# Interpretations of Probability

*First published Mon Oct 21, 2002; substantive revision Thu Nov 16, 2023*

Probability is the most important concept in modern science, especially as nobody has the slightest notion what it means.—Bertrand Russell, 1929 Lecture

(cited in Bell 1945, 587)

One regularly reads and hears probabilistic claims like the following:

- The Democrats will probably win the next election.
- The coin is just as likely to land heads as tails.
- There’s a 30% chance of rain tomorrow.
- The probability that a radium atom decays in one year is roughly 0.0004.

But what do these statements mean? This may be understood as a
metaphysical question about what kinds of things are probabilities, or
more generally as a question about what makes probability statements
true or false. At a first pass, various *interpretations of
probability* answer this question, one way or another.

However, there is also a stricter usage: an
‘interpretation’ *of a formal theory* provides
meanings for its primitive symbols or terms, with an eye to turning
its axioms and theorems into true statements about some subject. In
the case of probability, Kolmogorov’s axiomatization (which we
will see shortly) is the usual formal theory, and the so-called
‘interpretations of probability’ usually interpret
*it*. That axiomatization introduces a function
‘\(P\)’ that has certain formal properties. We may then
ask ‘What is \(P\)?’. Several of the views that we will
discuss also answer this question, one way or another.

Our topic is complicated by the fact that there are various
alternative formalizations of probability. Moreover, as we will see,
some of the leading ‘interpretations of probability’ do
*not* obey all of Kolmogorov’s axioms, yet they have not
lost their title for that. And various other quantities that have
nothing to do with probability *do* satisfy Kolmogorov’s
axioms, and thus are ‘interpretations’ of it in the strict
sense: normalized mass, length, area, volume, and other quantities
that fall under the scope of measure theory, the abstract mathematical
theory that generalizes such quantities. Nobody seriously considers
these to be ‘interpretations of probability’, however,
because they do not play the right role in our conceptual
apparatus.

Perhaps we would do better, then, to think of the interpretations as
*analyses* of various concepts of probability. Or perhaps
better still, we might regard them as *explications* of such
concepts, refining them to be fruitful for philosophical and
scientific theorizing (à la Carnap 1950, 1962).

However we think of it, the project of finding such interpretations is an important one. Probability is virtually ubiquitous. It plays a role in almost all the sciences. It underpins much of the social sciences — witness the prevalent use of statistical testing, confidence intervals, regression methods, and so on. It finds its way, moreover, into much of philosophy. In epistemology, the philosophy of mind, and cognitive science, we see states of opinion being modeled by subjective probability functions, and learning being modeled by the updating of such functions. Since probability theory is central to decision theory and game theory, it has ramifications for ethics and political philosophy. It figures prominently in such staples of metaphysics as causation and laws of nature. It appears again in the philosophy of science in the analysis of confirmation of theories, scientific explanation, and in the philosophy of specific scientific theories, such as quantum mechanics, statistical mechanics, evolutionary biology, and genetics. It can even take center stage in the philosophy of logic, the philosophy of language, and the philosophy of religion. Thus, problems in the foundations of probability bear at least indirectly, and sometimes directly, upon central scientific, social scientific, and philosophical concerns. The interpretation of probability is one of the most important such foundational problems.

- 1. Kolmogorov’s Probability Calculus
- 2. Criteria of adequacy for the interpretations of probability
- 3. The Main Interpretations
- 4. Conclusion: Future Prospects?
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Kolmogorov’s Probability Calculus

Probability theory was a relative latecomer in intellectual history.
To be sure, proto-probabilistic ideas concerning evidence and
inference date back to antiquity (see Franklin 2001). However,
probability’s mathematical treatment had to wait until the
Fermat-Pascal correspondence, and their analysis of games of chance in
17^{th} century France. Its axiomatization had to wait still
longer, in Kolmogorov’s classic *Foundations of the Theory of
Probability* (1933). Roughly, probabilities lie between 0 and 1
inclusive, and they are additive. More formally, let \(\Omega\) be a
non-empty set (‘the universal set’). A *field* (or
*algebra*) on \(\Omega\) is a set \(\mathbf{F}\) of subsets of
\(\Omega\) that has \(\Omega\) as a member, and that is closed under
complementation (with respect to \(\Omega)\) and union. Let \(P\) be a
function from \(\mathbf{F}\) to the real numbers obeying:

- (Non-negativity) \(P(A) \ge 0\), for all \(A \in \mathbf{F}\).
- (Normalization) \(P(\Omega) = 1\).
- (Finite additivity) \(P(A \cup B) = P(A) + P(B)\) for all \(A, B \in \mathbf{F}\) such that \(A \cap B = \varnothing\).

Call \(P\) a *probability function*, and \((\Omega ,
\mathbf{F}, P)\) a *probability space*. This is
Kolmogorov’s “elementary theory of probability”.

The non-negativity and normalization axioms are largely matters of convention, although it is non-trivial that probability functions take at least the two values 0 and 1, and that they have a maximal value (unlike various other measures, such as length, volume, and so on, which are unbounded). We will return to finite additivity at a number of points below.

We may now apply the theory to various familiar cases. For example, we may represent the results of tossing a single die once by the set \(\Omega = \{1, 2, 3, 4, 5, 6\}\), and we could let \(\mathbf{F}\) be the set of all subsets of \(\Omega\). Under the natural assignment of probabilities to members of \(\mathbf{F}\), we obtain such welcome results as the following:

\[\begin{align} P(\{1\}) &= \frac{1}{6}, \\ P(\text{even}) &= P(\{2\} \cup \{4\} \cup \{6\}) \\ &= \frac{3}{6}, \\ P(\text{odd or less than 4}) &= P(\text{odd}) + P(\text{less than 4}) - P(\text{odd} \cap \text{less than 4}) \\ &= \frac{1}{2} + \frac{1}{2} - \frac{2}{6} \\ &= \frac{4}{6}, \end{align}\]and so on.

We could instead attach probabilities to members of a collection
\(\mathbf{S}\) of *sentences* of a formal language, closed
under (countable) truth-functional combinations, with the following
counterpart axiomatization:

- \(P(A) \ge 0\) for all \(A \in \mathbf{S}\).
- If \(T\) is a logical truth (in classical logic), then \(P(T) = 1\).
- \(P(A \vee B) = P(A) + P(B)\) for all \(A \in \mathbf{S}\) and \(B \in \mathbf{S}\) such that \(A\) and \(B\) are logically incompatible.

The bearers of probabilities are sometimes also called “events”, “outcomes”, or “propositions”, but the underlying formalism remains the same. More attention has been given to interpreting ‘\(P\)’ than to interpreting its bearers; we will be concerned with the former.

The elementary theory of probability suffices for most everyday
applications of probability, and it will suffice for most of our
discussion below. But more advanced treatments in mathematics,
statistics, and science require more mathematical sophistication
involving *countable* infinite extensions. (Readers less
interested in the mathematical details may want to skip to "*The
conditional probability ...*" three paragaphs below.) Now let us
strengthen our closure assumptions regarding \(\mathbf{F}\), requiring
it to be closed under complementation and *countable* union; it
is then called a *sigma field* (or *sigma algebra)* on
\(\Omega\). It is controversial whether we should strengthen finite
additivity, as Kolmogorov does:

Kolmogorov comments that infinite probability spaces are idealized models of real random processes, and that he limits himself arbitrarily to only those models that satisfy countable additivity. This axiom is the cornerstone of the assimilation of probability theory to measure theory.

*The conditional probability of A given B* is then given by the
ratio of unconditional probabilities:

This is often taken to be the *definition* of conditional
probability, although it should be emphasized that this is a technical
usage of the term that may not align perfectly with a pretheoretical
concept that we might have (see Hájek, 2003). We recognize it
in locutions such as “the probability that the die lands 1,
given that it lands odd, is 1/3”, or “the probability that
it will rain tomorrow, given that there are dark clouds in the sky
tomorrow morning, is high”. It is the concept of the probability
of something *given* or *in the light of* some piece of
evidence or information. Indeed, some authors take conditional
probability to be the primitive notion, and axiomatize it directly
(e.g. Popper 1959b, Rényi 1970, van Fraassen 1976, Spohn 1986,
and Roeper and Leblanc 1999).

There are other formalizations that give up normalization; that give up countable additivity, and even additivity; that allow probabilities to take infinitesimal values (positive, but smaller than every positive real number); that allow probabilities to be imprecise — interval-valued, or more generally represented with sets of precise probability functions; and that treat probabilities comparatively rather than quantitatively. (See Fine 1974, Halpern 2003, Cozman 2016, Fine 2016, Hawthorne 2016, Lyon 2016.) For now, however, when we speak of ‘the probability calculus’, we will mean Kolmogorov’s approach, as is standard. See Hájek and Hitchcock (2016b) for a relatively non-technical introduction to it, intended for philosophers.

Given certain probabilities as inputs, the axioms and theorems allow
us to compute various further probabilities. However, apart from the
assignment of 1 to the universal set and 0 to the empty set, they are
silent regarding the initial assignment of
probabilities.^{[1]}
For guidance with that, we need to turn to the interpretations of
probability. First, however, let us list some criteria of adequacy for
such interpretations.

## 2. Criteria of Adequacy for the Interpretations of Probability

What criteria are appropriate for assessing the cogency of a proposed
interpretation of probability? Of course, an interpretation should be
precise, unambiguous, non-circular, and use well-understood
primitives. But those are really prescriptions for good philosophizing
generally; what do we want from our interpretations *of
probability*, specifically? We begin by following Salmon (1966,
64), although we will raise some questions about his criteria, and
propose some others. He writes:

Admissibility.We say that an interpretation of a formal system is admissible if the meanings assigned to the primitive terms in the interpretation transform the formal axioms, and consequently all the theorems, into true statements. A fundamental requirement for probability concepts is to satisfy the mathematical relations specified by the calculus of probability…

Ascertainability.This criterion requires that there be some method by which, in principle at least, we can ascertain values of probabilities. It merely expresses the fact that a concept of probability will be useless if it is impossible in principle to find out what the probabilities are…

Applicability.The force of this criterion is best expressed in Bishop Butler’s famous aphorism, “Probability is the very guide of life.”…

It might seem that the criterion of admissibility goes without saying.
The word ‘interpretation’ is often used in such a way that
‘admissible interpretation’ is a pleonasm. Yet it turns
out that the criterion is non-trivial, and indeed if taken seriously
would rule out several of the leading interpretations of probability!
As we will see, some of them fail to satisfy countable additivity; for
others (certain propensity interpretations) the status of at least
some of the axioms is unclear. Nevertheless, we regard them as genuine
candidates. It should be remembered, moreover, that Kolmogorov’s
is just one of many possible axiomatizations, and there is not
universal agreement on which is ‘best’ (whatever that
might mean). Indeed, Salmon’s preferred axiomatization differs
from
Kolmogorov’s.^{[2]}
Thus, there is no such thing as admissibility *tout court*,
but rather admissibility with respect to this or that axiomatization.
In any case, if we found an inadmissible interpretation (with respect
to Kolmogorov’s axiomatization) that did a wonderful job of
meeting the criteria of ascertainability and applicability, then we
should surely embrace it.

So let us turn to those criteria. It is a little unclear in the
ascertainability criterion just what “in principle”
amounts to – it outruns what is practical or feasible –
though perhaps some latitude here is all to the good. Most of the work
will be done by the applicability criterion. We must say more (as
Salmon indeed does) about what *sort* of a guide to life
probability is supposed to be. Mass, length, area and volume are all
useful concepts, and they are ‘guides to life’ in various
ways (think how critical distance judgments can be to survival);
moreover, they are admissible and ascertainable, so presumably it is
the applicability criterion that will rule them out. Perhaps it is
best to think of applicability as a cluster of criteria, each of which
is supposed to capture something of probability’s distinctive
conceptual roles; moreover, we should not require that all of them be
met by a given interpretation. They include:

*Non-triviality:* an interpretation should make non-extreme
probabilities at least a conceptual possibility. For example, suppose
that we interpret ‘\(P\)’ as the *truth* function:
it assigns the value 1 to all true sentences, and 0 to all false
sentences. Then trivially, all the axioms come out true, so this
interpretation is admissible. We would hardly count it as an adequate
*interpretation of* *probability*, however, and so we
need to exclude it. It is essential to probability that, at least in
principle, it can take *intermediate* values. All of the
interpretations that we will present meet this criterion, so we will
discuss it no more.

*Applicability to frequencies:* an interpretation should render
perspicuous the relationship between probabilities and (long-run)
frequencies. Among other things, it should make clear why, by and
large, more probable events occur more frequently than less probable
events.

*Applicability to rational beliefs:* an interpretation should
clarify the role that probabilities play in constraining the degrees
of belief, or *credences*, of rational agents. Among other
things, knowing that one event is more probable than another, a
rational agent will be more confident about the occurrence of the
former event.

*Applicability to rational decisions*: an interpretation should
make clear how probabilities figure in rational decision-making. This
seems especially apposite for a ‘guide to life’.

*Applicability to ampliative inferences:* an interpretation
will score bonus points if it illuminates the distinction between
‘good’ and ‘bad’ ampliative inferences, while
explicating why both fall short of deductive inferences.

*Applicability to science:* an interpretation should illuminate
paradigmatic uses of probability in science (for example, in quantum
mechanics and statistical mechanics).

