human animals, like human children and adults, could be using a much more diverse mix of strategies and tactics to enable their everyday understanding of minds than imagined by FP traditionalists (see section 4.4).
3.2 Developmental Psychology
There exists a substantial body of research on the development of folk psychological abilities in young children. A range of findings in developmental psychology reveals how younger children perform in experimental settings when it comes to their dealing with a wide variety of everyday mental states. For example, at around two years of age, children are sensitive to the fact that different people have different goals and desires (Wellman & Phillips 2001; Bartsch & Wellman 1995; Repacholi & Gopnik 1997). A two-year-old’s understanding of desires can be rather sophisticated: children understand, for example, how desires relate to emotions and perceptions, and what would relevantly and consistently satisfy specific desires, exhibiting some fluency with counterfactual thinking of a limited sort.
As impressive as these abilities are, they neither equate to nor entail an understanding of belief—and it is testing for belief understanding in younger children that takes center stage in child developmental research on ToM. Testing for an understanding of belief is deemed by many to be the empirically robust, gold standard way of ascertaining the presence or absence of ToM abilities. The false-belief test or FB test (sometimes referred to as “ToM test”) was first constructed by Perner and Wimmer in 1983, and the experimental protocol has been further modified by others. It now comes in many subtly different variants, including location change tasks, unexpected contents tasks, and appearance/reality distinction tasks (see Wimmer & Perner 1983; J. Flavell, E. Flavell, & Green 1983; Baron-Cohen, Leslie & Frith 1985; Perner, Leekam, & Wimmer 1987).
In the original test of young children’s grasp of false belief, participants were introduced to a puppet, Maxi. The participant watched as Maxi’s mother put Maxi’s chocolate in cupboard X. In Maxi’s absence, the mother moved the chocolate to cupboard Y. When Maxi returns, participants are asked where Maxi would look for the chocolate. Significantly, no participants in the 3-to-4-year range answered correctly. A familiar explanation of these findings is that those who fail these kinds of FB tests lack the concept of belief, or sufficient facility with it, be able to represent how things appear, cognitively speaking, from a vantage point that diverges from their own.
FB tests have been greatly popular because they provide psychologists with a well-defined yet modifiable experimental protocol that can be applied to different populations, across species, and in diverse settings. In their 2001 meta-analysis focusing on experiments conducted before 1998, Wellman, Cross, and Watson (2001) reviewed 178 such studies, conducted in 591 conditions.
A standard assumption in developmental psychology has been that something important happens in the normal pattern of child development somewhere between the ages of 3 to 5. These are the ages around which FB understanding is usually thought to be acquired by most normally developing children (Astington 2001; Wellman & Liu 2004). Indeed, for many, the passing of FB tests is thought to tell us something important about a subject’s ToM abilities. Some hold that success at FB test is the mark of a subject having acquired the final component of their mature ToM. The tacit assumption made here is that children put the finishing touches on their FP competence by mastering the concept of belief.
There are two things to note concerning these assumptions. Firstly, empirical studies of characteristic developmental patterns have focused almost exclusively on subjects from WEIRD (Western, Educated, Industrialized, Rich, and Democratic) societies, and, as such, conclusions drawn from them should be treated with caution (Henrich, Heine, & Norenzayan 2010). Secondly, even in industrialized Western populations, the full suite of standard FP abilities is not securely in place in children’s performance until after the ages of 5 or 6. Summarising a range of empirical findings, Apperly and Butterfill (2009) report that even older children who are capable of passing false belief tests still have problems understanding how beliefs are acquired, how beliefs interact with desires, and in anticipating the emotional consequences of false beliefs.
