Wilfrid Stalker Sellars (1912–89) was a systematic, original, and profound American philosopher. His effort in philosophy was “to formulate a scientifically oriented, naturalistic realism which would ‘save the appearances’ ” (AR: 289). Broadly educated in philosophy, the influences on Sellars’s work range from critical realism and logical positivism to German Idealism and phenomenology. Sellars was influential in part through his editorial work as a co-founder of the first American journal devoted to “analytic” philosophy and co-editor of two seminal collections of essays that defined the canon for generations of graduate students. More significantly, he is known for his attack on the “myth of the given” and his development of a coherentist epistemology and functional role/inferentialist semantics, for his distinction between the “manifest image” and the “scientific image” of the world, for his proposal that psychological concepts are like theoretical concepts, and for a tough-minded scientific realism. Sellars can claim the first explicit formulation of a functionalist treatment of intentional states, an early recognition of the “hard problem” of sensory consciousness, and a thoroughgoing nominalism, as well as rich interpretations of historical figures in philosophy. His work has inspired a number of contemporary philosophers, although they tend to fall into at least two camps, sometimes denominated “right-wing” and “left-wing” Sellarsians.
- 1. Life
- 2. The Philosophical Enterprise and the Images of Humanity-in-the-World
- 3. Language and Being
- 4. Epistemology
- 5. Philosophy of Mind
- 6. Science and Reality
- 7. Practical Reason: Intentions, Rules, and Normativity
- 8. The Stereoscopic Vision
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Wilfrid Stalker Sellars was born in Ann Arbor, Michigan, on 20 May 1912, to Roy Wood and Helen Stalker Sellars. His father was a significant philosopher in his own right, a professor at the University of Michigan and a founder of American Critical Realism. Wilfrid’s childhood in Ann Arbor was interrupted for two years when he was 9: the family spent a year in New England, the summer at Oxford, and the subsequent year in Paris, where Wilfrid attended the Lycée Montaigne. Returning to Ann Arbor, Sellars then attended the high school run by the University’s School of Education, where he particularly enjoyed mathematics. Following his graduation in 1929, the family returned to Paris. Sellars entered the Lycée Louis le Grand, where philosophy was in the curriculum and Marxism was in the air. Not having discussed philosophy previously with his father, he began in philosophy as a French Marxist, although his father’s influence soon took precedence. (For a partial account of their philosophical connections, see F. Gironi 2017, 2018.) He followed his year at the Lycée with six months in Munich, polishing his German.
In 1931 Sellars returned to Ann Arbor as an undergraduate philosophy major, studying with his father, DeWitt Parker, C.H. Langford and others in Michigan’s excellent department. Among other things, he studied the work of Russell and Moore, modal logic with Langford, and continued the dialogue with his father that had begun in Paris. At the height of the depression, Sellars was also involved in left-wing politics, campaigning for the socialist Norman Thomas. Because of his Lycée background, Sellars tested out of a number of requirements, graduating college with his high school cohort in 1933. He then enrolled at the University of Buffalo for an M.A., where he studied Husserl and Kant with Marvin Farber.
Sellars was a competitive athlete in college and won a Rhodes scholarship, which took him in the fall of 1934 to Oriel College at Oxford, where he enrolled in the PPE program. W. G. Maclagan was his tutor, and he came under the influence of H. A. Prichard and H. H. Price, and, through them, Cook Wilson. He took first class honors in 1936 and returned that fall for a D. Phil., attempting a dissertation on Kant under T. D. Weldon. While at Oxford, he also met his first wife, Mary Sharp, who was born in Yorkshire and to whom he was married in 1938. Unable to articulate his new interpretation of Kant sufficiently well to complete the degree, Sellars returned to the U.S. in the fall of 1937, entering the graduate department at Harvard and passing his prelims in the spring of 1938.
Newly married, Sellars was offered a job in 1938 at the University of Iowa by Herbert Feigl. The department there was small, and Sellars took charge of teaching the history of philosophy courses, working out the view of the history of philosophy that informed his work thereafter. But he never finished the dissertation at Harvard and was plagued for a number of years by an inability to get his thoughts down on paper. World War II interrupted his career; he served in the Navy from 1943–46. When the war ended, Sellars had no choice but to publish, and began a program of writing up to 10 hours a day, however much (or little) he produced. Draft after draft of his first attempt slowly evolved into “Realism and the New Way of Words.” Once he established a writing process, Sellars began publishing steadily. For a thorough interpretation of Sellars’ earliest publications, see P. Olen (2016, 2016).
In 1946, Sellars moved to the University of Minnesota, where he rejoined Feigl. Together they published Readings in Philosophical Analysis (1949), a classic early collection of analytical philosophy, and founded Philosophical Studies, a leading journal of analytic philosophy. With his colleague John Hospers, Sellars published Readings in Ethical Theory (1952), which also became an industry standard. Sellars chaired the department at Minnesota from 1952–59, a time which also saw the flowering of the Minnesota Center for the Philosophy of Science.
In the 1950s Sellars laid the groundwork for his systematic approach to philosophy in such path-breaking essays as “Some Reflections on Language Games” (1954, expanded in 1963) and “Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind,” (1956) which Tyler Burge (1992: 33) has called “the most influential paper of the period.” He visited at Yale in 1958, moving there as a tenured professor in 1959. But Yale became factionalized, and Sellars thought the internal politics disrupted his ability to do philosophy. In 1963 he moved to the University of Pittsburgh, which was in the process of reconstructing its philosophy department, becoming a top-ranked department. Sellars remained at Pittsburgh until his death in 1989, though he visited and lectured at a number of other universities. He also accrued a number of honors, giving the John Locke Lectures in 1965, the Matchette Foundation Lectures in 1971, the John Dewey Lectures in 1973, and the Carus Lectures in 1977. Sellars was elected President of the Eastern Division of the American Philosophical Association in 1970. He published many books and articles and also left his mark on the profession by training a large number of graduate students (this author included). He was productive into the early 1980s, when a stroke slowed him down; he died 2 July 1989. Following a lull in interest in his philosophy in the late 1980s and early 1990s, his work has garnered steadily increasing attention in the U. S. and abroad.
2. The Philosophical Enterprise and the Images of Humanity-in-the-World
In “Philosophy and the Scientific Image of Man” [PSIM], Sellars lays out his view of philosophy and its current situation. “The aim of philosophy, abstractly formulated, is to understand how things in the broadest possible sense of the term hang together in the broadest possible sense of the term” (PSIM, in SPR:1; in ISR: 369). “To achieve success in philosophy would be, to use a contemporary turn of phrase, to ‘know one’s way around’ …, not in that unreflective way in which the centipede of the story knew its way around before it faced the question, ‘how do I walk?’, but in that reflective way which means that no intellectual holds are barred” (loc. cit.). Thus, philosophy is a reflectively conducted higher-order inquiry that is continuous with but distinguishable from any of the special disciplines, and the understanding it aims at must have practical force, guiding our activities, both theoretical and practical.
PSIM describes what Sellars sees as the major problem confronting philosophy today. This is the “clash” between “the ‘manifest’ image of man-in-the-world” and “the scientific image.” These two ‘images’ are idealizations of distinct conceptual frameworks in terms of which humans conceive of the world and their place in it. Sellars characterizes the manifest image as “the framework in terms of which man came to be aware of himself as man-in-the-world” (PSIM, in SPR: 6; in ISR: 374), but it is, more broadly, the framework in terms of which we ordinarily observe and explain our world. The fundamental objects of the manifest image are persons and things, with emphasis on persons, which puts normativity and reason at center stage. According to the manifest image, people think and they do things for reasons, and both of these “can occur only within a framework of conceptual thinking in terms of which [they] can be criticized, supported, refuted, in short, evaluated” (PSIM, in SPR: 6; in ISR: 374). In the manifest image persons are very different from mere things; things do not act rationally, in accordance with normative rules, but only in accord with laws or perhaps habits. How and why normative concepts and assessments apply to things is an important and contentious question within the framework.
The manifest image is not fixed or static; it can be refined both empirically and categorically. Empirical refinement by correlational induction results in ever better observation-level generalizations about the world. Categorial refinement consists in adding, subtracting, or reconceptualizing the basic objects recognized in the image, e.g., worrying about whether persons are best thought of in hylomorphic or dualistic categories or how things differ from persons. Thus, the manifest image is neither unscientific nor anti-scientific. It is, however, methodologically more promiscuous and often less rigorous than institutionalized science. Traditional philosophy, philosophia perennis, endorses the manifest image as real and attempts to understand its structure.
One kind of categorial change, however, is excluded from the manifest image by stipulation: the addition to the framework of new concepts of basic objects by means of theoretical postulation. This is the move Sellars stipulates to be definitive of the scientific image. Science, by postulating new kinds of basic entities (e.g., subatomic particles, fields, collapsing packets of probability waves), slowly constructs a new framework that claims to be a complete description and explanation of the world and its processes. The scientific image grows out of and is methodologically posterior to the manifest image, which provides the initial framework in which science is nurtured, but Sellars claims that “the scientific image presents itself as a rival image. From its point of view the manifest image on which it rests is an ‘inadequate’ but pragmatically useful likeness of a reality which first finds its adequate (in principle) likeness in the scientific image” (PSIM, in SPR: 20; in ISR: 388).
Is it possible to reconcile these two images? Could manifest objects reduce to systems of imperceptible scientific objects? Are manifest objects ultimately real, scientific objects merely abstract constructions valuable for the prediction and control of manifest objects? Or are manifest objects appearances to human minds of a reality constituted by systems of imperceptible particles or something even more basic, such as absolute processes (see FMPP)? Sellars opts for the third alternative. The manifest image is, in his view, a phenomenal realm à la Kant, but science, at its Peircean ideal conclusion, reveals things as they are in themselves. Despite what Sellars calls “the primacy of the scientific image” (PSIM, in SPR: 32; in ISR: 400), he ultimately argues for a “synoptic vision” in which the descriptive and explanatory resources of the scientific image are united with the “language of community and individual intentions,” which “provide[s] the ambience of principles and standards (above all, those which make meaningful discourse and rationality itself possible) within which we live our own individual lives” (PSIM, in SPR: 40; in ISR: 408).
Norms are not reduced away in Sellars’s naturalism; he accommodates normativity, not as a basic, ontologically independent feature of the world, but rather as a conceptually irreducible, indispensable aspect of distinctively human activity grounded in the collective institution of principles and standards. We will return to the question of norms later in this article.
Sellars boldly proclaims that “in the dimension of describing and explaining the world, science is the measure of all things, of what is that it is, and of what is not that it is not” (EPM §41; in SPR: 173; in KMG: 253). But understood in the context of his system, this is not the proclamation of a harsh, reductive scientific realism, for (1) he does not believe that describing and explaining are the only significant dimensions of human activity. In particular, he recognizes that prescription and proscription are (a) different from description and (b) indispensable to human activity. And (2), his conception of ontology is object-oriented; the presence of normative truths does not belie his fundamental naturalistic nominalism. To begin to unpack these claims, we need to look at Sellars’s philosophy of language and his ontology.
