Notes to Formal Epistemology

1. Strictly speaking, this should read, “For any proposition that has a well-defined probability at all…”. For technical reasons we won’t go into here, some propositions cannot have any well-defined probability, at least not on the standard approach to probability.

2. We could use a different scale, from 0 to 2 for example. But the math would end up messier.

3. Despite appearing trivial or obvious, this is actually a substantive assumption. Certainly some things appear more probable than some tautologies. For example, that I have hands seems massively probable to me, whereas certain long and complicated tautologies will be hard for me to identify as tautologies.

4. From the three axioms stated, we can prove that the same rule works for a three-part breakdown, a four-part breakdown, and so on, for any finite number \(n\). It does not follow from these axioms, however, that the same rule holds for an infinite breakdown. Consequently, many authors replace our third axiom with an infinitary version called Countable Additivity. See the entry on Interpretations of Probability for more.

5. It was previously known as “The Principle of Insufficient Reason”, but was renamed by Keynes (1921) to avoid the impression of arbitrariness.

Copyright © 2015 by
Jonathan Weisberg <jonathan.weisberg@utoronto.ca>

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