Perhaps there are further *metaphysical* desiderata that we
might impose on the interpretations. For example, there appear to be
connections between probability and *modality.* Events with
positive probability *can* happen, even if they don’t.
Some authors also insist on the converse condition that *only*
events with positive probability can happen, although this is more
controversial — see our discussion of ‘regularity’
in Section 3.3.4. (Indeed, in uncountable probability spaces this
condition will require the employment of infinitesimals, and will thus
take us beyond the standard Kolmogorov theory —
‘standard’ both in the sense of being the orthodoxy, and
in its employment of standard, as opposed to
‘non-standard’ real numbers. See Skyrms 1980.) In any
case, our list is already long enough to help in our assessment of the
leading interpretations on the market.

## 3. The Main Interpretations

Broadly speaking, there are arguably three main concepts of probability:

- An epistemological concept, which is meant to measure objective
evidential support relations. For example, “in light of the
relevant seismological and geological data, California will
*probably*experience a major earthquake this decade”. - The concept of an agent’s degree of confidence, a graded
belief. For example, “I am not sure that it will rain in
Canberra this week, but it
*probably*will.” - A physical concept that applies to various systems in the world,
independently of what anyone thinks. For example, “a particular
radium atom will
*probably*decay within 10,000 years”.

Some philosophers will insist that not all of these concepts are
intelligible; some will insist that one of them is basic, and that the
others are reducible to it. Moreover, the boundaries between these
concepts are somewhat permeable. After all, ‘degree of
confidence’ is itself an epistemological concept, and as we will
see, it is thought to be rationally constrained both by evidential
support relations and by attitudes to physical probabilities in the
world. And there are intramural disputes within the camps supporting
each of these concepts, as we will also see. Be that as it may, it
will be useful to keep these concepts in mind. Sections 3.1 and 3.2
discuss analyses of concept (1), *classical* and
*logical/evidential* probability; 3.3 discusses analyses of
concept (2), *subjective* probability; 3.4, 3.5, and 3.6
discuss three analyses of concept (3), *frequentist*,
*propensity*, and *best-system* interpretations.

### 3.1 Classical Probability

The classical interpretation owes its name to its early and august pedigree. It was championed by de Moivre and Laplace, and inchoate versions of it may be found in the works of Pascal, Bernoulli, Huygens, and Leibniz. It assigns probabilities in the absence of any evidence, or in the presence of symmetrically balanced evidence. The guiding idea is that in such circumstances, probability is shared equally among all the possible outcomes, so that the classical probability of an event is simply the fraction of the total number of possibilities in which the event occurs. It seems especially well suited to those games of chance that by their very design create such circumstances — for example, the classical probability of a fair die landing with an even number showing up is 3/6. It is often presupposed (usually tacitly) in textbook probability puzzles.

Here is a classic statement by de Moivre:

[I]f we constitute a fraction whereof the numerator be the number of chances whereby an event may happen, and the denominator the number of all the chances whereby it may either happen or fail, that fraction will be a proper designation of the probability of happening. (1718; 1967, 1–2)Laplace gives the best-known but slightly different formulation:

The theory of chances consists in reducing all events of the same kind to a certain number of equally possible cases, that is to say, to cases whose existence we are equally uncertain of, and in determining the number of cases favourable to the event whose probability is sought. The ratio of this number to that of all possible cases is the measure of this probability, which is thus only a fraction whose numerator is the number of favourable cases, and whose denominator is the number of all possible cases. (1814; 1999, 4)

We may ask a number of questions about this formulation. When are events of the same kind? Intuitively, ‘heads’ and ‘tails’ are equally likely outcomes of tossing a fair coin; but if their kind is ‘ways the coin could land’, then ‘edge’ should presumably be counted alongside them. The “certain number of equally possible cases” and “the number of all possible cases” are presumably finite numbers. What, then, of probabilities in infinite spaces? Apparently, irrational-valued probabilities such as \(1/\sqrt{2}\) are automatically eliminated, and thus theories such as quantum mechanics that posit them cannot be accommodated. (We will shortly see, however, that Laplace’s theory has been refined to handle infinite spaces.)

Who are “we”, who “are equally uncertain”?
Different people may be equally undecided about different things,
which suggests that Laplace is offering a subjectivist interpretation
in which probabilities vary from person to person depending on
contingent differences in their evidence. Yet he means to characterize
the objective probability assignment of a rational agent in an
epistemically neutral position with respect to a set of “equally
possible” cases. But then the proposal risks sounding empty: for
what is it for an agent to *be* “equally uncertain”
about a set of cases, other than assigning them equal probability?

This brings us to one of the key objections to Laplace’s
account. The notion of “equally possible” cases faces the
charge of either being a category mistake (for
‘possibility’ does not come in degrees), or circular (for
what is meant is really ‘equally probable’). The notion is
finessed by the so-called ‘principle of indifference’, a
coinage due to Keynes (although he was no friend of the principle):
“if there is no known reason for predicating of our subject one
rather than another of several alternatives, then relatively to such
knowledge the assertions of each of these alternatives have an equal
probability” (1921, 52–53). (The ‘principle of equal
probability’ would be a better name.) Thus, it might be claimed,
there is no circularity in the classical interpretation after all.
However, this move may only postpone the problem, for there is still a
threat of circularity, albeit at a lower level. We have two cases
here: outcomes for which we have *no evidence*
(“reason”) *at all*, and outcomes for which we have
*symmetrically balanced evidence*. There is no circularity in
the first case unless the notion of ‘evidence’ is itself
probabilistic; but artificial examples aside, it is doubtful that the
case ever arises. For example, we have a considerable fund of evidence
on coin tossing from the results of our own experiments, the testimony
of others, our knowledge of some of the relevant physics, and so on.
In the second case, the threat of circularity is more apparent, for it
seems that some sort of *weighing* of the evidence in favor of
each outcome is required, and this seems to require a reference to
probability. Indeed, the most obvious characterization of
symmetrically balanced evidence is in terms of equality of conditional
probabilities: given evidence \(E\) and possible outcomes \(O_1, O_2 ,
\ldots ,O_n\), the evidence is symmetrically balanced iff \(P(O_1\mid
E) = P(O_2\mid E) = \ldots = P(O_n\mid E)\). Then it seems that
probabilities reside at the base of the interpretation after all.
Still, it would be an achievement if all probabilities could be
reduced to cases of equal probability. See Zabell (2016) for further
discussion of the classical interpretation and the principle of
indifference.

When the spaces are countably infinite, the spirit of the classical
theory may be upheld by appealing to the information-theoretic
principle of *maximum entropy*, a generalization of the
principle of indifference championed by Jaynes (1968). Entropy is a
measure of the lack of ‘informativeness’ of a probability
function. The more concentrated is the function, the less is its
entropy; the more diffuse it is, the greater is its entropy. For a
discrete assignment of probabilities \(P = (p_1, p_2,\ldots)\), the
entropy of \(P\) is defined as:

(For more explanation of this formula see the entry on Information.)

The principle of maximum entropy enjoins us to select from the family
of all probability functions consistent with our background knowledge
the function that maximizes this quantity. In the special case of
choosing the most uninformative probability function over a finite set
of possible outcomes, this is just the familiar ‘flat’
classical assignment discussed previously. Things get more complicated
in the infinite case, since there cannot be a flat assignment over
denumerably many outcomes, on pain of violating the standard
probability calculus (with countable additivity). Rather, the best we
can have are sequences of progressively flatter assignments, none of
which is truly flat. We must then impose some *further*
constraint that narrows the field to a smaller family in which there
*is* an assignment of maximum
entropy.^{[3]}
This constraint has to be imposed from outside as background
knowledge, but there is no general theory of which external constraint
should be applied when. See Seidenfeld (1986) for mathematical results
regarding maximum entropy and a critique of it.

Let us turn now to uncountably infinite spaces. It is easy — all too easy — to assign equal probabilities to the points in such a space: each gets probability 0. Non-trivial probabilities arise when uncountably many of the points are clumped together in larger sets. If there are finitely many clumps, Laplace’s classical theory may be appealed to again: if the evidence bears symmetrically on these clumps, each gets the same share of probability.

Enter Bertrand’s paradoxes (1889). They all arise in uncountable
spaces and turn on alternative parametrizations of a given problem
that are non-linearly related to each other. Some presentations are
needlessly arcane; length and area suffice to make the point. The
following example (adapted from van Fraassen 1989) nicely illustrates
how Bertrand-style paradoxes work. A factory produces cubes with
side-length between 0 and 1 foot; what is the probability that a
randomly chosen cube has side-length between 0 and 1/2 a foot? The
classical intepretation’s answer is apparently 1/2, as we
imagine a process of production that is uniformly distributed over
side-length. But the question could have been given an equivalent
restatement: A factory produces cubes with face-area between 0 and 1
square-feet; what is the probability that a randomly chosen cube has
face-area between 0 and 1/4 square-feet? Now the answer is apparently
1/4, as we imagine a process of production that is uniformly
distributed over face-area. This is already disastrous, as we cannot
allow the same event to have two different probabilities (especially
if this interpretation is to be admissible!). But there is worse to
come, for the problem could have been restated equivalently again: A
factory produces cubes with volume between 0 and 1 cubic feet; what is
the probability that a randomly chosen cube has volume between 0 and
1/8 cubic-feet? Now the answer is apparently 1/8, as we imagine a
process of production that is uniformly distributed over volume. And
so on for all of the infinitely many equivalent reformulations of the
problem (in terms of the fourth, fifth, … power of the length,
and indeed in terms of every non-zero real-valued exponent of the
length). What, then, is *the* probability of the event in
question?

The paradox arises because the principle of indifference can be used in incompatible ways. We have no evidence that favors the side-length lying in the interval [0, 1/2] over its lying in [1/2, 1], or vice versa, so the principle requires us to give probability 1/2 to each. Unfortunately, we also have no evidence that favors the face-area lying in any of the four intervals [0, 1/4], [1/4, 1/2], [1/2, 3/4], and [3/4, 1] over any of the others, so we must give probability 1/4 to each. The event ‘the side-length lies in [0, 1/2]’, receives a different probability when merely redescribed. And so it goes, for all the other reformulations of the problem. We cannot meet any pair of these constraints simultaneously, let alone all of them.

Jaynes attempts to save the principle of indifference and to extend
the principle of maximum entropy to the continuous case, with his
*invariance condition*: in two problems where we have the same
knowledge, we should assign the same probabilities. He regards this as
a consistency requirement. For any problem, we have a group of
admissible transformations, those that change the problem into an
equivalent form. Various details are left unspecified in the problem;
equivalent formulations of it fill in the details in different ways.
Jaynes’ invariance condition bids us to assign equal
probabilities to equivalent propositions, reformulations of one
another that are arrived at by such admissible transformations of our
problem. Any probability assignment that meets this condition is
called an *invariant* assignment. Ideally, our problem will
have a unique invariant assignment. To be sure, things will not always
be ideal; but sometimes they are, in which case this is surely
progress on Bertrand-style problems.

And in any case, for many garden-variety problems such technical machinery will not be needed. Suppose I tell you that a prize is behind one of three doors, and you get to choose a door. This seems to be a paradigm case in which the principle of indifference works well: the probability that you choose the right door is 1/3. It seems implausible that we should worry about some reparametrization of the problem that would yield a different answer. To be sure, Bertrand-style problems caution us that there are limits to the principle of indifference. But arguably we must just be careful not to overstate its applicability.

How does the classical theory of probability fare with respect to our criteria of adequacy? Let us begin with admissibility. (Laplacean) classical probabilities obey non-negativity and normalization, but they are only finitely additive (de Finetti 1974). So they do not obey the full Kolmogorov probability calculus, but they provide an interpretation of the elementary theory.

Classical probabilities are ascertainable, assuming that the space of
possibilities can be determined in principle. They bear a relationship
to the credences of rational agents; the circularity concern, as we
saw above, is that the relationship is vacuous, and that rather than
*constraining* the credences of a rational agent in an
epistemically neutral position, they merely record them.

Without supplementation, the classical theory makes no contact with frequency information. However the coin happens to land in a sequence of trials, the possible outcomes remain the same. Indeed, even if we have strong empirical evidence that the coin is biased towards heads with probability, say, 0.6, it is hard to see how the unadorned classical theory can accommodate this fact — for what now are the ten possibilities, six of which are favorable to heads? Laplace does supplement the theory with his Rule of Succession: “Thus we find that an event having occurred successively any number of times, the probability that it will happen again the next time is equal to this number increased by unity divided by the same number, increased by two units.” (1951, 19) That is:

\[ Pr(\text{success on } N+1^{\text{st}}\text{ trial}\mid N\text{ consec. succeses}) = \frac{N+1}{N+2} \]
Thus, inductive learning is possible — though not by classical
probabilities *per se*, but rather thanks to this further rule.
And we must ask whether such learning can be captured once and for all
by such a simple formula, the same for all domains and events. We will
return to this question when we discuss the logical interpretation
below.

Science apparently invokes at various points probabilities that look
classical. Bose-Einstein statistics, Fermi-Dirac statistics, and
Maxwell-Boltzmann statistics each arise by considering the ways in
which particles can be assigned to states, and then applying the
principle of indifference to different subdivisions of the set of
alternatives, Bertrand-style. The trouble is that Bose-Einstein
statistics apply to some particles (e.g. photons) and not to others,
Fermi-Dirac statistics apply to different particles (e.g. electrons),
and Maxwell-Boltzmann statistics do not apply to any known particles.
None of this can be determined *a priori*, as the classical
interpretation would have it. Moreover, the classical theory purports
to yield probability assignments in the face of ignorance. But as Fine
(1973) writes:

If we are truly ignorant about a set of alternatives, then we are also ignorant about combinations of alternatives and about subdivisions of alternatives. However, the principle of indifference when applied to alternatives, or their combinations, or their subdivisions, yields different probability assignments (170).