3. Language and Being
Sellars takes an unorthodox approach to language, but it is also crucial for his naturalistic metaphysics. The key to his view is that semantic terms and descriptions provide functional classifications of linguistic tokens. His analysis of meaning statements such as
‘Rot,’ in German, means red
‘Brother’ means male sibling
treats them as statements that convey the information that the word mentioned on the left-hand side has a relevantly similar usage to the phrase on the right-hand side. These meaning statements, however, do not explicitly say that the two expressions they each contain have the same usage. Rather, each sentence presupposes that the person it is directed at already understands the background language, in this case English, and uses the expression on the right-hand side as an illustrating sortal to form an indexical predicate (forming a predicate by giving an example bearing the relevant property), which is then applied to the tokens picked out by the expression on the left-hand side of the sentence. Sellars invented a device, dot-quotation, to express this formally. Dot quotation forms a common noun (not a name) that applies to every item in any language that functions in a relevantly similar way to the quoted expression. •Red• is a common noun true of any expression that functions like the English word ‘red.’ Thus, Sellars analyzes
‘Rot,’ in German, means red
‘Rot’s, in German, are •red•s.
“According to this analysis, meaning is not a relation for the very simple reason that ‘means’ is a specialized form of the copula” (MFC: 431).
Reference is also given a functional analysis. Reference, unlike meaning, is extensional. While we can say that both
‘Venedig’ (in German) refers to Venice
‘Venedig’s are German •Venice•s
are true, we can’t say that both
‘Die Königin der Adria’ (in German) refers to Venice
‘Die Königin der Adria’s are German •Venice•s
are true. The first member of each pair is true, but ‘die Königin der Adria’ has a different sense from ‘Venice,’ because it is a descriptive phrase and has an internal syntactic and semantic complexity that the proper name ‘Venice’ does not. Sellars guarantees the extensionality of reference by introducing a quantifier into his analysis of ‘refers’ statements. He takes reference statements to quantify implicitly over senses, that is, functions of expressions, and then defines an extensional relation of material or extensional equivalence between senses (see SM III §63: 84). Our example sentences are then analyzed, where ‘S’ is variable over senses (so that ‘S’ is a higher-order substitutional variable whose substituends are sortals such as •Venice•), as
For some S, ‘Venedig’ (in German) stands for S, and S is materially equivalent to •Venice•
For some S, ‘Die Königin der Adria’(in German) stands for S, and S is materially equivalent to •Venice•.
The idea of a reference relation is the heart of orthodox semantic theory in contemporary logic and the philosophy of language, but Sellars denies that reference is a relation, just as he denies that meaning is a relation. The same goes for truth, which classical theories try to understand through some correspondence relation purported to hold between sentences and the world. Sellars endorses instead a pragmatist conception of truth:
[F]or a proposition to be true is for it to be assertible, where this means not capable of being asserted … but correctly assertible; assertible, that is, in accordance with the relevant semantical rules, and on the basis of such additional, though unspecified, information as these rules may require… . ‘True’, then, means semantically assertible (‘S-assertible’) and the varieties of truth correspond to the relevant varieties of semantical rule (SM, IV, §26: 101).
The “varieties of truth” Sellars speaks of include empirical truth (which involves the picturing relation mentioned below), mathematical truth, legal truth, moral truth, etc.
This is a version of a use theory of meaning. Sellars distinguishes three different generic dimensions of usage: language-entry transitions, intralinguistic transitions, and language-exit transitions. Some examples: Contexts of perception and observation are those in which one enters a language in response to some form of sensory stimulation. The announcement of a resolution followed by an action that attempts to carry it out is a case of exiting a language. Intralinguistic transitions include inferences and responses of one kind or another. In contrast to Quine’s emphasis on occasion sentences, Sellars puts particular emphasis on the importance of intralinguistic connections, an aspect of his view that has been further developed in Robert Brandom’s inferentialism. Sellars distinguishes formal inferences, which are a matter of the syntactic rules of the language, from material inferences, which are not a function of syntactic structure alone. The inference from ‘This is red’ to ‘This is colored’ is one example of a material inference, but, in Sellars’s view, so is the inference from ‘It is raining’ to ‘The street will be wet’. Material inferences are not merely enthymemes ultimately to be made good by supplying an explicit principle: the web of material inferences an expression is involved in, especially the subjunctives it sustains, determines its core meaning.
Sellars has a complex view of what ties language to the world. In the first instance, language is tied to the world, not by a single reference (or ‘satisfaction’) relation, but by the multitude of relationships — causal (in both directions), spatio-temporal, and normative — between tokens of linguistic expressions and the world. Sellars does, however, single out for special attention a relation he calls picturing. Though the notion of picturing is inspired by early Wittgenstein, in Sellars’s version it is a natural, non-semantic relation between objects, not facts. The relata are, on the one hand, what Sellars calls ‘natural linguistic objects,’ tokens of linguistic expressions, and, on the other hand, objects in the world. The basic idea is that in any empirically meaningful language, the occurrences of a certain class of linguistic events (namely, first-level, atomic, matter-of-factual statements playing roles in observational and volitional contexts) have to constitute a map or picture of the surrounding environment in virtue of an isomorphism between the properties of worldly objects and counterpart properties of the linguistic events. Sellars thinks this is a condition on any empirically meaningful language, but he also believes that one of the tasks of science is to improve the accuracy and refine the grain of such an isomorphism. Sellars’s notion of picturing has puzzled many, but we can see an influence on Ruth Millikan’s biosemantics, as well as Huw Price’s recent (2011, 2013) distinction between e-representation and i-representation.
Sellars often described his realistic naturalism as ‘nominalistic,’ but the point is not so much to deny that there are abstracta as to tell us what language that uses abstract singular terms is doing for us and how differently it functions from language using concrete singular terms. If we understand how abstract singular terms function, the claims of the Platonist metaphysician seem an elaborate (and perhaps misleading) way to make a simpler, more pragmatic point. First, Sellars argues that the then-prevalent standard of ontological commitment —being the value of a variable of quantification— is mistaken (GE, NAO). Such a criterion makes the indeterminate reference of quantified variables more primitive than any form of determinate reference. This is incompatible with Sellars’s understanding of naturalism, and he claims it also gets the grammar of existence claims wrong. (Sellars construes quantification substitutionally; see Lance 1996.) Sellars proposes a different standard: we are committed to the kinds of things we can explicitly name and classify in the ground-level, empirical, object-language statements we take to be true.
In ordinary language we often talk about meanings, properties, propositions, etc., thus apparently committing ourselves to the existence of such abstracta. Sellars interprets such talk as material mode metalinguistic speech about the functional roles of expression-kinds. Thus, a sentence such as
Euclidean triangularity entails having angles that sum to two right angles
conveys information about the function of the •triangle•, namely, that its use (in Euclidean contexts)entitles one to a •has angles summing to two right angles•. Similarly, Sellars interprets fact-talk as material mode metalinguistic speech about truths. The only things to which we are ontologically committed by the use of abstract singular terms are linguistic items: specifically, expression-tokens that participate in complex causal systems which involve, inter alia, normatively assessable interactions between language users and the world. In Sellars’s reconstruction of it, talk of abstract entities does not have explanatory force, but is involved in making explicit certain linguistic norms.
Platonic realists are often moved by the belief that the most basic linguistic structure, predication itself, involves a commitment to abstracta, for common explications of predication make essential mention of properties, relations, and such. Sellars argues that this gets the order of explication exactly wrong: apparently purely descriptive claims about property instantiation are, in fact, misleading ways of communicating norms of linguistic correctness. Sellars offers a different explication of predication, according to which the focus is not on any relation between an object and some abstract entity, but qualifying and arranging names to suit them for certain linguistic purposes. So understood, the Platonist’s treatment of predication seems, again, to be an elaborate and misleading way to make a simpler, more pragmatic point. At the most basic, atomic level, predication is a matter of endowing names with counterpart characteristics of the objects they purport to name, enabling some true atomic sentences to ‘map’ or ‘picture’ objects in the world. Predication thus commits one only to natural objects potentially correlated with each other. NAO, chapter 3, contains the most complete statement of this view.
Sellars gives a unified treatment of the alethic, causal, and deontic modalities as (once again) material mode metalinguistic speech expressing the inferential commitments and priorities embedded in the language. Thus, using modal language in talking about the world and our agency in the world does not commit us to recognizing independent, metaphysically real necessary connections or the existence of moral facts independent of moral agents. It does commit us to prescribing and proscribing certain linguistic or conceptual transitions, including language-exit transitions that emerge in action. As Robert Kraut describes it, “metaphysical claims that initially appear to state language-world connections—claims about the relation between predicates and properties, for example—are, on Sellars’s theory, construed as normative claims about appropriate linguistic usage” (Kraut 2010: 601).
In his theory of knowledge Sellars attempts to balance competing insights in several different dimensions — empiricist-rationalist, foundationalist-coherentist, externalist-internalist, realist-phenomenalist-idealist — while also keeping an eye on the deep connections between epistemology and the metaphysics of mind. His attack on the ‘myth of the given’ is renowned, so we begin there.
Antecedent to epistemology, Sellars’s treatment of semantics essentially constitutes a denial of what can be called a semantic given—the idea that some of our terms or concepts, independently of their occurrence in formal and material inferences, derive their meaning directly from confrontation with a particular (kind of) object or experience. Sellars is anti-foundationalist in his theories of concepts, knowledge, and truth.
Traditional epistemology assumed that knowledge is hierarchically structured. There must, it was believed, be some cognitive states in direct contact with reality that serve as a firm foundation on which the rest of our knowledge is built by various inferential methods. This foundationalist picture of knowledge imposes two requirements on knowledge: (1) There must be cognitive states that are basic in the sense that they possess some positive epistemic status independently of their epistemic relations to any other cognitive states. I call this the Epistemic Independence Requirement [EIR]. Positive epistemic statuses include being knowledge, being justified, or just having some presumption in its favor. (It was popular to claim that basic cognitions must possess an unassailable epistemic warrant — certainty, incorrigibility, or even infallibility — but this is not as common today.) Epistemic relations include deductive and inductive implication. (2) Every nonbasic cognitive state can possess positive epistemic status only because of the epistemic relations it bears, directly or indirectly, to basic cognitive states. Thus the basic states must provide the ultimate support for the rest of our knowledge, which I call the Epistemic Efficacy Requirement [EER]. Such basic, independent and efficacious, cognitive states would be the given. Many philosophers have believed that there has to be such a given, if there is to be any knowledge at all.
Some commentators on Sellars take his attack on the given to turn on rejecting the belief that any cognitive state could have unassailable warrant or certainty. Although Sellars was a fallibilist and believed that any cognitive state could be challenged, his argument against the given does not worry about this issue. If the foundationalist picture of the structure of knowledge is itself wrong, the strength of foundational warrant is irrelevant.