In recent years, new kinds of FB tests experiments have shown that children as young as 25 months (Southgate, Senju, & Csibra 2007); 15-months (Onishi & Baillargeon 2005); and 13-months (Surian, Caldi, & Sperber 2007) can pass language-free versions of false-belief tasks. Taken at face value the new infant data suggests that very young children must have some command of the concept of belief, even though much older children lack, as we have seen, the capacity to pass standard, verbally based, FB tasks. These findings have led to the articulation of the so-called developmental “paradox” (Southgate 2013; De Bruin & Newen 2014). Why is it the case that cognitively typical 3–5-year-old children struggle with explicit FB tests if they are already competent with FP at much younger ages?
Some TTists seek to explain the evident developmental changes in children’s conceptual abilities without the need to posit any radical change to or development of ToM concepts. These TTists propose that children do not change the conceptual components of their ToM. These TTists hold that children operate with one and only one TOM with the same basic concepts throughout their entire lives—from early infancy to adulthood (Baillargeon, Scott, & He 2010; Scott & Baillargeon 2017).
TTists of this stripe claim that the developmental paradox is an illusion. By their lights, the core concepts of FP never change even though the capacity to apply concepts comes in degrees. The variation in children’s performance, they propose, is the result of other complicating factors, such as the development of executive function capacities, working memory, and language abilities. On this view, the failure of explicit, verbal false belief tasks does not reveal a conceptual deficit, rather it reveals a deficit of performance rather competence (Carruthers 2013, 2016; Baillargeon, Scott, & Bian 2016; Schönherr & Westra 2019).
An alternative TT proposal is that we can beset explain the aforementioned developmental changes in humans by positing the existence of two functionally distinct ToMs. On this theory, one type of ToM underwrites adult FP capacities to ascribe propositional attitudes. Yet we also make use of a more minimal ToM, one which employs and attributes weaker concepts than that of belief proper. This second, earlier developing ToM is, ex hypothesi, used for fast and efficient, but limited ToM tasks (Apperly & Butterfill 2009; Butterfill & Apperly 2013). On this dual-ToM theory, our first ToM never grows up. Instead, radically new concepts and principles come into play with the advent of our adult ToM, which arrives at around ages 3 to 4 in normally developing Western populations. After that point, both ToMs begin to work alongside one another.
Neutrally presented, the findings of FB tests do not automatically support ToM interpretations. What the FB data shows is that before a certain age, which varies considerably with individual differences, children are unable to make correct belief attributions or to correctly answer questions about belief-related actions when this requires them to specify the content of the divergent cognitive points of view of others. All such tests confront children with a task that inherently demands that they adopt a spectatorial stance. Consequently, the experimental data provide no direct insight into the true range of children’s FB understanding. Nor do they reveal what role such FB understanding might play in children’s ability to make sense of others in more natural and less restricted interactional settings (Reddy & Morris 2004; Buttelmann, Carpenter, & Tomasello 2009).
It has been argued that FB tests do not probe deeply into the child’s FP understanding because they only test for such understanding in third-personal, experimental conditions. Such tests leave us none the wiser as to how frequently or centrally such FB understanding is used; how the children come by it; what enables its acquisition; which other tasks it might be used for; and so on.
Several psychologists and philosophers have emphasized the artificiality of FB experiments and the contrived nature of the situations, those requiring subjects to take up a third-personal stance on others, in which they are conducted. These critics of FB testing conclude that while FB tests allow for the focused collection of data, that collected data tells us precious little about the use of FP in everyday human social engagements, namely those we find “in the wild” and “in the streets” (Gallagher 2001, 2015; Leudar, Costall, & Francis 2004; Leudar & Costall 2009). Given the limits of the FB experimental protocol, it has been argued that such tests do not tell us much about children’s FP capacities in other, more ecologically valid contexts and settings.
A great deal of experimental work has been devoted to identifying the dedicated brain regions or network of brain regions that are reliably involved in ToM tasks (see Koster-Hale & Saxe, 2013 for an overview). This empirical work usually takes the form of correlative fMRI neuroimaging and Transcranial Magnetic Stimulation, TMS, studies. Schuwerk, Langguth, and Sommer (2014) report on findings that have been employed using both of these methods to test a diverse range of subjects of different genders, ages, and cultural backgrounds.