This brings us to one of the chief points of controversy regarding the classical interpretation. Critics accuse the principle of indifference of extracting information from ignorance. Proponents reply that it rather codifies the way in which such ignorance should be epistemically managed — for anything other than an equal assignment of probabilities would represent the possession of some knowledge. Critics counter-reply that in a state of complete ignorance, it is better to assign imprecise probabilities (perhaps ranging over the entire [0, 1] interval), or to eschew the assignment of probabilities altogether.

### 3.2 The Logical/Evidential Interpretation

#### 3.2.1 The logical interpretation

Logical theories of probability retain the classical
interpretation’s idea that probabilities can be determined a
priori by an examination of the space of possibilities. However, they
generalize it in two important ways: the possibilities may be assigned
*unequal* weights, and probabilities can be computed whatever
the evidence may be, symmetrically balanced or not. Indeed, the
logical interpretation, in its various guises, seeks to encapsulate in
full generality the degree of support or confirmation that a piece of
evidence \(e\) confers upon a given hypothesis \(h\), which we may
write as \(c(h, e)\). In doing so, it can be regarded also as
generalizing deductive logic and its notion of implication, to a
complete theory of inference equipped with the notion of ‘degree
of implication’ that relates \(e\) to \(h\). It is often called
the theory of ‘inductive logic’, although this is a
misnomer: there is no requirement that \(e\) be in any sense
‘inductive’ evidence for \(h\). ‘Non-deductive
logic’ would be a better name, but this overlooks the fact that
deductive logic’s relations of implication and incompatibility
are also accommodated as extreme cases in which the confirmation
function takes the values 1 and 0 respectively. In any case, it is
significant that the logical interpretation provides a framework for
induction.

Early proponents of logical probability include Johnson (1921), Keynes
(1921), and Jeffreys (1939/1998). However, by far the most systematic
study of logical probability was by Carnap. His formulation of logical
probability begins with the construction of a formal language. In
(1950/1962) he considers a class of very simple languages consisting
of a finite number of logically independent monadic predicates (naming
properties) applied to countably many individual constants (naming
individuals) or variables, and the usual logical connectives. The
strongest (consistent) statements that can be made in a given language
describe all of the individuals in as much detail as the expressive
power of the language allows. They are conjunctions of complete
descriptions of each individual, each description itself a conjunction
containing exactly one occurrence (negated or unnegated) of each
predicate of the language. Call these strongest statements *state
descriptions*.

Any probability measure \(m(-)\) over the state descriptions automatically extends to a measure over all sentences, since each sentence is equivalent to a disjunction of state descriptions; m in turn induces a confirmation function \(c(-, -)\):

\[ c(h,e) = \frac{m(h \amp e)}{m(e)} \]
There are infinitely many candidates for \(m\), and hence \(c\), even
for very simple languages. Carnap argues for his favored measure
“\(m^*\)” by insisting that the only thing that
significantly distinguishes individuals from one another is some
qualitative difference, not just a difference in labeling. Call a
*structure description* a maximal set of state descriptions,
each of which can be obtained from another by some permutation of the
individual names. \(m^*\) assigns each structure description equal
measure, which in turn is divided equally among their constituent
state descriptions. It gives greater weight to homogenous state
descriptions than to heterogeneous ones, thus ‘rewarding’
uniformity among the individuals in accordance with putatively
reasonable inductive practice. The induced \(c^*\) allows inductive
learning from experience.

Consider, for example, a language that has three names, \(a\), \(b\) and \(c\), for individuals, and one predicate \(F\). For this language, the state descriptions are:

\[\begin{array}{crcrcr} 1. & Fa &\amp& Fb &\amp& Fc \\ 2. & \neg Fa &\amp& Fb &\amp& Fc \\ 3. & Fa &\amp& \neg Fb &\amp& Fc \\ 4. & Fa &\amp& Fb &\amp& \neg Fc \\ 5. & \neg Fa &\amp& \neg Fb &\amp& Fc \\ 6. & \neg Fa &\amp& Fb &\amp& \neg Fc \\ 7. & Fa &\amp& \neg Fb &\amp& \neg Fc \\ 8. & \neg Fa &\amp& \neg Fb &\amp& \neg Fc \\ \end{array}\]There are four structure descriptions:

\[\begin{align} \{1\}, &\text{ “Everything is }F\text{”;} \\ \{2, 3, 4\}, &\text{ “Two } F\text{s, one }\neg F\text{”;} \\ \{5, 6, 7\}, &\text{ “One } F\text{, two }\neg F\text{s”; and} \\ \{8\}, &\text{ “Everything is }\neg F\text{”;} \\ \end{align}\]The measure \(m^*\) assigns numbers to the state descriptions as follows: first, every structure description is assigned an equal weight, 1/4; then, each state description belonging to a given structure description is assigned an equal part of the weight assigned to the structure description:

\[\begin{array}{llll} \textit{State description} & \textit{Structure Description} & \textit{Weight} & \quad m^* \\ \left.\begin{array}{l} 1.\ Fa.Fb.Fc \end{array}\right. & \text{I. Everything is } F & 1/4 & \quad 1/4 \\ \left.\begin{array}{l} 2.\ \neg Fa.Fb.Fc\phantom{\neg} \\ 3.\ Fa.\neg Fb.Fc \\ 4.\ Fa.Fb.\neg Fc \end{array} \right\} & \text{II. Two } F\text{s, one }\neg F & 1/4 & \left\{\begin{array}{l} 1/12 \\ 1/12 \\ 1/12 \end{array}\right. \\ \left.\begin{array}{l} 5.\ \neg Fa.\neg Fb.Fc \\ 6.\ \neg Fa.Fb.\neg Fc \\ 7.\ Fa.\neg Fb.\neg Fc \end{array} \right\} & \text{III. One } F\text{, two }\neg F\text{s} & 1/4 & \left\{\begin{array}{l} 1/12 \\ 1/12 \\ 1/12 \end{array}\right. \\ \left.\begin{array}{l} 8.\ \neg Fa.\neg Fb.\neg Fc \end{array}\right. & \text{IV. Everything is } \neg F & 1/4 & \quad 1/4 \end{array}\]
Notice that \(m^*\) gives greater weight to the homogenous state
descriptions 1 and 8 than to the heterogeneous ones. This will
manifest itself in the inductive support that hypotheses can gain from
appropriate evidence statements. Consider the hypothesis statement \(h
= Fc\), true in 4 of the 8 state descriptions, with *a priori*
probability \(m^*(h) = 1/2\). Suppose we examine individual
“\(a\)” and find it has property \(F\) — call this
evidence \(e\). Intuitively, \(e\) is favorable (albeit weak)
inductive evidence for \(h\). We have: \(m^*(h \amp e) = 1/3,\)
\(m^*(e) = 1/2\), and hence

This is greater than the *a priori* probability \(m^*(h) =
1/2\), so the hypothesis has been confirmed. It can be shown that in
general \(m^*\) yields a degree of confirmation \(c^*\) that allows
learning from experience.

Note, however, that infinitely many confirmation functions, defined by suitable choices of the initial measure, allow learning from experience. We do not have yet a reason to think that \(c^*\) is the right choice. Carnap claims nevertheless that \(c^*\) stands out for being simple and natural.

He later generalizes his confirmation function to a continuum of
functions \(c_{\lambda}\). Define a *family* of predicates to
be a set of predicates such that, for each individual, exactly one
member of the set applies, and consider first-order languages
containing a finite number of families. Carnap (1963) focuses on the
special case of a language containing only one-place predicates. He
lays down a host of axioms concerning the confirmation function \(c\),
including those induced by the probability calculus itself, various
axioms of symmetry (for example, that \(c(h, e)\) remains unchanged
under permutations of individuals, and of predicates of any family),
and axioms that guarantee undogmatic inductive learning, and long-run
convergence to relative frequencies. They imply that, for a family
\(\{P_n\},\) \(n = 1, \ldots,k\) \((k \gt 2){:}\)

where \(\lambda\) is a positive real number. The higher the value of \(\lambda\), the less impact evidence has: induction from what is observed becomes progressively more swamped by a classical-style equal assignment to each of the \(k\) possibilities regarding individual \(s + 1\).

I turn to various objections to Carnap’s program that have been
offered in the literature, noting that this remains an area of lively
debate. (See Maher (2010) for rebuttals of some of these objections
and for defenses of the program; see Fitelson (2006) for an overall
assessment of the program.) Firstly, is there a correct setting of
\(\lambda\), or said another way, how ‘inductive’ should
the confirmation function be? The concern here is that any particular
setting of \(\lambda\) is arbitrary in a way that compromises
Carnap’s claim to be offering a *logical* notion of
probability. Also, it turns out that for any such setting, a universal
statement in an infinite universe always receives zero confirmation,
no matter what the (finite) evidence. Many find this counterintuitive,
since laws of nature with infinitely many instances can apparently be
confirmed. Earman (1992) discusses the prospects for avoiding the
unwelcome result.

Significantly, Carnap’s various axioms of symmetry are hardly logical truths. Moreover, Fine (1973, 202) argues that we cannot impose further symmetry constraints that are seemingly just as plausible as Carnap’s, on pain of inconsistency. Goodman (1955) taught us: that the future will resemble the past in some respect is trivial; that it will resemble the past in all respects is contradictory. And we may continue: that a probability assignment can be made to respect some symmetry is trivial; that one can be made to respect all symmetries is contradictory. This threatens the whole program of logical probability.

Another Goodmanian lesson is that inductive logic must be sensitive to the meanings of predicates, strongly suggesting that a purely syntactic approach such as Carnap’s is doomed. Scott and Krauss (1966) use model theory in their formulation of logical probability for richer and more realistic languages than Carnap’s. Still, finding a canonical language seems to many to be a pipe dream, at least if we want to analyze the “logical probability” of any argument of real interest — either in science, or in everyday life.

Logical probabilities are admissible. It is easily shown that they satisfy finite additivity, and given that they are defined on finite sets of sentences, the extension to countable additivity is trivial. Given a choice of language, the values of a given confirmation function are ascertainable; thus, if this language is rich enough for a given application, the relevant probabilities are ascertainable. The whole point of the theory of logical probability is to explicate ampliative inference, although given the apparent arbitrariness in the choice of language and in the setting of \(\lambda\) — thus, in the choice of confirmation function — one may wonder how well it achieves this. The problem of arbitrariness of the confirmation function also hampers the extent to which the logical interpretation can truly illuminate the connection between probabilities and frequencies.

The arbitrariness problem, moreover, stymies any compelling connection
between logical probabilities and rational credences. And a further
problem remains even after the confirmation function has been chosen:
if one’s credences are to be based on logical probabilities,
they must be relativized to an evidence statement, \(e\). Carnap
requires that \(e\) be one’s *total evidence*—the
maximally specific information at one’s disposal, the strongest
proposition of which one is certain. But perhaps learning does not
come in the form of such ‘bedrock’ propositions, as
Jeffrey (1992) has argued — maybe it rather involves a shift in
one’s subjective probabilities across a partition, without any
cell of the partition becoming certain. Then it may be that the
strongest proposition of which one is certain is expressed by a
tautology \(T\) — hardly an interesting notion of ‘total
evidence’.^{[4]}

In connection with the ‘applicability to science’ criterion, a point due to Lakatos is telling. By Carnap’s lights, the degree of confirmation of a hypothesis depends on the language in which the hypothesis is stated and over which the confirmation function is defined. But scientific progress often brings with it a change in scientific language (for example, the addition of new predicates and the deletion of old ones), and such a change will bring with it a change in the corresponding \(c\)-values. Thus, the growth of science may overthrow any particular confirmation theory. There is something of the snake eating its own tail here, since logical probability was supposed to explicate the confirmation of scientific theories.

We have seen that the later Carnap relaxed his earlier aspiration to
find a *unique* confirmation function, allowing a continuum of
such functions displaying a wide range of inductive cautiousness.
Various critics of logical probabilities believe that he did not go
far enough — that even his later systems constrain inductive
learning beyond what is rationally required. This recalls the classic
debate earlier in the 20^{th} century between Keynes, a famous
proponent of logical probabilities, and Ramsey, an equally famous
opponent. Ramsey (1926; 1990) was skeptical of there being any
non-trivial relations of logical probability: he said that he could
not discern them himself, and that others disagree about them. This
skepticism led him to formulate his enormously influential version of
the subjective interpretation of probability, to be discussed
shortly.

#### 3.2.2 The evidential interpretation

One might insist, however, that there are non-trivial probabilistic
*evidential* relations, even if they are not logical. It may
not be a matter of *logic* that the sun will probably rise
tomorrow, given our evidence, yet there still seems to be an objective
sense in which it probably will, given our evidence. In a crime
investigation, there may be a fact of the matter of how strongly the
available evidence supports the guilt of various suspects. This does
not seem to be a matter of logic—nor of physics, nor of what
anyone happens to think, nor of how the facts in the actual world turn
out. It seems to be a matter, rather, of *evidential*
probabilities.

More generally, Timothy Williamson (2000, 209) writes:

Given a scientific hypothesis \(h\), we can intelligibly ask: how probable is \(h\) on present evidence? We are asking how much the evidence tells for or against the hypothesis. We are not asking what objective physical chance or frequency of truth \(h\) has. A proposed law of nature may be quite improbable on present evidence even though its objective chance of truth is 1. That is quite consistent with the obvious point that the evidence bearing on \(h\) may include evidence about objective chances or frequencies. Equally, in asking how probable \(h\) is on present evidence, we are not asking about anyone’s actual degree of belief in \(h\). Present evidence may tell strongly against \(h\), even though everyone is irrationally certain of \(h\).