Sellars denies not only that there must be a given, but that there can be a given in the sense defined, for nothing can satisfy both EIR and EER. To satisfy EER, a basic cognition must be capable of participating in inferential relations with other cognitions; it must possess propositional form and be truth-evaluable. To meet EIR, such a propositionally structured cognition must possess its epistemic status independently of inferential connections to other cognitions. No cognitive states satisfy both requirements.
The standard candidates for basic empirical knowledge either fail EER (e.g., knowledge of sense-data), or presuppose other knowledge on the part of the knower, and thus fail EIR (e.g., knowledge of appearances). Such states count as cognitive states only because of their epistemic relations to other cognitive states. Because he argues by cases, it is unclear whether some other candidates might satisfy both requirements. There is no exhaustive list of all possible candidates for the given. Thus, the argument is not a conclusive, once-and-for-all refutation of foundationalism, but it is a significant challenge to it, putting the burden of proof on the defenders of a given. If it works, one has to abandon any picture of knowledge acquisition as piecemeal and incremental. Sellars’s argument, in combination with arguments by Quine and Davidson, among others, has put foundationalism on the defensive since, roughly, the mid-point of the 20th century.
A reconstruction of Wilfrid Sellars’s Argument that the given is a myth, from “Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind”.
|1.||A cognitive state is epistemically independent if it possesses its epistemic status independently of its being inferred or inferrable from some other cognitive state.|
|[Definition of epistemic independence]|
|2.||A cognitive state is epistemically efficacious — is capable of epistemically supporting other cognitive states — if the epistemic status of those other states can be validly inferred (formally or materially) from its epistemic status.|
|[Definition of epistemic efficacy]|
|3||The doctrine of the given is that any empirical knowledge that p requires some (or is itself) basic, that is, epistemically independent, knowledge (that g, h, i, …) which is epistemically efficacious with respect to p.|
|[Definition of doctrine of the given]|
|4.||Inferential relations are always between items with propositional form.|
|[By the nature of inference]|
|5.||Therefore, non-propositional items (such as sense data) are epistemically inefficacious and cannot serve as what is given.|
|[From 2 and 4]|
|6.||No inferentially acquired, propositionally structured mental state is epistemically independent.|
|7.||Examination of multiple candidates for non-inferentially acquired, propositionally structured cognitive states indicates that their epistemic status presupposes the possession by the knowing subject of other empirical knowledge, both of particulars and of general empirical truths.|
|[From Sellars’s analyses of statements about
sense-data and appearances in Parts 1–IV of EPM and his analysis of
epistemic authority in Part VIII]|
|8.||Presupposition is an epistemic and therefore an inferential relation.|
|[Assumed (See PRE)]|
|9.||Non-inferentially acquired empirical knowledge that presupposes the possession by the knowing subject of other empirical knowledge is not epistemically independent.|
|[From 1, 7, and 8]|
|10.||Any empirical, propositional cognition is acquired either inferentially or non-inferentially.|
|11.||Therefore, propositionally structured cognitions, whether inferentially or non-inferentially acquired, are never epistemically independent and cannot serve as the given.|
|[6, 9, 10, constructive dilemma]|
|12.||Every cognition is either propositionally structured or not.|
|13.||Therefore, it is reasonable to believe that no item of empirical knowledge can serve the function of a given.|
|[5,11, 12, constructive dilemma]|
Rejecting the myth of the given is not yet a positive epistemology. Sellars can abandon the myth of the given only if he gives us a positive theory of non-inferential knowledge to replace it. (There must be non-inferential knowledge, that is, knowledge that is not acquired by inference, even if its epistemic status depends on its inferential connections to other knowledge.)
The paradigm cases of non-inferential knowledge are introspection, perception, and memory [IPM] beliefs (see MGEC). According to Sellars, such beliefs have epistemic status because, given the processes by which language and beliefs are acquired, they are likely to be true. IPM beliefs are reliable indicators, like the temperature readings on a thermometer. This is a reliablist or externalist condition on such knowledge. A chain of empirical justification can properly start with IPM beliefs because they are noninferential reliable indicators of the truth of their contents. Thus, their occurrence licenses an inference to the likely truth of their contents, and thence to other consequences by formal or material rules of inference.
But Sellars is not, in the end, a reliablist. Thermometers may be highly reliable, but they have no knowledge. Sellars adds another condition: the subject must know that her IPM belief is reliable. This imposes a reflexivity requirement on knowledge.
[T]o be fully a master of his language, Jones must know [some] facts about what is involved in learning to use perceptual sentences in perceptual contexts. Thus, Jones too must know that other specifiable things being equal, the fact that a person says ‘Lo! Here is a red apple’ is a good reason to believe that he is indeed in the presence of a red apple. Thus, Jones, too, can reason:I just thought-out-loud ‘Lo! Here is a red apple’
(no countervailing conditions obtain);
So, there is good reason to believe that there is a red apple in front of me. (SK II §40: 325)
The point is not simply that knowers are capable of metajudgments. Sellars has a larger condition in mind: “The essential point is that in characterizing an episode or a state as that of knowing, we are not giving an empirical description of that episode or state; we are placing it in the logical space of reasons, of justifying and being able to justify what one says” (EPM: §36, in SPR: 169; in KMG: 248). This dictum needs to be combined with another well-known Sellarsian pronouncement: “Now the idea that epistemic facts can be analysed without remainder—even ‘in principle’—into non-epistemic facts, whether phenomenal or behavioural, public or private, with no matter how lavish a sprinkling of subjunctives and hypotheticals is, I believe, a radical mistake—a mistake of a piece with the so-called ‘naturalistic fallacy’ in ethics” (EPM: §5, in SPR: 131; in KMG: 209).
In order to operate within “the logical space of reasons,” one must be at home with normative discourse, responsive to reasons as such, sensitive to standards of correctness and appropriateness. This requirement imposes a coherentist/holist condition that precludes the possibility of atomistically isolable cognitive states: any cognitive state, including bottom-level, non-inferential IPM beliefs, can be cognitive only as one element in a complex, reflexively structured system of such states responsive to epistemic norms and goals.
Such a holism of cognitive states raises an obvious problem: how could one start acquiring cognitive states without falling into circularity or regress? The normativity of the cognitive is crucial to Sellars’s answer: we can acquire piecemeal by natural, causal pathways the individual habits and dispositions that, when present in sufficient numbers and appropriately interrelated, warrant the application of the normative language of cognition.
Even so, Sellars rejects the traditional forms of both foundationalism and coherentism.
One seems forced to choose between the picture of an elephant which rests on a tortoise (What supports the tortoise?) and the picture of a great Hegelian serpent of knowledge with its tail in its mouth (Where does it begin?). Neither will do. For empirical knowledge, like its sophisticated extension, science, is rational, not because it has a foundation but because it is a self-correcting enterprise which can put any claim in jeopardy, though not all at once (EPM §38, in SPR: 170; in KMG: 250).
5. Philosophy of Mind
Sellars’s philosophy of mind is deeply Kantian in the sense that he draws a sharp distinction between thought and sense. The intentionality-body problem requires a different solution from the sensorium-body problem. His philosophy of mind abandons many of the assumptions taken for granted by the Cartesian tradition (e.g., the transparent or self-intimating nature of the mental), moving towards a naturalism that respects the normative dimension of mind. His key idea is that psychological concepts are like theoretical concepts in the sciences. Mentalistic concepts are thus as compatible with naturalism as any well-grounded scientific concept.
Sellars defends these claims in his classic article, EPM. The “Rylean myth” narrated in parts 12–16 of EPM is a thought experiment aimed to convince us that the Cartesian story is not the only possible story about our knowledge of the mental. The thought experiment hypothesizes a community of proto-humans who lack concepts of inner psychological states, although they possess a complex language for describing and explaining objects and events in the world. Sellars calls them ‘Ryleans’ in honor of Gilbert Ryle, the Oxford philosopher whose book, The Concept of Mind, argues eloquently for a version of logical behaviorism. This community possesses a behaviorist’s ability to explain human behavior as well as metalinguistic abilities to describe and prescribe linguistic behavior. Thus, the community has semantic concepts at its disposal. Sellars claims that such a community can reasonably increase its explanatory resources by postulating unobservable states internal to each person that modulate that person’s responses to the world. Moreover, there is motive to postulate two different kinds of internal states: one kind—thoughts—has properties modeled on the semantic properties of overt linguistic events, while the other—sense impressions—has properties modeled on the properties of perceptible objects. Thoughts are postulated to explain how the members of the community can engage in complex patterns of reasonable behavior even when silent. Sense impressions are postulated to explain why members of the community acquire conceptual representations of objects as before them, even, at times, when such objects are not present. If Sellars’s story is coherent, then the traditional view that our concepts and knowledge of the mental are simply given is not compulsory, and a naturalistic treatment of the mental is potentially viable.
The fundamental thought behind Sellars’s treatment of intentionality is that our concepts of intentionality and intentional states are derived from concepts pertaining to linguistic behavior. Notice, this is not the claim that we always think in language or that we learn to speak before we learn to think, which claims have mistakenly been attributed to Sellars. Sellars is not engaged in armchair psychology but with what legitimates our use of psychological concepts.
This approach to intentionality mobilizes Sellars’s functionalist treatment of meaning. Attributing a thought (hope, regret, desire …) that p to someone is a complex affair. In the first instance, such an attribution locates the relevant state of the person “in the logical space of reasons.” This is to place the state-type of the person within a vast network of possible intentional state- and action-types related to each other by normative relations of inference, exclusion, relevance, and propriety. But actual intentional state-types must be embodied in physical tokens, so attributing an intentional state to someone effectively attributes to that person as well a behavioral control system that is so structured that something analogous to theoretical and practical inference goes on within it and, in this case, has a •p• active in it in the appropriate way. Being active “in the appropriate way” within someone’s behavioral control system will include participating in patterns of dispositions to infer and be inferred from other intentional states that mirror the patterns of relationships in the logical space of reasons, as well being tied to sensory input and to output activities in appropriate ways.
This approach is incompatible with the traditional view that the meaning of linguistic items is to be explained in terms of the thoughts they express. This issue is the heart of Sellars’s correspondence with Roderick Chisholm, published as “Intentionality and the Mental” [ITM]. Chisholm maintained that reference to mental states is always implicit in semantic statements and in our ability to comprehend the meanings of utterances. Sellars demurs:
The argument presumes that the metalinguistic vocabulary in which we talk about linguistic episodes can be analysed in terms which do not presuppose the framework of mental acts; in particular that“…” means pis not to be analysed as“…” expresses t and t is about pwhere t is a thought. (ITM: 522)
In Sellars’s view, thought is prior to language in the order of being, but language is prior to thought in the order of knowing. That is, linguistic utterances are normally the product of internal thinking activity, which they express. The Ryleans in Sellars’s myth have thoughts that are expressed in their utterances, but they don’t realize that they have such inner states. They have the notion of a meaningful utterance before generating the notion of a meaningful thought, modeled on the former notion. Thus, language is prior to thought in the order of knowing.