Based on accumulated evidence, it is now claimed that five regions of the brain are specifically and reliably active in ToM tasks. These regions have been identified as (1) the left and right temporoparietal junction (LTPJ and RTPJ); (2) the left and right dorsolateral prefrontal cortex (DLPFC); (3) the left inferior frontal gyrus (IFG); (4) the ventral medial prefrontal cortex (vMPFC); and (5) the posterior medial prefrontal cortex (pMPFC) (Schuwerk et al. 2014).
The idea that mindreading involves a large-scale network respects Apperly’s (2010) warning against over-emphasizing the importance of any single brain region and assigning it the function of “mindreading” per se. Focusing too narrowly on single brain regions, it is argued, overlooks the importance of a broader set of neural regions that must work together in concert, on the assumption that many such regions serve their own important or even indispensable mindreading functions.
Data-driven meta-analyses of networks seek to reveal the more specialized functional contributions of specific brain regions within a broader neural network. For example, it has been claimed that TMS studies can identify the specific contribution of particular regions to overall ToM tasks (Kalbe et al. 2010). Reportedly, TMS studies suggest that the medial prefrontal cortex (pMPFC), for example, plays a part in enabling subjects to distinguish their perspective from that of others. By contrast, other findings suggest that the R-TPJ brain region is selectively enlisted for tasks requiring the interpretatively complex attribution of mental states to others (Mahy, Moses, & Pfeifer 2014). For example, Saxe and Wexler (2005) found that R-TPJ activity is increased compared to other regions. This happens when the professed beliefs or desires of story protagonists conflict with a subjects’ background expectations about what these characters ought to believe or desire. Moreover, this region is not similarly recruited for other tasks that involve assessing other, more general, socially relevant facts about persons.
Importantly, it appears that the relevant selectivity of this brain region comes late in the day, emerging “in the R-TPJ between ages 6 and 11 years” (Saxe 2009: 1206). Citing work by Kobayashi, Glover, and Temple (2007), in their systematic examination of the neural evidence of major theories of ToM acquisition, Mahy, Moses, and Pfeifer (2014) also emphasize that
although 8-to-12-year-old children significantly engage TPJ bilaterally in ToM stories … younger children do not always show this selective TPJ recruitment. (2014: 70)
There is some consensus that the TPJ is recruited and involved in FP modes of understanding minds in later stages of development. There is also evidence that there no single, dedicated neural network at play in ToM-related tasks across all stages of development (Gweon et al. 2012). In a bid to make sense of these findings, Saxe and colleagues take seriously the
recent hint that middle childhood is a critical time for interactions between language and theory of mind. (Saxe 2009: 1207)
These findings present a prima facie challenge for approaches that assume ToMs are innate and early-maturing (see Saxe 2009; Mahy, Moses, & Pfeifer 2014).
Importantly, it is worth noting that even the TPJ is not deployed only or solely in ToM tasks. Commenting on this lack-of-specificity problem concerning the TPJ, Apperly (2010) reports the following conclusions reached in a meta-review of neuroimaging studies: the so-called “mindreading network” was implicated not only in mindreading tasks but also in tasks involving information recall, general reasoning, and inductive reasoning in uncertain conditions. It turns out that many tasks that do not appear to inherently involve ToM nevertheless evoke activity in the TPJ, violating the specificity criterion (see Mahy, Moses, & Pfeifer 2014).
Some, such as Rosenberg (2018), are sanguine that, taken together, the neuroscientific findings provide
evidence that the theory of mind is localized to a small number of specific brain regions acting together as a mental module. (2018: 60)
These considerations also allow for the possibility that mindreading is, at best, enabled by a loose confederation of brain areas that pull together in widescale networks to complete ToM task as opposed to consisting of a stable dedicated brain network (Anderson 2014).