Williamson identifies one’s evidence with what one knows. However, one might adopt other conceptions of evidence, and one might even take evidential probabilities to link any two propositions whatsoever. Williamson maintains that evidential probabilities are not logical—in particular, they are not syntactically definable. He assumes an initial probability distribution \(P\), which “measures something like the intrinsic plausibility of hypotheses prior to investigation” (211). The evidential probability of \(h\) on total evidence \(e\) is then given by \(P(h\mid e)\).

Are evidential probabilities admissible? Williamson says that “P will be assumed to satisfy a standard set of axioms for the probability calculus” (211). So admissibility is built into the very specification of P. Are they ascertainable? He writes:

What, then, are probabilities on evidence? We should resist demands for an operational definition; such demands are as damaging in the philosophy of science as they are in science itself. Sometimes the best policy is to go ahead and theorize with a vague but powerful notion. One’s original intuitive understanding becomes refined as a result, although rarely to the point of a definition in precise pretheoretic terms. That policy will be pursued here. (211)

This might be understood as rejecting ascertainability as a criterion of adequacy.

However, some authors are skeptical that there are such things as
evidential probabilities—e.g. Joyce (2004). He also argues that
there is more than one sense in which evidence tells for or against a
hypothesis. Bacon (2014) allows that there are such things as
evidential probabilities, but he argues that various puzzling results
follow from Williamson’s account of them, in virtue of its
identifying evidence with knowledge. Moreover, one may resist demands
for an *operational* definition of evidential probabilities,
while seeking some further understanding of them in terms of other
theoretical concepts. For example, perhaps \(P(h\mid e)\) is the
subjective probability that a perfectly rational agent with evidence
\(e\) would assign to \(h\)? Williamson argues against this proposal;
Eder (2023) defends it, and she offers several ways of interpreting
evidential probabilities in terms of ideal subjective probabilities.
If some such way is tenable, evidential probabilities would presumably
enjoy whatever applicability that such subjective probabilities have.
This brings us to our next interpretation of probability.

### 3.3 The Subjective Interpretation

#### 3.3.1 Probability as degree of belief

Nearly a century before Ramsey, De Morgan wrote: “By degree of
probability, we really mean, or ought to mean, degree of belief”
(1847, 172). According to the *subjective* (or
*personalist* or *Bayesian*) interpretation,
probabilities are degrees of confidence, or credences, or partial
beliefs of suitable agents. Thus, we really have *many*
interpretations of probability here— as many as there are
suitable agents. What makes an agent suitable? What we might call
*unconstrained subjectivism* places no constraints on the
agents — anyone goes, and hence anything goes. Various studies
by psychologists are taken to show that people commonly violate the
usual probability calculus in spectacular ways. (See, e.g., several
articles in Kahneman et al. 1982.) We clearly do not have here an
admissible interpretation (with respect to any probability calculus),
since there is no limit to what degrees of confidence agents might
have.

More promising, however, is the thought that the suitable agents must
be, in a strong sense, *rational*. Following Ramsey, various
subjectivists have wanted to assimilate probability to logic by
portraying probability as “the logic of partial belief”
(1926; 1990, 53 and 55). A rational agent is required to be logically
consistent, now taken in a broad sense. These subjectivists argue that
this implies that the agent obeys the axioms of probability (although
perhaps with only finite additivity), and that subjectivism is thus
(to this extent) admissible. Before we can present this argument, we
must say more about what degrees of belief are.

#### 3.3.2 The betting analysis and the Dutch Book argument

Subjective probabilities have long been analyzed in terms of betting behavior. Here is a classic statement by de Finetti (1980):

Let us suppose that an individual is obliged to evaluate the rate \(p\) at which he would be ready to exchange the possession of an arbitrary sum \(S\) (positive or negative) dependent on the occurrence of a given event \(E\), for the possession of the sum \(pS\); we will say by definition that this number \(p\) is the measure of the degree of probability attributed by the individual considered to the event \(E\), or, more simply, that \(p\) is the probability of \(E\) (according to the individual considered; this specification can be implicit if there is no ambiguity). (62)

This boils down to the following analysis:

Your degree of belief in \(E\) is \(p\) iff \(p\) units of utility is the price at which you would buy or sell a bet that pays 1 unit of utility if \(E\), 0 if not \(E\).

The analysis presupposes that, for any \(E\), there is exactly one
such price — let’s call this your *fair price* for
the bet on \(E\). This presupposition may fail. There may be no such
price — you may refuse to bet on \(E\) at all (perhaps unless
coerced, in which case your genuine opinion about \(E\) may not be
revealed), or your selling price may differ from your buying price, as
may occur if your probability for \(E\) is imprecise. There may be
more than one fair price — you may find a range of such prices
acceptable, as may also occur if your probability for \(E\) is
imprecise. For now, however, let us waive these concerns, and turn to
an important argument that uses the betting analysis purportedly to
show that rational degrees of belief must conform to the probability
calculus (with at least finite additivity).

A *Dutch book* is a series of bets bought and sold at prices
that collectively guarantee loss, however the world turns out. Suppose
we identify your credences with your betting prices. Ramsey notes, and
it can be easily proven (e.g., Skyrms 1984), that if your credences
violate the probability calculus, then you are susceptible to a Dutch
book—this is the *Dutch Book Theorem*. For example,
suppose that you violate the additivity axiom by assigning \(P(A \cup
B) \lt P(A) + P(B)\), where \(A\) and \(B\) are mutually exclusive.
Then a cunning bettor could buy from you a bet on \(A \cup B\) for
\(P(A \cup B)\) units, and sell you bets on \(A\) and \(B\)
individually for \(P(A)\) and \(P(B)\) units respectively. He pockets
an initial profit of \(P(A) + P(B) - P(A \cup B)\), and retains it
whatever happens. Ramsey offers the following influential gloss:
“If anyone’s mental condition violated these laws [of the
probability calculus], his choice would depend on the precise form in
which the options were offered him, which would be absurd.”
(1990, 78) The Dutch Book argument concludes: rationality requires
your credences to obey the probability calculus.

The argument is incomplete as it stands. As Hájek (2008, 2009b)
observes, the Dutch Book Theorem leaves open the possibility that you
are susceptible to a Dutch Book whether or not your credences violate
the probability calculus—perhaps we are all susceptible? Equally
important, and often neglected, is the converse theorem that
establishes how you can avoid such a predicament. If your subjective
probabilities conform to the probability calculus, then no Dutch book
can be made against you (Kemeny 1955); your probability assignments
are then said to be *coherent*. Williamson (1999) extends the
Dutch Book argument to countable additivity: if your credences violate
countable additivity, then you are susceptible to a Dutch book (with
infinitely many bets). Conformity to the full probability calculus
thus seems to be necessary and sufficient for
coherence.^{[5]}
We thus have an argument that rational credences provide an
interpretation of the full probability calculus, and thus an
admissible interpretation. Note, however, that de Finetti—the
arch subjectivist and proponent of the Dutch Book argument—was
an opponent of countable additivity (e.g. in his 1974). See
Hájek (2009b), Pettigrew (2020) and the entry on
Dutch Book arguments
for various objections to Dutch Book arguments for conformity to the
probability calculus and for other putative norms on credences.

But let us return to the betting analysis of credences. It is an
attempt to make good on Ramsey’s idea that probability “is
a measurement of belief *qua* basis of action” (67).
While he regards the method of measuring an agent’s credences by
her betting behavior as “fundamentally sound” (68), he
recognizes that it has its limitations.

The betting analysis gives an operational definition of subjective probability, and indeed it inherits some of the difficulties of operationalism in general, and of behaviorism in particular. For example, you may have reason to misrepresent your true opinion, or to feign having opinions that in fact you lack, by making the relevant bets (perhaps to exploit an incoherence in someone else’s betting prices). Moreover, as Ramsey points out, placing the very bet may alter your state of opinion. Trivially, it does so regarding matters involving the bet itself (e.g., you suddenly increase your probability that you have just placed a bet). Less trivially, placing the bet may change the world, and hence your opinions, in other ways. For example, betting at high stakes on the proposition ‘I will sleep well tonight’ may suddenly turn you into an insomniac! And then the bet may concern an event such that, were it to occur, you would no longer value the pay-off the same way. (During the August 11, 1999 solar eclipse in the UK, a man placed a bet that would have paid a million pounds if the world came to an end.)

These problems stem largely from taking literally the notion of
entering into a bet on \(E\), with its corresponding payoffs. The
problems may be avoided by identifying your degree of belief in a
proposition with the betting price you regard as fair, whether or not
you enter into such a bet; it corresponds to the betting odds that you
believe confer no advantage or disadvantage to either side of the bet
(Howson and Urbach 1993). At your fair price, you should be
indifferent between taking either
side.^{[6]}

De Finetti speaks of “an arbitrary sum” as the prize of the bet on \(E\). The sum had better be potentially infinitely divisible, or else probability measurements will be precise only up to the level of ‘grain’ of the potential prizes. For example, a sum that can be divided into only 100 parts will leave probability measurements imprecise beyond the second decimal place, conflating probabilities that should be distinguished (e.g., those of a logical contradiction and of ‘a fair coin lands heads 8 times in a row’). More significantly, if utility is not a linear function of such sums, then the size of the prize will make a difference to the putative probability: winning a dollar means more to a pauper more than it does to Bill Gates, and this may be reflected in their betting behaviors in ways that have nothing to do with their genuine probability assignments. De Finetti responds to this problem by suggesting that the prizes be kept small; that, however, only creates the opposite problem that agents may be reluctant to bother about trifles, as Ramsey points out.

Better, then, to let the prizes be measured in utilities: after all, utility is infinitely divisible, and utility is a linear function of utility. While we’re at it, we should adopt a more liberal notion of betting. After all, there is a sense in which every decision is a bet, as Ramsey observed.

#### 3.3.3 Probabilities and utilities

Utilities (desirabilities) of outcomes, their probabilities, and
rational preferences are all intimately linked. The *Port Royal
Logic* (Arnauld, 1662) showed how utilities and probabilities
together determine rational preferences; de Finetti’s betting
analysis derives probabilities from utilities and rational
preferences; von Neumann and Morgenstern (1944) derive utilities from
probabilities and rational preferences. And most remarkably, Ramsey
(1926) (and later, Savage 1954 and Jeffrey 1966) derives *both*
probabilities *and* utilities from rational preferences
alone.

First, he defines a proposition to be *ethically neutral*
— relative to an agent — if the agent is indifferent
between the proposition’s truth and falsehood. The agent
doesn’t care about the ethically neutral proposition as such
— it may be a means to an end that he might care about, but it
has no intrinsic value. (The result of a coin toss is typically like
this for most of us.) Now, there is a simple test for determining
whether, for a given agent, an ethically neutral proposition \(N\) has
probability 1/2. Suppose that the agent prefers \(A\) to \(B\). Then
\(N\) has probability 1/2 iff the agent is indifferent between the
gambles:

Ramsey assumes that it does not matter what the candidates for \(A\) and \(B\) are. We may assign arbitrarily to \(A\) and \(B\) any two real numbers \(u(A)\) and \(u(B)\) such that \(u(A) \gt u(B)\), thought of as the desirabilities of \(A\) and \(B\) respectively. Having done this for the one arbitrarily chosen pair \(A\) and \(B\), the utilities of all other propositions are determined.

Given various assumptions about the richness of the preference space, and certain ‘consistency assumptions’, he can define a real-valued utility function of the outcomes \(A, B\), etc — in fact, various such functions will represent the agent’s preferences. He is then able to define equality of differences in utility for any outcomes over which the agent has preferences. It turns out that ratios of utility-differences are invariant — the same whichever representative utility function we choose. This fact allows Ramsey to define degrees of belief as ratios of such differences. For example, suppose the agent is indifferent between \(A\), and the gamble “\(B\) if \(X, C\) otherwise”. Then it follows from considerations of expected utility that her degree of belief in \(X, P(X)\), is given by:

\[ P(X) = \frac{u(A) - u(C)}{u(B) - u(C)} \]Ramsey shows that degrees of belief so derived obey the probability calculus (with finite additivity).

Savage (1954) likewise derives probabilities and utilities from
preferences among options that are constrained by certain putative
‘consistency’ axioms. For a given set of such preferences,
he generates a class of utility functions, each a positive linear
transformation of the other (i.e. of the form \(U_1 = aU_2 + b\),
where \(a \gt 0)\), and a unique probability function. Together these
are said to ‘represent’ the agent’s preferences, and
the result that they do so is called a ‘representation
theorem’. Jeffrey (1966) refines Savage’s approach. The
result is a theory of decision according to which rational choice
maximizes ‘expected utility’, a certain
probability-weighted average of utilities. (See Buchak 2016 for more
discussion.) Some of the difficulties with the behavioristic betting
analysis of degrees of belief can now be resolved by moving to an
analysis of degrees of belief that is functionalist in spirit. For
example, according to Lewis (1986a, 1994a), an agent’s credences
are represented by the probability function belonging to a utility
function/probability function pair that best rationalizes her
behavioral dispositions, rationality being given a decision-theoretic
analysis. Representation theorems (in one form or another) underpin
*representation theorem arguments* that rational agents’
credences obey the probability calculus: their preferences obey the
requisite axioms, and thus their credences are representable that way.
However, as well as being representable probabilistically, such
agents’ credences are representable
*non-probabilistically*; why should the probabilistic
representation be privileged? See Zynda (2000), Hájek (2008),
and Meacham and Weisberg (2011) for this and other objections to
representation theorem arguments.