In his early work (see, e.g., EPM §29), Sellars takes a hard line equating language possession and the ability to think, thereby denying thought to infralinguals, but in later pieces, most notably SK and MEV, he modifies this position. He makes room for non-linguistic thought in humans, recognizing that visual perception and imagination are “in a sense most difficult to analyze, a thinking in color about colored objects” (SK I §37: 305). Then, in “Mental Events,” Sellars introduces a distinction between propositional form and logical form that he did not utilize earlier. “To have propositional form, a basic representational state must represent an object and represent it as of a certain character” (MEV: 336). Items in many non-linguistic representational systems such as maps possess propositional form by this characterization. Logical form, however, is possessed by items that belong to representational systems that include distinct symbols for logical operators. In this late essay, Sellars acknowledges that animals possess representations with propositional form and can make, correspondingly, what Sellars calls “Humean inferences,” that is, material inferences that employ no explicit generalization or logical principle. His example is the move from “Smoke here” to “Fire nearby.” Human representational systems possess logical form; they enable us to engage in what he calls “Aristotelian inferences” in which a general principle is explicitly represented: “Smoke here. Wherever there’s smoke, there’s fire. So, Fire nearby.” This, Sellars claims, is the crucial difference between animal and human: full-fledged thinkers can recognize conditionality and generality as such, because they possess explicit symbols for if…then, all, and some.
Sellars’s treatment of intentionality has implications for first-person authority and the “problem of other minds.” Reports of one’s own mental state cannot have an intrinsic or absolute, apriori warrant, nor can privileged accessibility be the defining trait of the mental, as some have claimed. The extent and strength of first-person warrant rests ultimately on the empirical reliability of such reports, just as the warrant of observation reports does. This extends as well to observation reports concerning the mental states of others, for are not we able, upon occasion, to see someone’s joy or misery? The “problem of other minds” never really gets off the ground in the context of Sellars’s philosophy, for the “concepts pertaining to such inner episodes as thoughts are primarily and essentially inter-subjective, as inter-subjective as the concept of a positron, and ... the reporting role of these concepts — the fact that each of us has a privileged access to his thoughts — constitutes a dimension of the use of these concepts which is built on and presupposes this intersubjective status” (EPM: §59; in SPR: 189; in KMG: 269).
Sellars’s treatment of mentalistic concepts as similar to theoretical concepts has been cited as an inspiration for the “theory-theory” in developmental psychology. This is the notion that the mechanisms we utilize to detect and attribute thoughts in ourselves and others operate via a kind of tacit theory application and that there is a developmental stage in children during which they acquire a “theory of mind” and learn to apply it. (See Astington et al. 1988; Gopnik and Wellman, 1994; Wellman, 1990; Garfield et al., 2001.) This creative extension of Sellars’s proposal is not something he is committed to; he is not engaged in empirical theorizing.
Sellars’s treatment of mentalistic concepts has also inspired eliminativist philosophies of mind such as that espoused by the Churchlands. The idea is that if folk psychology is like a theory, then, like any theory, it could be superseded and replaced by a better theory as scientific psychology and neuroscience progress. Sellars himself, however, was unmoved by this idea, because the concepts of folk psychology (of the manifest image) are not focused solely (or maybe even principally) on the description and explanation of phenomena. In the course of science, better descriptions of what is going on in our heads when we think and sense will be developed, but such descriptions could have only a part of the function of mentalistic language. The language of agency, to which we will shortly return, is indispensable and cannot be replaced by the language of any scientific theory.
5.2 The Sensory
Sellars’s treatment of the sensory is particularly complex; this article can only summarize. The context is, again, the idea that our concepts of sensory states are, in some important ways, like theoretical concepts. Concepts of sensory states, however, are introduced to explain different phenomena from those that concepts of intentional states are introduced to explain. They are originally introduced to explain illusions, hallucinations and such, cases in which people sincerely report and behave as if perceiving something that is not there. Once introduced for those purposes, however, such concepts must be applied generally: we cannot think that we have sensations only in cases of illusion and hallucination. A philosophically satisfactory theory of the sensory must account for the complexity and peculiarities of the language of sensory experience, both illusory and veridical.
It is therefore crucial to my thesis to emphasize that sense impressions or raw feels are common sense theoretical constructs introduced to explain the occurrence not of white rat type discriminative behavior, but rather of perceptual propositional attitudes, and are therefore bound up with the explanation of why human language contains families of predicates having the logical properties of words for perceptible qualities and relations. (IAMB in PP: 387; in ISR: 366)
Sellars then argues that the language of perceptible qualities and relations cannot be reduced to or replaced by any vocabulary we currently project to be adequate to the behavior of mere physical objects.
The argument for this claim is complex. There is a quasi-historical story about how the conception of the proper and common sensibles has been transformed over the course of human history and an argument that this story is constrained in a particular way that blocks a reductive interpretation of our concepts of the sensory (the so-called ‘grain argument’). Nonetheless, Sellars argues that, in the end, sensory states will turn out to be physical states of a very particular ilk that exist only in the context of living organisms. They are, in the terminology Sellars developed with his colleague Paul Meehl, physical1 but not physical2, where
Physical1: an event or entity is physical1 if it belongs in the space-time network.
Physical2: an event or entity is physical2 if it is definable in terms of theoretical primitives adequate to describe completely the actual states though not necessarily the potentialities of the universe before the appearance of life. (CE: 252)
Sensory states are, thus, historically emergent in the universe, but nonetheless physical: the effort to provide a complete description and explanation of the physics of sentient beings will expand the theoretical primitives utilized in that science, relocating the logical space of the proper and common sensibles within physics as a primitive vocabulary.
The quasi-history of our sensory concepts starts with a mythical beginning in which the concepts that we think of as concepts of sensible qualities are taken to be concepts of the very substance of things. ‘Blue triangle’ is construed as we would now construe ‘metal triangle’. But treating sensibles as substantive cannot go very far; it does not provide a useful way of classifying, explaining, and predicting the behavior of the things we encounter. The sensibles soon become treated as occurrent qualities of substances with complex causal profiles. The view that the sensibles are modifications of substances is then supplemented with the notion that they possess a subsidiary and analogous being-for-mind that explains our ability to apprehend them directly (unlike causal dispositions) and to be sometimes mistaken about their presence. In the current manifest image, this is how we think of sensible properties, according to Sellars. Physical objects are colored, odorous, etc., but ‘color,’ ‘odor,’etc. also apply in an analogous way to our sensory states. The rise of a new, atomistic science has started to push our conception of the sensibles in new directions. First, it encourages a reinterpretation of the distinction between the common and the proper sensibles. The common sensibles, those available to more than one sense, include such geometric and dynamic properties as shape and motion; these apply to physical objects and their microconstituents, because physical explanations exploit such properties. The proper sensibles are the qualities available only to specific senses, including colors, odors, etc., and they do not apply to the microconstituents of physical objects, because they do no explanatory work in physical laws. Primary and secondary qualities are distinct in kind, and secondary qualities are demoted to second-class, subjective status. They exist only in the mind, as states of the perceiver. The next move seems clear: the mind itself is subjected to scientific investigation and becomes increasingly identified with the brain or central nervous system. But the proper sensibles can no more exist in the brain than in any other kind of matter. This brings us to our current predicament: we are unable to find a place in the world for the proper sensibles, which have been brutually (and metaphysically) severed from the common sensibles, even though color and extension, for example, seem intrinsically related.
This streamlined historical view is combined with the ‘grain argument’, which encapsulates the reasoning that led to the denial that physical objects are really colored. This argument poses a challenge to materialism by purporting to show that the proper sensibles cannot be reduced to properties or relations of more basic physical particles that lack these properties.
Before considering the grain argument per se, however, we need to look at Sellars’s phenomenology of perceptual and imaginative experience. Sellars carefully distinguishes between propositional seeing and objectual seeing, and between seeing an object and what we see of the object. All perceptual experience, in his view, has conceptual content, which shows up in the propositional content of a seeing or in what we see an object as. But he is also firmly convinced that not everything in perception is present as conceptual content, as something thought of or believed in. “We see not only that the ice cube is pink, and see it as pink, we see the very pinkness of the object; also its very shape — though from a certain point of view” (SSOP §25: 88). What we see of the ice cube is present to us in a different way from that in which the (merely) conceptual content of our experience is present to us. What is needed is:
an analysis of the sense in which we see of the pink ice cube its very pinkness. Here, I believe, sheer phenomenology or conceptual analysis takes us part of the way, but finally lets us down. How far does it take us? Only to the point of assuring us thatSomething, somehow a cube of pink in physical space is present in the perception other than as merely believed in (SSOP §26: 89).
Sellars takes it that this claim states a structural feature of the manifest image. It is, note, incompatible with views that reject the idea that there is a nonconceptual component in perception—which Sellars would think are confused about the place of sensible qualities in the manifest image. The real challenge is filling in the placeholders in the above claim: what kind of thing that is in what kind of way a cube of pink in physical space is present in one’s perception, and how can it be present in a way other than as believed in?
The grain argument is meant to cut off reductive replies to these questions. Sellars’s commentators have often taken it to be a very complex and obscure argument, but Sellars seems to think it is fairly straightforward. The grain argument works only against attempts to reduce sensory phenomena to more basic atomistic/mechanistic entities. If the world does not have an ultimate ‘grain,’ then the argument won’t apply. The notion of a reduction must also be specified, for it is notoriously multivalent. Sellars’s notion of reduction is fairly straightforward:
if an object is in a strict sense a system of objects, then every property of the object must consist in the fact that its constituents have such and such qualities and stand in such and such relations or, roughly,every property of a system of objects consists of properties of, and relations between, its constituents (PSIM in SPR: 27).
But the proper sensibles are not reducible in this way to the properties and relations of micro-objects.
Pink does not seem to be made up of imperceptible qualities in the way in which being a ladder is made up of being cylindrical (the rungs), rectangular (the frame), wooden, etc. The manifest ice cube presents itself to us as something which is pink through and through, as a pink continuum, all the regions of which, however small, are pink. It presents itself to us as ultimately homogeneous; and an ice cube variegated in colour is, though not homogeneous in its specific colour, ‘ultimately homogeneous’, in the sense to which I am calling attention, with respect to the generic trait of being coloured (PSIM in SPR: 26).
In a world that science teaches us is a blooming, buzzing confusion of unobservable submicroscopic entities, there seems to be no room for the smoothly homogeneous, either ‘out there’ or ‘in the head.’ The dense, continuous, homogeneously colored objects of the manifest image are appearances of systems of imperceptible particles. Sense impressions are posited to explain how systems of particles appear the way they do; they cannot themselves turn out to be another kind of system of particles, or the explanation fails.
If this argument is right, then the postulation of sense impressions must differ in some important ways from the kind of theoretical postulation that typically results in a belief in new microentities. And this is what Sellars argues.