ToM-focused neuroscience is still developing. A recent verdict on the state-of-the-art summarizes the current situation:
Although functional neuroimaging techniques have been widely used to establish the neural correlates implicated in ToM, the specific mechanisms are still not clear. (Zeng et al. 2020: 1)
3.4 Cross-Cultural Psychology
Many studies in cross-cultural psychology reveal apparent socio-cultural variation in FP and FP-related abilities (e.g., Avis & Harris 1991; Vinden 1996, 1999, 2002; Naito & Koyama 2006; Liu et al. 2008). These empirical results suggest there may be important differences between the forms of FP used in different cultures (Mills 2001). Assessing a body of cross-cultural data relating to FB tests, Mayer and Träuble (2013) reach the cautious conclusion that
it is not clear whether it is justified to assume a universal onset of false-belief understanding across cultures. (2013: 22)
Plenty of cross-cultural variation has been found when comparing non-Western and Western societies concerning other aspects of FP-related understanding. The standard explanation for such differences is put down to the fact that the
early social experiences of children [in such societies] clearly differ from the experiences of children in Western cultures. (Mayer & Träuble 2013: 22; Barrett et al. 2013a, 2013b)
Consider, for example, Mayer and Träuble’s (2013) study of the onset of FP understanding in Samoan children. Like other cross-cultural researchers, they choose to look at this particular population precisely because “ethnographical work reports different practices of intersubjective understanding” (Mayer & Träuble 2013: 22). A plausible explanation of differences in the timing of the emergence and application of FP-related abilities in the Samoan case focuses on how, and how frequently, mental states terms are used in that culture. As cultural anthropologists and ethnographers observe, it is widely asserted in societies of the Pacific that
it is impossible or at least extremely difficult to know what other people think or feel. (Robbins & Rumsey 2008: 407–408)
A possible explanation of Samoan FP-related tendencies is that mental states are talked about less frequently and in different ways in Samoan populations than they are in populations with other socio-cultural practices.
Another line of research reveals that belief understanding varies in certain Eastern populations (Hong Kong, Japan) when compared with their Western (US, Eastern Europe) counterparts (Doan & Wang 2010; Liu et al. 2008). Again, this difference may be connected to the fact that different explanatory practices prevail in these societies (Chao 1994; Bradford et al. 2018). Fiebich (2016) proposes that these cultural differences are evident in early mother-child conversations. Caretakers from Western cultures seem to favor mentalistic narratives, whereas caretakers from Asian cultures exhibit a preference for behavioral-contextual narratives. For example, when reading a picture book together with their child, European and American mothers tend to refer more often to the mental states of the protagonist (e.g., “the bear is sad”) rather than to the embodied aspects of those states (e.g., “the bear has tears on his face”), in contrast to Chinese mothers. This correlates with earlier evidence that suggests children from several non-Western cultures do not employ the familiar Western FP schema, or at least that they do not do as readily or with the same proficiency as Westerners do (Vinden 1996, 1999; Lillard 1997, 1998; see also Lavelle forthcoming).
Other cross-cultural evidence reported by Wellman and Peterson (2013) found variations in the developmental sequence in which the component elements of FP competence are acquired. They observe people can understand other minds in terms of a range of attitudes, including, diverse desires concerning the same object (Diverse Desires, DD), different beliefs about the same situation (Diverse Beliefs, DB), that something can be true while the person may not know that (Knowledge Access, KA), that something might be true while the person believes otherwise (False Belief, FB), and that someone can feel one way but display a different emotion (Hidden Emotion, HE).
The order and sequence in which children get a grip on different attitudes vary socio-culturally. Based on a series of studies involving over 500 preschool children in the USA, Canada, Australia, and Germany, it was found that 80% of children exhibit a common pattern of acquisition, developing their FP-related understanding in the following sequence: DD > DB > KA > FB > HE. However, it has been discovered that Chinese and Iranian pre-schoolers come by their FP understanding in a different order, acquiring KA competence before DB (Shahaeian et al. 2011; Wellman et al. 2006; Wellman 2011). Once again, a possible explanation of these differences ties them to local conversational-cultural preferences.