There is a deep issue that underlies all of these accounts of subjective probability. They all presuppose the existence of necessary connections between desire-like states and belief-like states, rendered explicit in the connections between preferences and probabilities. In response, one might insist that such connections are at best contingent, and indeed can be imagined to be absent. Think of an idealized Zen Buddhist monk, devoid of any preferences, who dispassionately surveys the world before him, forming beliefs but no desires. It could be replied that such an agent is not so easily imagined after all — even if the monk does not value worldly goods, he will still prefer some things to others (e.g., truth to falsehood).

Once desires enter the picture, they may also have unwanted consequences. Again, how does one separate an agent’s enjoyment or disdain for gambling from the value she places on the gamble itself? Ironically, a remark that Ramsey makes in his critique of the betting analysis seems apposite here: “The difficulty is like that of separating two different co-operating forces” (1990, 68). See Eriksson and Hájek (2007) for further criticism of preference-based accounts of credence.

The betting analysis makes subjective probabilities ascertainable to the extent that an agent’s betting dispositions are ascertainable. The derivation of them from preferences makes them ascertainable to the extent that his or her preferences are known. However, it is unclear that an agent’s full set of preferences is ascertainable even to himself or herself. Here a lot of weight may need to be placed on the ‘in principle’ qualification in the ascertainability criterion. The expected utility representation makes it virtually analytic that an agent should be guided by probabilities — after all, the probabilities are her own, and they are fed into the formula for expected utility in order to determine what it is rational for her to do. So the applicability to rational decision criterion is clearly met.

#### 3.3.4 Orthodox Bayesianism, and further constraints on rational credences

But do they function as a *good* guide? Here it is useful to
distinguish different versions of subjectivism. *Orthodox
Bayesians* in the style of de Finetti recognize no rational
constraints on subjective probabilities beyond:

- conformity to the probability calculus, and
- a rule for updating probabilities in the face of new evidence,
known as
*conditioning*or*conditionalizing*. An agent with probability function \(P_1\), who becomes certain of a piece of evidence \(E\) (and nothing stronger), should shift to a new probability function \(P_2\) related to \(P_1\) by:

This is a permissive epistemology, licensing doxastic states that we would normally call crazy. Thus, you could assign probability 1 to this sentence ruling the universe, while upholding such extreme subjectivism.

Some subjectivists impose the further rationality requirement of
*regularity*: anything that is possible (in an appropriate
sense) gets assigned positive probability. It is advocated by authors
such as Jeffreys (1939/1998), Kemeny (1955), Edwards et al. (1963),
Shimony (1970), and Stalnaker (1970). It is meant to capture a form of
open-mindedness and responsiveness to evidence. But then, perhaps
unintuitively, someone who assigns probability 0.999 to this sentence
ruling the universe can be judged rational, while someone who assigns
it probability 0 is judged irrational. See, e.g., Levi (1978) for
further opposition to regularity.

Probabilistic coherence plays much the same role for degrees of belief
that *consistency* plays for ordinary, all-or-nothing beliefs.
What an extreme subjectivist, even one who demands regularity, lacks
is an analogue of *truth*, some yardstick for distinguishing
the ‘veridical’ probability assignments from the rest
(such as the 0.999 one above), some way in which probability
assignments are answerable to the world. It seems, then, that the
subjectivist needs something more.

And various subjectivists offer more. Having isolated the
“logic” of partial belief as conformity to the probability
calculus, Ramsey goes on to discuss what makes a degree of belief in a
proposition *reasonable*. After canvassing several possible
answers, he settles upon one that focuses on *habits* of
opinion formation — “e.g. the habit of proceeding from the
opinion that a toadstool is yellow to the opinion that it is
unwholesome” (50). He then asks, for a person with this habit,
what probability it would be best for him to have that a given yellow
toadstool is unwholesome, and he answers that “it will in
general be equal to the proportion of yellow toadstools which are in
fact unwholesome” (1990, 91). This resonates with more recent
proposals (e.g., van Fraassen 1984, Shimony 1988) for evaluating
degrees of belief according to how closely they match the
corresponding relative frequencies — in the jargon, how well
*calibrated* they are. Since relative frequencies obey the
axioms of probability (up to finite additivity), it is thought that
rational credences, which strive to track them, should do so
also.^{[7]}

However, rational credences may strive to track various things. For example, we are often guided by the opinions of experts. We consult our doctors on medical matters, our weather forecasters on meteorological matters, and so on. Gaifman (1988) coins the terms “expert assignment” and “expert probability” for a probability assignment that a given agent strives to track: “The mere knowledge of the [expert] assignment will make the agent adopt it as his subjective probability” (193). This idea may be codified as follows:

\[\begin{align} \tag{Expert} &P(A\mid pr(A)=x) = x, \\ &\text{for all } x \text{ where this is defined}. \end{align}\]where ‘\(P\)’ is the agent’s subjective probability function, and ‘\(pr(A)\)’ is the assignment that the agent regards as expert. For example, if you regard the local weather forecaster as an expert on your local weather, and she assigns probability 0.1 to it raining tomorrow, then you may well follow suit:

\[ P(\textit{rain}\mid pr(\textit{rain}) = 0.1) = 0.1 \]
More generally, we might speak of an entire probability function as
being such a guide for an agent over a specified set of propositions.
Van Fraassen (1989, 198) gives us this definition: “If \(P\) is
my personal probability function, then \(q\) is an *expert function
for me concerning* family \(F\) of propositions exactly if \(P(A
\mid q(A) = x) = x\) for all propositions \(A\) in family
\(F\).”

Let us define a *universal expert function* *for* a
given rational agent as one that would guide *all* of that
agent’s probability assignments in this way: an expert function
for the agent concerning all propositions. van Fraassen (1984, 1995a),
following Goldstein (1983), argues that an agent’s *future
probability functions* are universal expert functions for that
agent. He enshrines this idea in his *Reflection Principle*,
where *P* is the agent’s probability and \(P_{t}\) is her
function at a later time \(t\):

The principle encapsulates a certain demand for ‘diachronic coherence’ imposed by rationality. Van Fraassen defends it with a ‘diachronic’ Dutch Book argument (one that considers bets placed at different times), and by analogizing violations of it to the sort of pragmatic inconsistency that one finds in Moore’s paradox.

We may go still further. There may be universal expert functions for
large classes of rational agents, and perhaps all of them. The
*Principle of Direct Probability* regards the *relative
frequency* function as a universal expert function for all
rational agents; we have already seen the importance that proponents
of calibration place on it. Let \(A\) be an event-type, and let
*relfreq*\((A)\) be the relative frequency of \(A\) (in some
suitable reference class). Then for any rational agent with
probability function \(P\), we have (cf. Hacking 1965):

Lewis (1980) posits a similar expert role for the *objective chance
function, ch*, for all rational *initial* credences in his
*Principal Principle* (here
simplified^{[8]}):

‘\(C\)’ denotes the ‘ur’ credence function of
an agent at the beginning of enquiry. This is an idealization that
ensures that the agent does not have any “inadmissible”
evidence that bears on \(A\) without bearing on the chance of \(A\).
For example, a rational agent who somehow knows that a particular coin
toss lands heads is surely *not* required to assign

Rather, this conditional probability should be 1, since she has information relevant to the outcome ‘heads’ that trumps its chance. The other expert principles surely need to be suitably qualified – otherwise they face analogous counterexamples. Yet strangely, the Principal Principle is the only expert principle about which concerns about inadmissible evidence have been raised in the literature.

I will say more about relative frequencies and chance shortly.

The ultimate expert, presumably, is the *truth* function
— the function that assigns 1 to all the true propositions and 0
to all the false ones. Knowledge of its values should surely trump
knowledge of the values assigned by human experts (including
one’s future selves), frequencies, or chances. Note that for any
putative expert \(q\),

— the truth of \(A\) overrides anything the expert might say. So
all of the proposed expert probabilities above should really be
regarded as defeasible. Joyce (1998) portrays the rational agent as
estimating truth values, seeking to minimize a measure of distance
between them and her probability assignments—that is, to
maximize the *accuracy* of those assignments. Generalizing a
theorem of de Finetti’s (1974), he shows that for any measure of
distance that satisfies certain intuitive properties, any agent who
violates the probability axioms could serve this epistemic goal better
by obeying them instead, however the world turns out. In short,
non-probabilistic credences are *accuracy-dominated* by
probabilistic credences. This provides a “non-pragmatic”
argument for probabilism (in contrast to the Dutch Book and
representation theorem arguments) for finite domains. Nielsen (2023)
extends a related accuracy argument by Predd et al. (2009), with
different conditions on accuracy measures, to arbitrarily large
domains.

There are some unifying themes in these putative constraints on subjective probability. An agent’s degrees of belief determine her estimates of certain quantities: the values of bets, or the desirabilities of gambles more generally, or the probability assignments of various ‘experts’ — humans, relative frequencies, objective chances, or truth values. The laws of probability then are claimed to be constraints on these estimates: putative necessary conditions for minimizing her ‘losses’ in a broad sense, be they monetary, or measured by distances from the assignments of these experts.

#### 3.3.5 Objective Bayesianism

We have been gradually adding more and more constraints on rational
credences, putatively demanded by rationality. Recall that Carnap
first assumed that there was a unique confirmation function, and then
relaxed this assumption to allow a plurality of such functions. We now
seem to be heading in the opposite direction: starting with the
extremely permissive orthodox Bayesianism, we are steadily reducing
the class of rationally permissible credence functions. So far the
constraints that we have admitted have not been especially
*evidence*-driven. *Objective Bayesians* maintain that a
rational agent’s credences are largely determined by her
evidence.

How large is “largely”? The lines of demarcation are not
sharp, and subjective Bayesianism may be regarded as a somewhat
indeterminate region on a spectrum of views that morph into objective
Bayesianism. At one end lies an extreme form of subjective
Bayesianism, according to which rational credences are constrained
only by the probability calculus (and updating by conditionalization).
At the other of the spectrum lies an extreme form of objective
Bayesianism, according to which rational probabilities are constrained
to the point of uniqueness by one’s evidence—we may call
this *the Uniqueness Thesis*. But both objective Bayesians and
subjective Bayesians may adopt less extreme positions, and typically
do. For example, Jon Williamson (2010) is an objective Bayesian, but
not an extreme one. He adds to the probability calculus the
constraints of being calibrated with evidence, and otherwise
equivocating between basic outcomes, especially appealing to versions
of maximum entropy. As such, his view is a descendant of the classical
interpretation and its generalization due to Jaynes.

### 3.4 Frequency Interpretations

Gamblers, actuaries and scientists have long understood that relative
frequencies bear an intimate relationship to probabilities. Frequency
interpretations posit the most intimate relationship of all: identity.
Thus, we might identify the probability of ‘heads’ on a
certain coin with the number of heads in a suitable sequence of tosses
of the coin, divided by the total number of tosses. A simple version
of frequentism, which we will call *finite frequentism*,
attaches probabilities to events or attributes in a finite reference
class in such a straightforward manner:

the probability of an attribute A in a finite reference class B is the relative frequency of actual occurrences of A within B.

Thus, finite frequentism bears certain structural similarities to the
classical interpretation, insofar as it gives equal weight to each
member of a set of events, simply counting how many of them are
‘favorable’ as a proportion of the total. The crucial
difference, however, is that where the classical interpretation
counted all the *possible* outcomes of a given experiment,
finite frequentism counts *actual* outcomes. It is thus
congenial to those with empiricist scruples. It was developed by Venn
(1876), who in his discussion of the proportion of births of males and
females, concludes: “probability *is* nothing but that
proportion” (p. 84, his
emphasis).^{[9]})
Finite frequentism is often assumed, tacitly or explicitly, in
statistics and in the sciences more generally.

Finite frequentism gives an operational definition of probability, and
its problems begin there. For example, just as we want to allow that
our thermometers could be ill-calibrated, and could thus give
misleading measurements of temperature, so we want to allow that our
‘measurements’ of probabilities via frequencies could be
misleading, as when a fair coin lands heads 9 out of 10 times. More
than that, it seems to be built into the very notion of probability
that such misleading results can arise. Indeed, in many cases,
misleading results are guaranteed. Starting with a degenerate case:
according to the finite frequentist, a coin that is never tossed, and
that thus yields no actual outcomes whatsoever, lacks a probability
for heads altogether; yet a coin that is never measured does not
thereby lack a diameter. Perhaps even more troubling, a coin that is
tossed exactly once yields a relative frequency of heads of either 0
or 1, whatever its bias. Or we can imagine a unique radiocative atom
whose probabilities of decaying at various times obey a continuous law
(e.g. exponential); yet according to finite frequentism, with
probability 1 it decays at the exact time that it *actually*
does, for its relative frequency of doing so is 1/1. Famous enough to
merit a name of its own, these are instances of the so-called
‘problem of the single case’. In fact, many events are
most naturally regarded as not merely unrepeated, but in a strong
sense *unrepeatable* — the 2020 presidential election,
the final game of the 2019 NBA play-offs, the Civil War,
Kennedy’s assassination, certain events in the very early
history of the universe, and so on. Nonetheless, it seems natural to
think of non-extreme probabilities attaching to some, and perhaps all,
of them. Worse still, some cosmologists regard it as a genuinely
chancy matter whether our universe is open or closed (apparently
certain quantum fluctuations could, in principle, tip it one way or
the other), yet whatever it is, it is ‘single-case’ in the
strongest possible sense.