[T]he theory of sense impressions does not introduce, for example, cubical volumes of pink. It reinterprets the categorial status of the cubical volumes of pink of which we are perceptually aware. Conceived in the manifest image as, in standard cases, constituents of physical objects and in abnormal cases, as somehow ‘unreal’ or ‘illusory’, they are recategorized as sensory states of the perceiver and assigned various explanatory roles in the theory of perception… .
47. The pinkness of a pink sensation is ‘analogous’ to the pinkness of a manifest pink ice cube, not by being a different quality which is in some respect analogous to pinkness (as the quality a Martian experiences in certain magnetic fields might be analogous to pink with respect to its place in a quality space), but by being the same ‘content’ in a different categorical ‘form’ (FMPP III: 73).
Sellars holds, then, that the logical space of the sensible qualities has been successively recategorized in different stages of human development. He proposes that this history will take one more turn as science develops further: unable to reduce or eliminate the sensibles, science will postulate a distinctive set of entities, sensa, to be the final embodiment of the sensible qualities, physical1 but not physical2. Sellars is a physicalist about color, not because he thinks colors can be reduced to more basic properties and relations of physical objects, but because physics will have to expand to accommodate the sensible qualities, color included, as primitive entities.
There are still further twists and turns in Sellars’s treatment of the sensory. (See Rosenberg (1982) and deVries (2005), Chapter 8, for more exploration of this issue.)
6. Science and Reality
Sellars was a significant philosopher of science and a staunch defender of scientific realism. He often couched his discussions in the terms made common by the logical empiricists, but he was in many ways a subversive philosopher of science, undermining the irenic instrumentalism popular in the 1950s and ‘60s (e.g., the views defended by Ernest Nagel)in favor of a position that might seem oxymoronic: a pragmatic realism.
We can start with the distinction between observational and theoretical vocabularies. Many empiricists were wedded to the myth of the given, assuming that there is a privileged observation vocabulary. The meanings of observation terms were determined by their relation to what is given and were thus unrevisable or incorrigible. This vocabulary grounds the meaning of all empirical language. Two kinds of generalizations were recognized: (1) empirical generalizations formulated in the observation language and justified by straightforward inductive methods, and (2) higher-level generalizations formulated in a more abstract, theoretical idiom including novel theoretical posits. This theoretical language consists of terms invented in order to better organize, generalize, and make connections among the assertions and generalizations made in the observation language. The ideal would be a formal axiomatic structure that would allow a deduction of the empirical generalizations which, combined with statements of initial conditions, permit a deduction of particular empirical facts (thus explaining their truth).
The observational/theoretical vocabulary distinction, thus conceived, was taken to have ontological implications. We are committed to the existence of the given, for that is what ties thought to reality. Theories, however, are merely tools to enable us to explain observation-level empirical generalizations. Presumably, some empirical generalizations may be first derived with the help of a theory, but they are subject to more direct investigation and corroboration, so the theory is not essential to it. Thus, there is no ontological commitment to any entities that theories postulate; they can be viewed as convenient fictions, devices of calculation.
Sellars thinks that this instrumentalist picture gets almost everything wrong. In his view the observation vocabulary/theoretical vocabulary distinction is merely methodological and is, moreover, highly malleable; it therefore possesses no particular ontological force. There is no given, so it can play no semantic role. Meanings are functional roles in language usage, and nothing in principle prevents a term that might originally have arisen as part of a theory from acquiring a role in observation reports. The well-trained physicist “just sees” an alpha-particle track in a cloud chamber as directly and non-inferentially as the well-trained child just sees a dog. Furthermore, what is observable depends on the techniques and instruments employed, and these are often loaded with theoretical baggage. “Pure” observation uncontaminated by theory is outside our reach. A good theory, according to Sellars, does not just explain the observation-level empirical generalizations, it also explains why those empirical generalizations are as good (and as wrong) as they are. The Boyle-Charles ideal gas law works well in most conditions, but does not predict the behavior of gasses under extreme temperatures or pressures. The van der Waals equation, explicitly formulated with the theory of statistical thermodynamics in mind, allows us to see why the Boyle-Charles law is as good as it is and why it breaks down where it does. Sellars therefore rejects the “layer-cake” view that there are three distinct levels of assertion in the empirical sciences: observation level claims of particular fact, empirical generalizations using the observation vocabulary, and, finally, claims using a theoretical vocabulary which function to systematize the empirical generalizations. In the “layer-cake” view, theories are ultimately dispensable in favor of observation-level empirical generalizations; in Sellars’s view, it is the observation-level empirical generalizations that are ultimately dispensable in favor of the better explanations made available by theory. Thus, to have good reason to accept a theory is to have good reason to believe in the existence of those entities it postulates.
This is the basic reasoning behind Sellars’s scientific realism. His bold claim, “In the dimension of describing and explaining the world, science is the measure of all things, of what is that it is, and of what is not that it is not” (EPM: §41, in SPR: 173; in KMG: 253) needs proper interpretation, as mentioned above. Sellars does not believe, for instance, that describing and explaining are the only “dimensions” of linguistic activity. Prescribing, evaluating, and negotiating are equally indispensable dimensions of language use that go beyond the descriptive brief of science. It is science’s job to limn the structure of empirical reality, the causal nexus within which we live, but, as his own call for a “synoptic vision” that unites a science-generated picture of empirical reality with “the language of community and individual intentions” indicates, Sellars would never hold that all our questions are to be settled by scientific investigations.
Sellars also has a distinctive treatment of scientific laws. Laws are standardly treated as generalizations; they are distinguished from accidental generalizations because laws have a modal force capable of supporting counterfactuals. In Sellars’s view, laws are better understood as inference tickets. Though they have descriptive content, statements of laws serve a different function in our language. As mentioned above, Sellars treats modals uniformly as material-mode metalinguistic speech expressing the inferential commitments and priorities embedded in the language. So, saying that it is a law of nature that e.g., the angle of incidence equals the angle of reflection, endorses a certain set of inferences using those concepts. Furthermore, Sellars does not think of language as a fixed entity. Indeed, in his conception, the job of the sciences is to methodically revise and replace the resources available for description and explanation. Conceptual change is the very essence of science. In his view, laws of nature are proposed connections among concepts or terms that, pending possible empirical disconfirmation, can be rationally attached to the concepts.
[S]cientific terms have, as part of their logic a ‘line of retreat’ as well as a ‘plan of advance’ — a fact which makes meaningful the claim that in an important sense A and B are the ‘same’ properties they were ‘before.’ … The motto of the age of science might well be: natural philosophers have hitherto sought to understand ‘meanings’; the task is to change them (CDCM: 288).
Thus, I call his philosophy of science a ‘pragmatic realism’ because he insists on our commitment to the reality of the objects to be posited by Peircean ideal science, while explicating most of the structural features of science in terms of the pragmatic force of their linguistic expression.
7. Practical Reason: Intentions, Rules, and Normativity
7.1 The Logic of Intentions
Epistemology tries to make intelligible the acquisition, growth, and change of belief. It thus tends to focus on the input to and internal interactions of our cognitive states. Action theory, in contrast, focuses on the output side, accounting for the intelligibility of action. Sellars has a sophisticated and systematic approach to action theory, metaethics, and normativity that has not been widely appreciated.
The central problem is understanding the relation between belief and action. Normative judgments, e.g., judgments about what’s good or what’s right, are supposed to bridge the apparent gap between what one believes is the case and what one does to transform the world. Normative judgments thus need to interface smoothly with our beliefs, because we often seem to reason to our normative judgments and use them in reasoning further to our decisions to act. They must also, however, motivate action in a way that mere belief cannot. In mid-20th century philosophy, cognitivists emphasized practical reasoning, while non-cognitivists focused rather on the practical, that is, the motivational aspect of norms. According to the cognitivists, normative and especially ethical claims are truth-evaluable and participate in the same kinds of logical relations as other truth-evaluable claims. Cognitivists were thus in a position to attack the problem of how ethical and other normative claims function in our practical reasoning, but they had difficulty saying how normative beliefs are any more deeply connected to action than other beliefs. Non-cognitivists, in contrast, denied that ethical and normative claims are, in general, truth-evaluable. Their role, instead, is to motivate, either encouraging or discouraging particular actions. That role does not require truth-evaluability. One of Sellars’ teachers was C. L. Stevenson, who proposed that ethical judgments are actually expressions of pro or con attitudes towards actions, a position that came to be known as emotivism. Sellars also paid close attention to the metaethics of R. M. Hare, who proposed that normative statements be analyzed as imperatives, commanding or forbidding an action. But Sellars believed that there is no logic of imperatives, so Hare’s analysis could not capture the role norms play in our practical reasoning.
Instead, Sellars proposes an analysis of norms in which the central role is played by the notion of an intention. An intention is a thought that motivates one to realize its content. ‘I shall eat a light dinner later’ can be a mere prediction (suppose, e.g., that I know my cupboards are bare), but it can also express my intention, in which case it has motivational force within my behavioral control system. A volition is an intention that has come to fruition: it has an intentional content but also causally affects my behavior: ‘I shall eat a light dinner now’ expresses my volition and is usually accompanied by at least the first stirrings of activity.
Expressing an intention or volition is not the same as (self-)ascribing, an intention or volition, nor are such expressions descriptions of intentions or predictions of action. Expressions of intention are always first-personal in form and essentially tied to motivational force. Sellars reserves ‘shall’ to serve as an operator-like marker of intention expressions, and this convention will be observed here as well. Sellars recognizes two forms of ‘shall’-statements: ‘I shall do A’ and ‘It shall be the case that p’. ‘Shall be’s’ must ultimately imply ‘shall’s with direct implications for action, even if they are highly conditioned on other circumstances.
Sellars wrote extensively on the logic of intentions, for “An ideally rational being would intend the implications of his intentions, just as he would believe the implications of his beliefs” (SM VII §16: 183). The major principle governing intentions is
PLI: ‘Shall (A)’ implies ‘Shall (B)’ iff ‘A’ implies ‘B’.
This principle, note, is in the metalanguage in which we talk about intentions, not in the object language in which we express intentions. Sellars also stipulates that logical connectives and operators can occur inside the scope of a ‘shall’ operator, but not outside it. This is because ‘shall’ statements are construed as expressions of intentions.
Shall [I will not do A]
expresses a negative intention — the intention to refrain from doing A. But there is no expression of the lack of an intention to do A, so
Not shall [I will do A]
is ruled out as nonsensical, though, of course, one can describe oneself as lacking the intention to do A. A description of an intention, however, is different from an expression of it. For Sellars, “The implications pertaining to matters of fact concern only the content of intentions and not their status as intentions” (ORAV ¶52: 86), so the practical reasoning involving intentions must focus on the content of those intentions.
Sellars invokes a principle that governs how the facts of the world are to be taken up into our practical reasoning. He calls it “So-be-it”:
So-be-it: “Shall be [φ]” and “p” imply “Shall be [φ and p]” where ‘φ’ is a formula which may or may not be logically complex (ORAV ¶66: 88).
Sellars needs a principle like this, since logical connectives (by his stipulation) cannot show up outside the scope of a ‘shall,’ implications can be drawn only within the scope of a ‘shall,’ so practical reasoning is viewed in terms of the compounding and simplification of the contents of one’s intentions.