Taken together these findings suggest that not all cultures engage in all the same FP practices, nor do they do some in the same sequence or the same way. Evidence gleaned from the handful of cross-cultural studies that have been conducted suggests that neither full FP understanding nor mastery of the concept of belief comes automatically or in equal measure to all members of the human species.
Looking at the practices of other cultures, there is apparent heterogeneity in the explanatory tendencies and methods used in making sense of people’s actions. In some parts of the globe great emphasis is placed, for example, on situational, trait-based, and even supernatural explanations factors (Morris & Peng 1994; Lillard 1997, 1998). The accumulated cross-cultural evidence should make us cautious in assuming that all human populations exhibit the same kind of FP understanding or use FP to the same extent or for the same purposes.
4. Philosophical Challenges to Theory Theory
TTists assume that mature scientific psychology and FP both offer up theories that are in precisely the same line of work—namely, that of causally explaining behavior. Yet, to the extent the mature scientific psychology and FP compete in this domain, the latter looks like a poor contender.
Good theories run deep. They are based on hard-won knowledge of underlying causes rather than on generalizations based on surface data. Good theories provide a powerful means of anticipating, explaining, and controlling what happens. They do so by tapping into the world of the unseen and the abstract. A good theory allows us to make solid bets that pay off quickly and selectively, using minimal evidence. Good theories reliably guide expectations, even in novel circumstances.
The key question then is: If FP is a theory of everyday human psychology, is it a good theory? Some argue, given what we already know and are likely to discover, that is almost certainly a false theory. Some think it is so poor that we have reason to think the states over which it quantifies do not exist. Going by Churchland’s (1981) assessment, we have every reason to think FP’s principles are false and its ontology is an illusion. Churchland (1979, 1989, 1993) highlights FP’s lack of unity and fit with a growing body of theory elsewhere in the sciences. Others agree. Rosenberg (2018), for example, maintains that modern neuroscience directly refutes FP proposals about the true causes of human behavior.
Without the benefit of a sustained and thriving scientific research program, FP seems to be, at most, a low-grade theory that is in tension with the best theories of mind that the mature cognitive sciences are developing. Many suppose that the advancing theories of cognitive science and neuroscience offer a deeper and more accurate means of understanding mind and cognition (see Carruthers 2011; Heyes 2018; Rosenberg 2018; see Horgan & Woodward 1985 for a defense of FP on this score).
It has been argued that as long as we assume FP is any kind of ToM then it won’t remain in the theoretical running unless it allows for revision and is prepared to incorporate the latest findings of mature scientific theorizing about minds (Murphy 2006; Gerrans 2014). Assuming FP is not open to such significant, open-ended revision, Churchland (1989) famously characterizes it as a stagnant or degenerating research program.
Eliminativists regard FP’s theoretical commitments as backward and outdated. FP is often compared to rejected theories that sought to explain diseases by appeal to witches as opposed to germs. Importantly, a ToM can be an imperfect, false theory that fosters only illusions even if it is hardwired in our brains. If so, FP is a bad theory that we, as a species, may find it hard to shake because we are universally pre-set to acquire it due to its quick and dirty utility in everyday contexts.
Other reasons have been offered for thinking that FP is an inferior theory when compared to the theories of scientific psychology. It has been argued that the contents of propositional attitudes are necessarily world-relating in a way that requires us to look beyond the bounds of an organism’s skin when assigning contents to such attitudes (Stich 1983). On this analysis, the ways we attribute mental state concepts and contents involves recourse to “similarity conditions” and normative principles of charity that could not possibly feature in a mature science of the mind (Davidson 1984, 1987). On this view, FP involves the ascription of contentful attitudes by employing interpretative methods that are inescapably bound up with norms of rationality. For those persuaded by such arguments, to the extent that FP is properly characterized as a theory at all, it must be regarded as a domestic theory of very limited scope: one that is unfit to predict or explain the behavior of exotic subjects, such as very young children and animals (Stich 1983). If this analysis is correct, it reveals FP to be inherently wedded to an explanatory schema that is incompatible with the demands of serious scientific psychology.