The problem of the single case is particularly striking, but we really
have a sequence of related problems: ‘the problem of the double
case’, ‘the problem of the triple case’ …
Every coin that is tossed exactly twice can yield only the relative
frequencies 0, 1/2 and 1, whatever its bias… According to
actual frequentism, it is an analytic truth that every coin that is
tossed an odd number of times is biased. A finite reference class of
size \(n\), however large \(n\) is, can only produce relative
frequencies at a certain level of ‘grain’, namely \(1/n\).
Among other things, this rules out irrational-valued probabilities;
yet our best physical theories say otherwise. Furthermore, there is a
sense in which any of these problems can be transformed into the
problem of the single case. Suppose that we toss a coin a thousand
times. We can regard this as a *single* trial of a
thousand-tosses-of-the-coin experiment. Yet we do not want to be
committed to saying that *that* experiment yields its actual
result with probability 1.

The problem of the single case is that the finite frequentist fails to
see intermediate probabilities in various places where others do.
There is also the converse problem: the frequentist sees intermediate
probabilities in various places where others do not. Our world has
myriad different entities, with myriad different attributes. We can
group them into still more sets of objects, and then ask with which
relative frequencies various attributes occur in these sets. Many such
relative frequencies will be intermediate; the finite frequentist
automatically identifies them with intermediate probabilities. But it
would seem that whether or not they are genuine
*probabilities*, as opposed to mere tallies, depends on the
case at hand. Bare ratios of attributes among sets of disparate
objects may lack the sort of modal force that one might expect from
probabilities. I belong to the reference class consisting of myself,
the Eiffel Tower, the southernmost sandcastle on Santa Monica Beach,
and Mt Everest. Two of these four objects are less than 7 feet tall, a
relative frequency of 1/2; moreover, we could easily extend this
class, preserving this relative frequency (or, equally easily, not).
Yet it would be odd to say that my *probability* of being less
than 7 feet tall, relative to this reference class, is 1/2, although
it is perfectly acceptable (if uninteresting) to say that 1/2 of the
objects in the reference class are less than 7 feet tall.

Some frequentists (notably Venn 1876, Reichenbach 1949, and von Mises
1957 among others), partly in response to some of the problems above,
have gone on to consider *infinite* reference classes,
identifying probabilities with *limiting* relative frequencies
of events or attributes therein. Thus, we require an infinite sequence
of trials in order to define such probabilities. But what if the
actual world does not provide an infinite sequence of trials of a
given experiment? Indeed, that appears to be the norm, and perhaps
even the rule. In that case, we are to identify probability with a
*hypothetical* or *counterfactual* limiting relative
frequency. We are to imagine hypothetical infinite extensions of an
actual sequence of trials; probabilities are then what the limiting
relative frequencies *would be* if the sequence were so
extended. We might thus call this interpretation *hypothetical
frequentism*:

the probability of an attribute A in a reference class B is the value the limiting relative frequency of occurrences of A within B would be if B were infinite.

Note that at this point we have left empiricism behind. A modal element has been injected into frequentism with this invocation of a counterfactual; moreover, the counterfactual may involve a radical departure from the way things actually are, one that may even require the breaking of laws of nature. (Think what it would take for the coin in my pocket, which has only been tossed once, to be tossed infinitely many times — never wearing out, and never running short of people willing to toss it!) One may wonder, moreover, whether there is always — or ever — a fact of the matter of what such counterfactual relative frequencies are.

Limiting relative frequencies, we have seen, must be relativized to a
sequence of trials. Herein lies another difficulty. Consider an
infinite sequence of the results of tossing a coin, as it might be H,
T, H, H, H, T, H, T, T, … Suppose for definiteness that the
corresponding relative frequency sequence for heads, which begins 1/1,
1/2, 2/3, 3/4, 4/5, 4/6, 5/7, 5/8, 5/9, …, converges to 1/2. By
suitably reordering these results, we can make the sequence converge
to any value in [0, 1] that we like. (If this is not obvious, consider
how the relative frequency of even numbers among positive integers,
which intuitively ‘should’ converge to 1/2, can instead be
made to converge to 1/4 by reordering the integers with the even
numbers in every fourth place, as follows: 1, 3, 5, 2, 7, 9, 11, 4,
13, 15, 17, 6, …) To be sure, there may be something natural
about the ordering of the tosses as given — for example, it may
be their *temporal* ordering. But there may be more than one
natural ordering. Imagine the tosses taking place on a train that
shunts backwards and forwards on tracks that are oriented west-east.
Then the *spatial* ordering of the results from west to east
could look very different. Why should one ordering be privileged over
others?

A well-known objection to any version of frequentism is that
*relative* frequencies must be *relativised* to a
reference class. Consider a probability concerning myself that I care
about — say, my probability of living to age 80. I belong to the
class of males, the class of non-smokers, the class of philosophy
professors who have two vowels in their surname, … Presumably
the relative frequency of those who live to age 80 varies across (most
of) these reference classes. What, then, is my probability of living
to age 80? It seems that there is no single frequentist answer.
Instead, there is my probability-qua-male, my
probability-qua-non-smoker, my probability-qua-male-non-smoker, and so
on. This is an example of the so-called *reference class
problem* for frequentism (although it can be argued that analogues
of the problem arise for the other interpretations as
well^{[10]}).
And as we have seen in the previous paragraph, the problem is only
compounded for limiting relative frequencies: probabilities must be
relativized not merely to a reference class, but to a sequence within
the reference class. We might call this the *reference sequence
problem.*

The beginnings of a solution to this problem would be to restrict our
attention to sequences of a certain kind, those with certain desirable
properties. For example, there are sequences for which the limiting
relative frequency of a given attribute does not exist; Reichenbach
thus excludes such sequences. Von Mises (1957) gives us a more
thoroughgoing restriction to what he calls *collectives*
— hypothetical infinite sequences of attributes (possible
outcomes) of specified experiments that meet certain requirements.
Call a *place-selection* an effectively specifiable method of
selecting indices of members of the sequence, such that the selection
or not of the index \(i\) depends at most on the first \(i - 1\)
attributes. Von Mises imposes these axioms:

Axiom of Convergence:the limiting relative frequency of any attribute exists.

Axiom of Randomness:the limiting relative frequency of each attribute in a collective \(\omega\) is the same in any infinite subsequence of \(\omega\) which is determined by a place selection.

The probability of an attribute \(A\), relative to a collective
\(\omega\), is then defined as the limiting relative frequency of
\(A\) in \(\omega\). Note that a constant sequence such as H, H, H,
…, in which the limiting relative frequency is the same in
*any* infinite subsequence, trivially satisfies the axiom of
randomness. This puts some strain on the terminology — offhand,
such sequences appear to be as *non*-random as they come
— although to be sure it is desirable that probabilities be
assigned even in such sequences. Be that as it may, there is a
parallel between the role of the axiom of randomness in von
Mises’ theory and the principle of maximum entropy in the
classical theory: both attempt to capture a certain notion of
disorder.

Collectives are abstract mathematical objects that are not empirically
instantiated, but that are nonetheless posited by von Mises to explain
the stabilities of relative frequencies in the behavior of actual
sequences of outcomes of a repeatable random experiment. Church (1940)
renders precise the notion of a place selection as a recursive
function. Nevertheless, the reference sequence problem remains:
probabilities must always be relativized to a collective, and for a
given attribute such as ‘heads’ there are infinitely many.
Von Mises embraces this consequence, insisting that the notion of
probability only makes sense relative to a collective. In particular,
he regards single case probabilities as nonsense: “We can say
nothing about the probability of death of an individual even if we
know his condition of life and health in detail. The phrase
‘probability of death’, when it refers to a single person,
has no meaning at all for us” (11). Some critics believe that
rather than solving the problem of the single case, this merely
ignores it. And note that von Mises drastically understates the
commitments of his theory: by his lights, the phrase
‘probability of death’ also has no meaning at all when it
refers to a million people, or a billion, or any finite number —
after all, collectives are *infinite*. More generally, it seems
that von Mises’ theory has the unwelcome consequence that
probability statements never have meaning in the real world, for
apparently all sequences of attributes are finite.

Let us see how the frequentist interpretations fare according to our
criteria of adequacy. Finite relative frequencies of course satisfy
finite additivity. In a finite reference class, only finitely many
events can occur, so only finitely many events can have positive
relative frequency. In that case, countable additivity is satisfied
somewhat trivially: all but finitely many terms in the infinite sum
will be 0. Limiting relative frequencies violate countable additivity
(de Finetti 1972, §5.22). Indeed, the domain of definition of
limiting relative frequency is not even a field, let alone a sigma
field (de Finetti 1972, §5.8). So such relative frequencies do
not provide an admissible interpretation of Kolmogorov’s axioms.
Finite frequentism has no trouble meeting the ascertainability
criterion, as finite relative frequencies are in principle easily
determined. The same cannot be said of limiting relative frequencies.
On the contrary, any finite sequence of trials (which, after all, is
all we ever see) puts literally no constraint on the limit of an
infinite sequence; still less does an *actual* finite sequence
put any constraint on the limit of an infinite *hypothetical*
sequence, however fast and loose we play with the notion of ‘in
principle’ in the ascertainability criterion.

It might seem that the frequentist interpretations resoundingly meet
the applicability to frequencies criterion. Finite frequentism meets
it all too well, while hypothetical frequentism meets it in the wrong
way. If anything, finite frequentism makes the connection between
probabilities and frequencies *too* tight, as we have already
observed. A fair coin that is tossed a million times is very
*unlikely* to land heads *exactly* half the time; one
that is tossed a million and one times is even less likely to do so!
Facts about finite relative frequencies should serve as evidence, but
not *conclusive* evidence, for the relevant probability
assignments. Hypothetical frequentism fails to connect probabilities
with finite frequencies. It connects them with limiting relative
frequencies, of course, but again too tightly: for even in infinite
sequences, the two can come apart. (A fair coin could land heads
forever, even if it is highly unlikely to do so.) To be sure, science
has much interest in finite frequencies, and indeed working with them
is much of the business of statistics. Whether it has any interest in
highly idealized, hypothetical extensions of actual sequences, and
relative frequencies therein, is another matter. The applicability to
rational beliefs and to rational decisions go much the same way. Such
beliefs and decisions are guided by finite frequency information, but
they are *not* guided by information about limits of
hypothetical frequencies, since one never has such information. For
much more extensive critiques of finite frequentism and hypothetical
frequentism, see Hájek (1997) and Hájek (2009)
respectively, and La Caze (2016).

### 3.5 Propensity Interpretations

Like the frequency interpretations, *propensity*
interpretations regard probabilities as objective properties of
entities in the real world. Probability is thought of as a physical
propensity, or disposition, or tendency of a given type of physical
situation to yield an outcome of a certain kind, or to yield a long
run relative frequency of such an outcome.

While Popper (1957) is often credited as being the pioneer of
propensity interpretations, we already find the key idea in the
writings of Peirce (1910, 79–80): “I am, then, to define
the meaning of the statement that the *probability*, that if a
die be thrown from a dice box it will turn up a number divisible by
three, is one-third. The statement means that the die has a certain
‘would-be’; and to say that the die has a
‘would-be’ is to say that it has a property, quite
analogous to any *habit* that a man might have.” A
man’s habit is a paradigmatic example of a disposition;
according to Peirce the die’s probability of landing 3 or 6 is
an analogous disposition. We might think of various habits coming in
different degrees, measuring their various strengths. Analogously, the
die’s propensities to land various ways measure the strength of
its dispositions to do so.

Peirce continues: “Now in order that the full effect of the die’s ‘would-be’ may find expression, it is necessary that the die should undergo an endless series of throws from the dice box”, and he imagines the relative frequency of the event-type in question oscilating from one side of 1/3 to another. This again anticipates Popper’s view. But an important difference is that Peirce regards the propensity as a property of the die itself, whereas Popper attributes the propensity to the entire chance set-up of throwing the die.

Popper (1957) is motivated by the desire to make sense of single-case probability attributions that one finds in quantum mechanics—for example ‘the probability that this radium atom decays in 1600 years is 1/2’. He develops the theory further in (1959a). For him, a probability \(p\) of an outcome of a certain type is a propensity of a repeatable experiment to produce outcomes of that type with limiting relative frequency \(p\). For instance, when we say that a coin has probability 1/2 of landing heads when tossed, we mean that we have a repeatable experimental set-up — the tossing set-up — that has a propensity to produce a sequence of outcomes in which the limiting relative frequency of heads is 1/2. With its heavy reliance on limiting relative frequency, this position risks collapsing into von Mises-style frequentism according to some critics. Giere (1973), on the other hand, explicitly allows single-case propensities, with no mention of frequencies: probability is just a propensity of a repeatable experimental set-up to produce sequences of outcomes. This, however, creates the opposite problem to Popper’s: how, then, do we get the desired connection between probabilities and frequencies?

It is thus useful to follow Gillies (2000a, 2016) in distinguishing
*long-run* propensity theories and *single-case*
propensity theories:

A long-run propensity theory is one in which propensities are associated with repeatable conditions, and are regarded as propensities to produce in a long series of repetitions of these conditions frequencies which are approximately equal to the probabilities. A single-case propensity theory is one in which propensities are regarded as propensities to produce a particular result on a specific occasion (2000a, 822).