To use “So-be-it” properly, one must be able to distinguish between what is “up to one”, symbolized by ‘[φ]’, and what is not, captured in the symbolism by ‘p’. A fairly straightforward picture of practical reasoning emerges.
94. Thus C[onjunction] I[ntroduction] together with So-be-it, takes our separate purposes and relevant beliefs and puts them together into encompassing alternatives:
- Shall be [I do A at t, which means that …]?
- Shall be [I do B at t, which means that …]?
- Shall be [I do C at t, which means that …]?
The successive steps are
- elaboration by CI and So-be-it, and the drawing of implications
- choice, e.g. (2), or, continuing indecision
- simplification. Shall be [I do B at t]
- intention to act. Shall [I do B at t]
which, when time t comes (and I do not change my mind), generates a doing (or an attempt to do) B.
95. This picture is one according to which practical reasoning is essentially the process of elaborating alternative scenarios for a choice (ORAV ¶94: 91).
Clearly, the elaboration of alternatives is a rational process. Is making the ultimate choice among these alternatives also a matter of reason? In what sense is the choice among fully elaborated alternatives anything other than an arbitrary, personal choice? For answers, we need to look at Sellars’s views on the nature of oughts and the normativity they express.
Sellars’s unified treatment of the modalities as material mode expressions of our inferential endorsements and commitments has been mentioned above. It applies to the deontic modalities as well: they signal the endorsement of certain practical inferences and principles. We can see this clearly in his treatment of hypothetical oughts. An important fact about statements of the form
If X wants A, he ought to do B
is that they do not permit what we might call unconditional detachment. Suppose
If Harry wants his inheritance now, he ought to kill his father
Harry wants his inheritance now.
We do not draw the unalloyed conclusion
Harry ought to kill his father.
The reasonableness of killing his father remains strictly relative to Harry’s desire and does not achieve the objective status signaled by unconditional detachment. The choices we make are, effectively, always of encompassing alternatives, but the considerations we bring to bear on those choices are always only partial.
[A]lthough the ‘ought’ ofIf X wants A, he ought to do B
looks as though it concerned the propriety of doing B on a certain hypothesis, it actually concerns the logical propriety or impropriety of certain complex valuings. To offer advice of the formIf you want A you ought to do B
is not to offer substantive advice as doesYou ought to do X
It is to give logical advice (OMP: 8).
To give substantive advice, to be able to detach the ‘ought’ statement, we need to eliminate the subjectivity of the condition in the hypothetical; we need at least something that would make a coherent all-things-considered option. For a moral ought, we would seek a categorically reasonable intention, one that would be reasonable for anyone and everyone to have.
Sellars approaches the search for a categorically reasonable intention in several steps. A hypothetical intention that is at least universal in content takes an important step towards an ‘ought’ that we can count as objectively moral. Sellars asserts that “the hypothetical imperative which comes closest to capturing the moral point of view is that of impartial benevolence” (SM VII §100: 212). Such an intention duplicates the universality of content that he thinks full-fledged moral ‘oughts’ must have, but it still lacks the universality in form a moral ‘ought’ needs, because it depends on the possession of a particular desire (impartial benevolence) on the part of the agents. Intending impartial benevolence lacks universal form to the extent that such an intention remains the subjective possession of separate individuals who may have parallel intentions without yet having a shared intention.
In order to make intelligible such universality in form, Sellars introduces the notion of a we-intention, an intention that is not the merely subjective possession of an individual, but an intention had as a member of a group that constitutes us. There can be things I intend, as one of us, that I do not (or would not) intend, speaking on my own behalf. For instance, I might intend, as a citizen of the U.S., that the representatives duly elected in the last election take office, even though, speaking for myself, I am horrified at the prospect. Sellars thus suggests that the we-intention
It shallwe be the case that our welfare is maximized
constitutes a categorically reasonable intention. This intention
does seem to have an authority which is more than a mere matter of its being generally accepted. It is a conceptual fact that people constitute a community, a we, by virtue of thinking of each other as one of us, and by willing the common good not under the species of benevolence — but by willing it as one of us, or from a moral point of view (SM VII §132: 222).
This is Sellars’s reconstruction of the basic logic of moral judgments. What remains is to construct an argument demonstrating the reality of the moral community, that there really is an appropriate ‘we’ to invoke. Sellars thinks this could be done if the following claims can be justified (SM VII §144: 225):
- To think of oneself as rational being is (implicitly) to think of oneself as subject to epistemic oughts binding on rational beings generally.
- The intersubjective intention to promote epistemic welfare implies the intersubjective intention to promote welfare sans phrase.
While he thinks the first is plausible, Sellars does not claim to have an argument for the second, so the question of the reality of the moral community remains problematic. For further examination of Sellars’ ethics and an argument that the moral community is real enough, see Koons (2019).
7.3 Rules and Normativity
We can see from his reconstruction of moral judgment that Sellars thinks that things like normativity and rules exist only in a social context, for real ‘oughts’ require a community. The concept of a rule plays a central role in Sellars’s philosophy, for he thinks of both languages and well-ordered societies as rule-governed systems. Rules, he thinks, are distinctively human.
To say that man is a rational animal, is to say that man is a creature not of habits, but of rules. When God created Adam, he whispered in his ear, “In all contexts of action you will recognize rules, if only the rule to grope for rules to recognize. When you cease to recognize rules, you will walk on four feet.” (LRB §16, in PPPW: 138)
The language of individual and community intentions that Sellars claims must be preserved in the Peircean scientific millennium is the language that enables us to make sense of rules. Sellars has interesting things to say about rules, so this overview finishes with a look at this significant aspect of his work.
Rule-governed behavior exhibits a pattern, but it contrasts with habitual behavior, which also exhibits patterns. Here Sellars is worried particularly about linguistic behavior, but the points apply generally:
The key to the concept of a linguistic rule is its complex relation to pattern-governed linguistic behavior. The general concept of pattern governed behavior is a familiar one. Roughly it is the concept of behavior which exhibits a pattern, not because it is brought about by the intention that it exhibit this pattern, but because the propensity to emit behavior of the pattern has been selectively reinforced, and the propensity to emit behavior which does not conform to this pattern selectively extinguished. (MFC: 423)
Pattern-governed behavior is present wherever there is learning, but that includes learning bad habits. Some pattern-governed behavior, however, exists because of rules.
If patterned governed behavior can arise by “natural” selection, it can also arise by purposive selection on the part of trainers. They can be construed as reasoning.Pattern-behavior of such and such a kind ought to be exhibited by trainees, hence we, the trainers, ought to do this and that, as likely to bring it about that it is exhibited (MFC: 423).
Sellars distinguishes two different kinds of ‘oughts’ or rules. There are ought-to-dos, aka rules of action. The basic form of such a rule is a conditional imperative: “If in circumstances C, do A!” This is the kind of rule involved in what I call paradigmatic rule-obeying. Paradigmatic rule-obedience requires complex cognitive and conative capacities on the part of the agent: knowledge of the rule, recognition of the circumstances as appropriate to the application of the rule, and conative structures that motivate one to apply the rule and act on it. Sellars denies that all rule-governed behaviors, behaviors that occur because of the rules are cases of paradigmatic rule-obedience.
Sellars’s other ‘ought’ is the ought-to-be, aka rules of criticism. For example, it ought to be the case that dogs come when their masters call. Such a rule speaks to no agent in particular, and it is certainly not a rule that dogs obey in the paradigmatic sense. It simply endorses a particular state of affairs without regard for any mode of achieving it. Still, dogs can exhibit a pattern of behavior that accords with the rule, and they can do so because of the rule, if their masters train them to come when called because the masters have reasoned along the following lines:
It ought to be the case that dogs come when their masters call.
Therefore, it ought to be the case that my dog comes when I call.
My dog will come when called only if I train it to do so.
Therefore, I ought to train my dog to come when called.
This reasoning moves from an ought-to-be to a relevant ought-to-do and comes to full fruition not in a belief about one’s obligations, but in a set of actions that result in one’s dog learning to come when called. Ought-to-be’s imply ought-to-do’s; and ought-to-do’s typically lead to action.
This last point is crucial. According to Sellars, rules of criticism (ought-to-be’s) have no way of being realized in the world (other than merely accidentally) except insofar as there are agents who recognize them, infer rules of action from them and thereupon undertake the requisite actions. Unless there are agents cognizant of and acting on some rules of action, talk of any rules, including the apparently less committal rules of criticism, turns out to be empty. We are rule-governed creatures because we conceive of ourselves as rule-governed creatures. And, as long as we do conceive of ourselves as governed by rules and train ourselves and our progeny to recognize and live in accordance with rules, it is true that we are rule-governed creatures. By taking ourselves to be persons, agents acting for reasons in accordance with rules, we make ourselves persons.
8. The Stereoscopic Vision
Sellars thinks that science’s aperspectival description of the empirical world is the measure of reality, but he is also committed to the indispensability of the concepts built into the first-person perspective that makes agency possible. If those concepts were not involved in the regulation of our behavior, we would not be persons and could not engage in such activities as moral behavior or scientific research. This is why Sellars calls for a stereoscopic vision in which the descriptive resources of the sciences are united with the language of individual and community intentions and the dualism of the manifest and scientific images is transcended.
Sellars possessed a broad vision, but did not shy away from detail work. He was a “philosopher’s philosopher;” his essays are complex and difficult pieces, challenging but rewarding to master. Beginning in 1994 with Sellars-inspired publications by his erstwhile colleagues John McDowell and Robert B. Brandom, interest in Sellars’ work has increased steadily, both in the U. S. and abroad. Publications and conferences focused on or inspired by Sellars are now common. In 2015, for instance, significant conferences devoted to Sellars were held in North America, Europe, and the Middle East. The literature on Sellars has grown appreciably since the last revision of this article. Sellars’s philosophy is rich enough to provide a framework within which otherwise distinct philosophical tendencies can find sufficient common ground to engage each other fruitfully. Sellars studies has been dominated by a clash between the “right-wing Sellarsians” (e.g., Patricia and Paul Churchland, Ruth Millikan, Jay Rosenberg), who emphasize Sellars’s scientific realism and nominalism, and the “left-wing Sellarsians” (e.g., Rorty, McDowell, and Brandom), who emphasize instead Sellars’s insistence on the irreducibility and sociality of rules and norms. Sellars’s expressivism has garnered increasing attention in both camps. Lately, a younger generation has begun constructing a finer-grained story of Sellars’s development. This will likely enable a better articulation of the structure of Sellars’s philosophy and, perhaps, a new sense of its potential.