To the extent that FP embeds such features, it breaks faith with the alleged central tenet of any bona fide scientific psychology—namely, that proper causal explanations should only cite proximate causes of action, those located physically, inside the skin of agents (Fodor 1981; McGinn 1989). For those persuaded by this line of argument FP will be incapable of providing causal explanations of action if it turns out that the content of propositional attitudes needs to be individuated by factors that necessarily require looking beyond an agent’s skin.
4.2 Simulation Theory
Since the mid-1980s the main rival to TT has been the simulation theory, or ST, of which there are many varieties. The major proponents of ST diverge in their views about what exactly simulation involves. They heterogeneously characterize the process of simulation as a form of imaginative transformation (Gordon 1986, 1995, 1996), thought replication or co-cognition (Heal 1986, 1995, 1996, 1998a, 1998b), introspective modeling (Gopnik & Wellman 1992) and off-line practical reasoning (Goldman 1989, 2006).
Simulation theorists take it for granted that we regularly engage in FP, but they hold that doing so does not imply the existence of a set of conceptually articulated ToM principles. They propose that as our minds are already populated with the relevant mental states and that we can systematically manipulate those mental states in precisely the sorts of ways TT principles aim to describe. Proponents of ST also propose that when we make mentalistic attributions to other minds we use our minds as models for those targets. Thus, even though the simulation process is a structured activity involving the attribution of mental state concepts, no theoretical principles need to be consulted or used when we understand minds in FP fashion.
Goldman (2006), for example, depicts high-level mindreading of the sort associated with FP understanding as a three-stage process. In the primary or preparatory phase, appropriate targets must be identified (viz. intentional actions or what at least looks to be such). During the second, or what might be called the simulative phase, appropriate inputs—“pretend” thoughts, beliefs, or desires (or the same entertained hypothetically)—are “fed into” specific subpersonal mechanisms (e.g., the practical reasoning mechanism operating in an off-line mode). These mental states are then internally manipulated to yield predictions or explanations.
Mentalistic concepts are not needed for the first two stages of the process. But they come into play when attributing mental states to targets in the final phase. Making such attributions requires identifying which mental states it is that one is ascribing—these must be classified both by appeal to their general attitudinal type (belief, desire, hope) and their specific content (e.g., that “The bus leaves from stand 25”.).
To the extent that simulation processes might exhaustively explain our FP abilities, ST directly challenges TT explanations. ST offers to explain how FP ascriptions can be carried off without positing any kind of “theory” as being involved in the central mindreading process. Motivated by the acknowledgment of some limitations of pure TT accounts (see Heal 1998a, 1998b), some TTists have come to favor hybrid explanations of the cognitive basis of FP in which both theory and simulation have clear-cut parts to play in achieving FP understanding (Goldman 2006). Yet however this alliance is precisely conceived, there remains a crucial question about which, if either, of the two theories—TT or ST—does the work of explaining the core structural aspects of our FP competence (see Apperly 2008 for a critique of the explanatory value of both approaches).
4.3 Phenomenological Critiques of TT
Several authors, drawing on phenomenological considerations, offer a fundamental critique of all variants of TT, arguing that TT approaches systematically mischaracterize their target explanandum in crucial respects (Gallagher 2001, 2020; Ratcliffe 2007; Gallagher & Zahavi 2008; Gallagher & Hutto 2008; see Hutto & Ratcliffe 2007 for an overview). Such critics maintain that the way we engage with and understand others in everyday life is misdescribed when they are depicted as being essentially theoretical. These philosophers challenge the idea that interpersonal engagements of the sort that are meant to be captured under the FP umbrella are a matter of seeking to infer the underlying causes of another’s behavior by means of mental state attribution.