Hacking (1965) and Gillies offer long-run (though not infinitely
long-run) propensity theories. Fetzer (1982, 1983) and Miller (1994)
offer single-case propensity theories. So does Popper in a later work
(1990), in which he regards propensities as “properties of
*the whole physical situation* and sometimes of the particular
way in which a situation changes” (17). Note that
‘propensities’ are categorically different things
depending on which sort of theory we are considering. According to the
long-run theories, propensities are tendencies to produce relative
frequencies with particular values, but the propensities are not
measured by the probability values themselves; according to the
single-case theories, the propensities *are* measured by the
probability values. According to Popper’s earlier view, for
example, a fair die has a propensity — an *extremely
strong* tendency — to land ‘3’ with long-run
relative frequency 1/6. The small value of 1/6 does *not*
measure this tendency. According to Giere, on the other hand, the die
has a *weak* tendency to land ‘3’. The value of 1/6
*does* measure this tendency.

It seems that those theories that tie propensities to frequencies do
not provide an admissible interpretation of the (full) probability
calculus, for the same reasons that relative frequencies do not. It is
*prima facie* unclear whether single-case propensity theories
obey the probability calculus or not. To be sure, one can
*stipulate* that they do so, perhaps using that stipulation as
part of the implicit definition of propensities. Still, it remains to
be shown that there really are such things — stipulating what a
witch is does not suffice to show that witches exist. Indeed, to
claim, as Popper does, that an experimental arrangement has a tendency
to produce a given limiting relative frequency of a particular
outcome, presupposes a kind of stability or uniformity in the workings
of that arrangement (for the limit would not exist in a suitably
*unstable* arrangement). But this is the sort of
‘uniformity of nature’ presupposition that Hume argued
could not be known either *a priori*, or empirically. Now,
appeals can be made to limit theorems — so called ‘laws of
large numbers’ — whose content is roughly that under
suitable conditions, such limiting relative frequencies almost
certainly exist, and equal the single case propensities. Still, these
theorems make assumptions (e.g., that the trials are independent and
identically distributed) whose truth again cannot be known, and must
merely be postulated.

Part of the problem here, say critics, is that we do not know enough
about what propensities are to adjudicate these issues. There is
*some* property of this coin tossing arrangement such that this
coin would land heads with a certain long-run frequency, say. But as
Hitchcock (2002) points out, “calling this property a
‘propensity’ of a certain strength does little to indicate
just what this property is.” Said another way, propensity
accounts are accused of giving empty accounts of probability, à
la Molière’s ‘dormative virtue’ (Sober 2000,
64). Similarly, Gillies objects to single-case propensities on the
grounds that statements about them are untestable, and that they are
“metaphysical rather than scientific” (825). Some might
level the same charge even against long-run propensities, which are
supposedly *distinct* *from* the testable relative
frequencies.

This suggests that the propensity account has difficulty meeting the applicability to science criterion. Some propensity theorists (e.g., Giere) liken propensities to physical magnitudes such as electrical charge that are the province of science. But Hitchcock observes that the analogy is misleading. We can only determine the general properties of charge — that it comes in two varieties, that like charges repel, and so on — by empirical investigation. What investigation, however, could tell us whether or not propensities are non-negative, normalized and additive? (See also Eagle 2004.)

More promising, perhaps, is the idea that propensities are to play
certain theoretical roles, and that these place constraints on the way
they must behave, and hence what they could be (in the style of the
Ramsey/Lewis/‘Canberra plan’ approach to theoretical terms
— see Lewis 1970 or Jackson 2000). The trouble here is that
these roles may pull in opposite directions, *overconstraining*
the problem. The first role, according to some, constrains them to
obey the probability calculus (with finite additivity); the second
role, according to others, constrains them to violate it.

On the one hand, propensities are said to constrain the degrees of
belief, or *credences*, of a rational agent. Recall the
‘applicability to rational beliefs’ criterion: an
interpretation should clarify the role that probabilities play in
constraining the credences of rational agents. One such putative role
for propensities is codified by Lewis’s ‘Principal
Principle’. (See section 3.3.) The Principal Principle underpins
an argument (Lewis 1980) that whatever they are, propensities must
obey the usual probability calculus (with finite additivity). After
all, it is argued, rational credences, which are guided by them,
do.

On the other hand, Humphreys (1985) gives an influential argument that
propensities do *not* obey Kolmogorov’s probability
calculus. The idea is that the probability calculus implies
*Bayes’ theorem*, which allows us to reverse a
conditional probability:

Yet propensities seem to be measures of ‘causal
tendencies’, and much as the causal relation is asymmetric, so
these propensities supposedly do not reverse. Suppose that we have a
test for an illness that occasionally gives false positives and false
negatives. A given sick patient may have a (non-trivial) propensity to
give a positive test result, but it apparently makes no sense to say
that a given positive test result has a (non-trivial) propensity to
have come from a sick patient. Thus, we have an argument that whatever
they are, propensities must *not* obey the usual probability
calculus. ‘Humphreys’ paradox’, as it is known, is
really an argument against any formal account of propensities that has
as a theorem:

(∗) if the probability of \(B\), given \(A\) exists, then the probability of \(A\), given \(B\) exists,

however one understands these conditional probabilities. The argument
has prompted Fetzer and Nute (in Fetzer 1981) to offer a
“probabilistic causal calculus” that looks quite different
from Kolmogorov’s
calculus.^{[11]}
But one could respond more conservatively, as Lyon (2014) points out.
For example, Rényi’s axiomatization of primitive
conditional probabilities does not have (∗) as a theorem, and
thus propensities may conform to it despite Humphreys’ argument.
Nonetheless, Lyon offers “a more general problem for the
propensity interpretation. There are all sorts of pairs of events that
have no propensity relations between them, and all three axiom
systems—Kolmogorov’s, Popper’s, and
Rényi’s—will sometimes force there to be
conditional probabilities between them. This is not an argument that
there is no alternative axiom system that propensity theorists can
adopt, but it is an argument that the three main contenders are not
viable” (124).

Or perhaps all this shows that the notion of ‘propensity’ bifurcates: on the one hand, there are propensities that bear an intimate connection to relative frequencies and rational credences, and that obey the usual probability calculus (with finite additivity); on the other hand, there are causal propensities that behave rather differently. In that case, there would be still more interpretations of probability than have previously been recognized.

### 3.6 Best-System Interpretations

Traditionally, philosophers of probability have recognized five
leading interpretations of probability—classical, logical,
subjectivist, frequentist, and propensity. But recently, so-called
*best-system* interpretations of chance have become
increasingly popular and important. While they bear some similarities
to frequentist accounts, they avoid some of frequentism’s major
failings; and while they are sometimes assimilated to propensity
accounts, they are really quite distinct. So they deserve separate
treatment.

The best-system approach was pioneered by Lewis (1994b). His analysis
of chance is based on his account of *laws of nature* (1973),
which in turn refines an account due to Ramsey (1928/1990). According
to Lewis, the laws of nature are the theorems of the *best
systematization* of the universe—the *true* theory
that best combines the theoretical virtues of *simplicity and*
strength. These virtues trade off. It is easy for a theory to be
simple but not strong, by saying very little; it is easy for a theory
to be strong but not simple, by conjoining lots of disparate facts.
The best theory balances simplicity and strength optimally—in
short, it is the most economical true theory.

So far, there is no mention of chances. Now, we allow probabilistic
theories to enter the competition. We are not yet in a position to
speak of such theories as being true. Instead, let us introduce
another theoretical virtue: *fit*. The more probable the actual
history of the universe is by the lights of the theory, the better it
fits that history. Now the theories compete according to how well they
combine simplicity, strength, and fit. The theorems of the winning
theory are the laws of nature. Some of these laws may be
probabilistic. The chances are the probabilities that are determined
by these probabilistic laws.

According to Lewis (1986b), intermediate chances are incompatible with
determinism. Loewer (2004) agrees that intermediate
*propensities* are incompatible with determinism, understanding
those to be essentially *dynamical*: “they specify the
degree to which one state has a tendency to cause another” (15).
But he argues that *chances* are best understood along Lewisian
best-system lines, and that there is no reason to limit them to
dynamical chances. In particular, best-system chances may also attach
to *initial conditions*: adding to the dynamical laws a
probability assignment, or *distribution*, over initial
conditions may provide a substantial gain in strength with relatively
little cost in simplicity. Science furnishes important examples of
deterministic theories with such initial-condition probabilities.
Adding the so-called micro-canonical distribution to Newton’s
laws (and the assumption that the distant past had low entropy) yields
all of statistical mechanics; adding the so-called quantum equilibrium
distribution to Bohm’s dynamical laws yields standard quantum
mechanics. Indeed, this contact with actual science is one of the
selling points of best-system analyses. See Schwarz (2016) for further
selling points.

At first blush, best-systems analyses seem to score well on our criteria of adequacy. They are admissible by definition: chances are determined by probabilistic laws (rather than by those expressed by some other formalism). One could in principle ascertain values of probabilities, since they supervene on what actually happens in the universe (though ‘in principle’ bears a heavy burden). Applicability to frequencies is secured through the role that ‘fit’ plays. Schwarz (2014) offers a proof of the Principal Principle, which could be taken to undergird the best-systems analyses’ applicability to rational beliefs and rational decisions. And we have just mentioned the interpretation’s applicability to science.

This approach solves, or at least eases, some of frequentism’s problems. Progress can be made on the problem of the single case. The chances of a rare atom decaying in various time intervals may be determined by a more pervasive functional law, in which decay chances are given for a far wider range of atoms by plugging in a range of settings of some other magnitude (e.g., atomic number). And simplicity may militate in favour of this functional law being continuous, so even irrational-valued probabilities may be assigned. Moreover, bare ratios of attributes among sets of disparate objects will not qualify as chances if they are not pervasive enough, for then a theory that assigns them probabilities will lose too much simplicity without sufficient gain in strength.

However, some other problems for frequentism remain, and some new ones emerge, beginning with more basic problems for the Lewisian account of lawhood itself. Some of them are partly a matter of Lewis’s specific formulation. Critics (e.g. van Fraassen 1989) question the rather nebulous notion of “balancing” simplicity and strength, which are themselves somewhat sketchy. But arguably some technical story (e.g. information-theoretic) could be offered to precisify them. Lewis himself worries that the exchange rate for such balancing may depend partly on our psychology, in which case there is the threat the laws themselves depend on our psychology, an unpalatable idealism about them. But he maintains that this threat is not serious as long as “nature is kind”, and one theory is so robustly the front-runner that it remains so under any reasonable standards for balancing. And again, perhaps technical tools can offer some objectivity here. (See section 4 for a gesture at such tools.)

More telling is the concern that simplicity is language-relative, and
indeed that any theory can be given the simplest specification
possible: simply abbreviate it as \(T\)! Lewis replies that a
theory’s simplicity must be judged according to its
specification in a canonical language, in which all of the predicates
correspond to *natural* properties. Thus, ‘green’
may well be eligible, but ‘grue’ surely is not. (See
Goodman 1955.) Our abbreviation, then, has to be unpacked in terms of
such a language, in which its true complexity will be revealed. But
this now involves a substantial metaphysical commitment to a
distinction between natural and unnatural properties, one that various
empiricists (e.g. van Fraassen 1989) find objectionable.

Further problems arise with the refinement to handle probabilistic
laws. Again, some of them may be due to Lewis’s particular
formulation. Elga (2004) observes that Lewis’s notion of fit is
problematic in various infinite universes—think of an infinite
sequence of tosses of a coin. Offhand, it seems that the particular
infinite sequence that is actualized will be assigned probability
*zero* by any plausible candidate theory that regards the
probability of heads as intermediate and the trials as independent.
Elga argues, moreover, that there are technical difficulties with
addressing this problem with infinitesimal probabilities. However,
perhaps we merely need a different understanding of
‘fit’—perhaps understood as ‘typicality’
(Elga), or perhaps one closer to that employed by statisticians with
‘chi-squared’ tests of goodness of fit (Schwarz 2014).

Hoefer (2007) modifies Lewis’s best-system account in light of some of these problems. Hoefer understands “best” as “best for us”, covering regularities that are of interest to us, using the language both of science and of daily life, without any special privilege bestowed upon natural properties. Moreover, the “best system” is now one of chances directly, rather than of laws. Thus, there may be chances associated with the punctuality of trains, for example, without any presumption that there are any associated laws. Hoefer follows Elga in understanding ‘fit’ as ‘typicality’. Strength is a matter of the size of the overall domain of the best system’s probability functions. Simplicity is to be understood in terms of elegant unification, and user-friendliness to beings like us. As a result, Hoefer embraces the agent-centric nature of chances in his sense, regarding as essential the credence-guiding role for them that is captured by the Principal Principle. This is how his account meets the ‘applicability to rational beliefs’ criterion.

However, some other problems for Lewis’s account may run deeper,
threatening best-system analyses more generally, and symptomatic of
the ghost of frequentism that still hovers behind such analyses. One
problem for frequentism that we saw strikes at the heart of any
attempt to reduce chances to properties of patterns of outcomes. Such
outcomes may be highly misleading regarding the true chances,
*because of* their probabilistic nature. This is most vivid for
events that are single-case by any reasonable typing. Whether or our
universe turns out to be open or closed, plausibly that outcome is
compatible with any underlying intermediate chance. The point
generalizes, however pervasive the probabilistic pattern might be.
Plausibly, a coin’s landing 9 heads out of 10 tosses is
compatible with any underlying intermediate chance for heads; and so
on. The pattern of outcomes that is instantiated may be a poor guide
to the true chance. (See Hájek 2009 for further arguments
against frequentism that carry over to best-system accounts.)

Another way of putting the concern is that best-system accounts
mistake an idealized epistemology of chance for its metaphysics
(though see Lewis’ insistence that this is not the case, in his
1994). Such accounts single out three theoretical virtues—and
one may wonder why *just* those three—and reifies the
probabilities of a theory that displays the virtues to the highest
degree. But a probabilistic world may be recalcitrant to even the best
theorizing: nature may be unkind.