Principal Works by Wilfrid Sellars
There is an almost universally used standard citation format for Sellars’s works employing the abbreviations given below.
|[EPH]||Essays in Philosophy and Its History, D. Reidel Publishing Co.; Dordrecht, Holland; 1975|
|[EPM*]||Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind, Robert Brandom (ed.), Harvard University Press.; Cambridge, MA; 1997. [The original, 1956, version of [EPM] see below, lacking footnotes added in [SPR], with an Introduction by Richard Rorty and Study Guide by Brandom.]|
|[ISR]||Scharp, K. and R. B. Brandom (eds.), 2007: In the Space of Reasons: Selected Essays of Wilfrid Sellars. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.|
|[KPKT]||Kant and Pre-Kantian Themes: Lectures by Wilfrid Sellars, Pedro Amaral (ed.), Ridgeview Publishing Co.; Atascadero, CA: 2002. [A transcription of Sellars’s Kant lectures, plus essays on Descartes, Locke, Spinoza, and Leibniz.]|
|[KTM]||Kant’s Transcendental Metaphysics: Sellars’ Cassirer Lecture Notes and Other Essays, Jeffrey F. Sicha (ed.), Ridgeview Publishing Co.; Atascadero, CA: 2002. [Contains a complete bibliography of Sellars’s published work, philosophical correspondence, and circulated manuscripts through 2002.]|
|[ME]||The Metaphysics of Epistemology, Lectures by Wilfrid Sellars, Pedro Amaral (ed.), Ridgeview Publishing Co.; Atascadero, CA; 1989. [Contains a complete bibliography of Sellars’s published work through 1989.]|
|[NAO]||Naturalism and Ontology, Ridgeview Publishing Co.; Atascadero, CA: 1979. [An expanded version of the 1974 John Dewey Lectures]|
|[PP]||Philosophical Perspectives, Charles C. Thomas: Springfield, IL; 1967; reprinted in two volumes, Philosophical Perspectives: History of Philosophy and Philosophical Perspective: Metaphysics and Epistemology, Ridgeview Publishing Co.; Atascadero, CA; 1977.|
|[PPPW]||Pure Pragmatics and Possible Worlds — The Early Essays of Wilfrid Sellars, Jeffrey F. Sicha (ed.), Ridgeview Publishing Co; Atascadero, CA; 1980. [Contains a long introductory essay by Sicha and an extensive bibliography of Sellars’s work through 1979.]|
|[SM]||Science and Metaphysics: Variations on Kantian Themes, Routledge & Kegan Paul Ltd; London, and The Humanities Press; New York; 1968. The 1966 John Locke Lectures. Reissued in 1992 by Ridgeview Publishing Co., Atascadero, CA.|
|[SPR]||Science, Perception and Reality, Routledge & Kegan Paul Ltd; London, and The Humanities Press: New York, 1963; reissued in 1991 by Ridgeview Publishing Co., Atascadero, CA.|
|[AAE]||“Actions and Events,” Noûs 7, 1973: 179–202.|
|[AE]||“Abstract Entities,” Review of Metaphysics 16, 1963: 627–71; reprinted in PP: 229–69; ISR: 163–205.|
|[AR]||“Autobiographical Reflections (February 1973),” in Action, Knowledge, and Reality: Studies in Honor of Wilfrid Sellars, H-N. Castañeda (ed.), Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill, 1975: 277–93.|
|[CDCM]||“Counterfactuals, Dispositions, and the Causal Modalities,” in Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science, Vol. II, H. Feigl, M. Scriven, and G. Maxwell (eds.), Minneapolis, MN: University of Minnesota Press, 1957: 225–308.|
|[CE]||“The Concept of Emergence” (with Paul Meehl). In Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science, vol. I, H. Feigl & M. Scriven (eds.), Minneapolis, MN: University of Minnesota Press, 1956: 239–52.|
|[EAE]||“Empiricism and Abstract Entities,” in The Philosophy of Rudolf Carnap, P.A. Schilpp (ed.), LaSalle, IL: Open Court, 1963: 431–68; reprinted in EPH: 245–86.|
|[EPM]||“Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind,” in Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science, vol. I, H. Feigl & M. Scriven (eds.), Minneapolis, MN: University of Minnesota Press, 1956: 253–329. (Originally presented at the University of London Special Lectures in Philosophy for 1956 as “The Myth of the Given: Three Lectures on Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind”); reprinted in SPR with additional footnotes. Published separately as Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind: with an Introduction by Richard Rorty and a Study Guide by Robert Brandom, R. Brandom (ed.), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1997; also reprinted in W. deVries & T. Triplett, Knowledge, Mind, and the Given: A Reading of Sellars’ “Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind,” (KMG), Indianapolis, IN: Hackett, 2000.|
|[FD]||“Fatalism and Determinism,” in Keith Lehrer, (ed.), Freedom and Determinism, New York: Random House, 1966: 141–74.|
|[FMPP]||“Foundations for a Metaphysics of Pure Process,” The Carus Lectures for 1977–78, published in The Monist 64 (1) 1981: 3–90.|
|[GE]||“Grammar and Existence: A Preface to Ontology,” Mind 69 (1960): 499–533; reprinted in SPR: 247–81; in ISR: 126–62.|
|[GEC]||“Givenness and Explanatory Coherence,” Journal of Philosophy 70, 1973: 612–24.|
|[I]||“…this I or he or it (the thing) which thinks,” Proceedings of the American Philosophical Association 44, 1972: 5–31; the 1970 Presidential Address, American Philosophical Association (Eastern Division), reprinted in EPH, KTM: 341–62, and ISR: 411–36.|
|[IAMBP]||“The Identity Approach to the Mind-Body Problem,” Review of Metaphysics 18, 1965: 430–51; reprinted in PP: 370–88 and ISR: 350–68.|
|[IKTE]||“The Role of Imagination in Kant’s Theory of Experience,” The Dotterer Lecture, in Categories: A Colloquium, H.W. Johnstone, Jr. (ed.), University Park, PA: Pennsylvania State University Press: 1978: 231–45; reprinted in KTM: 419–30; ISR: 454–66.|
|[IM]||“Inference and Meaning,” Mind, 62 1953: 313–38; reprinted in PPPW: 261–86; ISR: 3–27.|
|[ITM]||“Intentionality and the Mental,” A symposium by correspondence with Roderick Chisholm. In Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science, vol. II, H. Feigl, M. Scriven & G. Maxwell (eds.), Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1957: 507–39.|
|[LRB]||“Language, Rules and Behavior,” In John Dewey: Philosopher of Science and Freedom, S. Hook (ed.), New York: Dial Press, 1949: 289–315; reprinted in PPPW: 129–55.|
|[LT]||“The Language of Theories,” in Current Issues in the Philosophy Science, H. Feigl and G. Maxwell (eds.), New York: Henry Holt, Rhinehart and Winston, 1961: 57–77; reprinted in SPR, pp. 106–26.|
|[LTC]||“Language as Thought and Communication,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 29 1969: 506–27; reprinted in EPH: 93–117; ISR:: 57–80.|
|[MFC]||“Meaning as Functional Classification,” Synthese 27, 1974: 417–37 (Issue also contains comments by Daniel Dennett and Hilary Putnam and Sellars’s replies.); reprinted in ISR: 81–100.|
|[MEV]||“Mental Events,” Philosophical Studies, 81, 1981: 325–45; reprinted in ISR: 282–300.|
|[MGEC]||“More on Givenness and Explanatory Coherence,” in Justification and Knowledge, George S. Pappas (ed.), Dordrecht: D. Reidel Publishing Co., 1979: 169–82; reprinted in Perceptual Knowledge, J. Dancy (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1988: 177–91.|
|[OAFP]||“On Accepting First Principles,” in Philosophical Perspectives 2: Epistemology, 1988, J. Tomberlin (ed.), Atascadero, CA: Ridgeview Publishing Co., 1988: 301–14; reprinted in KTM: 443–54.|
|[OMP]||“‘Ought’ and Moral Principles”. Unpublished typescript dated “Pittsburgh, February 14” 1966.|
|[ORAV]||“On Reasoning About Values,” American Philosophical Quarterly 17 1980: 81–101.|
|[P]||“Phenomenalism,” in SPR: 60–105; reprinted in ISR: 303–49.|
|[PSIM]||“Philosophy and the Scientific Image of Man,” in Frontiers of Science and Philosophy, Robert Colodny (ed.) (Pittsburgh, PA: University of Pittsburgh Press, 1962): 35–78; reprinted in SPR: 1–40, ISR: 369–408.|
|[SK]||“The Structure of Knowledge,” The Matchette Foundation Lectures for 1971, in Action, Knowledge, and Reality: Studies in Honor of Wilfrid Sellars, H-N. Castañeda (ed.), Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill, 1975: 295–347.|
|[SRLG]||“Some Reflections on Language Games,” Philosophy of Science 21, 1954: 204–28; reprinted in ISR: 28–56; reprinted with extensive additions in SPR: 321–58.|
|[SRT]||“Is Scientific Realism Tenable,” Proceedings of the PSA, 2, 1976: 307–34.|
|[SSMB]||“A Semantical Solution of the Mind-Body Problem,” Methodos, 5, 1953: 45–82; reprinted in PPPW: 219–56.|
|[SSOP]||“Sensa or Sensings: Reflections on the Ontology of Perception,” Philosophical Studies (Essays in Honor of James Cornman) 41 1982: 83–111.|
|[TA]||“Thought and Action,” in Freedom and Determinism, Keith Lehrer (ed.), New York: Random House, 1966: 105–39.|
Major Critical Studies
- Brandom, Robert B., 2015, From Empiricism to Expressivism: Brandom Reads Sellars, Cambridge, MA, and London: Harvard University Press. [Brandom’s take on what is living and what is dead in Sellars’ philosophy.]
- Brandt, Stefan, and Anke Breunig (eds.), 2019, Wilfrid Sellars and Twentieth-Century Philosophy ( Routledge Studies in American Philosophy), New York and London: Routledge. [Essays, originally presented at a conference in Erlangen, Germany, on Sellars’s relation to other 20th century philosophers.]
- Castañeda, H-N. (ed.), 1975, Action, Knowledge, and Reality, Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill. [Also contains an extensive bibliography of Sellars’s work through 1974, Sellars’s intellectual autobiography, and ‘The Structure of Knowledge’ (see above).]
- Corti, Luca, and Antonio M. Nunziante (eds.), 2018, Sellars and the History of Modern Philosophy (Routledge Studies in American Philosophy), New York and London: Routledge. [A collection of essays focused on Sellars’ interpretations of and relations to the history of modern and early contemporary philosophy.]
- deVries, Willem A., 2005, Wilfrid Sellars, Chesham, Bucks: Acumen Publishing and Montreal & Kingston: McGill-Queen’s University Press. [A clearly written and accessible survey of Sellars’s systematic philosophy as a whole.]
- deVries, Willem A., and Timm Triplett, Knowledge, Mind, and the Given: Reading Wilfrid Sellars’ “Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind,” 2000, Indianapolis & Cambridge, MA: Hackett Publishing Co. [A detailed commentary on [EPM] (see above), including the complete text as published with additional footnotes in [SPR], 1963. A comprehensive introduction to Sellars’s classic essay.]