Phenomenological reflection, they argue, speaks against the TT assumption that our situation with respect to others is fundamentally that of a scientific spectator to target phenomena. That TT assumption is fostered by thinking that if we are to understand other minds we must bridge an assumed epistemic gap that exists between us and others, and that we must bridge that gap by accurately depicting the mental states that move others to act.
It has been argued that modeling FP on a scientific enterprise paints a distorting picture of its character. Positively characterized, our everyday ways of engaging with and understanding others are said to be a matter of responding directly to the attitudes and emotions of others, making sense of their projects and commitments, and trusting or not trusting the accounts they give us about why they do what they do. Phenomenologically motivated critics of TT argue that when we deal with others in these kinds of ways we do not take up a scientific stance towards them.
These phenomenologically motivated critics deny that TT provides an accurate description of what we do when we make sense of actions in everyday life (Herschbach 2008; Strijbos & de Bruin 2012). For example, often when we are interested in another’s reasons for acting, we get at their reason by being told directly why they acted thus and so though second-personal exchanges, obviating the need to infer or attribute mental states to the other (Hutto 2004, 2008). To understand FP exchanges of this kind aright is, in McGeer’s words, to recognize that we do not “interact with one another as scientist to object, as observer to observed” (2007: 146).
The most radical phenomenologically motivated challenge to TT holds that when we look closely at how we understand one another in everyday life we do not find people making mental state attributions of standard FP sort at all (Ratcliffe 2006, 2007). Defending this analysis, Ratcliffe offers a deflationary appraisal of FP, regarding it as a kind of philosophical fiction. By his lights, FP is a misleading picture of our everyday ways of understanding one another—a picture that lacks depth and which does not come close to the richness of our actual practice.
Up until the 2000s, it was the received view that FP abilities were based, wholly or primarily, in mindreading abilities and that such abilities were assumed to be best explained by TT, ST, or some hybrid combination. That orthodoxy has been challenged by pluralists about FP who maintain that we engage in FP for many purposes other than prediction and explanation. For example, it has been proposed that FP enables us to coordinate, justify and regulate our actions and behavior. FP pluralists maintain that we achieve these diverse ends by diverse means and methods (Bermúdez 2003; Slors & MacDonald 2008; Andrews 2008, 2012; Fiebich, Gallagher, & Hutto 2016; Andrews, Spaulding, & Westra forthcoming).
A signature pluralist assumption is that the extension of FP is wider than traditionally supposed, encompassing anything we do when understanding minds and navigating everyday interpersonal relations (see Hornsby 1996; Spaulding 2018b). According to FP pluralists, there are many ways that we keep track of and think about minds—our methods for doing so are not exclusively restricted to attributing mental states but include being sensitive to a range of factors including socio-cultural situational norms, conventions, stereotypes, implicit biases, and person-specific character traits. How we think about minds on any given occasion, pluralists claim, varies as a function of context and our shifting FP goals.
Some variants of FP pluralism are perfectly compatible with TT. They assume that the use of ToM lies at the core of FP understanding and that a ToM interacts with and is informed by other kinds of information concerning the aforementioned range of socio-cognitive factors (Spaulding 2018a, 2018b; Westra 2018, 2019, 2020).
Other versions of FP pluralism do not give TT pride of place as FP’s primary or default function. Some variants place TT predictions and explanations on equal footing with other FP methods and goals. FP pluralism of this kind assumes that FP has no single primary function or method. Rather FP uses various means to achieve multiple ends—such as, making and justifying moral judgments, fostering social bonding, molding, and regulating behavior.