## 4. Conclusion: Recent Trends, Future Prospects

It should be clear from the foregoing that there is still much work to be done regarding the interpretations of probability. Each interpretation that we have canvassed seems to capture some crucial insight into a concept of it, yet falls short of doing complete justice to this concept. Perhaps the full story about probability is something of a patchwork, with partially overlapping pieces and principles about how they ought to relate. In that sense, the above interpretations might be regarded as complementary, although to be sure each may need some further refinement. My bet, for what it is worth, is that we will retain the distinct notions of physical, logical/evidential, and subjective probability, with a rich tapestry of connections between them.

There are further signs of the rehabilitation of classical and logical
probability, and in particular the principle of indifference and the
principle of maximum entropy, by authors such as Paris and
Vencovská (1997), Maher (2000, 2001), Bartha and Johns (2001),
Novack (2010), White (2010), and Pettigrew (2016). However, Rinard
(2014) argues that the principle of indifference leads to incoherence
even when imprecise probabilities are allowed. Eva (2019) resurrects
the principle as a constraint on *comparative* probabilities of
the form ‘I am more confident in *p* than in
*q*’ or ‘I am equally confident in *p* and
*q*’. This, in turn, showcases another recent trend: an
increased interest in comparative probabilities.

Relevant here may also be advances in information theory and complexity theory. Information theory uses probabilities to define the information in a particular event, the degree of uncertainty in a random variable, and the mutual information between random variables (Shannon 1948, Shannon & Weaver 1949). This theory has been developed extensively to give accounts of complexity, optimal data compression and encoding (Kolmogorov 1965, Li and Vitanyi 1997, Cover and Thomas 2006; see the entry on information for more details). It is applied across the sciences, from its natural home in computer science and communication theory, to physics and biology. Interpreting information in these areas goes hand-in-hand with interpreting the underlying probabilities: each concept of probability has a corresponding concept of information. For example, Scarantino (2015) offers an account of ‘natural information’ in biology that is compatible with either a logical interpretation of probability or objective Bayesian interpretation, while Kraemer (2015) offers one that rests on a finite frequency interpretation.

Information theory has also proved to be fruitful in the study of randomness (Kolmogorov 1965, Martin-Löf 1966), which obviously is intimately related to the notion of probability – see Eagle (2016), and the entry on chance versus randomness. Refinements of our understanding of randomness, in turn, should have a bearing on the frequency interpretations (recall von Mises’ appeal to randomness in his definition of a ‘collective’), and on propensity accounts (especially those that make explicit ties to frequencies). Given the apparent connection between propensities and causation adumbrated in Section 3.5, powerful causal modelling methods should also prove fruitful here. More generally, the theory of graphical causal models (also known as Bayesian networks) uses directed acyclic graphs to represent causal relationships in a system. (See Spirtes, Glymour and Scheines 1993, Pearl 2000, Woodward 2003.) The graphs and the probabilities of the system’s variables harmonize in accordance with the causal Markov condition, a sophisticated version of Reichenbach’s slogan “no correlation without causation”. (See the entry on causal models for more details.) Thus again, each understanding of probability has a counterpart understanding of causal networks.

Regarding best-system interpretations of chance, I noted that it is somewhat unclear exactly what ‘simplicity’ and ‘strength’ consist in, and exactly how they are to be balanced. Perhaps insights from statistics and computer science may be helpful here: approaches to statistical model selection, and in particular the ‘curve-fitting’ problem, that attempt to characterize simplicity, and its trade-off with strength — e.g., the Akaike Information Criterion (see Forster and Sober 1994), the Bayesian Information Criterion (see Kieseppä 2001), Minimum Description Length theory (see Rissanen 1999) and Minimum Message Length theory (see Wallace and Dowe 1999).

Physical probabilities are becoming even more crucial to scientific
inquiry. Probabilities are not just used to characterize the support
given to scientific theories by evidence; they appear essentially in
the content of the theories themselves. This has led to fertile
philosophical ground interpreting the probabilities in such theories.
For example, quantum mechanics has physical probabilities at the
fundamental level. The interpretation of these probabilities is
related to the interpretation of the theory itself (see the entry on
philosophical issues in quantum theory).
Statistical mechanics and evolutionary theory have non-fundamental
objective probabilities. Are they genuine chances? How can we account
for them? See Strevens (2003) and Lyon (2011) for discussion. However,
Schwarz (2018) argues that these probabilities can and should be left
uninterpreted. Loewer (2012, 2020) proposes that the Lewisian best
system of our world is given by “*the
Mentaculus*”—a complete probability map of the
universe. This is Albert’s (2000) package of:

- the fundamental dynamical laws of statistical mechanics;
- the claim that initially the universe was in a microstate \(M(0)\) whose entropy was tiny (“the Past Hypothesis”);
- and a law specifying a uniform probability distribution over the micro-states that realize \(M(0).\)

Another ongoing debate regarding physical probabilities concerns
whether chance is compatible with determinism—see, e.g.,
Schaffer (2007), who is an incompatibilist, and Ismael (2009) and
Loewer (2020), who are compatibilists. Handfield and Wilson (2014)
argue that chance ascriptions are context-sensitive, varying according
to the relevant “evidence base”. This captures the thought
that in a deterministic universe, there is *some* sense in
which all chances are extreme, while doing justice to other
compatibilist usages of chance. See Frigg (2016) for an overview of
this debate. Relatedly, an important approach to objective probability
that has gained popularity involves the so-called *method of
arbitrary functions*. Originating with Poincaré (1896), it
is a mathematical technique for determining probability functions for
certain systems with chaotic dynamical laws mapping input conditions
to outcomes. Roughly speaking, the probabilities for the outcomes are
relatively insensitive to the probabilities over the various initial
conditions — think of how the probabilities of outcomes of spins
of a roulette wheel apparently do not depend on how the wheel is spun,
sometimes vigorously, sometimes feebly. See Strevens (2003, 2013) for
detailed treatments of this approach.

The subjectivist theory of probability is also thriving—indeed, it has been the biggest growth area among all the interpretations, thanks to the burgeoning of formal epistemology in the last couple of decades. For each of the topics that I will briefly mention, I can only cite a few representative works.

Especially since Joyce (1998), *accuracy* arguments for various
Bayesian norms have been influential. They include arguments for
conditionalization (Greaves and Wallace 2006, Briggs and Pettigrew
2020), the Reflection Principle (Easwaran 2013), and the Principal
Principle (Pettigrew 2016). However, Mahtani (2021) argues that the
mathematical theorems that are invoked to support the accuracy
approach do not justify probabilism. These lines of research continue
to develop. And these norms themselves have received further
attention—e.g. Schoenfield (2017) on conditionalization, and
Hall (1994, 2004), Ismael (2008), and Briggs (2009) on the Principal
Principle.

Yet for some problems, Bayesian modelling seems not to be sufficiently
nuanced. A recently flourishing area has concerned modelling an
agent’s *self-locating* credences, concerning who she is,
or what time it is. The contents of such credences are usually taken
to be richer than just propositions (thought of as sets of possible
worlds); rather, they are finer-grained propositions (sets of centered
worlds — see Lewis 1979). This in turn has ramifications for
updating rules, in particular calling conditionalization into
question—see Meacham (2008). The so-called Sleeping Beauty
problem (Elga 2000) has generated much discussion in this regard. See
Titelbaum (2012) for a comprehensive study and approach to such
problems, Titelbaum (2016), and the entry on self-locating beliefs for
a survey of the literature. These continue to be fertile areas of
research.

On the other hand, there is another sense in which Bayesian modelling
has been regarded as *too* nuanced. It seems to be
psychologically unrealistic to portray *humans* (rather than
ideally rational agents) as having degrees of belief that are
infinitely precise real numbers. Thus, there have been various
attempts to ‘humanize’ Bayesianism, and this line of
research is gaining momentum. For example, there has been a
flourishing study of imprecise probability and imprecise decision
theory, in which credences need not be precise numbers—for
example, they could be sets of numbers, or intervals. See
http://www.sipta.org/ for up-to-date research in this area. This
resonates with recent work on whether imprecise probabilities are
rationally required—Hájek and Smithson (2012) and Isaacs,
Hájek, and Hawthorne (2022) on the pro side, Schoenfield (2017)
on the con side. The debate continues.

Nor is it plausible that humans obey all the theorems of the
probability calculus—we are incoherent in all sorts of ways. The
last couple of decades have also seen research on degrees of
incoherence—measuring the extent of departures from obedience to
the probability calculus—including Zynda (1996), Schervish,
Seidenfeld and Kadane (2003), De Bona and Staffel (2017, 2018), and
Staffel (2019). Lin (2013) sees traditional epistemology’s
notion of *belief* as appropriate for humans who fall short of
the Bayesian ideal, but who nevertheless may obey various doxastic
norms that can be given Bayesian endorsement. He models everyday
practical reasoning, with qualitative beliefs and desires, providing a
qualitative decision theory and representation theorem. Easwaran
(2016) takes humans to genuinely have all-or-nothing beliefs, but
offers an *instrumentalist* justification for representing
those beliefs with probabilities.

It also a fact of life that humans *disagree* with each other.
How should an agent modify her credences (if at all) when she
disagrees on some claim with an *epistemic peer*—someone
who has the same evidence as her, and whom she regards as equally good
at evaluating that evidence? The literature on this topic is huge (see
Kopec and Titelbaum (2016) for a survey, and the entry on
disagreement),
and it connects in important ways with the interpretations of
probability. Intuitively, we feel that disagreement with an epistemic
peer rationally calls for moving one’s opinion in the direction
of theirs, since disagreement with a peer seems to be evidence that
one has made a mistake in evaluating one’s initial evidence. As
Kelly (2010) argues, this ‘conciliationist’ intuition
appears to commit us to the evidential interpretation of probability,
with the common evidence bestowing a unique probability on the
disputed claim. (See Schoenfield 2014 and Titelbaum 2016 for dissent;
for a defense of the Uniqueness Thesis more generally, see Horowitz
and Dogramaci 2016.) The intuition also appears to commit us to
*probabilistic enkrasia*: the view that our credences are
beholden to our attitudes *about* evidential probabilities, in
much the same way as the Principal Principle portrays our credences as
beholden to our attitudes about chances. (See Christensen 2013 and
Elga 2010 for versions of probabilistic enkrasia principles.)
Let’s grant that disagreement with a peer about some claim is
evidence that one has made a mistake regarding it. This should affect
one’s opinion in it only if one’s attitude about the
*correct* way to evaluate the evidence constrains one’s
attitude about the claim. However, probabilistic enkrasia has been
criticised (see Williamson 2014; Lasonen-Aarnio 2015).

We thus come back full circle to where we started. The classical and logical/evidential interpretations sought to capture an objective notion of probability that measures evidential support relations. Early proponents of the subjective interpretation gave us a highly permissive notion of rational credences, constrained only by the probability calculus. Less liberal subjectivists added further rationality constraints, with credences beholden to attitudes about physical probabilities, and to evidential probabilities—at an extreme, to the point of uniqueness. The three kinds of concepts of probability that we identified at the outset converge: epistemological, degrees of confidence, and physical. Future research will doubtless explore further the relationships between them—and how they provide guides to life.

### Suggested Further Reading

Kyburg (1970) contains a vast bibliography of the literature on
probability and induction pre-1970. Also useful for references before
1967 is the bibliography for “Probability” in the
Macmillan *Encyclopedia of Philosophy*. Earman (1992) and
Howson and Urbach (1993) have large bibliographies, and give detailed
presentations of the Bayesian program. Hájek and Hitchcock
(2021 [Other Internet Resources]) has a more recent and extensive
annotated bibliography for all the interpretations of probability
discussed in this entry. Skyrms (2000) is an excellent introduction to
the philosophy of probability. Von Plato (1994) is more technically
demanding and more historically oriented, with another extensive
bibliography that has references to many landmarks in the development
of probability theory in the last century. Fine (1973) is still a
highly sophisticated survey of and contribution to various
foundational issues in probability, with an emphasis on
interpretations. More recent philosophical studies of the leading
interpretations include Childers (2013), Gillies (2000b), Galavotti
(2005), Huber (2019), and Mellor (2005). Hájek and Hitchcock
(2016) is a collection of original survey articles on philosophical
issues related to probability. Section IV includes chapters on most of
the major interpretations of probability. It also includes coverage of
the history of probability, Kolmogorov’s formalism and
alternatives, and applications of probability in science and
philosophy. Joyce (2011) is a thorough survey of subjective
Bayesianism; Titelbaum (2022) is a wide-ranging and accessible
introduction to Bayesian epistemology. Hájek and Lin (2017)
canvass various respects of similarity and dissimilarity between
Bayesian epistemology and traditional epistemology. Knauff and Spohn
(2021) is a comprehensive open access handbook on many topics
concerning rationality; the chapter by Hájek and Staffel (2021)
elaborates on a number of issues raised in this entry’s
discussion of subjective probability. Eagle (2010) is a valuable
anthology of many significant papers in the philosophy of probability,
with detailed and incisive critical discussions. Billingsley (1995)
and Feller (1968) are classic, rather advanced textbooks on the
mathematical theory of probability. Ross (2013) is less advanced and
has lots of examples.

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### Acknowledgments

I thank Branden Fitelson, Matthias Hild, Christopher Hitchcock, Leon Leontyev, Ralph Miles, Wolfgang Schwarz, Teddy Seidenfeld, Glenn Shafer, Elliott Sober, Jeremy Strasser, and Jim Woodward for their many helpful comments, and especially Jim Joyce, who gave me very detailed and incisive feedback.