- deVries, Willem. A. (ed.), 2009, Empiricism, Perceptual Knowledge, Normativity and Realism: Essays on Wilfrid Sellars, Oxford: Oxford University Press. [Mostly papers presented at a conference in London celebrating the 50th anniversary of EPM.]
- Delaney, C.F., Michael J. Loux, Gary Gutting, and W. David Solomon, 1977, The Synoptic Vision: Essays on the Philosophy of Wilfrid Sellars, Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press. [Also contains an extensive bibliography.]
- Garfield, Jay L. (ed.), 2019, Wilfrid Sellars and Buddhist Philosophy: Freedom from Foundations (Routledge Studies in American Philosophy), New York and London: Routledge. [A collection of essays cross-fertilizing Sellars and Buddhism, particularly the relations between (1) Sellars’ Manifest/Scientific Image distinction and the Buddhist notion of Two Truths and (2) Sellars’ critique of the Given and Buddhist epistemology and philosophy of mind.]
- Koons, Jeremy Randel, 2019, The Ethics of Wilfrid Sellars (Routledge Studies in American Philosophy), New York and London: Routledge. [The first book-length, thorough examination of Sellars’ ethical theorizing .]
- Olen, Peter, 2016, Wilfrid Sellars and the Foundations of Normativity, London: Palgrave Macmillan. [An interpretation of Sellars’ earliest publications, setting them in their historical context.]
- O’Shea, James R., 2007, Wilfrid Sellars, Cambridge & Malden, MA: Polity Press. [An excellent introductory overview of Sellars’s philosophy]
- O’Shea, James R. (ed.), 2016, Wilfrid Sellars and His Legacy, Oxford: Oxford University Press. [Essays originally presented at the Wilfrid Sellars Centennial Conference in 2012.]
- Pereplyotchik, David, and Deborah R. Barnbaum (eds.), 2017, Sellars and Contemporary Philosophy (Routledge Studies in American Philosophy), New York and London: Routledge. [A wide-ranging collection of essays originally presented at a conference at Kent State University in 2015.]
- Pitt, Joseph C. (ed.), 1978, The Philosophy of Wilfrid Sellars: Queries and Extensions, Dordrecht: D. Reidel Publishing Co. [Revised proceedings of a workshop on the Philosophy of Wilfrid Sellars held at Virginia Polytechnic Institute and State University in Blacksburg, VA, in November 1976.]
- –––, 1981, Pictures, Images, and Conceptual Change: An Analysis of Wilfrid Sellars’ Philosophy of Science, Dordrecht: D. Reidel Publishing Co.
- Rosenberg, Jay F., 2007, Wilfrid Sellars: Fusing the Images, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Seibt, Johanna, 1990, Properties as Processes: A Synoptic Study of Wilfrid Sellars’ Nominalism, Atascadero, CA: Ridgeview Publishing Co.
- Wolf, Michael P. and Mark N. Lance (eds.), 2006, The Self-Correcting Enterprise: Essays on Wilfrid Sellars, Poznan Studies in the Philosophy of Science and the Humanities, 93, Amsterdam and New York: Rodopi.
- Noûs, 1973, 7 (2). [Special issue devoted to the philosophy of Wilfrid Sellars.]
- The Monist, 1982, 65 (3). [Issue devoted to the philosophy of Wilfrid Sellars.]
- Philosophical Studies, 1988, 54 (2). [Revised proceedings of the colloquium on Sellars’s philosophy held in October 1987 at the University of Pittsburgh’s Center for Philosophy of Science.]
- Philosophical Studies, 2000, 101 (2–3). [Special issue devoted to the philosophy of Wilfrid Sellars.]
- Humana.Mente, 2012, 21. [Special issue: Between Two Images. The Manifest and Scientific Conception of the Human Being, 50 Years On.]
- International Journal of Philosophical Studies, July 2019, 27 (3). [Special issue devoted to the relation between Hegel and Sellars.]
- Alanen, L., 1992, “Thought-Talk: Descartes and Sellars on Intentionality,” American Philosophical Quarterly, 29: 19–34.
- Alston, W. P., 1989. “What’s Wrong with Immediate Knowledge?” In his Epistemic Justification, 52–78. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
- –––, 2002, “Sellars and the ‘Myth of the Given’,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 65: 69–86.
- Astington, J., P. Harris, and D. Olson (eds.), 1988, Developing Theories of Mind, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Aune, B., 1975, “Sellars on Practical Reason”, in Action, Knowledge and Reality, H.-N. Castañeda (ed.), Indianapolis, IN: Bobbs-Merrill, pp. 1–26.
- –––, 1978. “Sellars on Practical Inference”. In The Philosophy of Wilfrid Sellars: Queries and Extensions, J. C. Pitt (ed.), Dordrecht: D. Reidel, pp.19–24.
- –––, 1990, “Sellars’ Two Images of the World,” Journal of Philosophy, 87: 537–45.
- Bandini, Aude, 2011, “Meaning and the Emergence of Normativity,” International Journal of Philosophical Studies, 18 (3): 415–431.
- Baumeister, David, 2017, “Social Conceptions of Moral Agency in Hegel and Sellars,” International Journal of Philosophical Studies, 25 (2): 249–265.
- Beisecker, David, 2019, “On Peter Olen’s ‘Wilfrid Sellars and the Foundations of Normativity’,” Journal for the History of Analytical Philosophy, 7 (3). doi:10.15173/jhap.v7i3.3908.
- Bernstein, Richard J., 1965–66, “Sellars’ Vision of Man-in-the-Universe,” Review of Metaphysics, 20: 290–316.
- Bonevac, Daniel, 2002, “Sellars vs. the Given,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 64 (1): 1–30.
- Brandom, Robert, 1995, Making It Explicit: Reasoning, Representing, and Discursive Commitment, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
- –––, 1997, “Study Guide,” in EPM* (see above).
- –––, 2000, Articulating Reasons: An Introduction to Inferentialism, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
- –––, 2002, Tales of the Mighty Dead: Historical Essays in the Metaphysics of Intentionality, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
- –––, 2008, Between Saying and Doing: Towards an Analytic Pragmatism, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Burge, Tyler, 1992, “Philosophy of Language and Mind: 1950–1990” The Philosophical Review, 101: 3–51.
- Cayla, F., 1991, Routes et déroutes de l’intentionnalité: la correspondance W. Sellars/R. Chisholm, Paris: Éditions de L’éclat.
- Christias, Dionysis, 2015, “Somatic Intentionality Bifurcated: A Sellarsian Response to Sachs’s Merleau-Pontyan Account of Intentionality,” International Journal of Philosophical Studies, 23 (4): 539–561.
- –––, 2015, “A Sellarsian Approach to the Normativism-Antinormativism Controversy,” Philosophy of the Social Sciences, 45 (2): 143–175.
- –––, 2016, “Can ‘Ready-to-Hand’ Normativity Be Reconciled with the Scientific Image?” Philosophia, 44 (2): 447–467.
- –––, 2016, “Can Sellars’ Argument for Scientific Realism Be Used Against His Own Scientia Mensura Principle?” Synthese, 193 (9): 2837–2863.
- –––, 2016, “Sellars, Meillassoux, and the Myth of the Categorial Given,” Journal of Philosophical Research, 41: 105–128.
- –––, 2017, “Reconciling Scientific Naturalism with the Unconditionality of the Moral Point of View,” Res Philosophica, 95 (1): 111–149.
- –––, 2017, “Sellarsian Picturing in Light of Spinoza’s Intuitive Knowledge,” Philosophia, 45 (3): 1039–1062.
- –––, 2017, “Sellars’s Synoptic Vision,” Res Philosophica, 94 (1): 135–163.
- –––, 2018, “On the Proper Construal of the Manifest-Scientific Image Distinction: Brandom Contra Sellars,” Synthese, 195 (3): 1295–1320.
- –––, 2018, “Sellars’ Naturalism, the Myth of the Given and Ηusserl’s Transcendental Phenomenology,” Philosophical Forum, 49 (4): 511–539
- Churchland, Paul, 1979, Scientific Realism and the Plasticity of Mind, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Clark, Austen, 1989, “The Particulate Instantiation of Homogeneous Pink,” Synthese, 80: 277–304.
- Clark, Romane, 1982, “Sensibility and Understanding: The Given of Wilfrid Sellars,” The Monist, 65 (3): 350–64.
- Coates, Paul, 2007, The Metaphysics of Perception: Wilfrid Sellars, Perceptual Consciousness and Critical Realism, New York: Routledge.
- Cornman, James, 1969–70, “Sellars, Scientific Realism, and Sensa,” Review of Metaphysics, 23: 417–51.
- –––, 1976, “Sellars on Scientific Realism and Perceiving,” in F. Suppe and P.D. Asquith (eds.), Proceedings of the Philosophy of Science Association, 2: 344–58.
- Dach, Stefanie, 2018, “Sellars’s Two Images as a Philosopher’s Tool,” Metaphilosophy, 49 (4): 568–588.
- –––, forthcoming, “Sellars, we-intentions and ought-statements,” Synthese, first online 2 August 2019. doi:10.1007/s11229-019-02349-9
- Dennett, Daniel C., 1987, “Mid-Term Examination: Compare and Contrast,” in The Intentional Stance, Cambridge, MA: Bradford Books, The MIT Press, pp. 339–50.
- deVries, Willem A., 2006, “McDowell, Sellars, and Sense Impressions,” European Journal of Philosophy, 14 (2): 182–201.
- –––, 2010, “Naturalism, the Autonomy of Reason, and Picturing,” International Journal of Philosophical Studies, 18 (3): 1–19.
- –––, 2016, “Just What is the Relation Between the Manifest and the Scientific Images?” International Journal of Philosophical Studies, 24 (1): 112–128.
- –––, 2017, “Hegelian Spirits in Sellarsian Bottles,” Philosophical Studies, 174 (7): 1643–1654.
- deVries, W.and T. Triplett, 2007, “Does Observational Knowledge Require Metaknowledge? A Dialogue on Sellars,” International Journal of Philosophical Studies, 15 (1): 23–51.
- Echelbarger, Charles, 1974, “Sellars on Thinking and the Myth of the Given,” Philosophical Studies, 25: 231–46.
- –––, 1981, “An Alleged Legend,” Philosophical Studies, 39: 227–46.
- Gabbani,Carlo, 2007, “‘Immagine scientifica’ e/o ‘Immagine manifesta’ dell‘uomo nel mondo,” in Per un’epistemologia dell’esperienza personale, Milano: Guerini, pp. 25–59.
- Garfield, Jay, 1989, “The Myth of Jones and the Mirror of Nature: Reflections on Introspection,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 50: 1–23.
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Other Internet Resources
- Rosenberg, Jay, “Wilfrid Sellars,” Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Summer 2011 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/sum2011/entries/sellars/>. [This was the previous entry on Sellars in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy — see the version history.]
- Problems from Wilfrid Sellars. An excellent site maintained by Andrew Chrucky with a great deal of material relevant to Sellars on it.
- The Wilfrid S. Sellars Collection, University of Pittsburgh Digital Library.