Yet other versions of FP pluralism directly threaten TT by assuming FP has a primary function and basis that is non-theoretical. Such accounts reject TT by holding that FP’s primary function is not that of making third-personal predictions and explanations about minds. For example, it has been proposed that FP’s primary work is to achieve regulative mind-shaping by means of imitation, pedagogy, and other social conformity mechanisms. So understood, the main work of FP is that of normatively molding, not descriptively reading, minds (McGeer 2007, 2015, forthcoming; Zawidzki 2008, 2013; Castro 2020). It is assumed that as a result of such mindshaping minds become more predictable, enabling—amongst other things—successful cooperation and the successful predicting and explaining of minds by attributing contents to them. Importantly, on these mindshaping accounts, anything we might call theorizing about minds is a parasitic and peripheral capacity that only comes into play in special contexts.
4.5 The Narrative Practice Hypothesis
The Narrative Practice Hypothesis, or NPH, offers a thoroughgoing challenge to TT. In its original formulation, it incorporates versions of the challenges to TT issued by phenomenological critics and FP pluralists. Inspired by Bruner (1990), the NPH holds that folk psychology is a kind of narrative practice and hypothesizes that our FP competence is fostered by engaging in socially supported story-telling activities (Hutto 2004, 2007, 2008).
The NPH maintains that engaging in specific kinds of narrative practices is the normal route by which human beings come to understand, explain and make sense of actions done for reasons in FP terms. It is through such narrative practices that we normally become acquainted with mental attitudes or predicates (e.g., belief, desire, hope, fear) and learn of the complex ways such attitudes can inter-relate. The NPH is consistent with the fact that FP practice is quite variable. We call on many kinds of mental states, other than beliefs and desires—such as hopes, fears, and other more basic kinds of perceptions, emotions—as well as character traits and non-psychological attributes when making sense of why someone may have acted. The NPH assumes that fuller and more complete explanations of action will give details of the person’s character, situation, and history—in short, more of the person’s “story”.
The primary function of FP, according to the NPH, is the hermeneutic understanding and justification of action through normalizing explanations. It assumes that such explanations cannot be understood as backward-looking retrodictions that mirror forward-looking predictions. Following Andrews (2003), the NPH thus challenges the assumption that prediction and explanation are symmetrical. In agreement with the mindshaping hypothesis, the NPH assumes that any theorizing we do about minds, by calling on generalizations, is peripheral and parasitic on the more primary narratively based ways of understanding reasons for action. The NPH assumes theorizing only occurs in third-personal contexts and that core FP understanding upon which FP predictions and explanations are based need not be grounded in any kind of ToM.
The NPH acknowledges that our FP competence is structured. Yet it maintains that FP structure derives from the patterns embedded in the ambient narratives found in our socio-cultural environments and not, say, from the pattern of a set of internalized rules stored in the brains of individuals. The NPH advances the view that we acquire our structured FP competence through dealing with special kinds of narratives—FP narratives—when appropriately supported by caregivers. A range of empirical findings lend apparent support to the NPH (see Astington 1990, 1996; Astington & Jenkins 1999; Richner & Nicolopoulou 2001; Nelson 2003, 2007).
FP narratives are a special sub-set of narratives—those that make mention of and show how mental states figure in the lives, history, and larger projects of their owners. Like all narratives, FP narratives depict a particular series of events in the lives of certain protagonists. Yet FP narratives differ from other kinds of narratives in that they explicitly showcase the various psychological states and attitudes. The NPH predicts that if cultures diverge significantly in their narrative practices, then we should expect to find different patterns, tendencies, and proficiencies in the use of FP across those cultures (Hutto 2008).
Ultimately, the NPH holds that FP competence—our facility with FP forms and norms—is grounded in non-representational capacities that have been structured by social interactions and narratives. This proposal rejects the intellectualist individualism that is standardly assumed in mainstream cognitive science and proposes instead that FP competence is a kind of enculturated know-how (McGeer forthcoming). Some, however, for example, Overgaard and Michael (2015), object that to be workable as an account of FP competence the NPH has no choice but to assume that a ToM, and not just enculturated practical know-how, is acquired via engaging in the relevant narrative practices.
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